# Logicism and Neologicism

*First published Wed Aug 21, 2013*

Logicism is a philosophical, foundational,
and *foundationalist* doctrine that can be advanced with
respect to any branch of mathematics. Traditionally, logicism has
concerned itself especially with arithmetic and real analysis. It
comes in a stronger and a weaker version.

The *strong* version of logicism maintains that all
mathematical *truths* in the chosen branch(es) form a species
of logical truth. The weak version of logicism, by contrast, maintains
only that all the *theorems* do. (By ‘theorems’ we
mean results that are *provable* within the branch of
mathematics in question.) The foundationalism is with respect to those
parts of mathematics that the logicist reconstructs. Success in this
regard is compatible, however, with a non-foundationalist (e.g.,
coherentist) view of the parts of mathematics that cannot be so
reconstructed.

Both versions of logicism—strong and weak—maintain that

*All*the objects forming the subject matter of those branches of mathematics are logical objects; and- Logic—in some suitably general and powerful sense that the
logicist will have to define—is capable of furnishing
definitions of the primitive concepts of these branches of
mathematics, allowing one to derive the mathematician's ‘first
principles’ therein as results within Logic itself. (The branch
of mathematics in question is thereby said to have been
*reduced*to Logic.)

For the foundationalist who accepts Kant's distinction between
analytic and synthetic truth, the truths of logic are paradigm cases
of analytic truths. They are true *solely by virtue of the meanings
of the linguistic expressions involved* in expressing them; or, as
Kant might have preferred it, by virtue of internal relations among
the concepts involved. A successful logicist reduction of any branch
of mathematics will therefore show that its truths (strong version) or
its theorems (weak version) are analytic.

Another consequence of successful logicist reduction of a given
branch of mathematics is that mathematical certainty (within that
branch) is of a piece with certainty about logical truth. The same
holds for necessity; and for the *a priori* character of the
knowledge concerned.

Logicist doctrines were espoused in two main forms—Fregean
and Russellian—until around 1930, at which point logicism went
into decline, largely because of the discovery of Gödelian
incompleteness, and the ascendancy of Zermelo-Fraenkel set theory,
which displaced the Russellian theory of types as the most promising
foundational theory for mathematics. The doctrine
of *neo-logicism* subsequently revived some of the core ideas
of logicism, with its first hints appearing in the mid-1960s, and its
more substantive contributions beginning in the 1980s.

The main technical and philosophical innovation of
the *neo*-logicists is their use of *abstraction
principles* in order to secure the existence of such things as
numbers, understood, with Frege, as *logical* objects. One
favored kind of abstraction principle typically effects the
reification of equivalence classes of an equivalence
relation.^{[1]} One
of Frege's favorite examples involved the equivalence relation of
parallelism among lines. The relevant abstraction would be that of
the *direction* of a line. Thus, two lines *l*_{1}
and *l*_{2} have *the same direction* just in case
they are parallel:

d(l_{1}) =d(l_{2}) ⇔l_{1}||l_{2}.

The function denoted by the abstraction
operator *d*( ) is here applied to lines, and
produces *directions* (new abstract objects) as its
values. Note that the abstraction operator can take variables as
arguments.

The neo-logicists characterize abstraction operators that
produce *numbers* as their values. Details of notation and
method will be provided in due course.

There has not been any historical trend discernible as
an *evolution* of the doctrine of logicism, with incremental
adjustments to deal with occasional problems as they arose, while
maintaining a reasonably stable trajectory towards an ideal
formulation. Rather, the doctrine has been characterized by abrupt
shifts as far as methods and materials are concerned, even if the goal
has remained relatively constant through such
changes.^{[2]} We
shall allow the pattern of change to become evident as the different
phases of logicism are recounted below.

- 1. Historical background
- 2. Neo-Fregeanism
- 3. Second-order logic with Hume's Principle
- 4. Constructive Logicism
- 5. Modal Neo-Logicism
- 6. Summary of Problems for Logicism
- Bibliography
- Academic Tools
- Other Internet Resources
- Related Entries

## 1. Historical background

Kant had held that both arithmetic and (Euclidean) geometry were
synthetic *a priori*, just as—for him—metaphysics
was. Indeed, this was to explain the special status of both
mathematics and metaphysics, so that the latter could enjoy the
exalted status of the former. For Kant, both mathematics and
metaphysics afforded informative insights into the nature of reality
(they were synthetic); yet, for all that, the rational intellect
needed no sensory experience in order to attain such insights (they
were *a priori*). On Kant's account, even a simple
computational statement of arithmetic—let alone a statement
involving quantification over the natural numbers—is
synthetic. Here is how he put the matter in his *Critique of Pure
Reason*, at B16:

We might, indeed, at first suppose that the proposition 7 + 5 = 12 is a merely analytical proposition, and follows by the principle of contradiction from the concept of a sum of 7 and 5. But if we look more closely we find that the concept of the sum of 7 and 5 contains nothing save the union of the two numbers into one, and in this no thought is being taken as to what that single number may be which combines both. The concept of 12 is by no means already thought in merely thinking this union of 7 and 5; and I may analyze my concept of such a possible sum as long as I please, still I shall never find the 12 in it. (Translation by Norman Kemp Smith)

Kant's search for conceptual containments is confined to those that
he might be able to find among just the explicit constituents of the
proposition concerned, unmediated by any connections with related
concepts that do not themselves occur within the proposition. (We note
this in anticipation of a contrast to be made in due course with
Frege's modification of Kant's conception of analytic
truth.)^{[3]} For
Kant, the *a priori* character of arithmetical truth derives
not from conceptual containments (within the proposition in question),
but from the *pure form of our intuition of time*, as affording
an unbounded series of successive moments. According to Michael
Friedman, Kant held that

only the general features of succession and iteration in time can guarantee the existence and uniqueness of the sum of 7 and 5 …; only the unboundedness of temporal succession can guarantee the infinity of the number series, and so on ….

^{[4]}

Likewise, on Kant's account, the *a priori* character of
Euclidean geometry derives from the *pure form of our intuition of
space*, which enables the thinker, correctly one may presume, to
intuit straight lines in space as continuous.

These two pure forms of intuition—time and
space—delivered, for Kant, the theories of arithmetic and
Euclidean geometry respectively, and endowed them both with
their *a priori* character. And they made possible the
spatio-temporal manifold of intuitions (*Anschauungen*) which
would then in turn, upon structuring by the exercise of concepts of
the understanding (especially the concepts of *substance*
and *cause*) make possible objective knowledge of things and
events in the external world.

The logicists, then, could be seen as adopting Kant's distinction,
but applying it to radically different effect. Their first move was to
argue that *arithmetic*, at least, is *analytic*, not
synthetic.

The doctrine of logicism had its first glimmerings in the writings of Dedekind, but it really only came to full flowering in the work of Frege. In Dedekind's work, the ideas were presented in a form accessible to his contemporaries in the mathematical community. Precise and rigorous though those ideas were, they nevertheless enjoyed a relatively informal presentation. No one had yet come up with the idea of formal deductive systems of logic adequate for formalizing the mathematical reasoning of their day; so no logicist thesis in Dedekind's day could be formulated in the way that is now familiar to us. Matters were different, of course, with Frege, for his crowning achievement was a formal deductive system of logic by reference to which a logicist thesis could at last be expressed.

Now, when crediting Frege also with the pioneering of a detailed
execution of a logicist program, one cannot ignore his continuing
insistence that the truths of Euclidean geometry were *synthetic a
priori*, and founded in a completely different way from the truths
of arithmetic.^{[5]}
Hence they were not subject to his doctrine of logicism. This is why
we have exercised care in our introductory characterization of the
doctrine of logicism, as concerned first and foremost with the truths
of arithmetic and of real analysis.

The combined contributions of Dedekind and Frege represented a
culmination of the trend, by their time well under way among leading
mathematicians, towards the *arithmetization* of real (and
complex) analysis. This trend had its beginnings in the even earlier
works of Gauss and Bolzano. It came to maturity in the works of Cauchy
and Weierstraß, and became the dominant paradigm in Western
thought about the nature of mathematics. The leading idea of the
arithmetizers was that the concepts and first principles of arithmetic
and analysis are to be found in the concepts of the understanding (as
a Kantian might put it), independently of one's geometric intuitions
concerning any spatial or temporal continua. Arithmetic and analysis
are completely *conceptual* and *logical* in their
axiomatic sources and in their deductive development.

We proceed now to consider Dedekind and Frege in turn.

### 1.1 Dedekind

It is fair to say that Dedekind enabled the trend of
arithmetization to culminate in the doctrine of logicism. The
recommendation (or statement of the methodological maxim) that
one *ought* to avoid all matters geometric when providing a
foundation for real analysis goes back at least to
Dedekind, *Stetigkeit und Irrationale Zahlen* (1872). This work
was published late. Its breakthrough idea had come fourteen years
earlier, in
1858.^{[6]}
At pages 3–4 Dedekind writes in an
engaging and revelatory way of his earlier struggle in the autumn of
1858 to furnish “*eine wirklich wissenschaftliche
Begründung der Arithmetik*” (a really scientific
foundation for Arithmetic [i.e., real
analysis]).^{[7]}

It is clear that Dedekind is writing on
the *presumption*—assumed to be so widespread as not to
call for any justificatory argument—that one should have *no
recourse at all* to geometric intuitions or first principles when
founding the theory of the real numbers. This presumption, said
Dedekind, ‘no one will deny’. Dedekind wanted
“a *purely arithmetical* and perfectly rigorous
foundation for the principles of infinitesimal analysis”
[Emphases added].^{[8]}

The presumption receives further emphatic statement in Dedekind's
later work (1888) *Was sind und was sollen die Zahlen?*, which,
like the earlier work, was published much later than it could (or
should) have been. In the preface to the first edition (Dedekind
1996b: 790–1) Dedekind writes

In speaking of arithmetic (algebra, analysis) as merely part of logic I mean to imply that I consider the number-concept

entirely independent of the notions or intuitions of space and time—that I rather consider it an immediate product of the pure laws of thought.… It is only through the purely logical process of building up the science of numbers and by thus acquiring the continuous number-domain that we are enabled accurately to investigate our notions of space and time by bringing them into relation with this number-domain created in our mind.[fn] [Emphasis added]

Once again we see the presumption at work: in laying a foundation
for the theory of real numbers, one *must avoid* any recourse
to geometrical intuition. To inquire how such a presumption become so
widespread, and in whose works it originated, is a topic outside the
scope of the present study.

