Notes to The Influence of Islamic Thought on Maimonides

1. In his letter to Samuel Ibn Tibbon (the translator of the Guide into Hebrew), Maimonides describes Aristotle's works as foundational, and Averroes as one of the most important commentators on those works. For further discussion, some excerpts and further references, see Pines' Translator's Introduction to the Guide, pp. lix ff.

2. See Pines' Translator's Introduction, p. cviii.

3. This can be seen in his letter to Samuel Ibn Tibbon; for relevant excerpt, see Pines' Translator's Introduction, p. lx; and for somewhat different reading of that excerpt, see Steven Harvey, “A New Islamic Source of the Guide of the Perplexed,” in Maimonidean Studies, volume 2, edited by Twersky (New York: Yeshiva University, 1991), p. 32, note 3.

4. Here, see for example Shlomo Pines, “Translator's Introduction: The Philosophical Sources of The Guide of the Perplexed,” in his Moses Maimonides, The Guide of the Perplexed (Chicago: The University of Chicago Press, 1963), pp. cxxvi-cxxxi. The reader might consider too some helpful references to Maimonides' debt to Ghazali in the context of creation ideas in Herbert Davidson's “Maimonides' Secret Position on Creation,” in Studies in Medieval Jewish History and Literature, edited by I. Twersky (Cambridge: Harvard University Press, 1979), esp. pp. 28, 30, and 33.

5. See, for example, Pines' “Translator's Introduction,” pp. ciii-cviii, as well as his “The Limiitations of Human Knowledge according to al-Farabi, ibn Bajja, and Maimonides,” in Studies in Medieval Jewish History and Literature, edited by Isidore Twersky (Cambridge, Mass.: Harvard University Press, 1979), pp. 82-109.

6. Shlomo Pines, “Translator's Introduction: The Philosophical Sources of The Guide of the Perplexed,” in his Moses Maimonides, The Guide of the Perplexed (Chicago: The University of Chicago Press, 1963), pp. lvii-cxxxiv. One might note too Steven Harvey's further work on the themes addressed by Pines; see for example Steven Harvey, “A New Islamic Source of the Guide of the Perplexed,” in Maimonidean Studies, volume 2, edited by Twersky (New York: Yeshiva University, 1991), pp. 31-59.

7. For the Greek text with English translation, see Plotinus, The Enneads, translated with notes by A. H. Armstrong, The Loeb Classical Library (Cambridge: Harvard University Press, 1966). For an English translation see The Theology of Aristotle, translated by Geoffrey Lewis, in Plotini Opera, edited by Paul Henry and Hans-Rudolf Schwyzer (Paris, 1959) (see especially pages 225, 227). For text, see Plotinus apud Arabes: Theologia Aristotelis et fragmenta quae super sunt, edited by A. Badawî (Cairo, 1955). For a full-length study, see Peter Adamson, The Arabic Plotinus: A Philosophical Study of the Theology of Aristotle (Duckworth Publishing, 2003).

8. For an overview of the debate over the status of divine attributes in Islamic theology, see the chapter on “Attributes” (Chapter 2) in H. A. Wolfson's The Philosophy of the Kalam (Cambridge: Harvard University Press, 1976), pp. 112-234. See also the brief and extremely helpful overview discussion of Kalam theology debates in Majid Fakhry's “Philosophy and Theology,” Chapter 6 in The Oxford History of Islam, edited by John L. Esposito (Oxford: Oxford University Press, 1999), pp. 269-303. For a useful analysis of Maimonides on the essence / existence divide, see Alexander Altmann, “Essence and Existence in Maimonides,” in Studies in Religious Philosophy and Mysticism, edited by A. Altmann (Ithaca: Cornell University Press, 1969), pp. 108-27.

9. For Aristotle's description of God as a First Mover and as an intellect knowing itself, cf. Aristotle, Metaphysics Bk. 12, chapter 7 (lines 1072b10ff.) See The Basic Works of Aristotle, edited by Richard McKeon (New York: Random House, 1941), pp. 880 ff.

10. For Arabic text of Maimonides' Guide, cf. Dalâlat al-hâ'irîn, edited by S. Munk (with variant readings by Issachar Joel) (Jerusalem: J. Junovitch, 1931), p. 114, line 4.

11. I am thankful to Charles Manekin for this point.

12. Though see Herbert Davidson for why the Platonic “creation ex aliquo” view – and not Aristotelian eternity – would better count as creation ex nihilo's “opposite” in the context of the Guide; cf. Herbert Davidson, “Maimonides' Secret Position on Creation,” in Studies in Medieval Jewish History and Literature, edited by I. Twersky (Cambridge: Harvard University Press, 1979), pp. 16-40.

