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Epistemological Problems of Memory
That most of our knowledge is in memory at any particular time is a given. What is perhaps surprising, however, is the degree to which even our current conscious knowledge typically depends on memory. For example, you look at the sky and come to believe that the sunset is beautiful. This is a newly formed belief about an event currently taking place. Nevertheless, its justification is no doubt dependent on other beliefs that you hold. For example, if you didn't at least tacitly believe that you were looking west or that it is evening and not morning, the belief wouldn't be justified (I assume that the phenomenology of sunsets and sunrises is indistinguishable). Now I am not, however, supposing that all knowledge of the external world is inferential. Your belief that the sky is red might well be epistemically basic. Nor am I insisting that your sunset belief is psychologically inferential. My only claim here is that many relatively simple beliefs we form about the external world typically depend for their justification on background beliefs; and background beliefs are memory beliefs.
Yet the matter of the epistemology of memory belief is important for its own sake as well. Virtually all of what we know (or are justified in believing) at any given time resides in memory. However, epistemology has been focussed almost exclusively, even if implicitly, on the epistemology of belief formation — of coming to believe a proposition. Yet it is not at all clear that the conditions necessary and sufficient for justifiably coming to believing a proposition are necessary and sufficient for justifiably maintaining it. So if we are to understand how we know the vast majority of what we know at any given time, we'll need an account of the epistemology of memory. This essay will focus on the issues that arise when one attempts to construct such a thing.
The nature of memory was hotly debated in the early modern period by British empiricists David Hume and John Locke, and by Scottish Common Sense Realist Thomas Reid. Our selective excursion into historical discussions will also include a consideration of Bertrand Russell's from The Analysis of Mind. We'll conclude our historical review with the briefest of surveys from the small literature of the second half of the last century.
With our limited survey completed, we'll next clarify the various ways that “memory belief” can be construed. This turns out to be a more complicated business than one might have thought. Having made a number of relevant distinctions and defined our terms, we'll at last be prepared to consider how different kinds of theories account for the justification of that which we remember. Finally, we'll have a look at the prospects for demonstrating the general reliability of memory.
- 1. The Metaphysics of Memory
- 2. Remembering
- 3. Memory Belief
- 4. The Justification of Memory Belief
- 5. The Reliability of Memory
- Other Internet Resources
- Related Entries
Memory makes possible knowledge of the past. But how it does this is far from clear. The theory that has the best claim to the “traditional view” label is the “Representational Theory of Memory” (or RTM).
When I recall my twenty-first birthday, I bring to mind something that is now in the past; I think of an event that is no longer occurring. Therefore, the friend of RTM reasons, I can't now be directly related my twenty-first birthday since there is not now an event that is my twenty-birthday. The direct or immediate object of a recollection must surely be something that exists at the time of the memorial event; one can't be directly aware of an entity that doesn't exist.
So what is it that one is immediately aware of in memory if not the past? As its name implies, the RTM answer is that one is aware of a representation of that past event. Recall some important event in your life — your twenty-first birthday, your bar mitzvah or confirmation, your wedding, etc. You recall such events by bringing to mind images. So you picture, say, a large cake with twenty-one candles sitting on a table around which sit your parents and siblings. You remember your twenty first birthday by recalling this image. So as with the representational theory of perception, the RTM claims that the object of your immediate awareness in memory is a representation or image, and that it is in virtue of your now having that image that you are now able to recall the event you are remembering.
A difficulty arises almost immediately. As the last sentence of the above paragraph suggests, other cognitive processes or faculties also make use of images or representations. Most obviously, perception and imagination depend crucially on the subject's having the appropriate imagery. What, then, makes a representation a memory image rather than a perceptual or imaginary representation?
In his Treatise on Human Nature, David Hume discusses this very question. No perceptual realist, Hume nevertheless went along with the representational component of representational realism. Like the other empiricists of his time, Hume believed that the immediate objects of cognition are representations. It was his view of the relation of these perceptions to sensible objects that distinguished the view of Hume from that of Locke (and from Berkeley's idealism).
Hume divided the representations that inhabit the mind into two types: impressions and ideas. Impressions are the basic building blocks of cognition. In contrast with ideas of memory and imagination, impressions come upon us with “force and liveliness.” Once we've had an impression, we often find that “it again makes its appearance there as an idea.” When this happens, the impression retains some of its vivacity and forcefulness, and “is somewhat intermediate betwixt an impression and an idea” [Hume, 1739, Bk 1, Part 1, Section 2], in which case it is a memory image. Should it lose its vivacity entirely, it is then a “perfect idea” and is of the imagination.
Hume, then, answers our question about the distinguishing characteristic of memory images by appealing to the relative vivacity and force of the image. Memory images are, by definition, fainter than impressions but more vivacious and forceful than images of imagination.
While there may be a certain surface plausibility to Hume's account of memory, its inadequacies quickly come to light. First, as Hume himself recognizes, there is nothing in principle to prevent an idea of memory from being decidedly faint and without force (just as ideas of imagination can be vivid and forceful). Hume can and does say that when memory ideas are faint, they are often not recognized as memory images, but are instead taken to be of the imagination. But this response confuses the issue. Our concern here, and the one that Hume is addressing in the relevant sections of the Treatise, is with the metaphysics of memory and not with its epistemology. So it doesn't matter that sometimes memory images may be mistaken for images of the imagination. For even in describing such a circumstance, one assumes that the fact of the matter is that the image in question is a memory image and that the subject has made a mistake in judging the image to be of imagination. We are trying to figure out the criteria according to which an image is of memory and not the conditions under which one can introspectively know that this.
Things don't get a lot better if we seek help from Hume's comrade in empiricism John Locke. In the first edition of An Essay Concerning Human Understanding, Locke describes memory as the “storehouse” of ideas, but he never offers an account of what distinguishes a memory idea from an idea of imagination. And while the storehouse metaphor remains in the second edition of the Essay, Locke nevertheless backs away from it dramatically. He argues that because ideas don't exist unperceived there is no significant sense in which the ideas of memory continue to exist when we are not thinking about them. Rather the mind has the power to “revive” ideas that we are said to remember. Be this as it may, although Locke is clearly a proponent of RTM, he does nothing to help us answer the question of what it is that distinguishes memory images from those of other kinds. We'll look at Locke's account a little more closely when we discuss Reid's criticisms of the RTM.