### 1.2 Frege

It is clear from Frege's Preface to his *Begriffsschrift*
(at pp. IX–X) that he shared Dedekind's methodological concerns,
and that he had an eventual logicist treatment of arithmetic in his
sights when devising his concept script. Frege distinguished two kinds
of truths that require a *Begründung* (justification):
those whose proofs could proceed purely logically; and those which had
to be supported by experiential facts
(*Erfahrungsthatsachen*). And he sought to inquire how far one
could succeed in capturing arithmetic by means only of inferences
based on the laws of thought that transcend all particularities
(“*durch Schlüsse allein …, nur gestützt auf
die Gesetze des Denkens, die über allen Besonderheiten erhaben
sind*”). He made it clear that he wished to get at the root
concept of *ordering in a series*, and to advance from there to
the concept of number. Then comes this unmistakeable echo of
Dedekind:

In order that, in doing this, nothing intuitive could intrude unnoticed, everything would turn on there being no gaps in the chain of inferences.

Damit sich hierbei nicht unbemerkt etwas Anschauliches eindrängen könnte, musste Alles auf die Lückenlosigkeit der Schlusskette ankommen.

Frege stressed that he was concerned to reveal how the analyticity
of arithmetical truths derived from their justifications. In §3
of Frege 1884 (reprinted 1961; *Grundlagen der Arithmetik*) he
wrote

… these distinctions between a priori and a posteriori, synthetic and analytic, concern … the justification for making the judgement. … When a proposition is called … analytic in my sense, … it is a judgement about the ultimate ground upon which rests the justification for holding it to be true.

… The problem becomes … that of finding the proof of the proposition, and of following it up right back to the primitive truths.

If, in carrying out this process, we come only on general logical laws and on definitions, then the truth is an analytic one, bearing in mind that we must take account also of all propositions upon which the admissibility of any of the definitions depends. [Emphasis added]

We see, then, that Frege's conception of the analytic was suitably
broader than Kant's. Kant required that conceptual containments be
evident within the sentence, rather than that the sentence be
displayed as a conclusion following logically from axioms whose own
logical or conceptual truth was self-evident, and which might contain
expressions not occurring in the sentence in question. As we saw from
the quote from B16, Kant did not regard ‘7 + 5
= 12’ as an analytic truth. The Fregean, by contrast, is
able to exploit the internal structure of the numerals, and to invoke
the recursion axioms for addition (which themselves would have to have
been derived in logicist
fashion).^{[9]} So, for the Fregean, even if not for
Kant, ‘7 + 5 = 12’ is an analytic
truth. Where *s* is the successor function, Kant's example takes
the more detailed form

sssssss0 +sssss0 =ssssssssssss0,

which is provable using the recursion axioms

∀

xx+ 0 =x;

∀x∀yx+sy=s(x+y).

The latter axiom justifies each of the transitions below:

sssssss0 +sssss0

=s(sssssss0 +ssss0)

=s(s(sssssss0 +sss0))

=s(s(s(sssssss0 +ss0)))

=s(s(s(s(sssssss0 +s0))))

=s(s(s(s(s(sssssss0 + 0)))))

At this point the former axiom secures

s(s(s(s(s(sssssss0 + 0))))) =s(s(s(s(s(sssssss0)))))

Hence (suppressing parentheses) we have

sssssss0 +sssss0 =ssssssssssss0,

as
foreshadowed.^{[10]}

Frege went on in this work to give his famous elucidation of
‘number of’ as a concept of concepts, along with
devastating critiques of rival accounts of number by contemporaries in
the grip of psychologism, empiricism, or formalism. He kept
technicalities to a minimum, in a *tour de force* of
philosophical elucidation.

#### 1.2.1 Numbers as higher-level concepts

Frege's key insight, which he never abandoned, was first expressed in §46: “… the content of a statement about number is an assertion about a concept”. By way of illustration: Suppose one states that

- ν
- The number of apples in the basket is (i.e.,
*is identical to*) the number 2.

(ν) is definitely a statement ‘about number’. Yet all one is saying, when asserting (ν), is that

- γ
- There are exactly two apples in the basket.

(γ), for Frege, is an assertion about the *concept*
“___is an apple in the basket”. It is not an assertion
about the number 2, since the *adjectival* occurrence of
‘two’ in (γ) can be avoided. One could re-phrase
(γ) as

- γ′
- There is an apple in the basket, and another apple in the basket, and they are the only apples in the basket.

We shall show how Frege's point here can be made watertight, and general, after providing a few words of explanation about notation for number-abstraction.

In the simple example above about line-directions, the abstraction
operator *d*( ) is a function sign, and does not bind any
variables. But with *numerical* abstractions, matters are
subtly different. Here, the abstraction operator #, meaning “the
number of …”, can be deployed in two different ways. On
the one hand, it can be a function symbol: if *F* is a predicate
(resp., a second-level variable), then #*F* is a singular term
denoting the number of things falling under *F* (resp., in the
extension assigned to the second-level
variable).^{[11]}
On the other hand, the operator #*x* can be applied to the open
sentence Φ(*x*) with *x* free, thereby binding the
variable *x*. The complex term thus formed is read as “the
number of
Φs”.^{[12]}

With that explanation of notation in place, suppose one makes a
statement about number of the following form, where #*xFx* is the
formal rendering of “the number of *F*s”:

#xFx= 2.

Then one is thereby (says Frege) making the assertion that

∃x∃y(x≠y∧Fx∧Fy∧∀z(Fz→ (z=x∨z=y))).

The concept *F* is the only one finding expression in this
last assertion, apart from standard logical operators. Therefore the
assertion is about the concept *F*. It is in the general form of
a *numerosity assertion*, which does not necessarily refer to,
or generalize about, numbers. For arbitrary *n*, the logical form
in question will be

∃x_{1}…∃x_{n}(∧_{1≤i<j≤n}x_{ i}≠x_{j}∧_{1≤i≤n}Fx_{i}∧ ∀z(Fz→ ∨_{1≤i≤n}z=x_{i})).

Of course (returning to our example
where *n* = 2), one can consider matters
in the converse logical direction. If one makes the numerosity
assertion first, then one can regard that as a justifying ground for
the subsequent statement that the number of *F*s is identical to
2.

If, with Frege, we countenance these two different ways of ‘carving’ one and the same propositional content, then we shall require, in whatever language is rich enough to provide the two forms of expression in question, the following logical equivalence, indicated by the two-way deducibility sign ⊣⊢:

#xFx= 2 ⊣⊢ ∃x∃y(x≠y∧Fx∧Fy∧∀z(Fz→ (z=x∨z=y))).

As Frege put it, the propositional content on the right-hand side has been ‘re-carved’ as the identity statement on the left-hand side. One and the same thought has been presented in two very different ways. They have the same truth conditions, but different logico-grammatical forms.

The form on the right, within a language devoid of the operator #, is completely innocent of any commitment to numbers as objects. If such a language is extended, however, by adding # to its stock of logical expressions, then one is thereby able to express the form on the left, which is number-committal.

By being aware that the concept-numerosity thought on the right can be rendered equivalently (in the extended language) as the number-committal thought on the left, one comes to recognize numbers as abstract, logical objects. In the extended language, their existence can be established on purely logical grounds.

#### 1.2.2 Hume's Principle and the Caesar Problem

In the *Grundlagen*, Frege considered the following
equivalence, known as *Hume's Principle*:

- HP
- #
*x**F**x*= #*x**G**x*↔ ∃*R*(*R*maps the*F*s 1–1 onto the*G*s).

There are two important features to note.

First, HP is explicitly *second order* on the right-hand
side, involving, as it does, a second-order quantification over
relations *R*; and HP is *purely logical* on the
right-hand side. Here, the notion to be defined
(the *definiendum*) is that of a relation *R* mapping
the *F*s 1–1 onto the *G*s. This can be spelled out in
purely logical terms: every *F* bears *R* to exactly
one *G*, and every *G* is borne *R* by exactly
one *F*. In symbols, this *definiens* reads as
follows:

∀x(Fx→ ∃y∀z(z=y↔ (Gz∧Rxz))) ∧ ∀x(Gx→ ∃y∀z(z=y↔ (Fz∧Rzx))),

which we shall abbreviate as

Rxy[Fx1–1

↦

ontoGy].^{[13]}

Secondly, HP involves two predicates, *F* and *G*. It
does so in order to state an important *criterion of identity*
for numbers denoted, respectively, as #*xFx* and as
#*xGx*. Note that both terms in the identity-statement on the
left-hand side are abstractive terms.

Let us call (neo-)Fregean abstraction principles (like HP) that
seek to specify the truth conditions of *identities*
involving *two* distinct abstractive terms (involving the same
abstraction operator @) *double-abstraction
principles*. (Contrasting single-abstraction principles for
identities will be discussed
shortly.)^{[14]} Double-abstraction identity principles
have the general form

@xFx= @xGx↔ Ψ(F,G),

where the right-hand side expresses a second-order equivalence
relation Ψ between *F* and *G*, and is stated without
use of @. But that does not preclude instances of such a principle
where either *F* or *G*, or both, contain occurrences of
@.

Typically these double-abstraction principles are laid down as postulates, or axioms (or axiom schemes). But that is not absolutely necessary. All that is important is whether the theory in question contains such a principle as a theorem (or theorem-scheme). Like the earlier abstraction principle for directions, HP is a double-abstraction principle. So too is Frege's ill-fated Basic Law V, which we shall discuss in due course.

HP tells us that the numbers #*xFx* and #*xGx* will be
identical *if and only if* the predicate-extensions that they
respectively number are in one-one correspondence (under some
two-place relation *R*). Another way of expressing this latter
condition is to say that *F* and *G*
are *equinumerous*.

The basic idea of this equivalence is owed to Hume (whence the
current name of the principle); and it had of course been exploited to
great effect by Cantor, well before Frege wrote
the
*Grundlagen*.^{[15]}
Without the use of one-one
correspondences in this way, Cantor would not have been able to
motivate his later groundbreaking idea that there are distinct
infinite numbers (see Cantor 1891).

Frege considered whether HP might be laid down as a constitutive
definition of numbers—a definition that would give a full and
exact characterization of their nature. But he concluded that HP could
not meet this more exigent, yet reasonable, demand. The reason is what
has now become known as the *Julius Caesar Problem*. Frege
insisted (*Grundlagen*, §56), that our definition of
number should enable us to decide that Julius Caesar is *not* a
number. His conclusion was that HP could not enable us to do
this.

For, suppose we say that if there are exactly two apples in the basket, then the number of apples in the basket is Julius Caesar. For the sake of consistency, it would be enough (in conformity with HP) simply to make sure that one assigns the same number (i.e., Julius Caesar) to any other concept that is in one-one correspondence with the concept “…is an apple in the basket”. Thus, for example, the number of prime numbers strictly between 4 and 8 is Julius Caesar. Indeed, the number of prime numbers strictly between 1 and 4 is Julius Caesar, one of those prime numbers being Julius Caesar himself!

On the one hand, HP is, to be sure, a necessary condition on
number. It must be satisfied by any licit interpretation of the
abstraction operator #. HP is not, however, *sufficient* to
ensure that the things denoted by terms of the form
#*xFx* *really are numbers!*

On the other hand—as revealed in Frege's painstaking deductive work—HP suffices for a logicist derivation of the Peano-Dedekind postulates for the arithmetic of natural numbers. This is what accounts for the vaunted status of HP in certain subsequent neo-logicist accounts (see §2).

