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‘Memory’ labels a diverse set of cognitive capacities by which we retain information and reconstruct past experiences, usually for present purposes. Memory is one of the most important ways by which our histories animate our current actions and experiences. Most notably, the human ability to conjure up long-gone but specific episodes of our lives is both familiar and puzzling, and is a key aspect of personal identity. Memory seems to be a source of knowledge. We remember experiences and events which are not happening now, so memory differs from perception. We remember events which really happened, so memory is unlike pure imagination. Yet, in practice, there can be close interactions between remembering, perceiving, and imagining. Remembering is often suffused with emotion, and is closely involved in both extended affective states such as love and grief, and socially significant practices such as promising and commemorating. It is essential for much reasoning and decision-making, both individual and collective. It is connected in obscure ways with dreaming. Some memories are shaped by language, others by imagery. Much of our moral and social life depends on the peculiar ways in which we are embedded in time. Memory goes wrong in mundane and minor, or in dramatic and disastrous ways.
Although an understanding of memory is likely to be important in making sense of the continuity of the self, of the relation between mind and body, and of our experience of time, it has often been curiously neglected by philosophers. This entry's primary focus is on that part of contemporary philosophical discussion of memory which is continuous with the development of theories in the cognitive and social sciences: attention to these interdisciplinary fields of memory studies is driving renewed work on the topic. Many problems about memory require us to cross philosophical traditions and subdisciplines, touching on phenomenology, philosophy of psychology, epistemology, social theory, and ethics at once. The bibliography includes suggested readings on the history of theories of memory. A related entry addresses epistemological issues about memory.
- 1. The Concept of Memory
- 2. Memory and Representation
- 3. Memory in the Philosophy of Cognitive Science
- Other Internet Resources
- Related Entries
At the end of an intricate treatment of remembering in chapter 9 of The Analysis of Mind, Bertrand Russell laments that “this analysis of memory is probably extremely faulty, but I do not know how to improve it” (1921, p. 187). In similar vein, one of Hume's editors complains that “the unsatisfactory nature of Hume's account of memory is noticed by nearly all his commentators. It is a fault however which he shares with nearly all other philosophers” (Macnabb 1962, p. 360). Why is memory so hard to understand?
The answer, in part, is that the term labels a great variety of phenomena. I remember how to play chess and how to drive a car; I remember the date of Descartes' death; I remember playing in the snow as a child; I remember the taste and the pleasure of this morning's coffee; I remember to feed the cat every night. “Many very different things happen when we remember” (Wittgenstein 1974, p. 181). Some philosophers take this heterogeneity as reason to be wary of any attempt to explain memory (Malcolm 1977, Deutscher 1989). But subtleties of subjective memory experience need not be neglected or obliterated by careful theorizing: an explanatory framework which omitted the phenomenological and interpersonal diversity of memory would fail on its own terms.
This point is worth reiterating. In a letter to Mersenne, Descartes asks why “what makes one man want to dance may make another want to cry”: it may be, he suggests, that the second man has “never heard a galliard without some affliction befalling him”, so that he cries “because it evokes ideas in [his] memory” (18 March 1630, in Descartes 1991, p. 20; see Sutton 1998, pp. 74–81). But this explanation does not distinguish between two possibilities about the second man's memory. He may simply find himself tearful, the music making him sad because of its previous coupling with affliction in his experience, although he remains unaware of this association. Alternatively, he may be well aware of the specific and tragic past occasions on which he has heard the galliard, perhaps being able to give detailed affective, temporal, and contextual information about those past experiences, and perhaps even to use this knowledge to work through the revived emotions.
Philosophers often focus on the latter kind of case, sometimes denying that the merely implicit learned association in the former case is a genuine form of memory at all. But the distinction between conscious, personal memory and the non-conscious ways in which we are influenced by the past does not drive a useful wedge between philosophy and the sciences. On the one hand, scientific psychology is not, either in principle or in practice, restricted to the study of implicit learning and the varieties of conditioning: indeed, the study of our rich, socially-embedded capacities to remember our personal experiences is at the heart of much current research. On the other hand, philosophers too want to understand the operations of habit memory, skill memory, and involuntary memory, and their implications for expanded notions of agency and identity.
C.B. Martin and Max Deutscher concluded an influential analysis of memory by stressing “the complex and partly theoretical nature of our commonplace notion of remembering” (1966, p.196). Ordinary usage hides a battery of different but related concepts of memory, which are now investigated by philosophers and psychologists alike, attending to conceptual distinctions and subjective experience in conjunction with functional and empirical concerns about the nature and the basis of memory processes and systems.
A rough consensus has emerged among philosophers and psychologists around one promising, more-or-less unified terminology for the forms of long-term memory. Bergson (1908/1991) and Russell (1921) distinguished ‘recollective memory’ from ‘habit memory’, while Broad (1925) and Furlong (1948) further distinguished recollective memory from ‘propositional memory’. This classification (see also Ayer 1956, D. Locke 1971) is (roughly) consonant with more recent psychological terminology, used here for convenience in exposition. These varieties of remembering are marked by grammatical, phenomenological, and (on some views) psychological and neural differences. The ontological implications of such terminological distinctions are disputed: there are substantive disagreements about what's meant by the notion of a 'memory system', and about the utility of ‘systems’ taxonomies (Foster and Jelicic 1999; Willingham and Goedert 2001; Squire 2004). Progress in understanding psychological kinds and systems more generally is required in order to settle these issues. The following general characterisations are accepted even by those who stress the interactive coordination of the various forms of remembering.
Philosophers' ‘habit memory’ is, roughly, psychologists' ‘procedural memory’. These labels cover a range of phenomena, from simpler forms of associative learning through to kinesthetic, skill, and sequence memory. We naturally refer to procedural, habit, and skill memories with the grammatical construction ‘remembering how’. I continue to remember how to type, play piano, or dance, even when I am not, now, occurrently engaged in the relevant activity. While some habit memories may have something in common with rigid, inflexible, automated conditioning mechanisms, others are flexible and open to the changing influences of context, mood, and personal memory. But even richer, idiosyncratic memories for skills differ from other, more explicit forms of memory in their acquisition, nature, content, phenomenology, articulability, and patterns of breakdown (Ennen 2003; Sutton 2009a). Alongside revived interest in the general problem of relations between knowing how and knowing that (Ryle 1949/1963; Stanley and Williamson 2001; Young 2004; Noe 2005; Toribio 2008; Wallis 2008), the philosophy of kinesthetic memory and skilled movement can draw on applied fields including philosophy of sport, dance, and music (Dretske 1998; Sheets-Johnstone 1999, 2003; Sudnow 2001; Crease 2002; Morris 2002; Moe 2005; Sutton 2007; Montero forthcoming).
‘Propositional memory’ is ‘semantic memory’ or memory for facts, the vast network of conceptual information underlying our general knowledge of the world: this is naturally expressed as ‘remembering that’, for example, that Descartes died in Sweden.
‘Recollective memory’ is ‘episodic memory’, also sometimes called ‘personal memory’, ‘experiential memory’, or ‘direct memory’ by philosophers: this is memory for experienced events and episodes, such as a conversation this morning or the death of a friend eight years ago. Episodic memories are naturally expressed with a direct object: I remember arguing about Descartes yesterday, and I remember my feelings as we talked. Such personal memories can be generic or specific, and can be memories of more or less extended temporal periods. But the most characteristic feature of episodic remembering, arguably, is the way it brings us into contact with the particular past events which such memories are about and by which they are caused (Campbell 1997; Hoerl 1999).
