Max Stirner (1806–56) is best known as the author of the idiosyncratic and provocative book entitled Der Einzige und sein Eigenthum (1844). Familiar in English as The Ego and Its Own (a more literal translation would be The Unique Individual and his Property), both the form and content of Stirner's work are disconcerting. He challenges expectations about how political and philosophical argument should be conducted, and seeks to shake confidence in the superiority of contemporary civilisation. He provides a sweeping attack on the modern world as dominated by religious modes of thought and oppressive social institutions, together with a brief sketch of a radical ‘egoistic’ alternative in which individual autonomy might flourish. The historical impact of The Ego and Its Own is not easy to assess. However, Stirner's book can plausibly be claimed to have had an immediate and destructive impact on contemporary left-Hegelianism, to have played a significant role in the intellectual development of Karl Marx (1818–1883), and to have influenced the tradition of individualist anarchism.
There is a stark contrast between the often melodramatic tone of Stirner's best-known work and the rather less sensational events of his own life.
Stirner was born Johann Caspar Schmidt on 25 October 1806, the only child of lower middle class Lutheran parents living in Bayreuth.(‘Stirner’ was originally a nickname, resulting from his large forehead, and only later adopted — as ‘Max Stirner’ — as a literary pseudonym, and as his preferred name.) His father died when Stirner was only six months old, and he was brought up by his mother (who remarried) and then later by an aunt (who, when his mother moved from Bayreuth, looked after Stirner whilst he continued his schooling at the renowned local Gymnasium). Stirner subsequently pursued his undergraduate studies, with little notable academic distinction, at the universities of Berlin, Erlangen, and Königsberg. At Berlin, he is known to have attended three lecture-series given by G.W.F. Hegel (1770-1831): on the philosophy of religion; on the history of philosophy; and on the philosophy of 'subjective spirit' (that is, the cognitive structures and processes of the individual mind).
Towards the end of his university career, Stirner devoted much of his time to ‘family affairs’, possibly a euphemism for his mother's deteriorating mental health. In 1832, he returned with his mother to Berlin, and sought, with only partial success, to qualify as a teacher. (Stirner's mother was committed to a mental home in 1837 and she would outlive him by some three years.) A period of private study and irregular work followed, including eighteenth months as an unpaid Latin teacher. During this time he married Agnes Butz (1815–1838), a member of his landlady's family. Edgar Bauer (1820–1886) would later record that Stirner had confessed that having once caught sight of his wife naked he had been unable to touch her again. In August 1838, Agnes died giving birth to a still-born child.
Between 1839 and 1844 Stirner maintained something of a double life in Berlin. He obtained a position at a well-regarded private girls' school, and spent the next five years teaching history and literature, establishing a reputation as a polite and reliable teacher. Away from his teaching post, however, Stirner began to frequent the more avant-garde of Berlin's intellectual haunts. He used the reading room of the novelist Willibald Alexis (1798–1871), spent afternoons at the Café Stehely, and from 1841 onwards was a regular visitor to Hippel's wine bar on the Friedrichstrasse. The latter was the main meeting place of ‘the free’, an increasingly bohemian group of teachers, students, officers, and journalists, under the loose intellectual leadership of the left-Hegelian Bruno Bauer (1809-1882), who had recently been dismissed from his teaching post at the University of Bonn following an offical inquiry into the orthodoxy of his writings on the New Testament. This group included Marie Dähnhardt (1818–1902) who became Stirner's second wife (and the dedicatee of The Ego and Its Own). In this unconventional environment, and despite his calm and unassuming personal appearance, Stirner gained a reputation for his hostility to religion, intolerance of moderation, and ability to provoke fierce argument.
Stirner's earliest published writings date from this time in Berlin. In addition to some short and unremarkable pieces of journalism for the Rheinische Zeitung and the Leipziger Allgemeine Zeitung, they include a knowing review of Bruno Bauer's anonymous and parodic attack on Hegel in The Trumpet of the Last Judgement (1842) and an article on pedagogy entitled “The False Principle of Our Education” (1842), which adumbrated some of the themes of his own later work (for example, contrasting the training of individuals to an alien calling with the cultivation of the predisposition to become ‘sovereign characters’). During this period, Stirner is said to have occasionally alluded to a book that he was working on, but it seems that few of his associates took its existence seriously. The impact of The Ego and Its Own on these left-Hegelian circles was to be both considerable and unexpected. Stirner began serious work on the book in early 1843 and finished it in the middle of 1844. The Ego and Its Own was published by the Leipzig bookseller Otto Wigand (1795–1870) in an edition of a thousand copies (although dated 1845 the book appears to have been widely available by November of the previous year).