But Frege wanted more than just a logically powerful enough source
for arithmetic; he wanted, in addition, a principle that would account
for the *metaphysical* nature of numbers. They must, surely, at
least be *abstract*? Numbers are also eternal and
necessary. They are not located in space, and they do not enter into
any causal interactions. Frege therefore sought a deeper logical
theory that might be able to vouchsafe for numbers these latter
characteristics, and thereby solve the Caesar Problem.

Unfortunately, in this regard he arguably failed (and did so quite
independently of Russell's Paradox, of which more in due
course). Frege thought (mistakenly, according to Dummett (1998)) that
he could avoid the Julius Caesar problem by identifying numbers as
special kinds of *classes*, or *extensions* (of
concepts). In the *Grundlagen*, at §68, he wrote

My definition [of Number] is … as follows:

the Number which belongs to the concept

Fis the extension [Umfang][fn.] of the concept “equal [gleichzahlig] to the conceptF”.

And the footnote to “*Umfang*” ends with the
sentence “I assume that it is known what the extension of a
concept is.” For those who nevertheless needed some instruction
in this regard, the *Grundgesetze* were intended to supply
it.

The Julius Caesar problem would, in principle, bedevil any
double-abstraction principle. (It is not a problem specifically
for *logicism*; it is a problem for abstraction principles of a
specific
form.)^{[16]} The problem can be avoided by using
single-abstraction identity principles.

The general form of a single-abstraction identity principle, when expressed by a sentence rather than by rules of inference, is

t= @xFx↔ …t…F…,

where *t* is a placeholder for *singular terms in
general* (including parameters), and not just for @-terms. The
right-hand side may contain occurrences of @; moreover, when taking
instances, expressions substituted for either *F* or *t* may
contain occurrences of @. And all that is important with a
single-abstraction identity principle is whether the theory in
question contains it as a theorem (or theorem-scheme).

Some examples of single-abstraction identity principles are the
following. Here, ∃!*t* is short for
∃*x* *x* = *t*. It may be read as “*t*
exists”.

For definite descriptions (on Smiley's treatment, Smiley 1970):

t= ιxFx↔ (∃!t∧ ∀x(x=t↔Fx)).For set abstracts:

t= {x|Fx} ↔ (∃!t∧ ∀x(x∈t↔Fx)).^{[17]}For number-abstracts (on Tennant's treatment—see §4):

t= #xFx↔ ∃R∃G(Rxy[Fx1–1Gy] ∧t= #xGx).For number-abstracts (on Zalta's treatment—see §5):

^{[18]}

t= #G↔t= ιx(Ax∧ ∀F(xF↔Fis equinumerous withG)).

The important feature of single-abstraction identity principles of
the kind on which we are focusing is that they are free of ontological
commitment. Theories that postulate or prove them need to be
supplemented with specific further ontologically committal postulates
before incurring commitment to the sort of entities whose broad
logical behavior is captured by a single-abstraction identity
principle. For example, the set-abstraction principle above merely
places constraints on how sets, membership (‘∈’) and
set-defining conditions *F* interrelate. It logically implies
both extensionality and the conversion schemata (“If *u* is
a member of the set of all and only *F*s, then *u* is
an *F*”, and “If *u* is an *F*, and the set
of all and only *F*s exists, then *u* is a member of
it”), but does not guarantee the existence of
any *sets*—not even that of the empty set.

#### 1.2.3 The *Grundgesetze*

The heart of Frege's logicist achievement was deferred to
the *Grundgesetze der Arithmetik,* the first volume of which
appeared in 1893. This almost decade-long delay after
the *Grundlagen* he explained in his foreword as being
occasioned by some re-thinking of his *Begriffsschrift* (Frege
1879)—the most important innovation being the introduction of
the notion of, and notation for, the *Werthverlauf*
(value-range, or extension) of a concept. Frege had also, by the time
of publication of the *Grundgesetze*, formulated his
distinction between sense and reference, and decided to treat
truth-values as objects, and indeed as referents of sentences.

He confessed that he expected his symbolism to be a *grosses
Hemmniss* (great obstacle) standing in the way of the spread and
impact of his ideas (Frege 1893 [reprinted 1962]: x). On the one hand,
the exacting notation and absolutely rigorous and logically watertight
proofs were essential to his logicist project. On the other hand, he
feared, mathematicians would think *metaphysica sunt, non
leguntur!* (it's metaphysics, and is not [to be] read!), and
philosophers would think *mathematica sunt, non leguntur!*
(it's mathematics, and is not [to be] read!); (Frege 1893: xii). Poor
Frege might have been right. But the reason why the beef of
his *Grundgesetze* was never properly digested can be read off
the sandwiching. His foreword to Volume I ends with the confident
words

The only refutation I would acknowledge would be if someone actually showed that a better and more sustainable edifice could be erected on other foundational convictions, or if someone were to show that my axioms led to obviously false consequences. But no one will succeed in doing that. (Frege 1893: xxvi; author's translation)

This confident statement belies somewhat his own prescient misgiving expressed a few pages earlier, over his Basic Law V:

As far as I can see, controversy could arise only over my Basic Law of Value-ranges (V), which perhaps has not been given special expression by logicians, even though one thinks of it, for example, when one talks of extensions of concepts. I hold it to be purely logical. Anyway, this marks the place where the decision must fall. (Frege 1893: vii; author's translation)

And fall it did. Frege, it turned out, had gone in for overkill
with the formal system that was to vindicate his logicism. He sought
to unify all of arithmetic and analysis within a general theory
of *classes*, or extensions (of concepts). Classes were
supposed to be logical objects *par excellence*. The strategy
was to define the natural numbers, say, as particular classes within a
much more capacious universe of abstract, logical objects. Using the
definitions, one would then derive the first principles of arithmetic
(the Peano–Dedekind axioms, say) as theorems within the theory
of classes. To that end one would exploit, ultimately, only the deeper
underlying axioms (or basic laws) governing classes themselves. For
more details on this strategy,
see §1.2.4.

Among these deeper axioms was Frege's ill-fated Basic Law V. This,
like HP, is a double-abstraction principle. Basic Law V, however,
allows for the abstraction of *classes*, and the equivalence
relation by which this is effected is the relation of coextensiveness
among defining predicates. Frege never raised the Julius Caesar
objection against his Basic Law V. Using modern notation, Basic Law V
can be stated as the following axiom schema, in which Φ and Ψ
are placeholders for formulas:

(Basic Law V) {x| Φx} = {x| Ψx} ↔ ∀x(Φx↔ Ψx).

Frege was assuming a ‘logically perfect’ language, in
which every well-formed term—including any class-abstractive
term of the form {*x* | Φ*x*}—denotes. If, by
contrast, one countenances the possibility that certain well-formed
singular terms in one's language might *not* denote objects,
then one has to employ a different kind of logic—a
so-called *free* logic. (It is ‘free’ of the
background assumption that all singular terms denote.) Such a logic
qualifies the quantifier rules with ‘existential
presuppositions’ concerning the terms involved. For example,
instead of being able to infer directly from “for
all *x*, *F*(*x*)” to
“*F*(*t*)”, as one may, when using
the *un*free logic of a logically perfect language:

∀xF(x)

F(t) ,

one needs, in the case of a free logic dealing with possibly
non-denoting terms, to ensure that the singular term *t*
denotes:

∀xF(x) ∃!t

F(t)

The reader is reminded that ∃!*t*, to be read
“*t* exists”, is short for ∃*x* *x*
= *t*. Similar modifications are required for the other
quantifier rules.

Even if Frege had *not* been assuming a logically perfect
language, and had instead been using a free logic, Basic Law V would
still have committed him to the existence of the class of all Φs,
whatever the defining formula Φ might be. The proof proceeds as
follows.

Proof.Note, first, that it is a logical truth that∀x(Φx↔ Φx).By Basic Law V in the right-to-left direction, taking Φ for Ψ, it follows that

{x| Φx} = {x| Φx}.But in free logic, an identity holds only if its terms denote. Hence

∃yy= {x| Φx}. □

This schema is known nowadays as ‘Naïve Comprehension’. (Comprehension is the abstraction of sets or classes.) Basic Law V committed Frege to claiming that, corresponding to any defining predicate Φ, there exists the class of all and only those things that satisfy Φ.

Note that *any* double-abstraction principle for an
abstraction operator @, whose right-hand side

- adverts to concepts or predicates Φ and Ψ and
- is logically true upon taking Φ for Ψ,

will generate existential commitment to a denotation for any
well-formed abstract term @*x*Φ*x*. This is because, in
light of (ii), the self-identity @*x*Φ*x* =
@*x*Φ*x* will also be logically true. And
@*x*Φ*x* = @*x*Φ*x* is true only if
∃!@*x*Φ*x*. This consideration holds for any
defining predicate Φ. This invites the objection, raised both by
Tennant (1987: 236) and by Boolos (1987: 184) that in certain
conspicuous cases there is no *a priori* justification for
commitment to the existence of denotations for these terms, in the
case of particularly problematic concepts Φ (such as
self-identity). This was the earliest form of the ‘Bad Company
objection’.^{[19]}

#### 1.2.4 Frege's treatment of the natural numbers

We shall not dwell on the peculiarities of Frege's class theory,
but shall try instead to set out the overall shape of the leading
ideas in Frege's account, as they were set forth informally in
the *Grundlagen* and executed formally in
the *Grundgesetze*.

First Frege had to identify 0, which he defined as the number of
any empty concept. A necessarily empty concept is that
of *non-self-identity*:

0 =_{df}#xx≠x.

Next Frege had to specify what it was for one natural number to be
the *successor* of another, or the *next largest*
natural number. How might one define what it is for *m*
to *immediately succeed* *n*? The answer is found by
appeal to concepts *F* and *G*, say, that respectively
enjoy *m* and *n* as their (finite) cardinals. There must be
exactly one more object falling under the concept *F* than there
are objects falling under the concept *G*. And *this* will
consist in there being a one-one correspondence (*R*, say)
between all the *G*s and all but one of
the *F*s. Formally:

mimmediately succeedsn

↔

∃G(n= #xGx∧ ∃F(m= #xFx∧∃R∃y(Fy∧Rzw[Gz1–1

↦

onto (Fw∧w≠y)]))).^{[20]}

It is easy to show that *n* has exactly one immediate
successor. That is, if *m* immediately succeeds *n*,
and *m*′ immediately succeeds *n*, then *m*
= *m*′.

What, now, can we say about the extension of the concept
‘natural number’? It must consist of 0 along with any
number than can be reached from 0 by *finitely many* steps of
immediate succession. This characterization, however, threatens to be
circular: for, how is one to understand the adverb
‘finitely’ here, if not by appeal to the notion of natural
number itself?