13. For a treatment of how terms of creation and emanation might be conceptually reconciled (including a treatment of H.A. Wolfson and A. Altmann on this theme), see Sarah Pessin, “Jewish Neoplatonism: Being Above Being and Divine Emanation in Solomon Ibn Gabirol and Isaac Israeli,” in Cambridge Companion to Medieval Jewish Philosophy, edited by Dan Frank and Oliver Leaman (Cambridge University Press, 2003), pp. 91-110.

14. This latter view is espoused by Warren Zev Harvey, and is closest to my own reading of Maimonides; cf. Warren Zev Harvey, “A Third Approach to Maimonides' Cosmogony-Prophetology Puzzle,” Harvard Theological Review 74:3 (1981), pp. 287-301.

15. For a treatment of Averroes on this theme, see Herbert A. Davidson, Proofs for Eternity, Creation, and the Existence of God in Medieval Islamic and Jewish Philosophy (New York: Oxford University Press, 1987); see too Oliver Leaman, Averroes and his Philosophy (Oxford: Clarendon Press, 1988), esp. pp. 42-71.

16. Averroes, Decisive Treatise; Butterworth p. 15, section 19, lines 24-27, and p. 16, section 20, lines 1-3. Or, see Hourani translation, as reprinted in Hyman and Walsh, p. 306.

17. This ‘creation’ / ‘innovation’ terminology can already be found in al-Kindi, and earlier in Ps. Ammonius' On the Opinions of the Philosophers. See Altmann and Stern, Isaac Israeli: A Neoplatonic philosopher of the early tenth century (London: Oxford University Press, 1958), 68 ff.

18. Averroes, The Decisive Treatise; cf. Averroes, The Book of the Decisive Treatise Determining the Connection Between the Law and Wisdom, and Epistle Dedicatory, translated with notes by Charles E. Butterworth (Utah: Brigham Young University Press, 2001), p. 16, section 20, lines 14-15. This Butterworth edition includes facing page Arabic text: Kitâb fasl al-maqâl, edited by George F. Hourani (revised by Muhsin Mahdi) (Leiden: E. J. Brill, 1959). Or see On the Harmony of Religion and Philosophy, Chapter 2; cf. Averroes on the Harmony of Religion and Philosophy, translated by G. F. Hourani (London: Luzac and Co., Ltd., 1961), as well as reprinted selections of this in Hyman and Walsh, p. 306.

19. Ibid.

20. I am thankful to Charles Manekin for noting this connection.

21. See Aristotle, Metaphysics Book X11, esp. Chapter 8, lines1073a10ff, a discussion about the idea that“each of these movements [viz. the eternal motions of the planets] also must be caused by a substance both unmovable in itself and eternal…” (McKeon, p. 882; line 1073a32). As part of that discussion, Aristotle (at 1074a12) concludes that there are 47 celestial spheres. We might here compare Maimonides' own claim at Guide 2.4 (Pines p. 257) that, according to Aristotle there are 50 spheres. See also Guide 1.72 (Pines p. 185) where Maimonides rules out there being any fewer than 18 spheres.

22. Though, it should be noted, there is debate about the nature of emanation in Farabi: some say that it demarcates a voluntary creation in time, others say it demarcates a necessary and eternal activity. For a similar debate about the nature of creation in relation to emanation in some Jewish Neoplatonists, see my “Jewish Neoplatonism: Being Above Being and Divine Emanation in Solomon Ibn Gabirol and Isaac Israeli,” in Cambridge Companion to Medieval Jewish Philosophy, edited by Dan Frank and Oliver Leaman (Cambridge University Press, 2003), pp. 91-110.

23. Thanks to James Wilberding for a helpful conversation about current scholarship on Aristotelian cosmology.

24. On the emanation of this Active Intellect, see Farabi, Perfect State, II, 3, 9 – 10; Walzer p. 105.

25. Al-Farabi, The Harmonization of the Two Opinions of the Two Sages, Plato the Divine and Aristotle (Kitâb al-Jam‘ bayn Ra'yay al-Hakîmayn, Aflâtûn al-Ilâhî wa Aristûtâlîs), section 71-3; see Alfarabi, The Political Writings, translated by Charles E. Butterworth (Ithaca; London: Cornell University Press, 2001), pp. 163-4. For Arabic text, see Abû Nasr al-Fârâbî, L'Harmonie entre les opinions de Platon et d'Aristote, edited and translated by Fauzi Mitri Najjar and Dominique Mallet (Damascus: Institut Français de Damas, 1999).