While one finds little help in our query from Hume (because his account is clearly flawed) or from Locke (he doesn't even appear to recognize the issue), there is another empiricist who is more helpful, viz., Bertrand Russell. In his The Analysis of Mind, Russell offers a distinctly RTM that clearly addresses the issue of what it is in virtue of which an image is a memory image. Here is a clear statement of his position as it involves a particular example:
Suppose you ask me what I ate for breakfast this morning…The process of remembering will consist of calling up images of my breakfast, which will come to me with a feeling of belief such as distinguishes memory-images from mere imagination-images…
Memory-images and imagination-images do not differ in their intrinsic qualities, so far as we can discover. They differ by the fact that the images that constitute memories, unlike those that constitute imagination, are accompanied by a feeling of belief which may be expressed in the words “this happened.” The mere occurrence of images, without this feeling of belief constitutes imagination; it is the element of belief that is distinctive in memory. [Russell 1921, pages 175-176]
Russell's concludes his account as follows:
Memory demands (a) an image, (b) a belief in the past existence…The believing is a specific feeling or sensation or complex of sensations, different from expectation or bare assent in a way that makes the belief refer to the past; the reference to the past lies in the belief-feeling, not in the content believed. [Russell 1921, page 186]
Hume's and Russell's accounts of memory are both versions of the RTM. They differ, however, in two important respects. First, Hume's account of memory sees the objects of memory as ideas. But Humean ideas are not essentially propositional. In fact, a propositional representation will have to be constructed from two or more ideas. So inasmuch as we are interested in an account of memory belief, which is essentially propositional, we'll have to look elsewhere. On the other hand, the “images” that are the primary component of Russell's view surely have propositional content. Russell's second important point of departure from Hume concerns that which is distinctive of memory representations. On Hume's account, memory images are distinguished by an intrinsic property; memory images are more vivid and forceful than images of imagination and less vivid and forceful than impressions. Pace Hume, Russell takes the distinguishing feature of memory images to be relational: an image is a memory image if it is associated with a certain feeling or belief to the effect that the content of that image refers to an event in the past.
One major advantage of Russell's view over Hume's is that Russell's is decidedly more economical. For any event that one perceives, remembers, and imagines, one will need three distinct images each with the appropriate level of vivacity and forcefulness. Russell's view, in contrast, sees the difference between the different mental types as coming in the relation to the same representation. Russell's view, or something like it, has become standard in contemporary philosophy of mind: the difference between the thought that p, the desire that p, and the belief that p is taken to be found not in the representation itself but in the relationship one bears to the representation. In this way, the same thing can be the object of belief, thought, desire, and any other propositional attitude.
The most severe critic of the RTM was Scottish philosopher Thomas Reid, a contemporary Locke and Hume. I'll close this section of this essay by looking at Reid's critique of Locke and Hume. This will provide us with a natural transition to the next section on the Direct Theory of Memory, the chief proponent of which is none other than Reid himself.
Reid begins his attack on the RTM by quoting Locke's concession that the metaphor of the mind as a repository of ideas is not to be taken strictly. For on the standard Early Modern view, an idea is necessarily consciously perceived. Stored ideas of which one is not currently aware are not possible; a non-conscious idea is an unperceived idea and hence an impossibility. So Locke notes that to say that the mind is a storehouse of ideas is only to say that the mind has:
the power, in many cases, to revive perceptions which it once had, with this additional perception annexed to them, that it has had them before; and in this sense it is, that our ideas are said to be in our memories, when indeed they are actually no where. [Locke 1690, Bk II, Chapter 10]
Reid notes that Locke's view here seems to be that no-longer existent ideas are “revived” or brought back from the purely metaphorical storehouse. But as Locke himself acknowledges elsewhere in the Essay, no object can have two beginnings of existence — that is, it cannot come into existence at two distinct times. So there is no serious sense in which an old idea is revived. What Locke must be committed to, then, is not the mind's ability to resurrect nonexistent ideas but its power to produce new ideas that are similar in certain respects to ideas it has had before. So Locke must be read as saying that when we remember, our minds produce ideas that we recognize as similar to ideas we have had before. Of course, we might take these ideas of memory to be the very same token ideas we previously had, but this is just a pre-reflective opinion that we can see on reflection is not quite right.
But even this somewhat sympathetic reading of Locke creates problems. For Locke's view entails not just that the mind has the power to produce these ideas but also that we have the ability (at least much of the time) to recognize these ideas as ones (or like ones) we've seen before. Yet this ability would seem to itself presuppose memory. As Reid says, this recognition (that this idea has been seen before) “supposes a remembrance of those we had before, otherwise the similitude or identity could not be perceived” [Reid 1785, Essay III, Chapter VII]. Far from illuminating the nature of memory, then, Locke's version of the RTM merely presupposes what it sets out to explain.