Both semantic and episodic memories, whether linguistically expressed or not, usually aim at truth, and are together sometimes called ‘declarative memory’, in contrast to nondeclarative forms of memory, which don't seem to represent the world or the past in the same sense. In declarative remembering, we seek to track the truth: this is why we are uneasy or dismayed when our take on the past is challenged or overturned (Poole 2008). This contrast between declarative and nondeclarative memory is sometimes lined up with a more controversial distinction between ‘explicit’ and ‘implicit’ memory: explicit memories, roughly, can be accessed verbally or otherwise by the subject, whereas implicit memory is memory without awareness. But the category of implicit memory includes a range of heterogeneous phenomena, and it may be better to see ‘implicit memory’ as a label for a set of memory tasks rather than a distinct variety or system of memory (Willingham and Preus 1995; Roediger 2003).
We sometimes use ‘remember’ in its declarative senses as a ‘success-word’, so that ‘false memories’ are not ‘memories’ at all. It's possible either to think that I remember when in fact I am imagining or confabulating, or to think that I am creating something quite new (such as a melody, painting, or story) when in fact I am remembering it (Martin and Deutscher 1966, pp. 167–8, p. 177). Classification and explanation of the many varieties of false ‘memory’ are also intriguing philosophical tasks (Hacking 1995; Hamilton 1999); and the attempt to understand and explain any features, both phenomenological and causal, which veridical remembering and (some cases of) imagining, confabulating, and misremembering might have in common is a legitimate part of the overall interdisciplinary enquiry into memory. The very idea of truth in memory, and the attendant possibility of error, implies that we are naturally realists about the past: but this fact about us doesn't dictate answers to questions about just how, or how often, we do remember the past truly.
Much 20th-century philosophical discussion of memory addressed its status as a source of knowledge, either in the context of general sceptical concerns about knowledge of the past, or in investigating criteria for the reliability of particular memory beliefs (Owens 1999; and see the entry on epistemological problems of memory). But philosophers also have a special concern with the nature of human personal memory for episodes and experiences in the autobiographical past.
John Locke took memory to be a power of the mind “to revive Perceptions, which it has once had, with this additional perception annexed to them, that it has had them before” (1690/1975, p. 150; see also Owens 1996). William Brewer defines recollective episodic memory in similar terms, as a ‘reliving’ of the individual's phenomenal experience from a specific moment in their past, accompanied by a belief that the remembered episode was personally experienced by the individual in their past (1996, pp. 60–61). Significant psychological complexity is required, on such views, for genuine episodic remembering.
When I remember an episode of my personal history, I come into contact with events and experiences which are no longer present. My conception of my own life involves narratives in which such experiences are interrelated. We find it easy to engage in the peculiar sort of ‘mental time travel’ involved in such autobiographical memory, although we're often aware of significant limits to its reliability (Tulving 1983, 2002; Schacter 1996). We are oriented to events as having occurred at particular past times (Campbell 1994, 1997). This capacity may also underlie our ability to think about future contingencies, so that memory is one variant of a general capacity for the constructive simulating or imagining of specific events remote from immediate circumstances (Schacter, Addis, and Buckner 2007; Suddendorf and Corballis 2007). Some see this capacity as unique to humans, with the lives of apes (for example) being in contrast “lived entirely in the present” (Donald 1991, p. 149): but there is active current debate across the disciplines on how we could tell if either pre-linguistic infants or non-linguistic animals (McCormack 2001; Suddendorf and Busby 2005; Tulving 2005; Hoerl 2008; Clayton and Russell 2009).
Not all autobiographical memories, in the broadest sense, are episodic: I can non-experientially remember facts about my own life (such as the date and place of my birth), drawing information about lifetime periods and events at various levels of detail from a structured autobiographical memory knowledge base that is more or less integrated with my other beliefs (Conway 2005). But the converse question, whether all episodic memories are autobiographical, remains open. For Christoph Hoerl, episodic memories “are necessarily memories of particular events or situations, namely of episodes in the subject's autobiography” (1999, p. 235). But some psychologists want to leave open the possibility that genuine episodic memories may be distinct from full-blown autobiographical memories. In developmental psychology, for example, Melissa Welch-Ross argues that “before the autobiographical memory system develops, prelinguistic infants and young children possess long-term, episodic memory” (1995, p. 339). One issue here is whether it's useful to define autobiographical memories as those which are unusually significant (Nelson 1993). But more important in deciding if episodic memory predates full-blown autobiographical memory is the question whether the remembered episodes which come to be shaped into narratives, either by being organized around a self-schema (Howe and Courage 1997; Howe 2000), or by joint reminiscing between parents and children (Nelson and Fivush 2004), are already oriented to particular past experiences in the requisite way.
Because autobiographical memory thus connects my present self with my own particular past actions and experiences, it has naturally played a role in both psychological and philosophical theories about continuity of self. Remembering has social and directive or action-guiding functions as well as identity-related functions (Alea and Bluck 2003; Pillemer 2003). But my memory also has a bidirectional relation with my self-conception. The way I remember my personal past partly depends on the kind of person I take myself to be, and my memories sometimes alter on the basis of changes in that self-conception (Ross 1989; Wilson and Ross 2003). In Conway's influential Self-Memory System framework, the working self is a complex bundle of active goals, motivations, and associated self-images, which drives the compilation of autobiographical memories, seeking coherence as well as correspondence with reality (Conway and Pleydell-Pearce 2000; Conway 2005). But as well as the influence of self-concept on remembering, my memory in turn influences my life: my decision-making, choices, and attributions of significance are driven in part by what and how I remember. In their detailed operation, these loops between self-descriptions and self-conceptions exhibit considerable individual, cultural, and contextual variation. Sometimes, or in some people, there is stronger, more direct feedback from reflective self-representation into behavior, with ongoing integration lived out between actions and self-ascribed character, emotions, memories, and plans (Velleman, 2006). But in other people or on other occasions, there can be significant gulfs between autobiography and the control of action, since we can get by with less coherence between story and life (Dennett 1991; Clark 1994).
In philosophical theories of personal identity, the suitability of a ‘memory criterion’ for deciding questions about identity over time has been much debated since John Locke's discussions of memory-swapping and amnesia (see the entry on personal identity). Philosophers of personal identity who are uneasy with relying on unstable intuitions in science-fictional thought experiments instead examine real disorders of memory, such as fugues, amnesias, and dissociation (Wilkes 1988; Sacks 1985, chapters 2, 12, 15; and compare the remarkable case studies in Campbell and Conway 1995), or cognitive-psychological theories of autobiographical memory. Marya Schechtman (1994), for example, argues that autobiographical memory does not, and need not, provide simple connections between discrete past and present moments of consciousness, as suggested by some ‘psychological continuity’ theories of personal identity. Rather, it is by summarizing, constructing, interpreting, and condensing life experiences, often smoothing over the boundaries between different moments in our lives, that autobiographical memory produces any coherent narrative sense of a personal past (compare Glover 1988, chapter 14; Engel 1999, chapter 4). Neither total nor precise recall is required, on this view, for persistence of self: rather, what matters is the rich web of causal connections and dependencies between past experiences and present psychological states. The implications for the personal identity debate of this common-sense notion of causal connectedness between past and present experiences are still unclear (compare Slors 2001). But it is of central importance for further elucidation of our concept of personal memory.
