Notes to The Logic of Mass Expressions

1. Under the dominant view, these two sentences are cases of conversion: You should take a hot milk with some honey. You will find a lot of rabbit around here. In the first sentence, the mass noun milk is converted into (used as) a count noun, while in the second sentence, the count noun rabbit is converted into a mass noun. Cf. Gillon (1992), Nicolas (2002: chapters 1 and 7). Conversion is a common grammatical possibility, whereby a member of a grammatical category is used in the morphosyntactic environment characteristic of another grammatical category. For instance, proper names like Picasso can be converted into (used as) common nouns: The professor has two Picassos in his class.

2. More precisely, in Mandarin, only a very restricted subset of common nouns admits the mark of the plural (the suffix -men). So under this view, only these nouns would function like count nouns, while the vast majority of Mandarin common nouns would function like mass nouns.

3. To avoid assumptions that are not necessary and that are controversial seems a good idea in general. However, a semantic theory presumably cannot avoid making some metaphysical assumptions. Which are acceptable, then, and which are not? It's not clear whether there is a principled and precise answer to this question.

4. One way to answer the challenge would be to (try to) deny that the inference considered is formally valid.

5. An extensional approach doesn't distinguish between coextensive predicates. For this reason, Montague uses an intensional framework. However, this worry about coextensivity is orthogonal to the main questions concerning mass nouns, so we ignore it in this entry. Similarly, we say nothing about bare mass nouns, which can receive either an existential or a generic interpretation. There are different views about their semantics:

  • The generic interpretation is primary; the existential interpretation derives from it (Carlson 1977).
  • Bare mass nouns are directly interpreted as indefinites when they combine with stage- or individual-level predicates (Wilkinson 1991).
  • Generic interpretations correspond to a variety of phenomena that should be treated independently from the semantics of mass nouns proper (Bunt 1985; Gillon 1992; Koslicki 1999).

6. Pelletier (1974) treats mass nouns as predicates and opposes what he calls the “set-theoretic interpretation” proposed by Cartwright (1965). But the problems he points out seem to concern only Cartwright's specific proposals.

7. One way out of the problem would be to weigh the mereological sum of the instances of M (cf. section 4). But it's not available to the purely set-theoretic approach.

8. As explained in remark 1, section 2, the corresponding mereology need not be as strong as classical extensional mereology.

9. See also Link (1983); and La Palme-Reyes et al. (1994) in a category theoretic setting.

10. Their approach is nearly equivalent to the purely mereological approach discussed in section 2. As we shall see, what is new is that they propose an interpretation of negation in terms of the notion of Boolean complement. A similar solution can be adopted within the mixed set-theoretic and mereological framework. Likewise, formulas mentioning the bottom element (0) of the Boolean algebra can be reformulated in terms of non-overlap. See remark 2 (section 5).

11. To simplify computations, we treat is in the safe as an unanalyzed predicate, similar to red for instance.

12. The null hypothesis, which we adopt, is that all mass nouns should have the same semantics. A contrario, see for instance Bale & Barner (2009) and Schwarzschild (2011).

13. This is also called “the presupposition of homogeneity”. But the sense of homogeneity at play is different from the one occurring in the hypothesis that mass nouns are homogeneous (i.e., refer distributively and cumulatively).

14. Under the Boolean approach, the truth-conditions of this sentence can be specified as follows:

Some M P is true iff [M] ∧ [P] ≠ 0, where ∧ is Boolean intersection, 0 is the bottom element, [M] is the join of everything that is M, and [P] is the join of everything that P.

15. I.e., Much gold was stolen is interpreted as meaning the same as Much of the gold was stolen.

16. This notion of covering is based on the notion of sum and so it differs from the set-theoretic notion of cover. It can be seen as a generalization of the latter.

17. Gillon uses a more specific notion, that of “aggregation”. An aggregation is a covering of which no element is part of another. Nothing crucial hinges on this choice.

18. For Gillon, the denotation of a mass noun M is the set having for sole member the sum of everything that is M. However, this makes it hard to specify adequate truth-conditions for This is M.

19. By contrast, the interpretation of a sentence containing the demonstrative noun phrase This M depends on the choice of an M-covering of the noun phrase's denotation. And [This M] is the set having for sole member the sum of the M demonstrated in the circumstance. Relative to this choice of covering C: This M P is true iff C ⊆ [P].

20. Although plural logic and second-order logic share certain features, the two should be distinguished (see Linnebo 2012, section 2, for a detailed discussion).

21. Following Gillon (1992), Nicolas (2008) takes a sentence containing a mass noun to be ambiguous with respect to coverings. As mentioned in the remark at the end of section 8, an alternative view is that the sentence is indeterminate with respect to coverings. It is true if there exists a suitable covering, false otherwise.

Copyright © 2013 by
David Nicolas <>

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