First published Sat Oct 16, 2004; substantive revision Wed Apr 9, 2014

Mencius (fourth century B.C.E.) sought to defend the teachings of Confucius (551 to 479 B.C.E.) against other influential movements of thought, especially those associated with Mozi (fifth century B.C.E.) and Yang Zhu (fifth to fourth century B.C.E.). He is probably best known for the view that “human nature is good,” on the basis of which he defended the Confucian ideal and developed an account of the self-cultivation process. His view was subsequently challenged by Xunzi (third century B.C.E.), another major Confucian thinker, who defended the alternative view that “human nature is bad.”

Confucian thinkers of the Han (202 B.C.E. – 220 C.E.) were influenced by the teachings of both, but by the late Tang (618–907), influential intellectuals such as Han Yu (768–824) came to regard Mencius as the true transmitter of Confucius's teachings. This view was shared by Confucian thinkers of the Song (960–1279), and Zhu Xi (1130–1200) included the Mengzi (Mencius) as one of the Four Books, which became canonical texts of the Confucian tradition. Mencius came to be regarded as the greatest Confucian thinker after Confucius himself, and his teachings have been very influential on the development of Confucian thought in the Song, Ming (1368–1644), Qing (1644–1912), and up to modern times.

1. Background

“Mencius” is a Latinization (coined by Jesuit missionaries in the 17th century) of the Chinese “Mengzi,” meaning Master Meng. His full name was “Meng Ke.” Our main access to Mencius's thinking is through the eponymous collection of his dialogues, debates, and sayings, the Mengzi (Mencius). This work was probably compiled by his disciples or disciples of his disciples. It was subsequently edited and shortened by Zhao Qi in the second century C.E., who also wrote a commentary on the text. This version of the text was used by subsequent scholars and is the version available to us nowadays. The received text of the Mencius is divided into seven “books,” each of which is subdivided into two parts (labeled “A” and “B” in English), and then further subdivided into “chapters.” As a result, a passage can be uniquely identified in any translation; for example, 1A1 is the first passage in any edition or translation of the text and 7B38 is the last.

Mencius was born in the early part of the Warring States period (403 to 221 B.C.E.), a time of great social and intellectual ferment. This was in the waning years of the Zhou dynasty (c. 1040 to 249 B.C.E.) when the Zhou king was merely a figurehead and China was divided into different states with their own rulers, who often waged war against each other. During this period, philosophers articulated various accounts of the Way (the right way to live and to organize society) that would rescue people from the contemporary chaos and suffering. Details of Mencius's early life are sketchy and uncertain, but he is said to have been born in the state of Zou, in what is now Shandong Province. His father supposedly died when Mencius was young, leaving him and his mother in poverty, and there are several famous stories of the determination of Mencius's mother to provide a good education for her son.[1] Mencius is said to have studied under Confucius's grandson Zisi, and then as an adult he traveled to different states in an attempt to convince their rulers to govern through benevolence and moral suasion rather than brute force. In a memorable turn of phrase, he warned one ruler that to attempt to conquer the world through military means was as hopeless as “climbing a tree in search of a fish” (1A7).

The Mencius makes reference to a number of key philosophical terms in early Chinese thought as well as to ideas associated with the teachings of Confucius as recorded in the Lunyu (Analects). Three important terms are tian (Heaven), ming (mandate, decree, destiny), and de (Virtue, power). In early Zhou thought, Heaven (tian), which literally referred to the skies above, was viewed as a personal entity responsible for various natural phenomena, having control over human affairs, and having emotions and the capacity to act. It was viewed as just and loving, and as the source of political authority. The king retains the authority to rule only so long as he has the mandate (ming) from Heaven (tian), and his retention of the mandate of Heaven (tian ming) depends on his Virtue (de). Virtue referred to qualities such as generosity, self–sacrifice, humility, and receptiveness to instruction. In this sense it is much like the Western concept of “virtue.” However, an important aspect of Virtue is its capacity to induce others to willingly follow its possessor without the need for coercion. Confucius described the effect of Virtue using an astronomical metaphor: “One who practices government by virtue may be compared to the North Star: it remains in its place while the multitude of other stars turn around it” (Analects 2.1; Gardner 2007, 13). The king's Virtue is manifested in his caring for the people and properly fulfilling his responsibilities. If a king fails to be Virtuous, the mandate will be stripped from him and given to someone else, who will overthrow the reigning king and found a new dynasty.

