Notes to The Influence of Islamic Thought on Maimonides

1. See Pines 1963, lvii-cxxxiv. One might note too Steven Harvey's further work on the themes addressed by Pines; see for example Harvey 1991, 31-59.

2. Stroumsa points to Davidson 2005, 80; see Stroumsa 2009, 25, n. 3.

3. For text, see Badawi 1955; for English, see Lewis 1959. For overview and treatment, see Aouad 1989; Adamson 2002.

4. This text is an edited summary of parts of Proclus’ Elements of Theology.

5. This can be seen in his letter to Samuel Ibn Tibbon; see Marx 1935; for relevant excerpt, see Pines 1963, lx; and for somewhat different reading of that excerpt, see Steven Harvey 1991, 32, n. 3.

6. In his letter to Samuel Ibn Tibbon (the translator of the Guide into Hebrew), Maimonides describes Aristotle's works as foundational, and Averroes as one of the most important commentators on those works. For further discussion, some excerpts and further references, see Pines 1963, lix ff.

7.See Davidson 2005, 95; there he notes in particular that Maimonides might well have not had access to works of al-Ghazali, but might simply have learned of Ghazalian ideas in other texts; in this regard he notes that “[w]here Maimonides encountered th[ese ideas] is therefore uncertain.”

8. For an overview of the debate over the status of divine attributes in Islamic theology, see the chapter on “Attributes” (Chapter 2) in Wolfson 1976. See also the brief and extremely helpful overview discussion of Kalam theology debates in Fakhry 1999. For a useful analysis of Maimonides on the essence / existence divide, see Altmann 1969.

9. Some but not all have argued for a link between this group and the Mu‘tazilite school; see Stroumsa 2009, 10. Stroumsa also argues in detail for the direct influence on Maimonides of Almohadic legal principles of engaging only foundational texts and striving for brevity (without recounting sources, and without recounting legal disputes); see Stroumsa 2009, chapter 3.

10. For fuller discussion of this idea, including an analysis of Maimonides' reading of Exodus 33-34 and the 13 Attributes of Divine Mercy, see Pessin 2012.

11. For a lucid analysis of Averroes on creation with key primary text citations, see Taylor 2012a.

12. For Aristotle's description of God as a First Mover and as an intellect knowing itself, cf. Aristotle, Metaphysics Bk. 12, chapter 7 (1072b10ff.) See BWA 880 ff.

13. For overview of various passages pulling in both of these competing directions, see Pines 1963, cxiii-cxv; for a sense of Maimonides’ special sensitivity to opposing descriptions of God as a mover of the first sphere, one might consider Maimonides’ opposition to Sabianism alongside Maimonides’ summary description at Guide 3.29 of the Sabians specifically in terms of a belief in God as the spirit of the sphere. For an overview of Maimonides’ opposition to the Sabian heresy, as well as a sense of this category in Maimonides as a phenomenologically-rooted, as opposed to an historically-rooted, reference to a certain kind of pseudo-scientific outlook, see Stroumsa 2009, 84-105 and 138-52; on Sabianism, see too Pines 1963, cxxiii-iv.

14. Though see Davidson for why the Platonic “creation ex aliquo” view – and not Aristotelian eternity – would better count as creation ex nihilo's “opposite” in the context of the Guide; cf. Davidson 1979.

15. For a treatment of how terms of creation and emanation might be conceptually reconciled (including a treatment of H.A. Wolfson and A. Altmann on this theme), see Pessin 2003.

16. This “creation” / “innovation” terminology can already be found in al-Kindi, and earlier in Ps. Ammonius' On the Opinions of the Philosophers. See Altmann and Stern 1958, 68 ff. See too various creation entries in Encyclopaedia of Islam (see above in main text for references).

17. See Aristotle, Metaphysics Book X11, esp. Chapter 8, 1073a10ff, a discussion about the idea that “each of these movements [viz. the eternal motions of the planets] also must be caused by a substance both unmovable in itself and eternal…” (BWA 882; 1073a32). As part of that discussion, Aristotle (at 1074a12) concludes that there are 47 celestial spheres. We might here compare Maimonides' own claim that, according to Aristotle there are 50 spheres (G 2.4, P 257). See too G 1.72, P 185 where Maimonides rules out there being any fewer than 18 spheres.

18. Maimonides is particularly worried about mistaken ideas to which the term “overflow” has led in the context of astrology. For an overview of Maimonides on this theme (with references to key literature on the topic), see Pessin 2001.