Yet even if this serious difficulty is resolved or ignored, there are other problems lurking nearby. For, Reid argues, Locke's RTM does not provide a sufficient condition for having a memory. I'll let Reid speak for himself:
Every man knows what memory is, and has a distinct notion of it: but when Mr. Locke speaks of a power to revive in the mind those ideas, which, after imprinting have disappeared, or have been, as it were, laid out of sight, one would hardly know this to be memory, if he had not told us. There are other things which it seems to resemble at least as much. I see before me the picture of a friend. I shut my eyes, or turn them another way; and the picture disappears, or is, as it were laid out of sight. I have a power to turn my eyes again toward the picture, and immediately the perception is revived. But is this memory? No, surely; yet it answers the definition as well as memory itself can do. [Reid 1785, Essay III, Chapter VII]
Lest I give the impression that Reid picks only on Locke, I should note with due haste that he also has little patience with Hume's account of memory. Recall that Hume's theory is that a memory is an idea that is less vivid and forceful than an impression but more vivid and forceful than an idea of imagination. Always the attentive reader, Reid quotes the passage from Hume's Treatise of Human Nature in which Hume offers his initial characterization of memory. At the beginning of Book I, Part I, Section III of the Treatise, Hume writes “We find by experience when any impression has been present with the mind, it again makes its appearance as an idea; and this it may do after two different ways,” one of which is by memory. Reid asks what Hume could mean by experience in the quoted sentence. Reid can think of only one plausible answer: memory. So while Hume offers us a deflationary account of memory according to which to remember something is merely to have an idea that is midway between an impression and an idea of imagination, he helps himself in forming the account to experience which, Reid argues, turns out to require the robust memory of common sense. Reid says,
According to vulgar apprehension, memory is an immediate knowledge of something past. Our author [i.e., Hume] does not admit that there is any such knowledge in the human mind. He maintains that memory is nothing but a present idea or impression. But, in defining what he takes memory to be, he takes for granted that kind of memory which he rejects. For can we find by experience, that an impression, after its first appearance to the mind, makes a second, and a third, with different degrees of strength and vivacity, if we have not so distinct a remembrance of its first appearance, as enables us to know it, upon its second and third, notwithstanding that, in the interval, it has undergone a very considerable change.
All experience supposes memory; and there can be no such thing as experience, without trusting to our own memory or that of others; so that it appears from Mr. Hume's account of this matter, that he found himself to have that kind of memory, which he acknowledges and defines, by exercising that kind which he rejects. [Reid 1785, Essay III, Chapter VII]
So Reid thinks that Hume is illegitimately smuggling in a more standard understanding both of what memory is and of the knowledge it provides in giving his deflationary account. But it gets worse. Hume's theory does no better than Locke's in offering a sufficient condition for memory. First, as Locke and Reid have previously noted, it isn't literally true that the ideas of memory are the same ideas that were experienced before; when we cease to be conscious of the original ideas, they cease to exist. So memory must be nothing but “the faculty of making a weak impression…after a corresponding strong one.” But to this, Reid offers the following counterexample:
Suppose a man strikes his head smartly against the wall, this is an impression; now he has a faculty by which he can repeat this impression with less force, so as not to hurt him; this, by Mr. Hume's account, must be memory. [Reid 1785, Essay III, Chapter VII]
Reid's point is that Hume's account of memory entails that the person who is able to both bring about an impression and then, sometime later, a somewhat less forceful impression or idea (say, by literally hitting his head against a wall, once hard enough to really hurt, once not so hard), thereby remembers the first. But surely such head banging is not remembering.
Reid offers one further criticism of the RTM. He notes the structural similarity between the RTM and the representational theory of perception. He claims that Hume followed the logic of the view that the only objects that are truly given in perception are ideas, that all we ever experience are representations, to its natural conclusion: all we can have knowledge of are our ideas. If there is any single lesson taught by the history of epistemology, it is that there are no successful arguments that have only premises about the contents of our ideas and which conclude with propositions about physical objects. The so-called Theory of Ideas in the realm of sense perception brings with it skepticism about the physical world.
Reid argues that for exactly similar reasons, the RTM leads to skepticism about the past. If we begin with the thesis that in memory all that one is aware of are ideas, then in order to justify beliefs about the past one will have to provide an argument with premises about our present ideas and a conclusion that the past is how we remember it. But there is no more reason to think that such an argument will be forthcoming than there is for thinking that on the basis of our ideas of sense we can show that the world is as we suppose it to be.
In sum, then, Reid argues that the both Lockean and Humean versions of RTM fail because (a) they presuppose a more robust variety of memory than they can allow for, (b) they fail to shed light on the nature of memory because of (a), (c) the accounts they do offer are satisfied by many things that aren't memory, and (d) finally, they lead to skepticism about the past. Each of these points is well-taken and taken together seem more than adequate reason for rejecting Locke's and Hume's accounts of memory.
But what about Russell's view? Do Reid's objections hit the mark there too? It would seem that they do. As we have seen, Russell's view is that remembering involves the having of an image together with a “belief-feeling” that what the image depicts is in the past. On the assumption that we are at least generally reliable regarding which images we have previously experienced (that is, on the assumption that we don't have these memory feelings willy nilly), Russell's theory includes an unanalyzed component that includes the substance of memory. Furthermore, Russell's theory is consistent with one's being mistaken about the pastness of the image. That is, images that are the products of imagination but which have a misleading air of familiarity to them, will count as memories on Russell's view as long as they are associated with a belief feeling. Finally, inasmuch as the RTM theories of Locke and Hume can be fairly charged with aiding and abetting the skeptic, Russell's theory is guilty of the same. To remember is to have an image and a belief feeling; demonstrating a reliable connection between these two and the past event one is said to be remembering looks to be just another instance of arguing from the current contents of one's mind to the truth of claims about the external world (in this case, about the way the external world was).
Thomas Reid's view of memory is worth discussing if only because it provides a clear contrast to the view of the Locke, Hume, Russsell, and the whole RTM.
Reid was not only a critic of the RTM but of the whole “Theory of Ideas” on which it was based. Thus, he was just as opposed to the representative theory of perception as he was to the RTM. In contrast to the RTM and to representative theories in general, Reid held to a theory of memory that I'll call the Direct Theory of Memory (the DTM). On Reid's view, memory is immediate in the same way that perception is immediate. My, say, seeing the table is immediate if and only if there is no other object O such that it is in virtue of my seeing O that I see the table. The Representative Theory of Perception holds that our perception of the world is always mediated by the perception of our ideas of sense or, in Hume's vocabulary, our impressions. These ideas and impressions, these representations, mediate our knowledge of the world, if knowledge of the world there be.
Reid believed that there was no reason to posit ideas that we perceive immediately. This is not to say, of course, that our perception of the world lacks an experiential component but only to deny that it is in virtue of perceiving that element that we perceive the world. Reid thought that just as representationalism for perception was flawed, so was the RTM. When I remember having corn flakes for breakfast, Reid argues, it isn't in virtue of my now remembering an image of a bowl of cereal that I now remember my breakfast. Rather, my remembering breakfast is a direct apprehension of the past. Of course, there is an experiential element to my memory, but that doesn't begin to show that I only remember breakfast in virtue of “remembering” the mental image. To get from the experience to the representative theory requires two steps: a reification of the experience into an idea or image and the epistemic claim that my knowing that I had cornflakes for breakfast is mediated by my knowledge of that idea or image.