Frege's genius revealed itself in the solution he devised to this
circularity problem. He had already covered the necessary logical and
conceptual ground in his *Begriffsschrift* of 1879. For any
two-place relation *R*, Frege had defined what it was
for *x* to be *an R-ancestor of y*
(abbreviated here as

*R*

^{∗}

*xy*). For this definition, he had employed two ancillary notions. The first was that of a concept

*F*being

*:*

*R*-hereditary∀x∀y(Fx→ (Rxy→Fy)).

Let us abbreviate this as

Hxy(Fx,Rxy).

The second ancillary notion we shall express here as
“*x* is *R*-barred by *F*”, or
“*F* *R*-bars *x*”, and it is defined
thus:

∀z(Rxz→Fz).

Let us abbreviate this as

Bz(Rxz,Fz).

Now we are in a position to give Frege's definition of the
ancestral relation *R*^{∗}*xy* as
follows:

∀G(Hvw(Gv,Rvw) → (Bz(Rxz,Gz) →Gy)).

This tells us that *y* falls under any concept *G* that
is *R*-hereditary and *R*-bars *x*.

Still following Frege, one can then define *Nx*
(“*x* is a natural number”) as short for

0 =x∨ successor^{∗}0x.

The relation *Rxy* on which Frege focuses is that of *y*
(immediately) succeeding *x*. This has the further advantage of
being a *function*, i.e., a many-one relation. This enabled
Frege to prove that the ancestral of successor
is *linear*:

∀x∀y∀z((successor^{∗}xy∧ successor^{∗}xz) → (y=z∨ successor^{∗}yz∨ successor^{∗}zy)).

This definition of *Nx* secures the desired result: every
natural number is but finitely many steps of immediate succession away
from 0. Ancestralization captures the notion ‘finitely
many’ without invoking the notion of natural number, and indeed
serves as an independent logico-conceptual basis for the definition of
the notion of natural number itself. Note also that it is an
essentially second-order notion.

Given the functional character of the relation of immediate
succession, one can write *m* = *sn* when *m*
immediately succeeds *n*. One especially important consequence of
Frege's definition of *Nx* is that it enables one to prove, as
a *purely logical result*, the Principle of Mathematical
Induction:

∀F(F0 → (∀x((Nx∧Fx) →Fsx) →∀z(Nz→Fz))).

So too could Frege derive, logically, all the other
Dedekind–Peano postulates (involving the name 0 and the
successor function-sign *s*) for the natural numbers.

The most important of these remaining postulates is the one saying
that every natural number has a unique (immediate) successor. In order
to prove this in full generality, Frege had of course to take into
account the possibility that an arbitrarily given natural number might
far exceed the size of any collection of physical objects in the
universe. To what concept, then, could he turn (for a given natural
number *n*), whose cardinality would be the successor
of *n*?

His answer has earned the label ‘Frege's trick’. The
sought concept would be none other than
‘successor^{∗}*xn*’, i.e.,
“*x* is a natural number preceding or identical
to *n*”. The natural numbers relentlessly generate ever
more of their kind, as soon as we try to count them. *This* is
why there are infinitely many of them. The idea that each natural
number tallies its predecessors in the series of natural numbers was
fully formed in the *Grundlagen*, at §82, and rigorously
executed in Volume I of the *Grundgesetze*, at
§§114–119.

By the time of the *Grundgesetze*, Frege had settled on an
explication of cardinal numbers in class-theoretic terms, which would
preserve the structure of the foregoing considerations. The number
of *F*s (i.e., the cardinal number of the class of all *F*s)
was identified as the class of all classes that are equinumerous with
(i.e., in 1–1 correspondence with) the class of
all *F*s.^{[21]}
Thus the class of all *F*s is a
member of its own cardinal number. So too is any class that is
equinumerous with the class of all *F*s. Thus the cardinal number
of any one-membered class is the class of all one-membered classes;
the cardinal number of any two-membered class is the class of all
two-membered classes; … and so on. It is easy to see that, on
Frege's class-theoretic definition of cardinal number, any two
equinumerous classes have the same cardinal number. And numbers are
not *sui generis*, but are rather classes of a very special
kind. See also the Encyclopedia article on
Frege's Theorem and Foundations for Arithmetic.

#### 1.2.5 Russell's Paradox

In the language of modern logic, supplied with the binary predicate
∈ of membership, Frege's principle of naïve comprehension,
to which he was committed by Basic Law V in the *Grundgesetze*,
can also be rendered as the following schema:

∃x∀y(y∈x↔ Φy).

Russell's famous paradox ensues.

Proof.For Φy in the foregoing expression of naïve comprehension, takey∉y(non-self-membership). One thereby obtains∃x∀y(y∈x↔y∉y).Let

rbe such anx. So∀y(y∈r↔y∉y).But

ris an object within the scope of this generalization. Instantiating with respect tor, one obtainsr∈r↔r∉r.But one can show in short order, within a very weak propositional logic, that any statement of the form

A↔ ¬Ais inconsistent.

^{[22]}So Frege's Basic Law V is inconsistent. □

This simple formal discovery occasioned the ‘crisis in foundations’ early in the 20th century.

Frege's Afterword to Volume II of his *Grundgesetze*,
written in October 1902, begins with the heart-breaking words

Hardly anything more undesirable can befall a scientific writer than to have, at the completion of his work, one of the foundation-stones of his edifice shattered. (Frege [1903], p. 253; author's translation)

Russell's paradox consigned the details of
the *Grundgesetze* to relative obscurity. Even today there is
no complete English translation of the work. And this is unfortunate,
given its importance for the neo-Fregean revival currently under
way.^{[23]}

### 1.3 Logicism after Frege and up to Zermelo

#### 1.3.1 Russell's type theory

Russell offered his own solution to the problem of his paradox, in
the form of his *theory of types* (both simple and
ramified).^{[24]}
By stratifying the universe of objects into types, Russell sought to
avoid the vicious circularity that he had diagnosed as the underlying
problem with Fregean class abstraction.

Individuals would form the lowest type. Attributes or properties
of individuals (or what Russell called *propositional
functions* that could be true or false of individuals) would form
the next higher type … and so on. In Russell's type theory, the
relation of membership can hold only between objects of different
types: if α is a member of β, then α is of lower type
than β. In type theory, the variables are typed. That is, a given
variable is to be construed as ranging only over objects of a certain
type. Thus there will be ‘individual’ variables (of type
0, say) ranging over just the individuals. At the next type
up—type 1—there will be ‘property’ and
‘relation’ variables ranging over such properties and
relations as hold of, or among, individuals. (0 and 1 here are serving
as *indices* of types.) The idea iterates to cover all types of
finite index. Moreover, in Russell's theory, *only* the
finitely indexed types could be formed. These are the types that can
be indexed, from ‘outside’, so to speak, by natural
numbers *n*. There are no transfinite types, i.e., no types that
would be indexed by transfinite ordinals such as
ω.^{[25]}

A *predicative* propositional function is one that involves
no quantifications over types higher than those of its
arguments. Russell stratifies not only the universe of discourse (the
various types, and objects of those types); he also stratifies
the *language*. Suppose that a Russellian class (or predicative
propositional function) β is first formed at a higher rank than
is α. Then it is supposed to be *meaningless* (in the
language of type theory) to say that β is a member of α,
where this is construed in the official sense of supposedly
attributing the attribute corresponding to α to the object
β. (By contrast, *in the language of set theory*, it
is *meaningful*—even if false—to say
that β ∈ α.) Thus it is
impossible, within Russell's type theory, to deal with the would-be
predicate or property of non-self-membership. For that requires that
the predicate *x* ∈ *x* of
self-membership be meaningful (and well-formed); which it is not. So,
in his type theory, Russell blocked the kind of derivation of his own
paradox to which Frege's class theory fell victim.

Russell, however, sought to *preserve* Frege's approach to
defining cardinal numbers as classes of similar-sized classes:

The cardinal number of a class α is defined as the class of all classes similar to α, two classes being similar when there is a one-one relation between them. (Russell 1908: 256)

This definition, and the problems it engenders, survived
into *Principia Mathematica.*

Because of Russell's partitioning of the logical universe into
types, his ‘cardinal numbers’ became *typically
ambiguous*. (In the following quotation, the symbol Λ
stands for the null, or empty, class.) As Russell conceded (1908:
257),

… 0 and 1 and all the other cardinals, according to [our] definitions, are ambiguous symbols, like cls, and have as many meanings as there are types. To begin with 0: the meaning of 0 depends upon that of Λ, and the meaning of Λ is different according to the type of which it is the null-class. Thus there are as many 0's as there are types; and the same applies to all the other cardinals.

Russell does not, however, fully accept the strictures thus imposed. In more expansive mood he immediately adds

Nevertheless, if two classes α, β are of different types, we can speak of them as having the same cardinal … because a one-one relation may hold between the members of α and the members of β,

even when α and β are of different types. [Emphasis added]

By giving in to this structuralist impulse, Russell in effect puts
a second construal of cardinal numbers into contention with his
official type-theoretic one. The new construal is of a cardinal number
as something that results from *abstracting* from classes on
the basis of their similarity, rather than from forming classes of
similar classes. Such abstraction takes the Humean form (famously
exploited by Cantor)

Card(α) = Card(β) ⇔ ∃RR: α 1–1

↦

onto β.

For the reasons internal to type theory explained above, a Card
cannot be an object within any type within the official ontology of
type theory. For its would-be domain of definition would not only have
to straddle distinct types, but also include classes of all types. But
that is not possible for any type-theoretically admissible function or
operation. This fact also precludes Russell from using Frege's trick
to ensure an infinity of
numbers.^{[26]} For Frege had each natural
number *n* be the number of preceding natural numbers. For the
latter to be thus numbered, they have to be objects in the official
ontology—which, however, as just observed, Russell's Card(inal)s
are not.

Partitioning the universe into types accordingly exacted a high
price for the ‘logicism’ that might result. It is not
reassuring to learn that the logicist reconstruction on offer for
one's favorite mathematical structures is so generous as to be
uniquely re-presented within each type. One would wish to capture
their *commonalities* within *some one structure*. And
that, as we have just seen, is what Russell was trying to do, even
though it was doomed to failure from the start, on account of its
being committed to the existence of a different series of the
‘same’ numbers within each type.

The motivation for the typing that led to this *embarras de
richesses* was understandable at the time. Russell wished to avoid
any potentially vicious circularity that might result from
impredicative definitions. According to Russell, it should be illicit
to define a class *C* in a way that involves generalizing about
any range of individuals to which *C* itself would have to
belong. Thus, with partitioning into types, the notion of
self-membership, along with non-self-membership, could not even be
deployed.

This Russellian constraint on class abstraction, however, had the
consequence that with impredicative ‘class abstracts’ of
the form “the class of all *x* such that
Φ(*x*)”, the *existence* of such a class could
not be guaranteed *as a matter of logic*. So Russell had
to *postulate* that such classes existed. This came to be
regarded as detracting from their status as would-be logical objects,
and revealing them instead as no more than mathematical posits. Their
existence was once again (at best) a *synthetic a priori*
matter, rather than one of analytic necessity and certainty.