The Analects of Confucius shows a broadening of these key concepts. While they continue to have their original political implications, they are increasingly seen as having a more general application to human ethics. For example, Heaven came to be viewed as the source of norms of conduct governing the behavior of all people. That a human should behave in a certain manner is regarded as something mandated or decreed (ming) by Heaven (tian). In addition, while the traditional conception of a loving and just Heaven is still influential, texts from this period sometimes portray Heaven as the source of certain brute facts that obtain independently of human effort, whether morally just or not, such as the length of one's life. Part of being a good person is learning to accept Heaven's will without bitterness. Thus, Confucius remarks with sadness but with acceptance that one of his most talented disciples died when young: “Unfortunately, the time allotted to him (ming) was short, and he died” (Analects 6.2; Gardner 2007, 22).

The Analects continues to view Virtue as the basis for government; a king with Virtue will have a transformative effect on the people, and will be able to recognize and employ able and worthy officials in government. At the same time, the text also uses the term to refer to desirable qualities not just in the king but in people generally. In addition, it highlights three other key terms, ren, li, and yi. Ren is often translated as “benevolence” or “humaneness,” and is used by the text in a broader and a narrower sense. In the broader sense, it refers to an all–encompassing ideal for human beings that includes such desirable attributes as wisdom, courage, filial piety, loyalty, trustworthiness, caution in speech, and the ability to endure adverse circumstances. In the narrower sense, it emphasizes affective concern for others, and on one occasion is explained in terms of love for fellow human beings (Analects 12.22). Li originally referred to religious rites or rituals, such as sacrificial offerings of food or wine to the spirits of one's ancestors. However, the term later came to be used to refer to rules of conduct governing not just ceremonial behavior but also behavior in other social contexts, including matters of general ethics or even etiquette (12.1). Yi is conventionally translated as “rightness,” when it refers to a quality of an action, or “righteousness,” when it refers to a quality of an individual. In its earlier use, the character probably had the meaning of a proper regard for oneself, involving such things as maintaining one's honor and not brooking insults. By the time of Confucius, it had come to be used more generally in connection with conduct appropriate to one's role and to avoiding ethically shameful behavior. In the Analects, rightness is to a large extent determined by conformity with ritual. However, a conception is already emerging that regards righteousness as underlying the observance of ritual and as providing the basis for assessing and possibly departing from the rituals (e.g., Analects 9.3). (As we shall see in Section 2, below, each of these terms will also play a key role in the thought of Mencius.)

Mozi (fifth century B.C.E.) is the first systematic philosophical critic of Confucianism. He is generally interpreted as a sort of impartial consequentialist, who grounds ethics in maximizing overall benefit or profit, where this is defined in terms of material goods such as wealth, populousness, and social order. On this basis, Mozi criticizes the Confucian emphasis on ritual, regarding as wasteful such Confucian practices as elaborate funerals, lengthy mourning periods, and musical performances. In addition, Mozi advocated impartial caring (jian ai, sometimes translated “universal love”), which he distinguished from the filial piety or differentiated caring of the Confucians.[2] Mozi argued that caring more for oneself, one's family, or one's state was the cause of the warfare and cruelty of his era, and that impartial caring would lead to greater harmony and material satisfaction. Mozi acknowledged that people do not seem to be predisposed to have impartial care for others. However, he argued that human motivations are highly malleable, and can be radically altered, so long as humans are given appropriate rewards for compliance and punishments for disobedience.

At the other extreme from Mozi's impartial caring, Yang Zhu (fifth to fourth century B.C.E.) emphasized nourishing one's xing, a term often translated as “nature.” Earlier uses of the term referred to the direction of growth of a thing, and eventually the term came to also refer to needs and desires that a thing has or to certain tendencies characteristic of it.[3] Yang Zhu's conception of human nature emphasizes the needs and desires associated with biological life, including living a long life and satisfying one's basic physical desires. Yang Zhu advocated following and nourishing one's nature and avoiding political participation, which at that time often posed great danger to oneself. While it is possible that Yang Zhu was not actually indifferent to others and to the political order, Mencius interpreted Yang Zhu's position to be a form of selfish regard for oneself to the exclusion of others. For Mencius, just as the Mohist doctrine of impartial caring neglects one's parents by treating them as no different from others' parents, the Yangist position neglects one's ruler by advocating political withdrawal. From Mencius's perspective, these two positions together undermine the family and the state, the foundations of human society. Mencius saw his task as one of defending Confucius's teachings against the threat posed by these two opposing movements (3B9).