26. Maimonides is particularly worried about the mistaken ideas that the term “overflow” has led to in the context of astrology. For an overview of Maimonides on this theme (with references to key literature on the topic), see my “Maimonides' Opposition to Astrology: Critical Survey and Neoplatonic Response,” Al-Masâq: Islam and the Medieval Mediterranean 13 (2001): 25-41.

27. Guide 1.1, Pines p. 23; Pines' use of italics indicates Maimonides' use of Hebrew words in the context of his Arabic text.

28. Guide 1.2, Pines p. 24; Pines' use of italics indicates Maimonides' use of Hebrew words in the context of his Arabic text.

30. Ibid. p. 592, line 430a25. In fact, in his perplexing De Anima 3.5 discussion, Aristotle describes a sense (or kind) of intellect which is not only a principle “without [which] nothing thinks,” but which is also “what it is by virtue of making all things” – language which, at least on its face, lends at least some support to those Islamic philosophers who see the Active Intellect as the causal source for the very existence of the sublunar realm.

31. Here Maimonides uses the Arabic word, “‘ishq”.

32. On different levels of prophecy, see Maimonides, Guide 2.45; Pines pp. 395-403.

33. Guide 1.1, Pines p. 23; Pines' use of italics indicates Maimonides' use of Hebrew words in the context of his Arabic text.

34. Al-Farabi, The Political Regime; see Political Regime, in Alfarabi, The Political Writings, “Political Regime” and Other Texts, section 3 (as cited by Butterworth in Alfarabi, The Political Writings, Selected Aphorisms and Other Texts (Ithaca; London: Cornell University Press, 2001), p. 11, fn. 25). For Arabic, see Alfarabi, Kitâb al-Siyâsa al-Madaniyya, edited by Fauzi M. Najjar (Beirut: Imprimerie Catholique, 1964), 32: 11-12.

35. Al-Farabi, Book of Religion (kitâb al-milla) section 64, paragraph 26; see Al-Farabi, the Political Writings, Selected Aphorisms and Other Texts, translated and annotated by Charles E. Butterworth (Ithaca, London: Cornell University Press, 2001), p. 111. For Arabic text of the Book of Religion, see Abû Nasr al-Farâbî, Kitâb al-Milla wa Nusûs Ukhrâ, edited by Muhsin Mahdi (Beirut: Dâr al-Mashriq, 1968), pp. 41-66.

36. See earlier references to the essays by Davidson and W.Z. Harvey on Maimonides' views on creation; these essays additionally address his view on prophecy (and the relationship between the views on creation and prophecy in the context of the Guide).

37. See Maimonides, Guide 2.45; Pines p. 403: “…Moses…heard Him…without action on the part of imaginative faculty…”

38. Maimonides, Guide 1.26; Pines p. 56; and Guide 1.53; Pines p. 120. The dictum in question occurs in the Babylonian Talmud, Yebamot, 71a, and Baba Metzia, 31b.

39. For a helpful overview of this exegetical issue in Islam, see the entry for “Ta'wîl” in Encyclopedia of Islam, New Edition, edited by Gibb, Kramers, Lévi-Provençal, and Schact (Leiden: E.J. Brill, 1960), Volume X, pp. 390-2. For an overview of this theme in Jewish tradition, see Frank Talmage, "Apples of Gold: The Inner Meaning of Texts in Medieval Judaism,” in Jewish Spirituality from the Bible through the Middle Ages, edited by Arthur Green (Crossroad, 1986); see also Apples of Gold in Settings of Silver: Studies in Medieval Jewish Exegesis and Polemics, by Frank Talmage and Barry Walfish (Toronto: Pontifical Institute of Mediaeval Studies, 1999). For a treatment of outer and inner meanings in Maimonides' reading of the Biblical precepts, see Josef Stern, Problems and Parables of Law: Maimonides and Nahmanides on the Reasons for the Commandments (Ta'Amei ha-Mitzvot) (Albany: State University of New York Press, 1998).

40. Averroes, Decisive Treatise, section 30; Butterworth, p. 20. As pointed out in Butterworth's notes (see note 38, p. 55, and note 18, pp. 52-3), the Tradition in question states “God descends to the lower world.”

41. I am thankful to Charles Manekin for this point.

42. For “fifth cause,” see Maimonides, Guide, Introduction to First Part; Pines pp. 17-18.

43. For “seventh cause,” see Maimonides, Guide, Introduction to First Part; Pines p. 18.

44. This is “the third cause” of contradiction; cf. Maimonides, Guide, Introduction to First Part; Pines p. 17.

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