Measured by the reaction that it produced, The Ego and Its Own could be described as a critical success. The book was widely reviewed, and attracted attention from such leading figures as Bettina von Arnim (1785–1859), the doyenne of the Berlin literati, and Kuno Fischer (1824–1907), later a distinguished neo-Kantian historian of philosophy. The book also generated responses from many of its left-Hegelian targets: Bruno Bauer, Ludwig Feuerbach (1804-1872), Moses Hess (1812–1875), and Arnold Ruge (1802–1880), all ventured into print in order to defend their own views against Stirner's polemic. However, The Ego and Its Own was neither a popular nor a financial success. Stirner had left his teaching post shortly before the book was published, and, by 1846, having squandered much of his second wife's inheritance, he was reduced to advertising in the Vossische Zeitung for a loan. Marie Dähnhardt left him towards the end of the same year. Many years later she was traced by Stirner's loyal biographer, the poet and novelist John Henry Mackay (1864–1933), in England. She refused to meet Mackay in person but wrote to him describing Stirner as a very sly man whom she had neither respected nor loved, and claiming that their relationship together had been more of a cohabitation than a marriage.
From 1847, Stirner's life was characterised by social isolation and financial precariousness. He remained curiously detached from contemporary events — he seems, for example, to have largely ignored the revolution of 1848 — and his daily life was increasingly dominated by domestic routine and economic hardship. Stirner continued to write intermittently, but commentators have generally found his later work to be of little independent interest (that is, apart from its uncertain potential to illuminate The Ego and Its Own). He translated into German some of the economic writings of Jean-Baptiste Say (1767-1832) and Adam Smith (1723–1790), and may have written a series of short journalistic pieces for the Journal des oesterreichischen Lloyd. In 1852, he contributed some material to a History of Reaction, which mainly consisted of excerpts from other authors, including Edmund Burke (1729–1797). Stirner's main strategy for economic survival in this period seems to have involved changing addresses in order to evade his creditors, although he does not appear to have moved quickly enough to avoid two brief periods in a debtors' prison in 1853 and 1854.
In May 1856, still living in reduced circumstances in Berlin, Stirner fell into a 'nervous fever', possibly after being stung in the neck by a winged insect. Following a brief remission, he died on 25 June. His death went largely unnoticed by the outside world.
Modern readers hoping to understand The Ego and Its Own are confronted by several obstacles, not least the form, structure, and argument, of Stirner's book.
Much of Stirner's prose—which is crowded with aphorisms, italicisation, and hyperbole—appears calculated to disconcert. Most striking, perhaps, is the use of word play. Rather than reach a conclusion through the conventional use of argument, Stirner often approaches a claim that he wishes to endorse by exploiting words with related etymologies or formal similarities. For example, he associates words for property (such as ‘Eigentum’) with words connoting distinctive individual characteristics (such as ‘Eigenheit’) in order to promote the claim that property is expressive of selfhood. (Stirner's account of egoistic property—see below—gives this apparently orthodox Hegelian claim a distinctive twist.)
This rejection of conventional forms of intellectual discussion is linked to Stirner's substantive views about language and rationality. His unusual style reflects a conviction that both language and rationality are human products which have come to constrain and oppress their creators. Stirner maintains that accepted meanings and traditional standards of argumentation are underpinned by a conception of truth as a privileged realm beyond individual control. As a result, individuals who accept this conception are abandoning a potential area of creative self-expression in favour of adopting a subordinate role as servants of truth. In stark contrast, Stirner insists that the only legitimate restriction on the form of our language, or on the structure of our arguments, is that they should serve our individual ends. It is the frequent failure of ordinary meanings and standard forms of argument to satisfy his interpretation of this criterion which underpins Stirner's remorselessly idiosyncratic style.
The Ego and Its Own has an intelligible, but scarcely transparent, structure. It is organised around a tripartite account of human experience, initially introduced in a description of the stages of an individual life. The first stage in this developmental narrative is the realistic one of childhood, in which children are constrained by material and natural forces such as their parents. Liberation from these external constraints is achieved with what Stirner calls the self-discovery of mind, as children find the means to outwit those forces in their own determination and cunning. The idealistic stage of youth, however, contains new internal sources of constraint, as individuals once more become enslaved, this time to the spiritual forces of conscience and reason. Only with the adulthood of egoism do individuals escape both material (external) and spiritual (internal) constraints, learning to value their personal satisfaction above all other considerations.