One might wonder why such classes would qualify as logical objects courtesy of a single immensely powerful postulate (had it been consistent), but would not so qualify if their existence has to be secured in a more piecemeal postulational fashion. But that was the Achilles heel of Russellian logicism. The existential postulation present in Russell's Multiplicative Axiom (nowadays known as the Axiom of Choice) and in his Axiom of Infinity were seen as marks of the merely mathematical, albeit against the background of a much more capacious universe of abstract objects than just the natural numbers or the real numbers themselves.

Russellian types are *ramified*: that is, propositional
functions of one and the same type belong to
different *orders*, depending on their internal logical
structures. The *type* of a propositional function, as we have
seen, is determined by the types of its free variables. But two
propositional functions φ and φ′ of the same type can
involve different kinds of quantifications. If φ involves
quantifications whose (bound) variables range over higher types than
do the bound variables within φ′, then φ is of
correspondingly higher order than φ′, even though φ and
φ′ are of the same *type*. Recall that an
impredicative propositional function φ is one that contains bound
variables ranging over types as high as or higher than the type of
φ itself. Assigning an impredicative propositional function to a
higher order is the ramifier's way of marking it as not kosher.

Russell ramified his theory of types in order to avoid explicitly
impredicative definitions (against which definitions Poincaré
influentially inveighed). Russell then found himself hamstrung, unable
to derive certain desired mathematical results. Among these results
were Cantor's Theorem, and the theorem of real analysis which states
that every set *X* of real numbers that is bounded above has a
least upper bound *of the same order as the real numbers
in X*. Ramified type theory appeared powerless to prove
these results. So Russell, in pragmatist spirit, introduced the Axiom
of Reducibility simply in order to get things done.

Russell's Axiom of Reducibility in type theory states that every
propositional function is coextensive with a predicative
one—that is, one whose quantifiers range only over types lower
than that of the propositional function itself. The non-trivial
content of this axiom is that every *impredicative*
propositional function is coextensive with a predicative one. A well
known example to illustrate this is the impredicative propositional
function ∀*F*(*Fx*
↔ *Fy*). The Axiom of Reducibility could be
vindicated on this example by adducing the predicative propositional
function *x* = *y*—provided
that one accepts Leibniz's controversial principle of the identity of
indiscernibles. If, *contra* Leibniz, one believes it is
possible for indiscernibles to be distinct, then, in order to
vindicate the Axiom of Reducibility, it would be necessary to adduce
some other predicative propositional
function, *x* ∼ *y* say, for
which it is true that

∀F(Fx↔Fy) ↔x∼y.

The Axiom of Reducibility, however, is tantamount to conceding the admissibility of impredicative definitions after all. For it collapses the orders for propositional functions of type 1. Critics pointed out that it would be better to eschew ramification and embrace the procedure of impredicative definition as licit after all.

One was then left with simple type theory (and no need for the
Axiom of Reducibility). But even the simple theory of types eventually
fell out of favor as a foundational theory for
mathematics—possibly because in the wake of the Byzantine
ramified theory, no version of type theory could find favor among
mathematicians themselves. Type theory was displaced by the newly
emerging *set theory* due to Zermelo and Fraenkel, which
mathematicians could recognize more easily as a formal codification of
Cantorian mathematical practice. A definitive and richly detailed
history of the reception and eventual demise of Russellian logicism
can be found in Grattan-Guinness (2000). (The terminology of
‘sets’ was adopted in order to contrast these
‘safer’, paradox-free objects with the
problematic *classes* of Frege's inconsistent theory.)

#### 1.3.2 Zermelo-Fraenkel set theory

With some justice ZFC (Zermelo-Fraenkel set theory with the Axiom of Choice) can be construed as an intellectual descendant of Russellian type theory, even though both theories date from the same year, 1908.

The displacement of type theory by set theory took place during
the 1920s. The aim was still to unify all of mathematics, and to
provide a capacious universe of abstract objects in order to do
so. All the different mathematical theories would be interpretable
within set theory, upon suitable identification of
‘set-theoretic surrogates’ for the objects studied by
those theories. So, for example, the finite von Neumann ordinals can
serve as set-theoretic surrogates for the natural
numbers.^{[27]} And
℘(ω), the power set of the set of natural numbers, is the
set-theoretic surrogate for the real
continuum.^{[28]}

ZFC set theory is an account of a cumulative hierarchy *V* of
pure sets, built up, ultimately, from the empty set ∅. Each set
within *V* is ‘formed’ by some ordinally indexed
rank. The ranks are cumulative, and are generated, at successor
ordinals, by application of the power-set operation. The erstwhile
types are born again as ranks, except that ranks
are *cumulative*—every rank contains all members of lower
ranks. Their members are put on all fours, so to speak, for they are
taken to occupy one single extensionalized, untyped universe *V*
of sets.

Quine (1969), chapters XI and XII, is a masterly tracing of a
route consisting of incremental theoretical adjustments that one could
in principle make, beginning with the type theory of *Principia
Mathematica*, and ending with Zermelo-Fraenkel set theory. The
purpose behind postulating the Axiom of Reducibility in type theory,
as already observed, was to ensure that every propositional function
is coextensive with a predicative one. As Quine points out, however
(and as Ramsey had pointed out before him), the Axiom of Reducibility
really defeats the purpose behind its own postulation, thereby
motivating the adoption of a simple type theory in place of PM's
ramified one. If one then reformulates simple type theory with
‘general’, or untyped, variables, and lets the types be
cumulative (rather than remain stratified one from another without
overlap), one effects the segue to Zermelo set theory. Fraenkel's
Axiom Scheme of Replacement finally allows one to “[pierce] all
type ceilings” (Quine 1969: 282), and reach Zermelo-Fraenkel set
theory. Replacement says that any function that is defined on a set as
its domain has a set as its range. This allows one to form, for
example, for any transfinite ordinal number κ, the set

{ℵ_{α}| α < κ}

of all infinite cardinals numbers ℵ_{α}, where
α = 0,1,2,… < κ. The ordinals α less than
κ form a set (indeed: κ
itself). ℵ_{α}, better thought of as
ℵ(α), is the α-th infinite cardinal number. So
ℵ is a function with domain κ, whose value on α is
the α-th infinite cardinal number. By Replacement, the
set {ℵ_{α} | α <
κ} exists. Such a set resides at a rank way above
κ.

Quine's account amplifies the slightly less detailed one that is
to be found in Gödel
(1993/1995).^{[29]}
As Gödel observed (pp. 45–6),
the ‘theory of aggregates’, or set theory,

… as presented by Zermelo, Fraenkel and von Neumann … is nothing else but a natural generalization of the theory of types, or rather, it is what becomes of the theory of types if certain superfluous restrictions are removed.

These removals are threefold: make the types cumulative; untype the variables; and allow type formation to extend into the transfinite.

ZFC avoids Russell's Paradox, even though all its member-sets are
on all fours, within an untyped universe. This is because its
universe *V* itself is *not* a set. By not espousing any
powerful enough set-abstraction principle, the set theorist avoids
Russell's paradox. Partitioning the universe of discourse into types
appears to have been a methodologically costly over-reaction to the
problem of Russell's Paradox. The latter would of course be
re-instated if one were ever to treat the universe *V* as a
set. Simply apply the Axiom Scheme of Separation

∀y∃zz= {x|x∈y∧ Φ(x)},

using for Φ(*x*) the Russellian
formula-instance *x* ∉ *x*,
and instantiating ∀*y* with respect to *V*.

Mathematicians have a well-established practice of treating
set-abstracts as well-formed terms. They are of the logico-grammatical
form {*x* |
Φ(*x*)}.^{[30]}
If one's formalizing logic is to
respect this practice, then it must provide the *variable-binding
term-forming operator* (*v.b.t.o.*) of
set-abstraction:

{x| …x…}.

Such an operator may be applied to any formula Φ to produce a
term. Among such formulae are the hazardous ones *x* = *x*
and *x* ∉ *x*. The formalizing foundationalist will
therefore be careful to adopt a *free logic* in which it
is *not* assumed, of every well-formed term, that it enjoys a
denotation. The proof of Russell's Paradox can then be deprived of its
sting: it simply becomes a proof of the negative
existential ¬∃*x* *x* = {*y*
| *y* ∉ *y*}.

Adopting a free logic, however, brings with it the following
obligation: if one wishes to recognize that certain sorts of objects
exist, or that a particular object exists, then one will have to
postulate their existence explicitly. No longer does such existence
derive from a kind of built-in, or tacit, default assumption of the
underlying logic. Rather, it demands explicit expression as
a *theoretical commitment*.

*You want an empty set?* the ZFC-theorist asks. *By all
means! Here it is:*

∃xx= {y|y≠y}.

*You want singletons? Sure thing!:*

∀x∃yy= {w|w=x}.

*… Or, if you prefer, get them from the axiom of
unordered pairs, by taking the same instance twice over:*

∀x_{1}∀x_{2}∃yy= {z|z=x_{1}∨z=x_{2}}.

*You want an infinite set? By all means! Here is a very useful
one:*

∃xx= {y|Ny},

*where Ny means that y is a finite von Neumann
ordinal (and this concept can be explicitly defined in set-theoretic
terms).*

ZFC theorists wear their ontological commitments, either outright
or conditional, very much on their postulational sleeve. They are out
to characterize a very rich mathematical universe, to be
sure—one in which there are so many things, and of such great
variety of structure(s), that one should be able to find, therein, a
set-theoretic ‘surrogate’ for virtually any kind of
mathematical object or structure about which one may wish to make
conjectures and prove theorems. With only this over-riding concern to
unify all of mathematics within one overarching
domain,^{[31]} the
ZFC theorist is not particularly committed to a *logicist* view
of the objects and structures involved. If anything, logicism has
acquired a new challenge: show how *set theory
itself*—like arithmetic and analysis, say—is simply a
body of logical truths in definitional disguise; and show how *sets
themselves* can be (re-)construed as some kind of definitional
concoction from *purely logical
objects*!^{[32]}

## 2. Neo-Fregeanism

The neo-Fregean revival had its origin in an insight of Charles
Parsons (see Parsons 1965: 183 and 194). He pointed out that what he
called principle (A) below suffices, given the structure of Frege's
argumentation in the *Grundlagen*, for the derivation of the
axioms of Peano arithmetic. Parsons uses the binary quantifier
‘*Glz*’ to abbreviate
“*gleichzahlig*” (equinumerous), and
uses *N*_{x} to abbreviate “the number
of”:

(A)

N_{x}Fx=N_{x}Gx≡Glz_{x}(Fx,Gx).