What, then, is memory on Reid's view? According to Reid, memory is a faculty by which we:
…have an immediate knowledge of things past. The senses give us information of things only as they exist in the present moment; and this information, if it were not preserved by memory, would vanish instantly, and leave us as ignorant as if it had never been…
The object of memory…must be something that is past…What now is, cannot be an object of memory; neither can that which is past and gone be an object of perception or of consciousness.
Memory is always accompanied with the belief of that which we remember, as perception is accompanied with the belief that that which we perceive… [Reid 1785, Essay III, Chapter I]
So Reid's account of memory is “direct” in that he insists that we have “immediate knowledge of things past.” A remembrance is an act of the mind and it is in virtue of this act that we have knowledge of the past. So Reid flatly rejects what some have claimed to be a datum: when one is remembering what one is remembering must be present at the time of the remembering. Indeed, not only does Reid reject this principle, but he accepts its contrary: when one is remembering what one is remembering must not be present when one is remembering, but must be in the past instead.
Does Reid's view carry with it any absurdity? It has seemed to some that it does. How, it might be asked, can something be remembered and hence be present before the mind while at the same time not in the present but in the past? Isn't that like saying that is it possible to perceive objects that don't exist? Reid would allow that nothing could be both present before the mind and at the same time past but insist that his theory entails no such consequence. Reid claims that while, necessarily, the object of memory is in the past at the time it is remembered, nevertheless “the remembrance of it is a particular act of the mind which now exists, and of which we are conscious.” [Reid 1785, Essay III, Section I] That is, when one remembers p, the act of remembering is what is present (or better “occurring”) although p is not. We are currently aware of our act of remembering but the object of the act is in the past.
So far, so good. But what exactly is the cognitive act of remembering? And what distinguishes it from other mental events? If we are looking for full-blown analysis of memory from Reid, we're going to be disappointed. Although Reid points to certain characteristics of memory (i.e., that the object must be in the past, that it provides immediate knowledge, that the thing remembered is distinct from the remembrance of it, etc), he seems to hold that it is in the end unanalyzable. He writes:
The knowledge which I have of things past, by my memory, seems to me as unaccountable as an immediate knowledge would be of things to come: and I can give no reason why I should have the one and not the other, but that such is the will of my Maker. I find in my mind a distinct conception, and a firm belief of a series of past events; but how this is produced I know not. I call it memory, but this is only giving a name to it; it is not an account of its cause. [Reid 1785, Essay III, Section I]
His claim that memory is “unaccountable” could be understood in at least two different ways. He might mean only that he doesn't have an account of the actual workings of the faculty, that he lacks a psychological theory of the operation of the mechanism by which we remember. Yet this would not be a reason for thinking that memory is “unaccountable,” but only “presently unaccounted for”. So the most plausible interpretation is that memory is unanalyzable. Reid's insistence that memory cannot be accounted for via a relationship to an image, but that it is instead an immediate knowledge of the past would seem to support the unanalyzablity reading. To call memory “unanalyzable” in the sense Reid has in mind is to say that it cannot be analyzed or reduced to component parts, at least not over and above its characterization as direct knowledge of the past.
When looking for problems with the DTM a good place to start is by recalling the problems that face a Direct Theory of Perception. The most obvious and possibly most serious problem for the DTP is the problem of error. If perceiving X as F is nothing more than having a direct awareness of X's being F, then how is it that we are often wrong in our perceptual beliefs? To allow for the possibility of error, it seems that an account must provide space for things to go wrong. Similarly, the DTM tells us simply that memory provides us with immediate knowledge of the past. But it doesn't seem that it always does that; after all, memory is fallible. This “problem,” though, might not bother Reid who claims that when memory is “distinct and determinate” and when the mind is sound, then what is believed is “no less certain than if it was grounded on demonstration” [Reid 1785, Essay III, Section I]. Reid also claims, when considering a case of his remembering something from earlier in the day, “It is impossible that this act [of remembrance] should be, if the event [i.e., the event remembered] did not happen” [Reid 1785, Essay III, Section II]. So Reid might welcome the result that the DTM apparently entails the infallibility of memory (at least where what it remembered is distinct and the mind is in good working order). But whether Reid acknowledges it or not, it surely it a problem. Even clear and distinct “memories” in those who suffer from no psychological disorder can turn out to be false.
The twentieth century saw rather little work on the epistemology of memory. We've already seen that Russell continued and improved upon the RTM tradition of the empiricists. Inasmuch as memory was discussed in the epistemological literature in the middle of the last century, the issue of concern was the nature of remembering, or more precisely, the nature of “remembering.” What is the proper analysis of “S remembers P at t”?
As we have seen, there was a tradition going back to Locke and Hume according to which having a memory of an event required having a belief that the event occurred. In their classic essay “Remembering,” C.B. Martin and Max Deustscher read Locke (and others) as claiming that the belief condition is necessary for S's remembering. In defense of Locke, it can be argued that he was interested in giving an account of what it is that makes a belief a memory belief; if that is correct, then the belief condition surely is unobjectionable.
Martin and Deutscher offer a compelling reason for thinking that belief is not necessary for S to remember something. They give an example of a painter who believes that the scene he is painting derives from his imagination rather than from his memory. Yet it turns out that the mental image guiding his work is the product of his experience at a farm when he was very young. So he remembers, say, the horse galloping across the meadow, although, believing that this is the product of his imagination, he does not believe that what he is depicting is an actual event. Yet so long as the image is causally connected with his past experience in the right way, the painter will be remembering the horse even though he doesn't believe that there was such a horse in such a meadow.