Stirner portrays this dialectic of individual growth as an analogue of historical development, and it is a tripartite account of the latter which structures the remainder of the book. Human history is reduced to successive epochs of realism (the ancient, or pre-Christian, world), idealism (the modern, or Christian, world), and egoism (the future world). Part One of The Ego and Its Own is devoted to the first two of these subjects, whilst Part Two is concerned with the third of them.
Part One of The Ego and Its Own is backward-looking, in that it is concerned with the ancient and modern worlds rather than with the future, and negative, in that its primary aim is to demonstrate the failure of modernity to escape from the very religious modes of thought which it claims to have outgrown. The bulk of Stirner's historical account is devoted to the modern epoch, and he discusses the ancient world only insofar as it contributes to the genesis of modernity. In both cases, however, the majority of his examples are taken from the realm of cultural and intellectual affairs. Cumulatively these examples are meant both to undermine historical narratives which portray the modern development of humankind as the progressive realisation of freedom and to support an account of individuals in the modern world as increasingly oppressed by the spiritual. For Stirner, the subordination of the individual to spirit—in any of its guises—counts as religious servitude.
Stirner's account of the historical development of modernity largely revolves around a single event, the Reformation. He attempts to show that, from the perspective of the individual, the movement from Catholic to Protestant hegemony was not a liberating one, but instead constituted both an extension and intensification of the domination of spirit. The Reformation extended, rather than contracted, the sphere of religious control over the individual because it refused to recognise the distinction between the spiritual and the sensuous. Rather than prevent priests marrying, for example, Protestantism made marriage religious, thereby absorbing the sensuous into the sphere of the spiritual. The Reformation also intensified, rather than relaxed, the bond between individuals and religion. The more inward faith of Protestantism, for example, established a perpetual internal conflict between natural impulses and religious conscience. In a typically vivid and belligerent metaphor, Stirner describes this internal conflict in the individual as analogous to the struggle between the population and the secret police in the contemporary body politic.
Stirner's claim that the modern world reproduced, rather than abolished, religious modes of thought provides the opportunity for a sustained attack on the writings of his left-Hegelian contemporaries, Ludwig Feuerbach in particular, for failing to overcome the subordination of the individual to spirit. Stirner's expansive definition of religion enables him to portray Feuerbach's work as sustaining rather than undermining religious modes of thought. The primary error of Christianity, according to Feuerbach, was that it took human predicates and projected them into another world as if they constituted an independent being. However, Stirner insists that Feuerbach's rejection of God as a transcendental subject leaves the divinity of the Christian predicates untouched. In short, rather than describing human nature as it is, Feuerbach is said to have deified a prescriptive account of what being human involves. As a result, the real kernel of religion, the positing of an ‘essence over me’ (46), had been left intact. (All page references in parenthesis are to the English edition of The Ego and Its Own cited in the Bibliography below.) Indeed, Stirner suggests that Feuerbach's achievement was to have effected a ‘change of masters’ (55) which made the tyranny of the divine over the individual even more complete, because human nature (unlike the conventional Christian God) was an immanent divinity which could possess both believers and unbelievers alike.
Stirner extends his critique to the work of all the left-Hegelians, including those with whom he had associated in Berlin. Although they disagreed about the content of human nature—for ‘political liberals’ like Arnold Ruge human nature was identified with citizenship, for ‘social liberals’ like Moses Hess human nature was identified with labour, and for ‘humane liberals’ like Bruno Bauer human nature was identified with critical activity—all the left-Hegelians are said to have reproduced the basic Feuerbachian error: separating the individual from his human essence, and setting that essence above the individual as something to be striven for. In contrast, Stirner maintains that because it has no universal or prescriptive content, human nature cannot ground any claim about how we ought to live. His own intellectual project—which he describes as an attempt to rehabilitate the prosaic and mortal self, the ‘un-man’ (124) for whom the notion of a calling is alien—is intended as a radical break with the work of these contemporaries.
Part Two of The Ego and Its Own is forward-looking, in that it is concerned with the egoistic future rather than the ancient or modern worlds, and positive, in that it aims to establish the possibility that Stirner's contemporaries could escape the tyranny of religion.