… we can put [Frege's procedure] in the form of defining Peano's three primitives ‘0’, ‘natural number’ and ‘successor’, and proving Peano's axioms. … it is not necessary to use any axioms of set existence except in introducing terms of the form ‘

N_{x}Fx’ and in proving (A), so that the argument could be carried out by taking (A) as an axiom.

This is nowadays called ‘Frege's
Theorem’.^{[33]}
Frege's Theorem has Principle (A) as its
hypothesis. Curiously, the stress Frege places, in
the *Grundlagen*, on the importance of this principle (that two
concepts have the same number just in case they
are *gleichzahlig*) is dissipated in the *Grundgesetze*,
where the two halves of the biconditional appear widely separated: in
§53 Frege proves that if two concepts correspond 1–1, then
their numbers are identical, and in §69 he proves the
converse. But nowhere in the *Grundgesetze* does he re-assemble
the biconditional and accord it prime philosophical importance. Had he
done so, he *might* well have become the first neo-Fregean in
response to Russell's Paradox. In order to do so, however, he would
have had to overcome his reluctance to view (A) as a logical
axiom.^{[34]}

The neo-Fregean movement seeks to reveal that a significant amount
of mathematics is analytic. This is a stronger claim than that it
is *a priori* and derives no part of its justification from
empirical science, or even from successful applications within the
empirical sciences. For that would hold of mathematics (or indeed any
other branch of knowledge) conceived of as synthetic *a
priori*. The neo-Fregean maintains in addition that significant
parts of mathematics flow logically from principles that are analytic
of (or definitional of) their central concepts or predicates, such as
‘natural number’ or ‘real number’. That is,
they flow from the very meanings of those central predicates. (We opt
here for the linguistic version of the analyticity claim). Note the
stress here on ‘significant
parts’.^{[35]}
We know from Gödel's second
incompleteness theorem that any consistent and sufficiently strong
theory of arithmetic is unable to prove or refute (the formalized
statement of) its own consistency. The latter statement is true, but
unprovable. In light of the incompleteness phenomena, one would be
hard pressed to make good on the claim that *all* mathematical
truths are true by virtue only of such *logical* considerations
as can be captured in systems of formal
proof.^{[36]} When
the first principles of a mathematical theory, such as arithmetic,
form an essentially incomplete axiomatization, the logicist will have
to maintain that the justification of any *new* first principle
can be furnished in some strictly logical sense.

Note that the foregoing remarks describe the general context for a neo-Fregean revival of logicism of any kind. They do not dictate the exact form of any such revival. In §3 we discuss the particular form of the revival that involves extending second-order logic with Hume's Principle; and in §4, we discuss constructive logicism.

These two forms of neo-Fregean revival of logicism share the following three important features with Frege's own treatment.

First, the number 0 (zero) is still defined as the number of any
empty concept: in particular, as *the number of non-self-identical
things* (formally: #*x* ¬*x*
= *x*).

Secondly, once the existence of any natural number *n* is
secured, that of its successor, *s*(*n*), is secured by
taking *s*(*n*) to be the number of *all natural numbers
from* 0 *to n, inclusive* (Frege's trick).

Thirdly, the definition of the concept of natural number exploits
the notion of the *ancestral* of the relation of
succession: *x* bears the succession-ancestral relation
to *y* just in case *y* is at most finitely many steps of
succession away from *x*. (As already made clear, any apparent
circularity in this definition, deriving from the adverbial gloss
‘finitely’, turns out, upon closer inspection of the
definitions used, to be just that: merely apparent.) The concept
“*z* is a natural number” is then defined as
“either 0 is *z*, or 0 bears the succession-ancestral
relation to *z*”. And this is what allows the neo-Fregean
logicist to derive the principle of mathematical induction for the
natural numbers. The reader of this survey article will be spared the
formal details.

## 3. Second-order logic with Hume's Principle

The neo-Fregean revival began in earnest with
Wright.^{[37]}
Wright (1983) sought to derive the Peano–Dedekind axioms for
successor arithmetic from what was called N^{=} and has since
come to be known as Hume's Principle (that is, Parsons's principle (A)
above):

#xFx= #xGx↔ ∃R(Rmaps theFs 1–1 onto theGs).

Wright sketched a derivation of the Peano–Dedekind axioms
from Hume's Principle. The deductions sketched would be carried out in
standard second-order logic—‘standard’ in the sense
that, in the presence of HP, all number-abstractive terms of the form
#*x*Φ(*x*) can be proved to denote. Such a system
is *unfree with respect to its number-abstractive terms.* This
point holds *even if* the second-order logic in question is a
free logic in the official sense of not being committed to the
theorem-scheme ∃!*t*
(i.e., ∃*x* *x* = *t*)
for any well-formed singular term *t*. The proof of this point is
short and easy, and is like the one given in
§1.2.3. We shall given an informal version as follows.

Clearly, the identity relation is a one-one correspondence of the Φs onto the Φs. Therefore it is a theorem of second-order logic that

∃

R(Rmaps the Φs 1–1 onto the Φs).This is the right-hand side of that instance of HP whose left-hand side is

#

xΦ(x) = #xΦ(x).The latter has now been established as a theorem-scheme of second-order logic with HP. Hence in this system we have the theorem-scheme

∃!#

xΦ(x).

The over-arching theme is that we can redeem Frege's key
philosophical insights concerning (natural and real) numbers and our
knowledge of them, despite Russell's discovery of paradox in Frege's
own theory of classes. That paradox notwithstanding, numbers are still
logical objects, characterized by methods or principles of
abstraction—which of course cannot be as ambitious as Frege's
Basic Law V. These principles afford a distinctive form of epistemic
access to numbers. The usual mathematical axioms governing the two
kinds of numbers are to be derived as results in (higher-order)
logic—essentially following Frege's deductive plan. These
derivations will exploit appropriate definitions of the primitive
constants, functions, and predicates of the brand of number theory
concerned. (For example: 0, 1; *s*, +, ×;
<; *N*(*x*); ℝ(*x*).)

The main difference is this: the neo-Fregean no longer accepts
Frege's definition of numbers as classes of equinumerous
classes. Instead, the numbers are vouchsafed as *sui generis*,
courtesy of newly chosen abstraction principles. The Wrightian
neo-logicist (henceforth: the HP-er) opts for HP; the constructive
logicist opts, much more modestly, for rules permitting the
introduction of zero and of successors. Apart from this key
difference, however, the neo-Fregeans hew in other places quite
closely to Frege's overall deductive strategy when deriving the
Dedekind–Peano postulates.

No supplementation by intuition or sensory experience will be
needed in the derivations of these postulates. The trains of reasoning
involved will depend only on our grasp of logical validities,
supplemented by appropriate definitions. Purported result (for the
HP-er): *because HP is analytic*, logicism is vindicated; and
the mathematical knowledge derived in this way is revealed to be
analytic, not synthetic.

For reservations about this claimed result, however, see Boolos
(1997). The main objection with which the HP-er needs to contend is
that Hume's Principle is neither a logical nor an analytic truth. It
cannot be logical, so the objection would go, because it has such a
huge ledger of ontological commitments: for *every* concept,
its alleged number. And it cannot be analytic, because the two sides
of the biconditional have *different* ontological commitments:
the right-hand side has *no* commitments to numbers, while the
left-hand side is brimming with such commitments. In order to defend
against these objections, the HP-er needs to do two
things. First—as any logicist needs to do—he needs to
challenge the dogma that no logical principle can carry any
ontological commitments. Secondly, he needs to provide an account of
analyticity according to which a biconditional can be analytic even
when the explicit ontological commitments of each side of the
biconditional differ. (These commitments are to be judged by
considering each side as a sentence in the restricted language whose
vocabulary is just sufficient to allow the sentence in question to be
formed.)

The HP-er advocates Hume's Principle in its unrestricted form, and
is thereby committed, as we have seen, to the existence of a
denotation for every term of the form {*x* |
Φ(*x*)}. The HP-er is committed, not only to the
number of all natural numbers, but also to the number of all
self-identical things—or, at least, so Wright was in Wright
(1983). This ‘universal
number’ #*x*(*x* = *x*)
is sometimes called ‘anti-zero’. In n. 5 on p. 187 one
reads

It is worth stressing that it is, of course, absolutely essential that there be such a number as

Nx:x=x; for it is impossible to imagine what sort of ground there could be for admittingNx:x≠xif that were in doubt.

Boolos (1987), after raising qualms about the universal number,
provided an ingenious model (which had been anticipated informally by
Geach (1975: 446–7)) to allay the misgiving about the
consistency of full second-order logic with HP (the system now known
as FA, for ‘Frege Arithmetic’). Simply take the natural
numbers along with the distinct object ω as the elements of the
domain. The element ω serves as the denotation of any term of
the form #*x*Φ(*x*) where Φ is satisfied by
infinitely many elements. Note, however, that this consistency proof
works only when FA is taken on its
own.^{[38]} The Geach–Boolos model cannot be
relied upon to secure the consistency of FA *in conjunction
with* other theories, such as set theory, that one might wish to
extend with FA. Since, however, counting finite extensions ought to be
a universally applicable intellectual operation, regardless of subject
matter, it will be the exception rather than the rule that FA is to be
applied *only to the natural numbers* (plus, perhaps, the
unnatural factotum ω). Rather, FA should be applicable not only
to concrete objects, but also to abstract mathematical entities such
as real numbers and sets. Provided only that one has a criterion of
identity for the objects in question, one should be in a position to
count any finite collection of them.

Subsequently, in Hale and Wright 2001 (p. 315), Wright expressed
reservations over whether “*x*
= *x*” counts as a sortal predicate eligible to be
prefixed by “the number of *x* such that”. Now Wright
was inquiring after what “is wanted for the *exorcism* of
anti-zero” (p. 314, emphasis added). His considered answer is
that a term of the form #*xFx* will denote a number only if the
concept *F* is both sortal and not indefinitely
extensible.^{[39]}
So Wright subsequently hoped to make actual what he had previously
alleged to be impossible to imagine. The technical proposal must
therefore be that Hume's Principle is to be restricted to predicates
that (express concepts that) are both sortal and not indefinitely
extensible. But this, of course, raises the question whether there is
an effective method for determining, of any given predicate *F*,
whether *F* (expresses a concept that) is both sortal and not
indefinitely extensible. In the absence of any such effective method,
the theory will not have been axiomatized.

This survey perforce confines itself, in the main, to
(neo-)logicist accounts of the *natural* numbers. But it is
worth raising one more question about the extension of a neo-Fregean
account in an attempt to cope with the *real* numbers. We shall
call it the *inclusion question*. How is one to appreciate that
the natural numbers *qua* reals *are* (in the
non-punning sense of numerical identity) the natural numbers
vouchsafed by logicism about the
naturals?^{[40]}
This question is not answered by the neo-Fregean abstractionist
account of the reals in Shapiro (2000). In that account, the various
new abstracta are abstracted from quite varying equivalence relations,
and no attempt is made to leave it open as a possibility that the
natural number *n* *is* the integer *n*, *is*
the rational number *n*, and *is* the real
number *n*. (Although on p. 339 Shapiro writes that he proposes
“to avoid the issue [of *identity* under inclusion]
here”, his proposed treatment nevertheless answers the inclusion
question negatively.)