The Martin and Deutscher account of remembering is essentially this: S remembers (that) X iff X, S has observed (that) X in the past, S's current representation of X is appropriately causally related to S's earlier experience of (that) X via a memory trace. It is not enough that S's current state be simply “causally dependent” on S's earlier state since there are deviant causal chain examples in which this condition is satisfied without their being instances of memory. For instance, suppose Jones has an altercation with Smith that he then describes to Johnson. Five years later, Jones has irretrievably forgotten about his disagreement with Smith but Johnson, who possesses a much better memory, remembers what Jones told him five years ago, and tells Jones everything he remembers about the incident. Now Jones has a representation that is causally dependent upon his earlier representation of his altercation with Smith, but Jones still doesn't remember the relevant interaction with Smith. It should be noted that Martin and Deutscher have a fair amount to say about what the appropriate causal relation is (indeed, that phrase doesn't appear in their article), but their discussion is too long and complicated to reproduce here.
The analysis of remembering that Martin and Deutscher offered was not particularly in the spirit of the times. More common was the view of Norman Malcolm, who explicitly eschewed a causal condition because he thought that if one were included, it would follow that anytime someone remembered something, she would have to have beliefs about the neurophysiology of memory. (Martin and Deutscher correctly point out that the claim that the concept of “remembering” includes a causal component has no such implication.) The non-causal accounts of Malcolm, Gilbert Ryle, and R.F. Holland tend to require only previous experience and a lack of a current, independent source of information about the event, perhaps (as in the case of Malcolm) with the additional claim of the following counterfactual dependence: without the previous experience the subject would not be having the current representation. Again, Martin and Deutscher put their collective finger on a problem with such accounts. One might have the relevant experience, lack a current source and still not be remembering. For example, it might turn out that the current apparent memory is causally unrelated to the original source. Even if we add Malcom's counterfactual component to the account, there can still be cases in which a person has the current present experience only because of the earlier experience, but the chain that leads from the earlier experience to the present is not of the right sort for memory.
No matter what exactly the facts about the metaphysics of memory and the analysis of remembering are, we will need a more precise characterization of the notion of a memory belief before we can proceed. To begin with, it will be useful to see what memory is not. First, it is tempting to think that memory is knowledge of the past. But this definition is doubly problematic. Although everyone but the skeptic thinks that there is memory knowledge, it is universally agreed upon that not every belief in memory is an instance of knowledge. There is remembered false belief. The second reason that memory can't be defined as knowledge of the past is that one can remember an event that has yet to take place or at least an event that is temporally present. I might recall now that I have a doctor's appointment in two hours. One might take this to be memory of a future event. However, it can be reasonably argued that this is only a recollection of the fact that I currently have an appointment to see the doctor at a future time.
The fact that one can have a memory belief about the future (or at least about the present) might be easier to see once another distinction has been made. I have a memory belief that the Japanese attacked Pearl Harbor on December 7th 1941, but there is a perfectly straightforward sense of ‘remember’ in which I can't be said to remember the attack. Some philosophers want to make this distinction by saying that although I can remember that Pearl Harbor was attacked on that date, I can't remember the event itself. To have the relevant sort of memory of the event (as opposed to only remembering a proposition about the event), I have to have experienced it myself. Exactly what the “experience” requirement comes to is not entirely clear. Although no one born after the event can truly be said to remember it in this sense, it isn't obvious that one had to be at Pearl Harbor on that date to have this kind of memory. Hearing about it on the radio that evening is arguably sufficient for having remembering the event. Let's mark the distinction of this paragraph by calling the former ‘propositional memory’ and the latter ‘event memory.’ The objects of propositional memory are propositions; the objects of event memory are events. My memory that the cake at the party was chocolate is propositional; my memory of the party is an event memory. While one can't have event memory of a future event, one might have propositional memory of a proposition that refers to an event that has yet to happen; one can remember that an event will take place.
Although it is clear that this distinction is real and significant, I don't propose to have too much more to say about it here. Since epistemology is primarily the study of knowledge and rational belief, and since knowledge and belief are propositional in nature, we'll here limit our focus to propositional memory.
The question now is whether there is any important, structural difference between propositional memory that begins as event memory of the event that the proposition is about and propositional memory that doesn't significantly involve event memory. For example, my memory that my driveway was icy last Christmas is propositional, yet it is based on my experience of the event in question. My memory belief that Abraham Lincoln was shot in Ford's Theatre is not based on any such event (although, of course, for virtually any non-innate belief, there will be some event that leads to its formation).
There can be cases of propositional memory that are not based on event memory even when the memory is due to one's experience of the event in question. Last Christmas, I came to believe that my driveway was then icy; that's why I parked on the street. My belief that my driveway was icy was formed on the basis of my perceiving the ice. But now that I recall the condition of my driveway, I don't base my belief on my event memory of the icy driveway. I just remember that my driveway was icy. On the other hand, there are cases where one does recall an event and form a new belief on the basis of a memory image. For example, if I were asked whether the ice on my driveway last Christmas was uniform, I might well call to mind a memory image of the driveway and see if it contains that information. In this case, it seems, I am using event memory (i.e., memory of my seeing the driveway) to form a belief about the uniformity of the thickness of the ice. There is a real sense, then, in which the belief that the ice's thickness was (say) uniform is not a memory belief in at least one legitimate sense of that term. There is surely a suitable way of thinking of memory beliefs that stipulates that only beliefs that have been formed at a prior time count as memory beliefs.
So there are myriad philosophical and even epistemological issues that memory raises. To keep this discussion manageable, we will have to narrow our focus a bit. First, we will be concerned in what follows only with the epistemology of memory beliefs. But as we've seen, there are a number of things that ‘memory belief’ might designate. So to make the domain of our discussion precise, we'll have to give it a stipulative (and hence somewhat artificial) definition. Let the following be our working definition of memory belief:
S has a memory belief that p at t2 iff
- there is a time prior to t2, t1, when S believed that p,
- S has believed P during the interval between t1 and t2,
- S's belief that p between t1 and t2 is at least sometimes only dispositional (i.e., nonoccurrent), and
- S's believing that p at t2 is causally related to S's believing that p at t1 in an appropriate way.