Stirner's account of the developing historical relationship between the individual and society is advanced in a series of parallels which are designed to portray egoism as the embodiment of a more advanced civilisation. At one point, he neatly inverts the terms of a familiar progression (rehearsed by countless early modern political thinkers) from a state of nature to civil society. It is membership of society, and not isolation, Stirner suggests, which is humankind's “state of nature” (271), in that it constitutes an early stage of development whose inadequacies are, in due course, outgrown. Elsewhere, he describes the developing relationship between the individual and society as analogous to that between a mother and her child. As the individual (the child) develops a mature preference for a less suffocating environment, it must throw off the claims of society (the mother) which seeks to maintain it in a subordinate position. In both cases, Stirner draws the lesson that the individual must move from social to egoistic relationships in order to escape subjection.
What is meant by ‘egoism’, however, is not always clear. Stirner is occasionally portrayed as a psychological egoist, that is, as a proponent of the descriptive claim that all (intentional) actions are motivated by a concern for the self-interest of the agent. However, this characterisation of Stirner's position appears mistaken. Not least, The Ego and Its Own is structured around the opposition between egoistic and non-egoistic forms of experience. Indeed, he appears to hold that non-egoistic action has predominated historically (in the epochs of realism and idealism). Moreover, at one point, Stirner explicitly considers adopting the explanatory stance of psychological egoism only to reject it. In a discussion of a young woman who sacrifices her love for another in order to respect the wishes of her family, Stirner remarks that an observer might be tempted to maintain that selfishness has still prevailed in this case since the woman clearly preferred the wishes of her family to the attractions of her suitor. However, Stirner rejects this hypothetical explanation, insisting that, provided “the pliable girl were conscious of having left her self-will unsatisfied and humbly subjected herself to a higher power” (197), we should see her actions as governed by piety rather than egoism.
It is also a mistake to think of Stirner as advocating a normative proposition about the value of self-interested action. Stirnerian egoism needs to be distinguished from the individual pursuit of narrow self-interest as it is conventionally understood. In The Ego and Its Own, Stirner discusses the important example of an avaricious individual who sacrifices everything in pursuit of material riches. Such an individual is clearly self-interested (he acts only to enrich himself) but it is an egoism which Stirner rejects as one-sided and narrow. Stirner's reason for rejecting this form of egoism is instructive. He suggests that the avaricious man has become enslaved to a single end, and such enslavement is incompatible with egoism properly understood.
Stirnerian egoism is perhaps best thought of, not in terms of the pursuit of self-interest, but rather as a variety of individual self-government or autonomy. Egoism properly understood is to be identified with what Stirner calls ‘ownness [Eigenheit]’, a type of autonomy which is incompatible with any suspension, whether voluntary or forced, of individual judgement. “I am my own”, Stirner writes, “only when I am master of myself, instead of being mastered … by anything else” (153). This Stirnerian ideal of self-mastery has external and internal dimensions, requiring both that we avoid subordinating ourselves to others and that we escape being ‘dragged along’ (56) by our own appetites. In short, Stirner not only rejects the legitimacy of any subordination to the will of another but also recommends that individuals cultivate an ideal of emotional detachment towards their own appetites and ideas.
Judged against this account of egoism, characterisations of Stirner as a ‘nihilist’—as rejecting all normative judgement—would also appear to be mistaken. The popular but inaccurate description of Stirner as a ‘nihilist’ is encouraged by his explicit rejection of morality. Morality, on Stirner's account, involves the positing of obligations to behave in certain fixed ways. As a result, he rejects morality as incompatible with egoism properly understood. However, this rejection of morality is not grounded in the rejection of values as such, but in the affirmation of what might be called non-moral goods. That is, Stirner allows that there are actions and desires which, although not moral in his sense (because they do not involve obligations to others), are nonetheless to be assessed positively. Stirner is clearly committed to the non-nihilistic view that certain kinds of character and modes of behaviour (namely autonomous individuals and actions) are to be valued above all others. His conception of morality is, in this respect, a narrow one, and his rejection of the legitimacy of moral claims is not to be confused with a denial of the propriety of all normative judgement. There is, as a result, no inconsistency in Stirner's frequent use of an explicitly evaluative vocabulary, as when, for example, he praises the egoist for having the ‘courage’ (265) to lie, or condemns the ‘weakness’ (197) of the individual who succumbs to pressure from his family.