19. BWA 592, 430a25. In fact, in his perplexing De Anima 3.5 discussion, Aristotle describes a sense (or kind) of intellect which is not only a principle “without [which] nothing thinks,” but which is also “what it is by virtue of making all things” – language which, at least on its face, lends at least some support to those Islamic philosophers who see the active intellect as the causal source for the very existence of the sublunar realm.

20. On Judeo-Arabic terms for love in Maimonides' context, see S. Harvey 1997; see too Pessin 2013 on this concept (and the interplay of love and desire) in medieval Neoplatonic Jewish contexts.

21. For Arabic text, see Mehren 1891; for English translation, see Fackenheim 1945.

22. Though for a more skeptical reading of Maimonides, see Pines 1979.

23. On different levels of prophecy, see G 2.45, P 395-403.

24. Al-Farabi, The Political Regime; see Political Regime, in Alfarabi, The Political Writings, “Political Regime” and Other Texts, section 3 (as cited by Butterworth in his Alfarabi, The Political Writings, 2001), 111, n. 25). For Arabic, see Alfarabi, Kitāb al-Siyāsa al-Madaniyya, edited by Fauzi M. Najjar (Beirut: Imprimerie Catholique, 1964), 32: 11-12.

25. See Maimonides, Guide 2.45; Pines p. 403: “…Moses…heard Him…without action on the part of imaginative faculty…”

26. Farmer here cites the positive discussions of music, as for example in Iḥṣā’ al-‘Ulūm; Farmer 1933, 883.

27. For a sense of Strauss as ultimately championing reason over revelation, see, e.g., Meier 2006 (a reading which Batnitzky describes as concluding that “revelation is in the end for Strauss a straw man”; see Batnitzky 2009, 54). For a sense of Strauss’ emphasis on truth along with a sense of reason’s limit, see Kraemer 2009 on Struass’ sense that “human knowledge is limited, and the requirement for divine illumination cannot be denied, [and therefore] the possibility of revelation cannot be rejected” (Kramer 2009, 144); see too Kraemer 2009 on Strauss’ love of truth and his “prais[ing] modern man’s liberation from “the religious delusion”,” alongside his “admit[ting] the presence of the unfathomable or the ultimate mystery in the universe, the truth that…being is radically mysterious” (Kraemer 2009, 169). For a robust sense that Strauss equally values reason and revelation precisely for the tension that they create which is itself an important ground for living (and arguably even for a sense of Strauss as in some sense championing revelation over reason within the necessary dynamics of the revelation-reason partnership), see Batnitzky 2009; there Batnitzky highlights Strauss’ sensitivity to the ultimate incompleteness of knowledge alongside his emphasis on reason’s reliance on revelation to find universal morality, and the importance of doubt in one’s overall living if one is to “return to a philosophy, theology, and especially politics of moderation” (Batnitzky 2009, 60; and see too Batnitzky 2007). See too: Strauss 1952, 1965, 1995; Adler 1995; Brague 1998; Parens 1995; Batnitzky 2007.

28. See G 1.26, P 56 and G 1.53, P 120. The dictum in question occurs in the Babylonian Talmud, Yebamot, 71a, and Baba Metzia, 31b.

29. Stroumsa highlights this different approach in Averroes; Stroumsa 2009, 74; she also argues that this Averroean move relates to some differences between Averroes and Maimonides on the issue of textual hermeneutics which we will address below. For a helpful overview of exegesis in Islam, see “Ta‘wīl” in Encyclopaedia of Islam. For an overview of this theme in Jewish tradition, see Talmage 1986; Talmage and Walfish 1999. For a treatment of outer and inner meanings in Maimonides' reading of the Biblical precepts, see Stern 1998.

30. Averroes DT (section 30), B 20. As pointed out in Butterworth's notes (see note 38, p. 55, and note 18, pp. 52-3), the Tradition in question states “God descends to the lower world.”

31. See Stroumsa 2009, 74; see also her argument that Maimonides here reveals the influence of the Almohads who also hold that no person should ever believe in divine corporeality. It is worth noting that Stroumsa may have overemphasized the difference between Averroean v. Maimonidean exegesis; consider, for example, Averroes' reading of Quranic verses in the Decisive Treatise that we addressed earlier; he seems to there note that when “the apparent sense of the Law is scrutinized” one will find the true philosophical insight that being and time “extend continuously in both extremes”; while he is not there advocating announcing this idea to the masses, he is suggesting that the meaning is there to be seen in the external layer; see DT, B 16].

32. See Stroumsa 2009, 123-4; there Stroumsa also emphasizes how Maimonides seems to go beyond all Muslim thinkers (aside from overtly heretical Muslim thinkers) in his willingness to denounce certain Talmudic/midrashic ideas as nonsense.

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Sarah Pessin <spessin@du.edu>

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