This definition requires some explanation. Clause (a) distinguishes memory belief from beliefs newly formed on the basis of a memory image. If one has never before believed p, then S can't now have a memory belief that p, although one might now form a belief for the first time on the basis of an event memory. Clause (b) is necessary to distinguish cases in which one believes that P at one time, completely and utterly forgets P, and then relearns P from an independent source. Clause (c) requires that the belief not be occurrent all the time from the time it was formed until the time at which we are calling it a memory belief. I'm not certain this restriction is required, but I think having it rules out certain complicating factors. For example, if I believe that P and hold it in occurrent, working memory for one minute, say, shall we now count it as a memory belief? What if I hold it in memory for ten seconds? Two seconds? If we require that a belief must have been nonoccurrent (while still continuing to exist) for a time before it's now counting as a memory belief, we don't have to deal with these issues, which are anyway not central to our concerns. One other important note here: I have required that it be the “same belief” that is at one time occurrent, then dispositional, and then occurent again. This is not the requirement that it be the same token belief all along, but only a belief with the same content that, after its first appearance, is appropriately causally related to earlier tokens of that person's having that belief with that content. When I believe that my car is locked because I just checked the doors, and later recall that my car is locked, it might be that my later belief is not token identical with the earlier belief. On the other hand, I don't want to insist that it is not the same token. I shall be leaving this issue open.
Another issue that needs discussing here is whether ‘S has the memory belief that P at t’ includes only beliefs that are occurrent at t. Or do we mean to be including in the domain of our discussion beliefs that are at the time dispositional? This is an important question because if we mean to be including nonoccurrent beliefs then our domain is a great deal larger than it would otherwise be.
There is good reason to be inclusive here. At any given time, nearly all a person's beliefs are dispositional. A good epistemological theory will then have to say something about the epistemic status of these beliefs. So our definition of memory belief should not be limited to the exceedingly small class of occurrent memory beliefs. Perhaps the epistemologist will need to have something special to say about occurrent memory beliefs, but our main topic will be more general than that.
Having carefully circumscribed the domain of our inquiry, we are now in a position to consider how memory belief gets its justification. This is not the place to argue for any particular theory, so we'll canvas the theoretical means that different types of theories have for avoiding skepticism about memorial belief. In this section, we will discuss foundationalism, coherentism, deontological theories, and reliabilism as well as the relevance of internalist and externalist considerations for the justification of memory belief.
Perhaps the most common theory of the justification of memory belief is a variety of foundationalism. We can distinguish between two types of foundational theories of the justification of memory belief: simple foundationalism holds that every memory belief, just in virtue of being a memory belief, is prima facie justified. Memory is not merely a repository for belief but a generation mechanism for justification (see Audi 1998 pp. 68-69).
In contrast to this is what we might call “experiential foundationalism.” The experiential foundationalist requires that a memory belief be accompanied by an image or at least an experiential “memory seeming” in order to be justified. In demanding that memory requires an image, such a view ipso facto implies that the justification of memory belief requires the having of an experience of a certain type if the memory is to be justified. (For a critical discussion of both varieties of foundationalism see Senor 1993. For a somewhat sympathteic treatment see Huemer 1999 and for a defense of memory foundationalism see Schroer 2008.)
How plausible this variety of foundationalism is will depend on the variety of epistemic justification it is concerned with. For example, if one is committed to a strong truth-connection and thinks that a belief that is justified must be in some significant sense likely to be true, then adopting either of the above versions of foundationalism is out of the question. For there is no necessary connection between a belief's being stored and recalled (with or without a memorial seeming) and its being likely to be true. This isn't to say that memory is not generally reliable. But its reliability is at best conditional: miracles aside, an agent's recalled beliefs will be likely to be true only if her belief-forming (as opposed to preserving) processes are generally reliable. So the simple foundationalist will see herself as giving conditions for an internalistic variety of justification that minimizes the connection between a belief's being justified and its being true.
One difficulty that experiential foundationalism faces is that it accounts only for the justificatory status of occurrent memory beliefs. But as was argued above, this leaves almost all of our beliefs either unjustified (since the foundationalist might be read as claiming that a memory belief is justified only if it is occurrent) or epistemically unaccounted for (since, as is more likely, the foundationalist will see herself only providing conditions for the justification of occurrent memory beliefs). This problem might be thought resolved by appealing to counterfactuals or dispositions. That is, a stored belief might be thought to be prima facie justified iff were this belief to become occurrent, it would be would be accompanied by the appropriate memory image or seeming. Yet this condition is pretty clearly false. The phenomenology of recollection depends crucially on the context in which the belief is recalled. Typically, the experience one has when one recalls a belief depends at least on how the recollection was cued, how much attention one is currently paying to the recalled belief, and what other beliefs are then occurrent.
For reasons that will presently become apparent, we will consider the problems of simple foundationalism when we discuss negative coherentism.
We can divide coherentist theories into two types: positive and negative. The positive coherentist will claim that a memory belief is justified if it possesses a sufficiently strong coherence relation with one's system of belief. This is “positive” coherence because such coherence demands more than an absence of doxastic conflict. For a belief to positively cohere it must in some way be supported or made probable by the doxastic system with which it coheres. (BonJour 1985 never discusses the epistemology of memory in particular, but the view he presents there entails a positive coherentist account; and in BonJour 2002, pp. 183-184, he gives a positive coherentist account of memory justification and explicitly rejects the foundationalism he accepts in other epistemic domains.) The negative coherentist, on the other hand, will insist only that there be an absence of conflict with the belief system in order for the memory belief to be justified. In effect, the negative coherence theory and the simple version of foundationalism are just the same: each claims that in the absence of defeat, memory beliefs are justified. (For a defense of negative coherentism see Harman 1986 and McGrath 2007; for a critical discussion see Senor 1995.)