For me to have a personal episodic memory, my present act of remembering must be causally connected in an appropriate way to the past experience being recollected. Even if it happens to be true that, as a child of four, I got lost in a shopping mall, we would deny that I personally remember the experience if I had completely forgotten it, and have only later been told about it by my parents, or had such a possibility suggested to me by a therapist or an experimental psychologist. Genuine episodic memories, then, causally depend in certain ways on the particular remembered experiences (Martin and Deutscher 1966; Shoemaker 1970; Perner 2000; Bernecker 2008).
Martin and Deutscher (1966), developing a causal theory of memory, argued that the past experience itself must have been causally operative in producing (intervening) states which are in turn causally operative in producing the present recollective experience. While some degree of prompting may be necessary to trigger my present recollection (Deutscher 1989), this recollection of a past experience must also causally derive from states which themselves causally derive from that experience. What's surprising about this analysis is that it suggests that built in to common sense concepts of memory is a reliance on the existence of some kind of ‘memory trace’ as a continuous bridge across the temporal gap, causally connecting past and present.
If we had no grasp of these kinds of causal connection in memory, it is arguable that our autobiographical narratives would not get off the ground. We are often aware, of course, of the selective and gappy nature of these narratives: but our ability sometimes to identify such gaps and errors in memory, some philosophers have argued, itself presupposes a conception of the causal connectedness of the self. John Campbell (1997), for example, posits conceptual connections between autobiographical memory, a grasp of time as linear, and a strong conception of the spatio-temporal continuity of the self. Children need to grasp that both world and self have a history for genuine autobiographical remembering to emerge. This suggests that a temporal asymmetry is built in to autobiographical memory, in that (again) we are inevitably realists about the past, conceiving of past events as being all, in principle, integratable on a single temporal sequence. Various principles of plot construction thus ground our ordinary memory practices: we assume, for example, that the remembered I has traced “a continuous spatio-temporal route through all the narratives of memory, a route continuous with the present and future location of the remembering subject” (Campbell 1997, p. 110).
In autobiographical memory, we thus assign causal significance to specific events, so that our temporal orientation is by particular times rather than simply by rhythms or phases. Because we can grasp the temporal relations between different cycles or phases, we have a conception of the connectedness of time which gives us the concept of the past (Campbell 1994, chapter 2). For Christoph Hoerl (1999, pp. 240–7), this feature of our concept of time grounds our awareness of the singularity of events and especially of actions. We are thus “sensitive to the irrevocability of certain acts”, so that we, unlike other animals and (perhaps) some severely amnesic patients, incorporate a sense of the uniqueness and potential significance of particular choices and actions into our plans and our conceptions of how to live. There are potential connections here with moral psychology and studies of the specificity of autobiographical memory and emotion: many emotionally disturbed people, for example those suffering depression, tend to have overgeneral memories which summarize categories of events rather than retrieving a single episode (Williams et al 2007).
On any view which thus treats causal connectedness as built in to our concept of memory, remembering is a core instance of the general, flexible human capacity to think about events and experiences which are not present, so that mental life isn't entirely determined by the current environment and the immediate needs of the organism. We can often remember without having any such traces in our current external environment, such as photographs or words written in a diary: so many philosophers and scientists have argued that memory traces or representations are retained within the individual.
Although it takes many significantly different forms, this idea that a ‘trace’ acquired in past experience somehow ‘represents’ that experience, or carries information about it, is at the heart of ‘representative’ or ‘indirect’ realism in the philosophy of memory. This has been the dominant view of memory in modern philosophy of mind, and it is assumed in much work on memory in cognitive science. Research programmes for representative realism thus seek to clarify the nature of representations in memory, and the various processes in which they are involved. But before examining these topics, we need to look at criticisms of the entire representative realist framework. Some recent work in the cognitive sciences of memory, described in section 3 below, is intended to respond to or incorporate the more powerful of these criticisms within revised forms of representative realism.
In contrast to the representative realist, direct realists and others hostile to the memory trace claim that in the act of remembering I am in direct contact with past events. Memory is “an immediate knowledge of something past” (Reid 1785/ 1849, p. 357), or “the mind's awareness of past things themselves” (Laird 1920, p. 56). There are two ways of interpreting this dispute.
Are we aware of memory representations?
Some critics of representations complain that, in memory, there is no direct awareness of a trace or idea from which, in a two-step process, the subject then indirectly infers the past event or experience. This criticism hits the mark only against versions of representative realism (prevalent only before the 1960s) in which representations were immaterial or ontologically ambiguous mental items which are first scanned and then interpreted by a non-physical soul. This form of representative realism makes our awareness of the past indirect in an obvious sense, and critics were right to see it as a form of dualism (Woozley 1949; Gibson 1979, p. 223).
But if traces are taken to be physical items, within a broadly naturalistic ontology, it is clear that they are not immediate objects of experience which a subject then consciously puts to use. The ‘inference’ involved in remembering is unconscious, so representationists are not relying on incorrigible present awareness of a private inner object from which the past is somehow read off. Memory may involve representations of the past, most modern representationists argue, without involving awareness of those representations themselves. The genuine phenomenology of ‘direct’ access to the past, as when a vivid memory returns me to a past emotional state, does not thus falsify representative realism.
Are there memory representations?
It might then seem that ‘direct awareness’ of the past is in fact compatible with the involvement of representations in memory. If that is so, there is no genuine conflict between direct and representative realism: we can be directly aware of the past just by virtue of a trace in the present. A memory trace could then mediate between past and present without rendering our access to the past problematically indirect. Indeed, the contrast between ‘direct’ and ‘indirect’ access to the past may seem to lose its grip if representations are not thought of as objects of immediate awareness (compare Schwartz 1996 on perception).
But the availability of this conciliatory position has rarely dissolved the debate about memory representations. In fact many critics of memory traces argue that representative realism is fundamentally flawed even if it does not posit awareness of representations themselves. The objections to representations evaluated below do not depend on the ‘two-step’ interpretation of representative realism: these criticisms are meant to strike at the heart of any theory which relies on representations in memory.
The debate has been pursued primarily in epistemological contexts, in which arguments from the parallel debate about perception play an important role (Shoemaker 1967; Dancy 1985, chapter 12; Audi 1998, chapter 2; and see the entries on epistemological problems of memory and epistemological problems of perception). But it is also vital in the philosophy of mind and cognitive science, where philosophers of various persuasions have attacked “those ‘traces’ that still plague psychology” (Grene 1985, p. 43).
Since memory traces, impressions, or images have figured in theories of memory from Aristotle, through Descartes and theorists of the association of ideas, into the 21st century, it may seem that little progress has been made. The concept of some static, permanent, distinct storage form that experiences leave in the organism seems to link old and modern models. For some, this erodes confidence in contemporary science: David Krell, noting “the staying-power of the ancient model for memory”, hopes to expose “the failure of neurophysiological research to render plausible accounts of long-term memory” (1990, p. 5, p. xi). There is continuity too in metaphors for the spatial organization of memory as containing rooms, palaces, or purses, as a bottle or a dictionary, as tape recorder or junk box (Roediger 1980, p. 233). Critics also point out that external technologies for recording information or for keeping items safe, from wax tablets and aviaries through the camera obscura and the photograph to digital computers and holograms, seem to be wheeled in almost arbitrarily in the search for a model of internal processes (Draaisma 2000; Danziger 2008, chapter 2).