Two features of Stirner's position emerge as fundamental. First, he values ‘ownness’ neither as one good amongst many, nor as the most important of several goods, but rather as the only good. Second, he adopts an account of self-mastery which is incompatible with the existence of any legitimate obligations to others, even those which an individual has voluntarily undertaken (thereby rejecting perhaps the most familiar way of reconciling individual autonomy with the existence of binding obligations). In short, Stirner appears to value nothing other than individual self-mastery, and he interprets the latter in a stringent and idiosyncratic manner.
The consequences of Stirner's position appear extreme and far-reaching. As the example of morality suggests, egoists are likely to find themselves in conflict with some cherished social institutions and practices. Stirner consistently associates (non-egoistic) society with relationships of ‘belonging’, which he treats as involving the subjugation of individuals. For example, he maintains that ‘the forming of family ties binds a man’ (102). (Stirner never appears to consider seriously the possibility that, in at least some of these social relationships, belonging might have more positive associations; for example, of being at home or of feeling secure.) Confronted with the conflict between egoism and ‘society’, Stirner is not prompted to re-examine his commitment to, or understanding of, self-mastery, but instead confidently denies the legitimacy of those conventional institutions and practices. Two examples of this response may suffice.
On Stirner's account, there is a necessary antipathy between the egoistic individual and the state. This inevitable hostility is based on the conflict between Stirner's conception of autonomy and any obligation to obey the law. “Own will and the state”, he writes, “are powers in deadly hostility, between which no ‘perpetual peace’ is possible” (175). Since self-mastery is incompatible with, and valued more highly than, any obligation to obey the law, Stirner rejects the legitimacy of political obligation. Note that this rejection stands irrespective of the foundation of that political obligation, and whatever the form of the state. “Every state”, Stirner insists, “is a despotism, be the despot one or many.” (175) Even in the hypothetical case of a direct democracy in which a collective decision had been made unanimously, Stirner denies that the egoist would be bound by the result. To be bound today by “my will of yesterday”, he maintains, would be to turn my ‘creature’, that is ‘a particular expression of will’, into my ‘commander’; it would be to freeze my will, and Stirner denies that ‘because I was a fool yesterday I must remain such’ (175).
Promise-keeping is another early victim of this commitment to, and understanding of, self-mastery. Stirner associates the institution of promising with illegitimate constraint, since the requirement that duly made promises be kept is incompatible with his understanding of individual autonomy. Stirner rejects any general obligation to keep promises as just another attempt to bind the individual. The egoist, he suggests, must embrace the heroism of the lie, and be willing to break even his own word “in order to determine himself instead of being determined” (210). Note that Stirner's enthusiasm is reserved not for those who break their word in the service of some larger spiritual goal (as Luther, for example, became unfaithful to his monastic vows for God's sake), but rather for those individuals who are willing to break their word for their own sake.
As well as a negative account of the institutions and practices that egoists must reject as incompatible with autonomy, The Ego and Its Own also contains some positive suggestions about the possible shape of egoistic relationships which do not conflict with individual self-mastery. In particular, Stirner provides a brief sketch of what he calls the “union of egoists [Verein von Egoisten]” (161).
The egoistic future is said to consist not of wholly isolated individuals but rather in relationships of ‘uniting’, that is, in impermanent connections between individuals who themselves remain independent and self-determining. The central feature of the resulting union of egoists is that it does not involve the subordination of the individual. The union is “a son and co-worker” (273) of autonomy, a constantly shifting alliance which enables individuals to unite without loss of sovereignty, without swearing allegiance to anyone else's ‘flag’ (210). This union of egoists constitutes a purely instrumental association whose good is solely the advantage that the individuals concerned may derive for the pursuit of their individual goals; there are no shared final ends and the association is not valued in itself.
Stirner occasionally appears uncertain as to how best to elaborate this basic account of egoistic social relations. In The Ego and Its Own, he appears to be pulled in two divergent directions.
In the first, and least typical, of these moods, Stirner shies away somewhat from the suggestion that his views might have radical consequences. More precisely, he seeks to suggest that certain familiar and worthwhile relationships (such as ‘love’) might continue into the egoistic future. This suggestion is presumably aimed at making that future appear more attractive (not least to those attached to these familiar and worthwhile relationships). However, it is far from certain that all of the relationships he mentions would emerge intact from their reincarnation in egoistic form.