Both varieties of the coherence theory can be understood in a way that allows them to avoid the problem we noted for experiential foundationalism: each can be taken as a theory of justification for memory beliefs, both dispositional and occurrent (and since negative coherentism and simple foundationalism are essentially the same theory, we will consider simple foundationalism here as well). Taken as global theories of the justification of memory belief, they claim that any stored belief is prima facie justified. Yet there other problems that infect both theories. The primary problem for positive coherence theories is what has been dubbed the “problem of forgotten evidence.” A belief might positively cohere with the subject's belief system at the time the belief was formed but later fail to positively cohere even though it intuitively remains justified. One might have once had a web beliefs about American history with which the belief that Lincoln was assassinated in Ford Theatre neatly cohered. Yet years after having had one's last history class, this belief might remain while much of the imbedding web was disappeared. Yet, intuitively, it is still justified. The coherentist might hope to reply to this problem by claiming that there is still a justificatory web: the belief is a memory belief and one might believe that most of one's memory beliefs are true; therefore, this belief is likely to be true and is hence justified. The problem with this response is that it works for just any memory belief; if this gambit is allowed, then every memory belief will be prima facie justified. That is, accepting this solution to the problem of forgotten evidence amounts to trading in positive coherence theory for its negative sister.
A problem for negative coherentism (and hence for simple foundationalism) is that a belief that is unjustified when formed will become justified simply in virtue of being stored in memory. Suppose that I come to believe, unreliably and for no reason at all, that President Kennedy loved green tea. My belief is unjustified when I form it. But when I come to have it and it becomes a memory belief, the conditions of its justification are now wholly different. As long as I have no defeaters for my memory belief, the negative coherentist tells us, it is justified. So the next day, when I believe that Kennedy loved green tea, my belief will be justified (since I possess no defeater for it). And while it isn't quite as acute, the problem exists also for the other versions of foundationalism and coherentism. Take experiential foundationalism first; suppose it seems to me that I remember reading that Kennedy loved green tea but that in fact I've never read any such thing and that any historical belief I possess comes with a strong conviction (a “memory seeming”) that I acquired the belief by reading it in a very reputable publication. Then again, my forming the belief unjustifiably together with my epistemic vice of always believing that my history beliefs come from “very reputable” sources together turn an unjustified belief into a justified one. But this seems to be the epistemic equivalent of two wrongs making a right. Notice that the same kind of case will show a similar difficulty for positive coherentism. For a person who thinks his every history belief comes from a very reputable source and who believes that he has a given history belief, will have a system with which his belief that Kennedy loved green tea coheres.
The Kennedy case might be thought to indicate that foundationalist and coherentist accounts of the justification of memory belief share a common flaw: they are both (at least as typically construed) synchronic rather than diachronic theories. They make the justificatory status of a memory a belief purely a function of the current, internal state of the person at the time in question. Put somewhat differently, the only properties relevant to the justification of my belief are my current, non-historical properties. But, arguably, what the Kennedy case shows is that, in at least some circumstances, whether a memory belief is justified now is partially dependent on whether it was justified earlier.
One might think that even if some forms of internalism are thereby shown to require a diachronic component, a deontological internalism — a theory of justification that emphasizes epistemic duty and responsibility — will surely be synchronic. What matters for duty fulfillment is that you are now doing the best you can and not that you did the best you could when you initially formed the belief. So, the synchronic holdout continues, if you now sincerely believe that Kennedy was partial to green tea, and you also believe that this belief was generated from a very reputable source, then you are doing your best and surely must be deemed deontologically justified in your memory belief.
This consideration shows one can describe a concept of deontological justification according to which only synchronic considerations matter. Its theoretical use will be akin to the use of the parallel synchronic notion of ethical duty fulfillment and responsibility. Suppose I owe you a hundred dollars and am in a position to repay you. But instead of doing paying my debt, I spend my money frivolously and become once again broke. Looked at synchronically, my present inability to pay apparently makes my failing to pay excusable. I can't give you what I don't have, and if ‘ought’ implies ‘can,’ then it's not the case that I ought to pay you. I daresay that you won't be impressed by this line of defense, should I be foolish enough to use it. This shows that synchronic deontological concepts are dubious philosophical significance. So there is no significant refuge for the synchronic theory of the justification of memory belief in deontologism.
If internalism in its various guises fails to generate an adequate account of the justification of memory belief, then we should consider externalism. Since reliabilism is the most plausible and popular externalism theory, we'll do well to put our focus there. Loosely, reliabilism claims that a belief is justified if it is the product of a reliable belief-forming process. Perhaps, then, we should say that a memory belief is justified if it is a product of a reliable memory process. As long as we are thinking of reliability as propensity to generate truth rather than as a measure of the track-record of a process, then a process's being reliable is a synchronic property of that process. So will the reliabilist believe that the justificatory status of a belief earlier is irrelevant to its status as a memory belief? No, she won't. The reliabilist will think of memory as what Alvin Goldman has called a “belief-dependent process” (Goldman 1979). The input of the belief-dependent process is a belief. Memory belief is (normally, at any rate) belief that has been kept in memory. So a reliabilist will hold that a memory belief is justified only if the memorial process that maintains it is reliable and if it was justified when originally formed. To hold otherwise would be very much out of keeping with the spirit of reliabilism.
The lesson, the reliabilist will tell us, is that the justificatory status of a memory belief is, in standard cases, partially a function of the belief's justificatory status at an earlier time. I say “in standard cases” because it is possible, of course, for one to acquire new information that will turn a formerly unjustified belief into a now justified memory belief. But in the majority of cases, when the memory belief is not accompanied by new information, one will be justified now only if one was justified at an earlier time. This consequence of the theory is plausible because memory is generally a belief-preserving rather than a belief-generating process. Unlike perception, which takes nondoxastic inputs and produces beliefs, memory aims at preservation. Thus it is natural that the epistemology of the former depends only on the conditions at the time of the operation of the process, while the justification of the latter sort of belief makes demands on its history. What both have in common is that the pedigree of the belief is relevant to its epistemic status; the pedigree of memory belief is just a more complicated and historically robust affair.
Although reliabilism might seem to be particularly suited to accounting for the diachronic aspects of the justification of memory belief, other theories we've looked at are able to accommodate the historical point too. Exactly how these diachronic components figure into a full-blown theory of the justification of memory belief is a complex and controversial matter. This is not the place to arbitrate between competing epistemic perspectives. Suffice it to say that the kinds of general problems we've seen in standard theories of justified memory belief can apparently be handled within the theoretical means available to foundationalist and coherentist epistemologies. Each theory can be amended, for instance, to simply require that when the memory belief has not come to be based on new information it will be now justified only if it was justified when the belief was initially formed, where the conditions of initial justifications are those that theory spells out.