But there are stronger and weaker versions of representative realism, with quite different assumptions about the nature of the memory trace. The extreme ‘localist’ account takes memory to be a place in which independent traces or ‘atomic’ items are laid down separately by every experience (or perhaps every part of every experience), and stored at a separate location, until called out again in the reproduction of that experience. A clear historical statement of this localist version of trace theory is that of the 17th-century English natural philosopher Robert Hooke, who took memory ideas in the brain “to be material and bulky, that is, to be certain Bodies of determinate Bigness”: for Hooke, memory was a “Repository of Ideas” in which separate items were laid down on the “coils” or “spirals” of the brain, for later extraction by an executive mechanism. Hooke's model was localist in the sense that all ideas in memory are “in themselves distinct; and therefore that not two of them can be in the same space, but that they are actually different and separate one from another” (Hooke 1682/ 1705, p. 142; Sutton 1998, pp. 137–8).
This localist view of memory representations suggests that the memory system, which has no intrinsic dynamics of its own, is separate from other cognitive systems. Storage is distinct from processing, and an executive mechanism must search for and extract information in memory before it can be used. Some models of human memory developed in classical Artificial Intelligence research employ local representations of this sort, relying on an analogy with the random-access storage systems of digital computers. The passivity of such discrete memory representations is one reason such models have trouble dealing with the ways we can sometimes automatically update relevant background knowledge without explicit search (see Copeland 1993, chapters 4–5).
But local representations are not the only option available for understanding how a ‘trace’ might represent past experience. There are also quite different ‘distributed’ models of memory traces (section 3.3 below), which may afford distinctive responses to anti-representationist criticisms.
In a taxonomy and evaluation of criticisms of memory representations and traces, this section synthesizes the polemics of theorists who hold quite different positive views about memory. The answers sketched here to some of these criticisms leave open a number of issues. In particular, the issue of how the content of memory representations is determined is barely mentioned: and the question of how memory traces could provide the right causal connections between past and present if they are not static and permanent inner items is postponed to section 3. Again, the key question here is whether memory does involve representation of the past.
One initial objection mischaracterizes its target. Some critics complain that trace theorists see an episode of remembering as entirely determined by the nature of the stored item. But, they note, many factors other than internal brain states affect remembering. As Wittgenstein notes, “whatever the event does leave behind, it isn't the memory” (1980, paragraph 220). Trace theorists, however, accept this point: “the engram (the stored fragments of an episode) and the memory … are not the same thing” (Schacter 1996, p. 70). Traces (whatever they may be) are “merely potential contributors to recollection”, providing one kind of continuity between experience and remembering; so traces are relevant but not sufficient causal/ explanatory factors. In fact, psychologists' attention is increasingly focussed on the context of recall: research on “synergistic ecphory” (Tulving 1983, pp. 12–14) addresses the conspiratorial interaction of the present cue and circumstances with the trace (Schacter 1982, pp. 181–9; 1996, pp. 56–71). Developmental psychologist Susan Engel argues that often “one creates the memory at the moment one needs it, rather than merely pulling out an intact item, image, or story” (1999, p. 6). So there is no inevitable reduction of the multicausal nature of remembering to a single inner cause (see further sections 3.4 and 3.5 below).
The role of empirical evidence
Could memory traces be discovered? Wittgenstein sought to undermine our confidence in the empirical nature of representationism, asking “Why must a trace have been left behind?” (1980, paragraph 905). Do trace theorists misguidedly seek, on a priori grounds, to “dictate to science what to discover in the brain” (Zemach 1983, pp. 32–3)?
Some defenders of the trace in response drain it of empirical content. Deborah Rosen, for example, develops a “logical notion of the memory trace”, distanced from the “scientific notions for which the logical notion provides only a philosophical underpinning” (1975, p. 3). But giving up the ideal of an independent characterization of the trace may not be necessary. The postulation of traces is empirical, but the relevant domain is not psychology. What's doing the work is the physical assumption that there is no macroscopic action at a temporal distance, that mechanisms in fact underlie apparent cases of direct action between temporally remote events. This assumption may be mistaken, but challenges to it must offer some positive alternative theoretical framework. The mere logical possibility of a unique “mnemic causation” which does operate at a temporal distance (Heil 1978, pp. 66–69; Anscombe 1981, pp. 126–7) is insufficient, as is the simple denial of any temporal gap between past and present (Malcolm 1963, p. 238).
Critics deny that the retention involved in memory requires any continuous storage (Squires 1969; Malcolm 1977, pp. 197–9; Bursen 1978). This worry rightly requires trace theorists to be explicit on the relation between occurrent remembering and dispositional memories. We do need models of the mechanism by which enduring dispositions are actualized. But the criticism does not show that there is anything deeply mysterious in the notion of underlying causal processes which ground memory abilities (Warnock 1987, pp. 50–2; Deutscher 1989, pp. 58–63). The kind of ‘storage’ invoked by trace theorists need not be the storage of independent atomic items localized in particular places, like sacks of grain in a storehouse.
A dilemma: circularity or solipsism?
How does the postulated trace come to play a part in the present act of recognition or recall? Trace theorists must resist the idea that it is interpreted or read by some internal homunculus who can match a stored trace with a current input, or know just which trace to seek out for a given current purpose. Such an intelligent inner executive explains nothing (Gibson 1979, p. 256; Draaisma 2000, pp.212–29), or gives rise to a vicious regress in which further internal mechanisms operate in some “corporeal studio” (Ryle 1949/1963, p. 36; Malcolm 1970, p. 64).
But then the trace theorist is left with a dilemma. If we avoid the homunculus by allowing that the remembering subject can just choose the right trace, then our trace theory is circular, for the abilities which the memory trace was meant to explain are now being invoked to explain the workings of the trace (Bursen 1978, pp. 52–60; Wilcox and Katz 1981, pp. 229–232; Sanders 1985, pp. 508–10). Or if, finally, we deny that the subject has this circular independent access to the past, and agree that the activation of traces cannot be checked against some other veridical memories, then (critics argue) solipsism or scepticism results. There is then no guarantee that any act of remembering does provide access to the past at all: representationist trace theories thus cut the subject off from the past behind a murky veil of traces (Wilcox and Katz 1981, p. 231; Ben-Zeev 1986, p. 296).
We'll see below (section 3.3) that this dilemma recurs empirically, in the difference between supervised and unsupervised learning rules in connectionist cognitive-scientific models of memory. There, as in this general context, the natural response is to take the second prong of the dilemma, and accept the threat of solipsism or scepticism. The trace theorist must show how in practice the past can play roles in the causation of present remembering. The past is not uniquely specified by present input, and there is no general guarantee of accuracy: but the demand for incorrigible access to the past can be resisted.
How can memory traces represent past events or experiences? How can they have content? This is in part a general problem about the meaning of mental representations (see the entry on mental representation). But specific problems crop up for naturalistic trace theories of memory. In stating the causal theory of memory, Martin and Deutscher argued that an analysis of remembering should include the requirement that (in cases of genuine remembering) “the state or set of states produced by the past experience must constitute a structural analogue of the thing remembered” (1966, pp. 189–191), although they denied that the trace need be a perfect analogue, “mirroring all the features of a thing”. But is there a coherent notion of structural isomorphism to be relied on here? If memory traces are not images in the head, somehow directly resembling their objects, and if we are to cash out unanalysed and persistent metaphors of imprinting, engraving, copying, coding, or writing (Krell 1990, pp. 3–7), then what kind of “analogue” is the trace?