Consider, for example, Stirner's contrast between two different kinds of love: the ‘bad case’ where ‘ownness’ is sacrificed, and egoistic love in which self-mastery is retained. Egoistic love allows the individual to deny himself something in order to enhance the pleasure of another, but only because his own pleasure is enhanced as a result. The object of egoistic love, in other words, remains the individual himself. The egoist will not sacrifice his autonomy and interests to another, but rather loves only as long as “love makes me happy” (258). At one point, Stirner characterises this relationship as one in which the individual ‘enjoys’ the other (258). The description is a revealing one, since enjoying another person and loving them would appear to be rather different matters. Loving another person in the conventional (and non-egoistic) sense might be thought to include the desire to promote the welfare of that person, even when it is not in our interests, or when it conflicts with our own wants and happiness. In this respect, it stands at some distance from Stirner's account of egoistic love. The point here is not a terminological one—Stirner rightly cares little whether we call egoistic love ‘love’ and “hence stick to the old sound” (261) or whether we invent a new vocabulary—but rather that a world without this experience would be an unfamiliar and impoverished one. Stirner appears to have failed to establish that this particular familiar and worthwhile relationship would survive this reestablishment on egoistic premises.
In the second, and more representative, of these moods, Stirner acknowledges the radical and unfamiliar consequences of adopting an egoistic order. Indeed, in places, he might be said to revel in the acknowledgement that his views have startling consequences from which few will take any solace. This is one of the sources of the melodramatic tone of parts of The Ego and Its Own.
Stirner describes the relation between the egoist and his objects (which include, of course, other persons) as a property relation. The egoist stands in a relation of ‘ownership’ to the wider world. This notion of ‘egoistic property’ is not to be confused with more familiar juridical concepts of ownership (such as private property or collective ownership). These more familiar forms of property rest on notions of right, and involve claims to exclusivity or constraints on use, which Stirner rejects. Egoistic property is rather constituted by the ‘unlimited dominion’ (223) of individuals over the world, by which Stirner appears to mean that there are no moral constraints on how an individual might relate to things and other persons. Stirner sometimes describes the resulting association between people as involving relationships “of utility, of use” (263). The egoist, he suggests, views others as “nothing but—my food, even as I am fed upon and turned to use by you” (263). Stirner embraces the stark consequences of this rejection of any general obligation towards others, insisting, for example, that the egoist does not renounce “even the power over life and death” (282). Over the course of the book, he variously declines to condemn the officer's widow who strangles her child (281), the man who treats his sister ‘as wife also’ (45), and the murderer who no longer fears his act as a ‘wrong’ (169). In a world in which “we owe each other nothing” (263), it seems that acts of infanticide, incest, and murder, might all turn out to be justified.
At one point, Stirner acknowledges that few readers of The Ego and Its Own will draw any comfort from his vision of an egoistic future, but insists that the welfare of this audience is not of any interest to him. Indeed, Stirner suggests that, if he had been motivated by a concern for others, then he would have had to conceal rather than propagate his ideas. As it is, even if he had believed that these ideas would lead to the “bloodiest wars and the fall of many generations” (263) Stirner maintains that he would still have disseminated them.
At the time of his death, Stirner's brief period of notoriety was long over, his book had been out of print for several years, and there was little sign that his work might have any longer term impact. Since then, however, The Ego and Its Own has been translated into at least eight languages, and appeared in over one hundred editions.
Subsequent interpretations of Stirner have often followed contemporary intellectual fashion. For example, at the beginning of the twentieth century, Stirner was frequently portrayed as a precursor of Friedrich Nietzsche (1844–1900), as having anticipated, if not influenced (it is far from certain that Nietzsche had ever read Stirner's work), both the style and substance of Nietzsche's work. In the 1960s and early 1970s, Stirner was rediscovered as a forerunner of existentialism, whose anti-essentialist concept of the self as a ‘creative nothing’ had affinities with the notion of human nature employed by Jean-Paul Sartre (1905-1980). More recently, Stirner has been identified as a nascent poststructuralist, employing a genealogical critique of humanist discourses of power and identity. It would be wrong to suggest that these various parallels are wholly implausible. However, they often appear to reflect changing historical enthusiasms as much as they accurately capture aspects of his philosophical and political thought.
The historical influence of Stirner's work is perhaps more plausibly located in two rather different contexts. As far as its contemporary impact on the cultural life of Vormärz Germany is concerned, The Ego and Its Own had a destructive impact on Stirner's left-Hegelian contemporaries, and played a significant role in the intellectual development of Karl Marx. As far as its longer term historical influence is concerned, Stirner's work has become a founding text in the tradition of individualist anarchism.