2. The Ethical Ideal

Mencius elaborated on the Confucian ideal by highlighting four virtues — ren (benevolence, humaneness), li (propriety, observance of rites), yi (righteousness), and zhi (wisdom). While he retained the use of benevolence in the broader sense to refer to an all–encompassing ethical ideal, he used it more often in the narrower sense to emphasize affective concern. Benevolence in this narrower sense has to do with love or concern for others, and involves a reluctance to cause harm and the capacity to be moved by the suffering of others. The scope of such concern includes not just human beings but also certain kinds of animals (1A7). However, there is a gradation in benevolence in that one has special concern for and obligations to those closer to oneself, particularly family members. Benevolence results from cultivating the special love for parents that everyone shares as an infant (7A15) and the affective concern for others shown in the well–known Mencian example of our commiseration for the infant on the verge of falling into a well (2A6).

Besides using yi to refer to the rightness of conduct, Mencius also used it to refer to a virtue, righteousness, that has to do with a proper regard for oneself and distancing oneself from disgrace. However, disgrace is not measured by ordinary social conventions but has to do with one's falling below certain ethical standards. As an ethical attribute, righteousness has to do with a firm commitment to such standards. One regards what falls below such standards as potentially tainting oneself, and insists on distancing oneself from such occurrences even at the expense of death. One example is that of a beggar, who is starving to death, being given food in an abusive manner. The beggar would reject the food despite the resulting loss of life; according to Mencius, everyone shares responses of this kind, which provide the starting point for cultivating righteousness (6A10).

Mencius continued to use li to refer to various rules of conduct in ritual and other kinds of social contexts, but also used it to refer to a virtue, propriety, having to do with the observance of rituals. This virtue involves a general disposition to follow the rites, as well as a mastery of the details of the rites that enables one to follow them with ease. It also involves one's observing the rites with the proper attitude and mental attention, such as reverence in interacting with others or sorrow in mourning. However, Mencius is clear that one should be prepared to suspend or depart from the rites in exigent circumstances. For example, he notes that rescuing one's sister–in–law if she were drowning would justify violation of the ritual prohibition on physical contact between unmarried men and women (4A17).

The fourth virtue, wisdom (zhi), involves an understanding of and commitment to the other virtues, especially benevolence and righteousness (4A27), and an ability to properly assess individuals and situations (5A9). Mencian wisdom (somewhat like Aristotelian phronesis) seems to be only partially constrained by rules. He notes that no sage would kill an innocent person, even if it meant obtaining control of (and being able to benefit) the whole world (2A2). However, he also stresses that sages often act very differently from one another, but if they “had exchanged places, each would have done as the other” (Mengzi 4B31; Van Norden 2008, 114; cf. 4B29). The ultimate standard for any action is “timeliness” (5B1), which seems to mean performing the right action out of the appropriate motivation for this particular situation.

Besides the above four virtues, Mencius also highlighted other desirable qualities such as a steadfastness of purpose that enables one to follow what is proper without being swayed by fear or uncertainty. For him, the ideal form of courage involves an absence of fear and uncertainty that is based on one's awareness that one is adhering strictly to what is proper, or righteous (2A2). He also urged that one should cultivate oneself so that one follows what is proper and willingly accepts unfavorable conditions of life that are not within one's control or are of such a nature that altering them requires improper conduct. The point is sometimes put by saying that one should willingly accept fate (ming), what is not within one's control, and according to Mencius, one should devote effort to ethical pursuits and not worry about these external conditions of life (2B13, 7A2).

3. The Heart/Mind and Human Nature

In early Chinese thought, xin, which literally refers to the physical heart, is regarded as the site of both cognitive and affective activities. It is translated sometimes as “heart,” sometimes as “mind,” and in recent literature often as “heart/mind” to highlight the different aspects of the activities of xin. The heart/mind can form certain directions, which can take the form of long term goals in life or more specific intentions. For Mencius, the four virtues—benevolence, righteousness, wisdom, and propriety—result from our cultivating four kinds of predispositions of the heart/mind that everyone shares. These include sympathy or commiseration, the sense of shame, a reverential attitude toward others, and the sense of right and wrong. He referred to these as the four “sprouts” or “beginnings,” and regarded the four virtues as growing from these predispositions in the way that a plant grows from a sprout. Besides commiseration and the sense of shame, he also regarded love for parents and obedience to elder brothers as the starting point for cultivating benevolence and righteousness respectively. His view that the heart/mind has these ethical predispositions provides the basis for his response to the Mohist and the Yangist challenges.