One issue that is not satisfactorily disposed of, is this: in what
sense can Wright's neo-Fregean logicist claim to be furnishing
an *epistemic foundation* for, let us say, first-order Peano
arithmetic, if their axiomatic principle HP, along with the
second-order logic employed (=FA), puts the supposed
‘foundation’ much higher in the hierarchy of
consistency-strengths than the weaker theory being
‘founded’? (This is to raise once again the worry
expressed by Boolos (1997:
248–9).)^{[41]}

It is an age-old tradition in foundational investigations to provide a foundation that is not only obviously consistent, but obviously true, and from which all the results in the branch(es) of mathematics being founded will follow logically. Moreover, this following logically is itself something that must be epistemically accessible—hence the importance of checkable proof. A foundational effort can be directed at many different branches of mathematics simultaneously, or just at some particular branch, such as arithmetic. In the former case, it is understandable if the foundational theory chosen (such as ZFC) has a higher consistency strength in relation to any one branch of mathematics being founded. But if the effort is directed at just that one branch (say, arithmetic), then the foundation provided should be of a consistency-strength that is as low as possible, in relation to that branch.

The consistency-strength of FA is that of second-order
arithmetic *Z*_{2} (i.e., real analysis), which is equal
to that of Zermelo–Fraenkel set theory without the Axiom of
Power Sets. The consistency-strength of first-order Peano arithmetic
is much weaker, namely that of Zermelo–Fraenkel set theory
without the Axiom of Power Sets *and* without the Axiom of
Infinity.

By adopting second-order logic along with Hume's Principle in an
unrestricted form, Wright incurred commitment (as a matter of
analyticity) not only to each natural number, *seriatim*, but
also to the cardinal number of *any* concept whatsoever. We
know now, however, that Gödel's prescient
‘completionary’ insight has long since been fully borne
out. The insight in question was that the set-theorist's key to
proving stronger and stronger results in mathematics—and in
particular the consistency of each newly attained system—is to
postulate the existence of ever-larger cardinal numbers. If all these
cardinals were available across the board courtesy of Hume's Principle
applied to appropriately expressed concepts, then Wright would be
proposing a foundational theory of enormous strength. The only reason
why FA is not even more powerful than *Z*_{2} is that the
former system's ontology is being generated solely by the
abstractions. There is no other source of existential postulation, as
there would be if one were to add, say, set theory to the theoretical
mix.

Upon such addition further care would be needed when considering
the nature of Wright's transfinite cardinals begotten by Hume's
Principle. As the investigations of Kit Fine (1998: 515; 2002) have
revealed, any attempt to combine such an abstractive account of
transfinite cardinals with set theory must resort to treating the
abstracted cardinals as *Urelemente* rather than as sets. Set
theory cannot, by itself, provide a set-surrogate for every
transfinite cardinal that would be generated by Hume's Principle.

## 4. Constructive Logicism

### 4.1 Motivation for a different kind of neo-logicism

We begin this section with some remarks about Gentzenian proof theory. This is not because it played any direct role in the development of logicism—far from it—but because we seek in this section to describe in broad terms a different kind of neo-logicism that draws more heavily on proof-theoretic resources.

It was only with the work of Gerhard Gentzen in the early 1930s
(see Gentzen 1934, 1935) that researchers in foundations were equipped
with formal calculi of deduction that could do real justice to the
actual structure of inferential dependencies within mathematical
proofs. What we have in mind here are the dependencies of conclusions
upon both premises and assumptions that may have been made only
“for the sake of argument”. A good example of assumptions
of the latter kind are *reductio* assumptions (assume φ;
derive absurdity; conclude ¬φ, now independently of
φ).

It is extraordinary that the community of mathematical logicians
took so long to discover the calculi of natural deduction (and
the *sequent calculi*), once Frege, in 1879, had cracked the
previously hidden grammatical code of multiply quantified
sentences. It is remarkable that Gödel, in 1929, could have
demonstrated the completeness of first-order logic *before*
Gentzen's natural formulation of it, when that logic was available
only in the forms of the highly unnatural deductive calculi devised by
Frege, by Hilbert, and by Russell and Whitehead.

The essential breakthrough of Gentzen's treatment was to
characterize each logical operator in isolation, with rules of its
own, rules in which *only* that operator would explicitly
feature. Moreover, the rules in question would deal only with
a *single occurrence* (in dominant position) of the operator in
question. The rule for reasoning to a conclusion with the operator
dominant was called the operator's *introduction* rule; while
the rule for reasoning *from* a premise with the operator
dominant was called its *elimination* rule.

The introduction and elimination rules for any logical operator
have to be in a certain kind of *equilibrium*, an equilibrium
that lends itself to an interpretation of the rules as matching the
inferential obligations of any responsible, rational and sincere
speaker to the inferential entitlements of any responsible, rational
and trusting
listener.^{[42]}

The equilibrium in question is explicated by the
so-called *reduction procedures* for the logical
operators. These procedures enable one to remove from a proof any
sentence occurrence that stands both as the conclusion of an
application of an introduction rule and as the major premise of an
application of the corresponding elimination rule. Repeated
application of the procedures will eventually turn the proof into one
that is in *normal form*—essentially, one that is not
eligible for any further application of the
procedures.^{[43]}
The significance of proofs in normal form is that they
represent *direct* deductive routes from their premises to
their conclusions.

Powerful, incisive and revolutionary though Gentzen's approach has
since proved to be, it was, in its turn, curiously limited. It was
restricted to just the universally acknowledged *logical*
operators of first-order logic: ¬, ∧, ∨, →, ∃
and ∀.

At exactly the same time there appeared Carnap
(1934), *Logische Syntax der Sprache*, which offered an account
of analyticity for languages in which all logico-*mathematical*
operators could make similar contributions to the status of a sentence
as analytically true (or analytically false). Carnap, however, did
this by employing axiomatizations involving all the various
logico-mathematical operators, co-functioning in grammatically complex
axioms. His approach was therefore quite unlike the more
‘natural’ one of Gentzen, which was *single-operator
focused*. Moreover, the unnatural approach was still Carnap's
preferred choice in work as late as his *Foundations of Logic and
Mathematics* (Carnap
1939).^{[44]} We mention Carnap in contrast with
Gentzen here because of Gentzen's tragic early death at the end of the
Second World War. Who knows how Gentzen might have extended his
exquisitely conceived inferentialist techniques to items on the broad
logicist agenda? His writings appeared in English translation only in
1969 (see Gentzen 1934/1935 [1969]). Carnap, however, did survive to
exert considerable influence on the thinking of a new generation of
philosophers of mathematics on the problems and prospects for
logicism; and he was able to do so from the mid-1930s, in the USA,
writing in English.

After the early 1940s, proof theory did not broaden and diversify
so as to address a potentially fertile agenda: an investigation of the
various forms that introduction and elimination rules might take, as
it examines rule-governed expressions whose rules are not quite so
neatly classifiable as introduction and elimination rules. This is the
case, for example, with families of ‘coeval’ and
interdependent concepts of a nevertheless logico-mathematical kind. An
example of such a family is that of the *ordered pair* of any
two things; the *first member* of any ordered pair; and
the *second member* of the same. An important feature of this
example, and of other examples that could be given, is that the
operators in question are *term-forming operators*. Gentzen had
confined his study to sentence-forming operators. Perhaps it was
Tarski's theory of truth for formalized languages (see Tarski 1956
[1933]) that deflected interest away from further development of this
essentially *inferentialist* approach to the meanings of
logical and mathematical operators.

### 4.2 Anti-realism and an inferentialist approach to logicism

An inferentialist approach holds special appeal for the semantic
anti-realist. According to Michael Dummett's influential
characterization of semantic realism, the realist is one who believes
that every declarative sentence of one's language is determinately
true or false, independently of our means of coming to know
which. This is what is supposed to justify the realist's use of
strictly classical logical principles such as the Law of Excluded
Middle. The anti-realist, by contrast, insists that all truths
are *knowable*; and is quick to point out that we do not have
any effective method for deciding the truth or falsity of statements
in mathematics. Anti-realists, accordingly, reject the Law of Excluded
Middle (and all other strictly classical rules that are
intuitionistically equivalent to it), and advocate the use of
intuitionistic or constructive logic, rather than classical
logic.

An anti-realist concerned to demonstrate the analyticity of the basic laws of arithmetic would inquire whether one can eschew strictly classical passages of inference when deriving the Peano postulates. For, if those postulates are analytically true, then the anti-realist would expect to attain them by means of rules justifiable by appeal only to the constructive contents involved (see Rumfitt 1999). And indeed the anti-realist can. She can avoid recourse to the full power of Hume's Principle. The innocuous ingredients of the conceptual content of Hume's Principle, insofar as finite numbers are concerned, will find expression in the inferential rules that the anti-realist lays down for zero, #, and successor. Heyting arithmetic, after all, has exactly the same axioms as Peano arithmetic, and is the logical closure of those axioms under intuitionistic, rather than classical, logic. The two systems PA and HA differ only in respect of the logic used for closure. It would be rather odd if the intuitionist were debarred from being a logicist in the sense at issue here.

The pursuit of analyticity in the foundations of arithmetic is one that could be very well served by the proof-theoretic methods favored by the Dummettian anti-realist's theory of meaning. Central to such a proof-theoretic approach is the formulation of inferential rules governing all the expression-forming operators in question—rules that come, preferably, in introduction-elimination pairs. The rules are constitutive of the respective operators' meanings; whence results proved solely by means of those rules qualify as analytic. A question that will be raised by any alert meaning-theorist, therefore, is the following: Might there not be some anti-realist (constructive, or intuitionistic) derivation, in Fregean spirit, of the basic laws of arithmetic by appeal to suitable meaning-constituting rules of inference that conform to the general requirements of an anti-realist theory of meaning? Anti-realist doctrine invites such extension to the mathematical expressions in fundamental theories such as arithmetic. It could give Fregean logicists what they are seeking: fundamental derivations of the Dedekind–Peano postulates from more basic logical principles, logical principles that are at least as secure, epistemically, as the mathematical postulates they are seeking to derive.

### 4.3 Execution

A theory of this kind, called *constructive logicism*, was
presented in Tennant (1987). Its distinguishing features may be
summarized as follows.