One approach to content determination does retain resemblance as the core explanatory notion. According to the structuralist theory of mental representation developed by Robert Cummins (1996), Paul Churchland (1998), and by Gerard O'Brien and Jon Opie (2004), there is an objective relation of ‘second-order resemblance’ between the system of representing vehicles in our heads and their represented objects. ‘First-order resemblance’ involves the sharing of some physical properties, and is thus unlikely to ground mental representation, since no traces in my brain share relevant physical properties with (say) the elephants or the conversations which I remember. But in second-order resemblance, the relations among a system of representing vehicles mirror the relations among their objects. In the case of brain traces, second-order structural resemblances hold when some physical relations among certain brain states (such as distance relations in the activation space of a neural network) preserve some system of relations among represented objects (O'Brien and Opie 2004, pp. 8–14).
Whatever the fate of such a general defence of the notion of a structural analogue, there is another (compatible yet independent) response. We can weaken the requirement of isomorphism further, remembering that a theory of memory in the philosophy of psychology should not cover veridical remembering alone. Details in my memory of an experience need not have been permanently encoded in the same enduring determinate trace as that experience. We often tell more than we (strictly speaking) remember. Even where memory for the gist of an event is roughly accurate, details may shift as the trace is filtered through other beliefs, dreams, fears, or wishes (compare Schacter 1996, pp. 101–113). The causal connections between events and traces, and between traces and recollection, may be multiple, indirect, and context-dependent. The structures which underpin retention, then, need not remain the same over time, or might not always involve identifiable determinate forms over time.
This more dynamic vision of traces, rejecting the idea of permanent storage of independent items, may satisfy both recent developments in cognitive science (section 3 below) and some of the positive suggestions with which critics of static traces have accompanied their objections. In notes of 1935/6, Wittgenstein had wondered “whether the things stored up may not constantly change their nature” (quoted in Stern 1991, p. 204). Gibsonian direct realists in psychology, like some phenomenologists and Wittgensteinians in philosophy, have sometimes assimilated all theories of memory traces to the vision of passive, separate entities each with a fixed location in an inner archive. But writers in these diverse traditions have rightly stressed various ways in which remembering often relies on information left in the external world, arguing that we should see the internal aspects of memory more as an active resonance or attunement to information of certain kinds than as the encoding and reproduction of determinate images (Gibson 1966/1982, 1979; Wilcox and Katz 1981; Casey 1987; ter Hark 1995; Toth and Hunt 1999; Manier 2004). These ideas have had considerable influence on recent theorizing in cognitive science, and on views of memory and mind as embodied, embedded, and extended (section 3 below). But they do not rule out weaker, dynamic notions of the memory trace. As the great English psychologist of memory Frederic Bartlett argued, “though we may still talk of traces, there is no reason in the world for regarding these as made complete, stored up somewhere, and then re-excited at some much later moment. The traces that our evidence allows us to speak of are interest-determined, interest-carried traces. They live with our interests and with them they change” (1932, pp. 211–2).
“A variety of conditions exist”, notes Daniel Schacter, “in which subjectively compelling memories are grossly inaccurate” (1995, p. 22). Cognitive and developmental psychologists have forged a broad consensus about the constructive nature of remembering. This was one key, uneasy outcome of fierce disputes around 1990 between ‘ecological’ and ‘laboratory’ approaches to memory (Middleton and Edwards 1990; Koriat and Goldsmith 1996; Neisser 1997), and was perhaps partly a response to the political and institutional crisis over recovered memories and false memories (Hacking 1995; Haaken 1998).
To say that memory is a constructive process, and that psychologists have turned their research efforts to the study of suggestibility, misinformation, and distortion is not to focus unrealistically on cases where memory goes wrong, or to say that accuracy in memory has suddenly been shown by science to be impossible or unlikely. There is no reason to think that ‘constructed memories’ must be false. Warnings about the forensic dangers of constructive processes (Loftus 2005) should not lead us simply to equate construction with error, or malleability with unreliability, since veridical memories too are constructed (Campbell 2003, 2004; Barnier, Sutton, Harris and Wilson 2008). A better understanding of the mechanisms of distortion and confusion should also illuminate the general reliability of memory, by revealing processes which also operate in veridical remembering (Mitchell and Johnson 2000, pp. 179–180). But neither ‘accuracy’ or ‘reliability’ is a transparent notion in this context: pragmatic and contextual factors set the standards and criteria (Bernecker 2008, chapter 10). ‘Truth’ in memory, though not forever inaccessible, is neither single nor simple, and is not the only goal of remembering. In particular, verbatim recall and other forms of exact reproduction are rarely necessary for success in remembering (Rubin 1995).
This point is compatible with the causal theory of memory, as introduced above. The causal theory does not require that the original experience provides the entire content of the memory trace, or that the trace provides the full content of the later memory, as in an archival or full storage model. Instead, it allows that, at various stages, both selective and elaborative processes can operate on the materials of memory, within context-dependent limits (Bernecker 2008, 2010; Michaelian 2010).
An example from the phenomenology of remembering underlines this point that truth in memory is compatible with some transformation at the time of recollection. For many ordinary and obviously genuine autobiographical memories, most people can ‘flip’ perspectives (Rice and Rubin 2009). Sometimes one takes “the position of an onlooker or observer, looking at the situation from an external vantage point and seeing oneself ‘from the outside’”; or one can remember the same scene from one's own (past) perspective, with roughly the field of view available in the original situation, without ‘seeing oneself’ (Nigro and Neisser 1983, pp.467–8). This availability of both ‘observer’ and ‘field’ points of view in personal memory is puzzling in many respects (Berntsen and Rubin 2006; Rice and Rubin 2009). But it confirms that some construction or compilation is compatible with veridical remembering, and does not threaten our common sense trust in the reliability of memory (Debus 2007; Matthen 2010; Sutton 2010a).
This section continues with an overview of issues in the philosophy of science arising from memory research. It then addresses two related aspects of the psychological investigations into constructive remembering: the more flexible and dynamic accounts of long-term ‘storage’ and ‘traces’ offered by connectionist models, and increased attention to the contexts of recall. The entry concludes with a discussion of the role of memory in recent attempts to link the cognitive sciences and the social sciences by way of the ‘extended mind’ hypothesis.
Even if cognitive science is still ‘a mere babe in the woods of science’ (von Eckardt 1999, p. 221), the cognitive sciences of memory nevertheless harness a vast institutional, technological, and textual apparatus more typical of Kuhnian normal science than of an entirely pre-paradigmatic era. Yet because memory is studied in many different disciplines, from neurobiology to narrative psychology, there is no obvious unity to either the objects of enquiry or the methods employed.
Are the various disciplines and subdisciplines which study memory autonomous for principled reasons? Or is memory research a case in which lack of contact between natural sciences, social sciences, and humanities is damaging? Could there be a positive framework for understanding the relations between levels of explanation and between disciplines in the sciences of memory?
The relevant relation between different theories would not be the wholesale unification of all relevant sciences, as in the dream of classical reductionism (see the entry on intertheory relations in physics). Rather, we might seek the elucidation of local points of contact between different (sub)disciplines, in the search for interfield theories (Darden and Maull 1977), or in pinpointing genuinely interdependent phenomena at different levels of explanation (Kitcher 1992, pp. 6–7; Sutton, 2004).