The claim that there is a key diachronic element to the justification of memory belief has come to be known as preservationism. Memory, it is thought, serves to preserve both the belief and its justification; a belief that had no justification when it was formed, has no justification to be preserved. According to the preservationist, then, such a belief will be unjustified when recalled (and, for that matter, while in memory). (Preservationist accounts can be found in Audi 1995, Audi 1998, Dummett 1994, Goldman 1999, and Plantinga 1993.)
Although the preservationist can allow that memory generates justification when it also generates a new belief (recall the example of my using my event memory of the ice on my driveway to form the new belief that the ice on my driveway was of uniform thickness), she'll insist that when memory acts only to preserve belief, it is not an epistemically generative process. However, the claim that memory is not generative has recently come under attack. Jennifer Lackey has presented cases in which, at t1, S has a prima facie justified but defeated belief that P but over time comes to lose the defeater and hence at t2 has an ultima facie justified belief that P. That is to say, at t1 the belief is unjustified but at t2 the belief is justified even though S has acquired no new evidence regarding P. So, it is argued, memory can generate epistemic justification. (For discussion of these cases see Lackey 2005, Senor 2007, and Lackey 2007.)
We'll conclude our discussion of the epistemology of memory with a brief consideration of an issue absolutely fundamental to the whole enterprise. Epistemologists of all stripes will agree that the reliability of memory is crucial if there is to be memory knowledge. And while space prohibits a long exploration into this matter, we will be able to make some important points about the likelihood of successfully showing the reliability of memory.
There is little doubt that within certain parameters, there can be evidence of the reliability of memory, and of its reliability in particular situations and among particular groups. Cognitive psychologists can test people's memory for associated word pairs, and determine under what conditions forgetting is more likely to occur. Such studies are not only intrinsically interesting (in part because we depend on memory for so much) but potentially very useful in helping us to know what to do to increase our ability to recall information when it is needed. But as interesting and useful as such empirical studies are, there is reason to doubt their ability ever to show the general reliability of memory.
To see this, suppose Sid is a cognitive psychologist running experiments in which subjects hear word pairs and an hour later are given the first word of each pair as a cue and are asked to remember the second word. Sid collects his data with the utmost care, and holds to the highest standards of data collection and interpretation. Suppose Sid does many such studies and concludes that his studies show that in conditions C, memory for words that have been paired with words that are used as cues is generally reliable. Finally, suppose that given his general assumptions, Sid is right in claiming that his research indicates general reliability. Still, in conducting his research as he does, Sid depends on the general reliability of his own memory at many turns. For example, in setting up the experiment, Sid draws on his memory of the principles for conducting his research; in cuing the subjects and collecting the data of their responses, he depends on his memory for believing that this group of people is the same group of people to whom the lists were originally read; collecting the data from the each person, Sid remembers not just that this person is in the group, but also which person in the group this is, so that the data can be accurately recorded; finally, in drawing out the conclusions from his research, Sid must, at the very least, keep in mind the procedures of the study, the summaries of the empirical data, and the principles guiding inductive inferences.
The problem here is perfectly general. In order to construct an argument for anything that is not a simple syllogism (and perhaps even then), one must depend on the reliability of one's memory for the earlier steps and for their justifications. Therefore, if one wants to construct anything other than the simplest of arguments for the reliability of memory, one will have to depend on the reliability of memory. This means that any such argument is infected with a kind of circularity: one will be able to construct such an argument only by depending on the reliability of memory. Of course, the inability to construct a noncircular argument for memory does not tend to show that memory is unreliable. William Alston (Alston 1986) has argued convincingly that all of the basic epistemic processes share this common trait: their reliability cannot be shown without circularity. Still, we have no choice but to trust them and we shouldn't take our inability to offer a non-circular argument for them to impugn them in any way.
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- Audi, Robert, 1995. “Memorial Justification” Philosophical Topics, 23: 251-272.
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- Dummett, Michael, 1994. “Testimony and Memory,” in Bimal Krishna Matilal and Aridam Chakrabarti (eds.), Knowing From Words, Dordrecht: D. Reidel, pp. 1-23
- Goldman, Alvin, 1979. “What is Justified Belief?” in George Pappas (ed.), Justification and Knowledge, Dordrecht: D. Reidel, pp. 1-23
- Goldman, Alvin, 1999. “Internalism Exposed,” The Journal of Philosophy, 96 (6): 271-293.
- Harman, Gilbert, 1986. Change in View, Cambridge, MA: MIT Press. (See Chapter 4.)
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- Huemer, Michael, 1999. “The Problem of Memory Knowledge,” Pacific Philosophical Quarterly, 80: 346-357.
- Hume, David, 1739. A Treatise of Human Nature.
- Lackey, Jennifer, 2005. “Memory as an Epistemically Generative Source,” Philosophy and Phenomenological Research, 70 (3): 636-658.
- Lackey, Jennifer, 2007. “Why Memory Really is an Epistemically Generative Source: A Reply to Senor,” Philosophy and Phenomenological Research, 74 (1): 209-219.
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- Martin, C.B., and Deutscher, Max, 1966. “Remembering,” The Philosophical Review, 75: 161-196.
- McGrath, Matthew, 2007. “Memory and Epistemic Conservatism,” Synthese, 157: 1-24.
- Plantinga, Alvin, 1993. Warrant and Proper Function, New York, NY: Oxford University Press. (See Chapter 3.)
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- Russell, Bertrand, 1921. The Analysis of Mind, London: Allen & Unwin Limited.
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- Schroer, Robert, 2008. “Memory Foundationalism and the Problem of Unforgotten Carelessness,” Pacific Philosophical Quarterly, 89: 74-85.
- Senor, Thomas D., 1993. “Internalistic Foundationalism and the Justification of Memory Belief,” Synthese, 94: 353-376.
- –––, 1995. “Harman, Negative Coherentism, and the Problem of Ongoing Justification,” Philosophia, 24: 271-294.
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Other Internet Resources
- Philosophy of Memory, maintained by John Sutton (Macquarie University).