Stirner's insistence that his radical contemporaries had failed to break with religious modes of thought prompted most of the leading left-Hegelians to defend their own work in public against this attack. In perhaps the most important of these replies, a defensive and ill-tempered Feuerbach (who suspected Stirner of trying to make a name for himself at his own expense) was widely seen as struggling to maintain a besieged and outdated position. Stirner responded to three of these left-Hegelian reviews—the defence of Bauer's ‘humane liberalism’ by ‘Szeliga’ (the pseudonym of Franz Zychlinski (1816–1900)); the defence of socialism by Moses Hess; and the defence of Feuerbach by Feuerbach himself—in an article entitled ‘Stirner's Critics’ (1845). In this confident rejoinder, Stirner reiterated some of the central themes of The Ego and Its Own and clarified the character of his own commitment to egoism.
Stirner's work also had a significant impact on a little known contemporary associate of these left-Hegelians, one Karl Marx. Between 1845 and 1846, Marx collaborated with Friedrich Engels (1820–1895) on a group of texts now usually called The German Ideology, which included a fierce and sustained attack on their erstwhile philosophical contemporaries. Most of these texts were not published at the time, and it was 1932 before this critical engagement with the work of Bauer, Feuerbach, and Stirner, appeared in print. The account of Stirner contained in The German Ideology takes up over three hundred pages of the published text (unfortunately abridged editions occasionally omit this dense but fascinating part of the book), and, although Marx is remorselessly critical of Stirner's position, it scarcely follows that The Ego and Its Own was without influence on the former's own work. Not least, Stirner's book appears to have been decisive in motivating Marx's break with the work of Feuerbach, whose influence on many of Marx's earlier writings is readily apparent, and in forcing Marx to reconsider the role that concepts of human nature should play in social criticism.
Finally, and over a longer period of time, the author of The Ego and Its Own has become best-known as a member of, and influence upon, the anarchist tradition. In particular, Stirner's name appears with familiar regularity in historically-orientated surveys of anarchist thought as one of the earliest and best-known exponents of individualist anarchism. The affinity between Stirner and the anarchist tradition lies in his endorsement of the claim that the state is an illegitimate institution. However, his elaboration of this claim is a distinctive and interesting one. For Stirner, a state can never be legitimate, since there is a necessary conflict between individual self mastery and the obligation to obey the law (with which the legitimacy of the state is identified). Given that individual self-mastery trumps any competing consideration, Stirner concludes that the demands of the state are not binding on the individual. However, he does not think that individuals have, as a result, any general obligation to oppose and attempt to eliminate the state (insofar as this is within their power). Rather the individual should decide in each particular case whether or not to go along with the state's demands. Only in cases where there is a conflict between the autonomy of the egoist and the demands of the state, does he recommend resisting the requirements of law. That said, whilst individuals have no duty to overthrow the state, Stirner does think that the state will eventually collapse as a result of the spread of egoism. The cumulative effect of a growing egoistic disrespect for law, he suggests, would be to ‘scuttle’ the ‘ship of state’. (54) Anarchists influenced by Stirner's individualism and his suspicion of the state can be found in several European countries. However, his best-known anarchist admirers were in America, in the circle which formed around Benjamin R. Tucker (1854–1939) and the remarkable journal Liberty (founded in 1881).
Stirner is unlikely to have regretted these various disputes about the nature and influence of The Ego and Its Own. In considering interpretative accounts of the Bible, he himself declined to chose between the judgement of the child who played with the book, the Inca emperor Atahualpa (c.1502–1533) who threw it away when it failed to speak to him, the priest who praised it as the word of God, and the critic who dissected it as a purely human invention. The plurality of interpretations of his own work might well have both amused Stirner and encouraged him in his view that there could be no legitimate constraints on the meaning of a text. Stirner once described himself as writing only to procure for his thoughts an existence in the world, insisting that what subsequently happened to these ideas ‘is your affair and does not trouble me’ (263).
Works by Stirner
- Der Einzige und sein Eigentum, Stuttgart: Philipp Reclam, 1972. (A modern edition of Stirner's best-known work.)
- Max Stirner's Kleinere Schriften und seine Entgegnungen auf die Kritik seines Werkes “Der Einzige und sein Eigentum”. Aus den Jahren 1842–1848, edited by J.H. Mackay, second revised edition, Berlin: Bernhard Zack, 1914. (An extensive collection of Stirner's lesser writings.)
- Parerga Kritiken Repliken, edited by Bernd A. Laska, Nürnberg: LSR, 1986. (A modern selection of Stirner's lesser writings.)