A number of philosophers of psychology have found case studies in interdisciplinary theory-construction in the sciences of memory. The possibility that liberalized conceptions of reduction might fit work on the neural bases of associative learning and of spatial memory has been developed by Schaffner (1992), Bickle (1998), and Bechtel (2001). In contrast, others retain stricter notions of reduction and then argue that these cases don't meet their tighter criteria (Stoljar and Gold 1998; Gold and Stoljar 1999; Schouten and Looren de Jong 1999). Others develop positive integrative accounts of levels and mechanisms in the neurobiology and cognitive psychology of memory (Craver and Darden 2001; Craver 2002; Bechtel 2008). Valerie Hardcastle offers a detailed narrative of the integration of interdisciplinary traditions, methods, and theories in the development of the distinction between implicit and explicit memory (1996, pp. 105–139). She sees it as a typically “complicated and cluttered” interdisciplinary theory, which relies actively on the methods and underlying assumptions of a number of different research traditions, in this case including developmental psychology, clinical neuropsychology, animal neurobiology, and experimental cognitive psychology. Although Hardcastle herself sees this account as anti-reductionist, it's not obviously inconsistent with the acceptance by ‘new-wave’ reductionists that any reductions in neuropsychological practice are “bound to be patchy” (Schaffner 1992, p. 337) and domain-specific (see the entries on the philosophy of neuroscience and multiple realizability).
While these writers address relations between the neural and the cognitive sciences of memory, there has been less work on cognitive psychology's relations ‘upwards ’, with the developmental, personality, or social psychology of memory. Is there a clear and principled division between the cognitive and the social sciences of memory? We return to this question in discussing context and environment in memory, after first examining the internal mechanisms of constructive remembering.
If we retain memory traces, to account for causal continuity between past and present, but argue that they are not stored in fixed and independent form in the brain, then what form do traces take? What are the mechanisms by which traces link experience and recollection?
Research on constructive remembering in cognitive and developmental psychology developed in the 1980s and 1990s fairly independently of the connectionist computational modelling with which philosophers were more concerned (see the entry on connectionism). But connectionism offers one way to cash out the more flexible and dynamic understanding of the format of stored mental representations which we saw was required to deflect direct realist and phenomenological criticisms. The internal plasticity of memory which ‘distributed’ models suggest is one of the most curious and characteristic features of human memory, and one which clearly differentiates our cognitive systems from the ‘memories’ of current digital computers. It's useful for the contents of the files stored on my computer to remain exactly the same from the moment I close them at night to the time I open them again in the morning. But various kinds of reorganization and realignment often happen to the information retained in my brain over the same period. In us, memories do not naturally sit still in cold storage.
In connectionist cognitive science, occurrent remembering is the temporary reactivation of a particular pattern or vector across the units of a neural network. This reconstruction is possible because of the conspiring influences of current input and the history of the network, where this history is sedimented in the connection weights between units. Memory traces are not stored statically between experience and remembering, but are piled together or ‘superposed’ in the same set of weights. In fully distributed representation, the same resources or vehicles are thus used to carry many different contents (van Gelder 1991). As McClelland and Rumelhart put it,
We see the traces laid down by the processing of each input as contributing to the composite, superimposed memory representation. Each time a stimulus is processed, it gives rise to a slightly different memory trace—either because the item itself is different or because it occurs in a different context that conditions its representation—the traces are not kept separate. Each trace contributes to the composite, but the characteristics of particular experiences tend nevertheless to be preserved, at least until they are overridden by canceling characteristics of other traces. Also, the traces of one stimulus pattern can coexist with the traces of other stimuli, within the same composite memory trace. (1986, p. 193)
This framework postulates two abstract features: distinct transient patterns of activity, and composite enduring (but modifiable) dispositional states. It is not tied to current computational models, for these two features can be implemented in different physical systems, and were clearly described in a number of theories of memory before the 20th century (Sutton 1998). The term ‘trace’ in this context is systematically ambiguous: it can be applied either to the fleeting patterns which constitute an explicit, occurrent representation, or to the persisting dispositions which underlie and ground the (re)construction of such occurrent patterns.
Connectionist remembering is thus an inferential process, constructive not reproductive. Rather than the retrieval of a discrete stored symbol, it is the filling in of a pattern on the basis of particular (perhaps partial or distorted) input. Information that has been processed survives only in dispositional form: “the data persist only implicitly by virtue of the effect they have on what the system knows” (Elman 1993, p. 89). Within the single network at least, “there is no difference between reconstructing a previous state, and constructing a totally new state (confabulating)” (Bechtel and Abrahamsen 1991, p. 64; compare McClelland 1995, pp. 69–70).
Truth in memory is a glaring problem in such a framework. Some connectionist simulations employ supervised learning rules, in which a network is given explicit feedback in response to its output as its weights are adjusted so as to minimize error. The importance of supervised learning in human development is considerable (Strauss and Quinn 1997, pp. 76–9): but we cannot always compare our current memories with some independent version of the past. If we could, the postulation of even the dynamic distributed memory trace would be redundant. As Paul Churchland notes, we need “to escape the unreality of an omniscient teacher” (1989, p. 246). But just as the circularity prong of the trace theorist's dilemma (section 2.2 above) has this empirical realization, so the alternative, unsupervised connectionist learning algorithms run the risk of solipsism or scepticism. In unsupervised learning, networks must evolve processing strategies which find similarities among inputs, progressively accommodating to their objective distribution (Churchland 1989, pp. 246–8; P.S. Churchland and Sejnowski 1992, pp. 96–7, 202–221). If the charge of solipsism or scepticism has to be met by a guarantee of incorrigible access to the past, as some direct realist critics demand (Turvey and Shaw 1979, p. 178), this influence of the world on the memory system would not be enough. But a fallibilist realist about the past can reject the requirement of certainty.
In unsupervised distributed models, memory systems extract information from inputs, becoming attuned, in context-dependent fashion, to what the environment affords. It would be strange if empirical theories of memory described the mind/brain as faithfully retaining or reflecting the past in its full presence, as the demand for epistemologically unquestionable remembering requires. Better metaphors are those of the continual filtering, deformation, revision, and melding of representations over time. Of course truth in memory is a problem, when multiple causes drive any act of remembering. There is seldom a simple, direct transmission from a single past experience through discretely stored inner items to a cleanly defined moment of recall, for each memory is many memories. Outside philosophy and the courtroom, perhaps we only recognise human memory as operating ‘normally’ when its successes are shot through with instances of forgetting, selection, condensation, interference, and distortion. The past, for all its occasional obscurity and its opacity to conscious or complete capture, affects the present on many timescales and at many levels. But since remembering is an occurrent and context-sensitive activity, it is influenced by a variety of present factors independent of any mediated residues of past events themselves.
The conditioning of representations by context, to which McClelland and Rumelhart refer in the quotation above, applies to encoding, ‘storage’, and retrieval alike. Interest in context effects goes back a long way in the psychology of memory. On Tulving and Thomson's ‘encoding specificity principle’, the context of encoding influences what is stored in memory, and in turn “what is stored determines what retrieval cues are effective in providing access to what is stored” (1973, p.353). Encoding operations, firstly, are “some sort of interaction between the perceptual input and its cognitive environment”, and then remembering is “the joint product of information stored in the past and information present in the immediate cognitive environment of the rememberer” (1973, pp. 352, 369). The ‘cognitive environment’, here, is “the totality of conditions determining the encoding of a perceived item”.