**Finitude:**It proves the existence of numbers of concepts with at most*finite*extensions;**Logical weakness:**it uses only*free intuitionistic relevant*logic;**Conceptual Adequacy:**It proves all instances of Schema N (for which, see below);**Rigor:**It provides a ‘fully rigorous deduction of the Peano postulates’ (Burgess 2005: 147).^{[45]}

Constructive logicism is based on rules of natural deduction that
are arguably analytic of the central notions zero, successor, and
number. There are also rules that pin down the meaning of the
number-term-forming operator #*x*Φ(*x*) (the number of
Φs). In the terminology introduced above, the rules for #*x*
amount to a *single-abstraction* identity principle. The
remaining rules are allowed to carry only very local and modest
ontological commitment, on the grounds that it is part of the very
meaning of a term such as ‘0’ that its use in the language
commits one to the existence of the number 0. Here, for example, are
the natural-deduction rules governing zero. ‘⊥’ is
the symbol for absurdity.

^{(i)}

*F*(

*a*), ∃!

*a*

^{(i)}

⋮

⊥

0 = #

*x*

*F*(

*x*)

^{(i)}

(where the parameter

*a*may occur only where indicated) 0-Elimination 0 = #

*x*

*F*(

*x*) ∃!

*t*

*F*(

*t*)

⊥

In order to temper the modest commitment just mentioned, all
derivations are constructed within a *free* logic, so that all
existential commitments other than those incurred by the rules
themselves would have to be made
explicit.^{[46]}
All of the existential commitments that the constructive logicist
incurs in this way will be incurred, anyway, by the HP-er who
advocates Hume's Principle in its unrestricted form. Recall that the
HP-er is committed, not only to the number of all natural numbers, but
also to the number of all self-identical things.

The ontological bill for the constructive logicist is much more
modest, compared to that of the HP-er. The constructive logicist is
not even committed (by the rules he lays down) to the existence of the
number of all natural numbers. Commitment is incurred (by employing
Frege's trick) to the natural numbers *seriatim*, as necessary
existents. No commitment is incurred, however, to any other cardinal
numbers.

Chapter 25 of Tennant (1987), titled “On deriving the basic laws of arithmetic: Or, how to Frege–Wright a Dedekind–Peano”, provides detailed formal derivations of the Peano–Dedekind axioms, within a free, intuitionistic relevant logic. All the derivations given are intuitionistic, in conformity with the anti-realist aspirations explained above, and in order to warrant the adjective ‘constructive’ in the phrase ‘constructive logicism’.

Heck (1997b) dealt with so-called ‘finite Frege
arithmetic’. His treatment was classical. But Heck was
concerned, as constructive logicism had been, to derive the basic laws
of arithmetic while incurring ontological commitment only to the
natural numbers. To this end Heck restricted Hume's Principle to
predicates with finite extensions. It is therefore natural to
conjecture that constructive logicism is the *intuitionistic
(relevant) fragment* of Heck's finite Frege arithmetic.

Tennant (1987) argues that a condition of adequacy for any
logicist theory is to explain the applicability of the finite
cardinals (see p. 234). Let ∃_{n}*xFx* be
the formula of first-order logic with identity, defined inductively in
the usual way, that says that there are
exactly *n* *F*s. Let * n* be the numeral
denoting the natural number

*n*, that is, “

*s*…

*s*0”, with

*n*occurrences of the successor symbol

*s*. Schema N is the following biconditional, an instance of which is obtained by fixing on a particular natural number

*n*and open formula Φ.

Schema N: #

xΦx=↔ ∃n_{n}xΦx.

An adequate theory of number would allow one to derive every
instance of Schema
N;^{[47]} and the theory of constructive logicism
does that. Tennant suggests that this constitutes a solution to the
problem of the applicability of natural numbers in counting finite
collections.

All the logicist accounts discussed so far dealt only with zero, successor, and “…is a natural number”. But there are important differences among them. It is not at all clear that constructive logicism has the same high consistency-strength of Frege Arithmetic. There appears to be no way to derive, within the constructive logicist system, an existence claim of the form

∃yy= #xF(x),

where the extension of *F* is an infinite set (such as the set
of all natural numbers). Contrast this with the fact that FA
proves

∃yy= #x(xis a natural number).

The present author therefore conjectures that the consistency-strength of this system is lower than that of FA.

In Tennant (2009), the constructive logicist treatment is extended
to deal with both addition and multiplication. The key innovation is a
‘logic of orderly pairing’: a system of natural-deduction
rules of inference governing the formation of the ordered pair
π(*t*,*u*) from existing objects *t* and *u*,
and the projections λ(*u*) of the left, and
ρ(*u*) of the right, member of any ordered
pair *u*.

## 5. Modal Neo-Logicism

Zalta (1999) proposes an interestingly different,
because *modal-logical*, route to the natural numbers. Although
Zalta does not himself classify it as such, his approach would appear
to warrant the adjective ‘neo-logicist’. (We prescind from
questions about the logical status of modal logic.)

Zalta employs a classical second-order modal logic (S5) with identity, and with both the first-order Barcan ‘formula’, or axiom-scheme

◊∃xψ(x) → ∃x◊ψ(x).

and its second-order correlate

◊∃Fψ(F) →∃F◊ψ(F).

The first-order Barcan formula forces one to interpret quantifiers as ranging over all possible individuals, whatever world one is ‘in’—no ‘expansion’ or ‘contraction’ of the domain can be involved as one traverses the accessibility relation from possible world to possible world.

The logic is free, and descriptive terms (the description operator ι is primitive) are interpreted rigidly—that is, the denotation of a descriptive term in the actual world, if it has one there, is its denotation in any other possible world.

There are the usual alethic modalities □ and ◊ of
necessity and possibility (as interpreted by S5, of course), and the
actuality operator A. The
relation *xF* of *encoding* can hold between
an *abstract* object *x* and a property *F*.

Axwill mean thatxis an abstract object. The properties that an abstract object encodes are constitutive of its nature, and as such, are essential to its identity as an object. (Zalta 1993: 396)

For example, Plato's Form of a Triangle encodes the property of being a triangle, but does not exemplify it.

Among Zalta's fundamental principles are the following.

- Ordinary objects cannot encode any properties.
- Given any condition on properties, some abstract object encodes just those properties meeting that condition.
- Identical individuals are intersubstitutable
*salva veritate*. - Identical properties are intersubstitutable
*salva veritate*. - Particular encodings are necessary if possible.

Zalta defines an equinumerosity relation ≈ among properties
with respect to *ordinary* objects—that is,
the *possibly concrete* ones. With ≈ in hand, Zalta
offers the notion of a (cardinal) number (Zalta 1993: 630):

Numbers(x,G) ≡_{df}Ax∧ ∀F(xF↔F≈G).

It follows that *x* numbers *G* just in case *x* is
an abstract object that encodes exactly the properties equinumerous
to *G* (where, *nota bene*, equinumerosity is judged only
with respect to the *ordinary* objects). And it follows easily
from Zalta's first principles that “for every property *G*,
there is a unique object which numbers *G*”.

Zalta's system delivers Hume's Principle:

#

F= #G↔F≈G,

and the following obvious corollary:

∀

G∃y(y= #G).

In this regard Zalta's system is as powerful as Wright's: they both guarantee for every property its number. Wright, however, begins with Hume's Principle as a first principle, whereas Zalta derives Hume's Principle (as Frege originally did) from his own ‘more basic’ (and possibly more powerful) principles.

We note the following three points, in concluding our exposition of Zalta's system. In his sense of ‘concrete’ and ‘abstract’,

- Properties holding of
*ordinary*objects can be assigned numbers. - Properties holding of
*abstract*objects (including numbers themselves), cannot be assigned numbers. - The existence of all infinitely many natural numbers depends on the possible existence of unboundedly (but finitely) many concrete objects.

In points (2) and (3), Zalta departs explicitly from Frege and all other (neo-)logicists discussed above.

## 6. Summary of Problems for Logicism

We see from the foregoing discussion that there are various problems to be faced by extant versions of logicism or neo-logicism in the literature. The reader who remains mindful of them will be in a position to examine the details of any proposed new neo-logicist account with a more critically focused eye.

Some of these problems confront any version of logicism, and their solutions might be required as ‘conditions of adequacy’ on the latter. Others among these problems arise only in response to the particular methods or posits employed by the version of logicism under consideration. The following problems appear to have loomed large in the foregoing discussion.

**Frege's ‘conceptualization problem’**

How do we apprehend numbers, if we are persuaded that arithmetic is*not*grounded in Kant's “pure form of intuition of time”? As Frege put it in*Grundlagen*§62: “How … are numbers to be given to us, if we cannot have any ideas or intuitions of them?”**Frege's ‘Julius Caesar problem’**

How can one show that, given a would-be logicist account of the nature of numbers,*Julius Caesar is not a number?*More generally: how can one show, on such an account, that*no number is a concrete individual*?**The ‘applicability problem’**

Can the logicist account for (i) how*natural*numbers may be applied in counting finite collections, and (ii) how*real*numbers may be applied in measuring continuously varying magnitudes such as lengths, periods of time, etc.?**The ‘inclusion problem’**

How does one show that the*natural*number*n*is the very same abstract object as the*integer**n*, the*rational*number*n*, and the*real*number*n*? (See footnote 40.)**The ‘abstraction problem’**

What is the correct form for number-abstraction principles (to be espoused by those who hold that numbers are logical*abstracta*)?**The ‘analyticity problem’**

Can one demonstrate that one's chosen number-abstraction principles are analytic?**The ‘existence problem’**

Can Logic commit one to the existence of any thing, or kind of thing?^{[48]}**The ‘infinity problem’**

Is the logicist permitted to simply*postulate*an Axiom of Infinity, to the effect that there are infinitely many things (perhaps of a certain kind)?**The ‘demarcation problem’**

What makes something a logical constant? Which notions commonly held to be mathematical can actually be defined, implicitly or otherwise, in a properly formulated Logic for logicism?^{[49]}**‘Bad Company’,**^{[50]}or**‘Embarrassment of Riches’**

Some abstraction principles are inconsistent. Yet others, though individually consistent, are mutually inconsistent. How then can we know, of any proposed abstraction principle, whether we should accept it?**‘Theoretical Invariance’**

Natural numbers are universally applicable; they enjoy their arithmetical properties and enter into their arithmetical relations necessarily, independently of what other kinds of things there might be, and of how these things might be. So abstraction principles for natural numbers should be consistent with any consistent theory about any domain of discourse. Are they?

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## Related Entries

analytic/synthetic distinction | choice, axiom of | Dedekind, Richard: contributions to the foundations of mathematics | Frege, Gottlob | Frege, Gottlob: theorem and foundations for arithmetic | Gödel, Kurt | identity: of indiscernibles | Kant, Immanuel | Leibniz, Gottfried Wilhelm | Russell's paradox | set theory | type theory

### Acknowledgements

The author is grateful for helpful comments on various earlier drafts from Julian Cole, Mauro Corneli, Salvatore Florio, Teresa Kouri, Lisa Shabel, Stewart Shapiro, Matthew Souba and Ed Zalta. Thanks are owed especially to John MacFarlane, who provided detailed, insightful and helpful refereeing comments on later but still ancestral drafts. The author is solely responsible for any defects that remain.