Works by Stirner in Translation
- The False Principle of Our Education, edited by James J. Martin, Colorado Springs: Ralph Myles, 1967. (An early article on pedagogy.)
- “Stirner's Critics”, The Philosophical Forum, 8 (1978): 66–80. (A partial translation of Stirner's 1845 response to critics, covering his reply to Feuerbach.)
- “Art and Religion”, Lawrence S. Stepelevich (edited), The Young Hegelians. An Anthology, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 1983, pp. 327–334. (An article on an eminently Hegelian topic from 1842.)
- The Ego and Its Own, edited by David Leopold, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 1995. (A thoroughly-annotated English edition of Stirner's best-known work.)
- Carroll, John, 1974, Break-Out from the Crystal Palace. The Anarcho-Psychological Critique: Stirner, Nietzsche, Dostoevsky, London: Routledge and Kegan Paul.
- Clark, John P, 1976, Max Stirner's Egoism, London: Freedom Press.
- De Ridder, Widukind, 2008, “Max Stirner, Hegel, and the Young Hegelians: A Reassessment”, History of European Ideas, 34(3): 285–297.
- Helms, Hans G., 1966, Die Ideologie der anonymen Gesellschaft. Max Stirner ‘Einziger’ und der Fortschritt des demokratischen Selbstbewußtseins vom Vormärz bis zur Bundesrepublik, Köln: Du Mont Schauberg. (Contains an excellent bibliography.)
- Jenkins, John, 2009, “Max Stirner's Egoism”, Heythrop Journal, 50(2): 243–256.
- Koch, Andrew M., 1997, “Max Stirner: The Last Hegelian or the First Poststructuralist”, Anarchist Studies, 5: 95–108.
- Laska, Bernd A., 1996, Ein dauerhafter Dissident. 150 Jahre Stirners ‘Einziger’. Eine kurze Wirkungsgeschichte, Nürnberg: LSR-Verlag.
- Lobkowicz, Nicholas, 1969, “Karl Marx and Max Stirner”, Frederick J. Adelmann (edited), Demythologising Marxism, The Hague: Martinus Nijhoff, pp. 64–95.
- Leopold, David, 1995, “Introduction”, Max Stirner, The Ego and Its Own, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, pp. xi-xxxii.
- Leopold, David, 2006, “The State and I: Max Stirner's Anarchism”, Douglas Moggach (ed.), The New Hegelians. Politics and Philosophy in the Hegelian School, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, pp. 176–199.
- Leopold, David, 2011, “A Solitary Life”, in S. Newman (ed.), Max Stirner, London: Palgrave Macmillan, pp. 21–42.
- Löwith, Karl, 1941, From Hegel to Nietzsche. The Revolution in Nineteenth Century Thought, London: Constable; first published in German in 1941.
- Mackay, John Henry, 1914, Max Stirner. Sein Leben und sein Werk, Berlin, second edition.
- Martin, James J., 1953, Men Against the State. The Expositors of individualist Anarchism in America, 1827–1908, DeKalb, Illinois: Adrian Allen.
- Maruhn, Jürgen, 1982, Die Kritik an der Stirnerschen Ideologie im Werk von Karl Marx und Friedrich Engels, Frankfurt: R.G. Fischer.
- Marx, Karl and Friedrich Engels, 1846, The German Ideology, in Marx-Engels Collected Works (Volume 5), London: Lawrence and Wishart, 1976.
- Newman, Saul (ed.), 2011, Max Stirner, London: Palgrave Macmillan.
- Paterson, R.W.K., 1971, The Nihilistic Egoist: Max Stirner, Oxford: Oxford University Press (for University of Hull Publications).
- Stepelevich, Lawrence S., 1978, “Max Stirner and Ludwig Feuerbach”, Journal of the History of Ideas, 39: 451–463.
- Stepelevich, Lawrence S., 1985, “Max Stirner as Hegelian”, Journal of the History of Ideas, 46: 597–614.
- Tucker, Benjamin R., 2002, Instead of a Book. By a Man Too Busy to Write One. A Fragmentary Exposition of Philosophical Anarchism, culled from the writings of Benj. R. Tucker, New York: Haskell House.
- Welsh, John F., 2010, Max Stirner's Dialectical Egoism: A New Interpretation, Lanham, MD: Lexington Books.
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- Max Stirner im LSR Projekte, maintained by Bernd A. Laska.