This ‘totality of conditions’ may be seen as a vital trigger to memory processing, or more controversially as itself potentially part of that processing. Increasing recognition of the context-dependent nature of memory now links cognitive psychology with a diverse body of recent work on cognition as ‘distributed’ across the body and the world as well as the brain. The aim is to set the connectionist mechanisms of transformation and reconstruction on internal representations into a broader picture of the operation of personal memory in an intricate interpersonal and cultural world. The case of memory might challenge the easy, institutionally-entrenched idea that cognitive psychology studies the individual mind, while social processes must be treated separately by the social sciences.
If memories are not fixed mental images or discrete items of any kind, permanently stored in the individual mind or brain, then the relatively unstable individual memory may need support from more stable external scaffolding or props. Experience attunes us to certain information or regularities or artifacts which we can exploit in the present. This is not to deny the importance of our capacity sometimes to remember experiences which are not retained in some external medium (section 2 above), but to suggest that we may only understand such capacities fully by attending also to our habitual uses of present resources to shape and anchor our versions of the past.
Both cognitive anthropologists and philosophers drawing on dynamical and situated approaches to cognition suggest a general framework for memory science incorporating traces both inside and outside the individual. This is not to collapse the distinction between external and internal representational formats: for a connectionist in particular, the kind of ‘storage’ mechanisms employed by the brain are quite distinct in format and process from those of most external linguistic or digital systems. The point rather is to see brain traces and external traces as potential parts of temporarily integrated larger systems, used by us so as more successfully to exploit and manipulate information in the environment. As Andy Clark puts it, “our brains make the world smart so that we can be dumb in peace” (1997, p. 180). Our interaction with different forms of external symbol systems and ‘cognitive technologies’ in some contexts alter our cognitive capacities. Culture and technology are products of cognition and action, but in the human case, as Merlin Donald argues, such products in turn “have direct effects upon individual cognition” (1991, p. 10).
So the best explanations of the form and content of specific personal memories may often refer not simply to the past episode itself, but to multiple causes which span internal and external factors. Cognitive scientists cannot legitimately ignore the transmission and transformation of external representations: conversely, some explanations in the social sciences of memory will refer to appropriately flexible internal processes of schematization or reconstruction.
This point might counter scepticism among both naturalistic philosophers of mind and a number of sociologists and historians about the very idea of a social ontology of memory. In his account of memories of the Holocaust, James Young prefers to use the term ‘collected memory’ instead of ‘collective memory’, because “societies cannot remember in any other way than through their constituents' memories” (1993, p. xi). Critics within the humanities have offered robust critiques of alleged conceptual confusions in the recent explosion of interdisciplinary work in memory studies: they complain that historians and sociologists mistakenly attribute memories to groups or to objects, when, on their view, only individuals can remember (Funkenstein 1989; Gedi and Elam 1996; Klein 2000; Berliner 2005). Discussing the work of the sociologist of memory Maurice Halbwachs, Fentress and Wickham worry that his concept of collective consciousness was “curiously disconnected from the actual thought processes of any particular person”, leaving later sociological accounts with the danger of treating the individual as “a sort of automaton, passively obeying the interiorized collective will” (1992, pp. ix-x).
But this embarrassment about social memory may be unnecessary if memory studies in the social sciences can be more firmly grounded in social ontology and social-cognitive psychology. Halbwachs was indeed critical of the individualism of the psychological theory of his time, but his positive views are closer to the ‘active externalism’ of the recent ‘extended mind’ hypothesis (section 3.5 below) than to any quasi-Jungian mysticism (Wilson 2005; Tollefsen 2006; Sutton 2009). What Halbwachs called ‘social frameworks of memory’ are not the simple product of isolated individual memories, constructed after the fact by combinations of separate reminiscences, but are rather, in part, their source, the instruments used in particular acts of recall. “There is no point in seeking where memories are preserved in my brain or in some nook of my mind to which I alone have access: for they are recalled to me externally” (Halbwachs 1925/1992, p. 38). The people and groups around me normally “give me the means to reconstruct” my memories. There's a sharp contrast, argues Halbwachs, between remembering and “the actual state of isolation” of a dreamer, who isn't capable directly of relying on these frameworks of collective memory: “it is not in memory but in the dream that the mind is most removed from society” (1925/1992, p. 42). Public scaffolding of various forms, in the physical, symbolic, and social environment, can shape the specific form and content of individual memory (see also Connerton 1989; Olick and Robbins 1998; Winter and Sivan 2000).
Accounts of memory in the social sciences do, however, often remain unnecessarily divorced from relevant research in developmental, cognitive, social, and organizational psychology, despite calls for integrative analyses and case studies (Olick 1999; Kansteiner 2002; Welzer and Markowitsch, 2005; Hirst and Manier 2008; Reese and Fivush 2008). For example, a robust tradition oddly neglected in the interdisciplinary literature on social memory is research on collaborative recall and transactive memory. Daniel Wegner and colleagues introduced the notion of transactive memory to describe the enduring, interactive forms of remembering among close groups such as friends, teams, or intimate couples. In such cases,
individual memory stores are physically separated. Yet it is perfectly reasonable to say that one partner may know, at least to a degree, what is in the other's memory. Thus, one's memory is “connected” to the other's, and it is possible to consider how information is arranged in the dyadic system as a whole. A transactive memory structure thus can be said to reside in the memories of both individuals—when they are considered as a combined system. (Wegner, Giuliano, and Hertel 1985, p. 257).
A transactive memory system has both knowledge components and process components: it is “a set of individual memory systems in combination with the communication that takes place between individuals” (Wegner 1986). The distribution of knowledge across individuals can be more or less differentiated and specialized, but there must be some higher-level agreement about and awareness of who remembers what if the group is to function as a more or less coherent transactive memory system: if a group can interactively integrate information over time, the theory predicts a form of socially emergent remembering when the collective remembers more than—or at least something different from—the sum of its members' memories (Wegner 1995). This theory has been put into practice in flourishing applied work in small group research and organizational psychology, as well as in the study of memory in older couples (Barnier, Harris, Sutton, and Wilson 2008).
In contrast, in a distinct line of research on collaborative recall, psychologists have found that in many circumstances groups working together remember less than a nominal group, measured as the pooled sum of non-redundant items remembered by the same number of individuals (Weldon and Bellinger 1997; Basden, Basden, and Henry 2000; Harris, Paterson, and Kemp 2008). These findings on collaborative inhibition are based, however, on materials that are not intrinsically significant to the participants, and groups of strangers with no history of interaction (Barnier, Harris, Sutton, and Wilson 2008). But when trained experts remember meaningful narrative units from their domain of expertise, in contrast, collaborative facilitation (position mnemonic emergence) results (Meade, Nokes, and Morrow 2009); and when material is generated and encoded together by group members, collaborative inhibition is eliminated. Philosophers and social scientists working on memory need to be better informed on these robust traditions of empirical research on shared memory phenomena.
The concept of ‘schema’ exemplifies fruitful interdisciplinary relations between psychology and cognitive anthropology. Theorists seek to describe relations between internal and external memory systems without either collapsing the distinction, or treating the internal as simply a reflection of the social. When Frederic Bartlett imported the term ‘schema’ into the psychology of memory from neurophysiology, he worried about its static implications: “I strongly dislike the term ‘schema’. It is at once too definite and too sketchy. … It suggests some persistent, but fragmentary ‘form of arrangement’, and it does not indicate what is very essential to the notion, that the organised mass results of past changes … are actively doing something all the time” (1932, p. 201). For Bartlett, a schema is not a definite or determinate cognitive structure at all: yet it's still a useful construct to capture the simultaneously conservative and creative aspects of memory. As an enduring but modifiable set of tendencies or dispositions, a schema may be invoked to explain or predict, for example, the way a story may be normalized in the remembering or retelling, with the schema driving easy inferences to uncertain or untold parts of the story.
Cognitive-psychological accounts of the schema were then implemented in connectionist models in the 1980s. The history of past processing is ‘stored’ in the (enduring but modifiable) matrix of connection weights of the neural network, and thus influences (in a causally holistic fashion) the ongoing processing of input (Rumelhart, Smolensky, McClelland, and Hinton 1986). Cognitive anthropologists have found this a helpful way to model, simultaneously, both the ‘centripetal’ forces of cultural reproduction and the competing ‘centrifugal’ processes of variation and inconsistency. Claudia Strauss and Naomi Quinn, for example, employ connectionist schema theory to show how cultural learning produces responses which are permeated by tradition and yet not rigidly repetitive (1997, chapter 3). The traces culture leaves on individual brains and bodies are not downloaded copies of any specified (or specifiable) cultural instructions, but are dispositions to partial, flexible, and action-oriented responses. The dynamics of intrapersonal memories, feelings, and motives may be quite different from those of interpersonal messages and practices, even if the boundaries between inner and outer are permeable.
But how plausible is the idea that there are memory traces outside the individual, in the world as well as the brain? How seriously can either cognitive or social scientists talk of ‘external memory’?
It's no accident that memory is at the heart of recent work on dynamical cognition and the embodied, embedded, and extended mind. On top of the connectionist focus on the plasticity of superpositionally stored memory traces, theorists explore forms of interplay or ‘coupling’ between such flexible internal representations and the (natural and social) environment (Donald 1991; Hutchins 1995; Clark 1997, 2002, 2008; Clark and Chalmers 1998; Haugeland 1998; Rowlands 1999; Dennett 2000; Auyang 2000, chapter 6; Giere 2002; Knappett 2005; Sutton 2010b). Linked in various forms of “continuous reciprocal causation” (Clark 1997, pp. 163–6), brain and world are often engaged in an ongoing interactive dance through which adaptive action results. The vehicles of representation in memory, as well as the processes of remembering, may spread out of the brain and be left in the world. Just as our problem-solving abilities depend in part on “our abilities to dissipate reasoning” by building “designer environments” (Clark 1997, pp. 180, 191), so our capacities to access, manage, and manipulate large bodies of information depend in part on the technological and cultural symbolic networks we've constructed to plug ourselves into (Donald 1991, pp. 269–360; Rowlands 1999, pp. 119–147; Sutton 2009).
The claim that ‘external memory’ is no mere metaphor does not rest on the idea that some external ‘representations’ (such as information in notebooks) are identical to internal mental representations, provided that they meet certain criteria of accessibility and reliability (as assumed for example in Adams and Aizawa 2001). Instead, the core idea is that quite disparate internal and external elements can be simultaneously co-opted into integrated larger cognitive systems, which have properties distinct from those of either inner or outer elements alone. The external media on which we rely as cognitive scaffolding are, as Clark argues, “best seen as alien but complementary to the brain's style of storage and computation. The brain need not waste its time replicating such capacities. Rather, it must learn to interface with the external media in ways that maximally exploit their peculiar virtues” (1997, p. 220). For example, our internal working memory, with its limited capacity and unreliability, is not duplicated in the various systems of ‘exograms’ which humans have produced: “unlike the constantly-moving and fading contents of biological working memory, the contents of this externally-driven processor can be frozen in time, reviewed, refined, and reformatted” (Donald 1991, p. 316). So biological working memory is often best seen as a loop in processes that transform information in external structures (Rowlands 1999).
But different environmental media for the storage, transmission, and transformation of information have their own peculiar virtues. The various kinds of memory scaffolding which humans use, from knots, rhymes, codes, diagrams, slide-rules, and sketchpads to artificial memory techniques, photographs, books, rituals, and computers, have quite different properties, so that the resources of the historian, media theorist, and social scientist may again have a role within cognitive science. While the enduring and expandable nature of some external symbol systems has indeed altered the informational environment in which brains develop, not all such systems are designed to hold information permanently in a context- or medium-independent fashion, and not all systems which are designed to do so actually succeed (Kwint 1999; Renfrew and Scarre 1999). Sciences of the interface will have to deal with heterogeneous mnemonic systems involving tools, labels, and technologies as well as embodied brains. Perhaps lawlike regularities will then be hard to find: critics of the extended mind complain that “there just isn't going to be a science covering the motley collection of ‘memory’ processes found in human tool use” (Adams and Aizawa 2001, p.61). This, however, is a price other philosophers may be prepared to pay if it encourages a proliferation of informed multidisciplinary narrative case studies of memory in cognition and culture.
The best general book on the philosophy of memory is Warnock (1987). Engel (1999) and Schacter (1996) are reliable and well-written introductions to the psychology of memory, while Conway (2005), Rubin (2006), and Nelson and Fivush (2004) offer good entry-points to advanced work in cognitive and developmental psychology respectively. An ambitious and critical thematic history of ideas and technologies of memory is found in Danziger (2008), with a focus on modern psychology. Draaisma (2000) and Krell (1990) include interesting, polemical surveys of memory metaphors and their central roles in theory-construction. Carruthers (2008), Small (1997), and Yates (1966) are wonderfully detailed histories of ancient and Renaissance memory techniques and practices, and Sutton (1998) includes a treatment of early modern theories. Hacking (1995) is a readable and provocative philosophical and historical account of problems about false memory and personal identity, while Campbell (2003) is an important philosophical treatment of related issues. In analytic philosophy, Martin and Deutscher's rich causal analysis (1966) can be supplemented by Bernecker (2008) and (on autobiographical memory) Campbell (1997) and Hoerl (1999). For phenomenological work on memory, start with Casey (2000) and Middleton and Brown (2005). In the broader interdisciplinary field, classic 20th-century works by Bartlett (1932) in psychology and Halbwachs (1950/1980) in sociology are still very much worth reading. Connerton (1989) and Fentress and Wickham (1992) include helpful overviews of studies of social and collective memory: see also the recent attempt to integrate psychology and social science in Hirst and Manier (2008).
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- Bibliography and resource list for the Interdisciplinary Study of Memory, (John Sutton, U. Macquarie)
- Memory references in PhilPapers, (David Bourget and David Chalmers, Australian National University)
- Resources on the Human Ecology of Memory, (John F. Kihlstrom, U. California, Berkeley)
- Resources and Courses on the History and Psychology of Memory, (Elizabeth Johnston, Sarah Lawrence College)
- Luce Program in Individual and Collective Memory, (Pascal Boyer, Washington U. St Louis)
- Memory Studies, (interdisciplinary journal)
- Memory, (psychology journal publishing empirical and theoretical research)
- Aristotle's text, On Memory and Reminiscence, (translated by J.I. Beare)
[Please contact the author with other suggestions]
connectionism | consciousness: unity of | memory: epistemological problems of | mental representation | neuroscience, philosophy of | perception: epistemological problems of | personal identity | time: the experience and perception of