Mozi did not believe that human beings have any specific set of ethical predispositions to begin with, but thought that one could restructure one's motivations accordingly after endorsing the doctrine of impartial caring. However, in the absence of such predispositions, the practice of indiscriminate concern seems humanly impossible, a point seized upon by Mozi's opponents. Mencius, on the other hand, held the view that human beings have ethical predispositions that relate to the ethical ideal in the way that a sprout relates to a full–grown plant.[4] Such predispositions contain within them a direction of development in the way that a sprout contains within it a certain direction of growth, and they also provide the appropriate emotional resources that one can draw on to achieve the ideal. In his debate with a contemporary Mohist Yizi, Mencius put the point by saying that the ethical way of life has one root — both the validity of that way of life and the emotional resources required for living it have one root in the relevant predispositions (3A5).

Related points are made in Mencius's debate with another contemporary intellectual, Gaozi. Mencius opposed Gaozi's view that righteousness is external, and also opposed part of a maxim of Gaozi's that says: “what you do not get from doctrines, do not seek for in your heart” (Mengzi 2A2; Van Norden 2008, 37). While the nature of these disagreements has been subject to different interpretations, it is likely that Mencius was again making similar points about the basis of our ethical life. For Gaozi, righteousness is external in that one should seek it from ethical doctrines, and if one cannot obtain it from doctrines, there is no point in seeking it from within the heart/mind. By contrast, Mencius believed that the heart/mind already has ethical predispositions that point in an ethical direction. Accordingly, righteousness is internal in that our recognition of what is proper derives from these predispositions of the heart/mind rather than from external doctrines, and so one should seek righteousness in the heart/mind rather than from doctrines.[5]

Another view of Gaozi's that Mencius opposed had to do with the moral tendencies of human nature. Gaozi held that there is neither good nor bad in human nature (xing) and that one should derive righteousness from doctrines and reshape oneself accordingly. For Gaozi, human nature has to do primarily with eating and having sex, the two activities that continue life in human beings, both within the individual and from generation to generation (6A1, 6A4). Mencius, on the other hand, characterized human nature in terms of the direction of development of the ethical predispositions of the heart/mind, and for him human nature is good as these predispositions already point in an ethical direction. The task of self–cultivation is not to reshape but to nourish one's predispositions.

Yang Zhu was similar to Gaozi in that both construed human nature in terms of narrowly biological drives. However, while Gaozi argued that following the Way required deviating from and reshaping human nature, Yang Zhu argued that we should follow human nature. Human nature has its source in Heaven, and so one also serves Heaven by nourishing and cultivating our natural predispositions. Mencius agreed with Yang Zhu that human nature is the standard for proper development, but he rejected Yang Zhu's narrowly biological conception of human nature. According to Mencius, human nature is also constituted by the ethical direction implicit in the predispositions of the heart/mind. Mencius did not deny that human beings have biological tendencies, but held that the ethical predispositions of the heart/mind have priority over these other tendencies and should more properly be viewed as the content of human nature (6A15). Examples like the beggar who declined food given with abuse, even at the expense of loss of life, show that human beings do believe that ethical propriety has priority over even life itself (6A10).

4. Self–Cultivation and the Political Order

Although the heart/mind has the relevant ethical predispositions, they need to be nourished for them to grow and flourish. One should direct attention to these ethical predispositions and act in accordance with them till one can do so with ease and can take joy in so acting (4A27). At the same time, just as one should avoid injury to a plant in order to allow it to grow, we also need to attend to the various factors that can potentially harm one's ethical development. Mencius on several occasions highlighted the senses as something that can lead one astray. The senses operate automatically — when they come into contact with their ideal objects, they are pulled along by these objects and have neither the capacity to reflect on the propriety of the course of action nor the capacity to refrain from being pulled along. By contrast, the heart/mind has the capacity to reflect on what is proper, and has the capacity to halt any course of action it regards as improper. The heart/mind should do so under the guidance of its ethical predispositions, and should constantly exercise these capacities to ensure that one progresses in an ethical direction (6A15). However, the ultimate goal of the process of ethical cultivation is to become the sort of person who spontaneously follows the Way, without the need for either external coercion of strength of will.

There are other factors that can interfere with one's ethical development. One may be led astray by erroneous ethical doctrines, such as the teachings of the Mohist and the Yangist, and Mencius explicitly stated that he saw one of his main tasks as that of combating such doctrines (3B9). One may also be led astray by certain forms of problematic desires. For example, in a series of dialogues between Mencius and King Xuan of the state of Qi, the king referred to his great desire to expand territories and even to his feverish desires for wealth, sex, and display of valor. These desires not only led the king to harsh policies, but also led him to engage in rationalizations about how he lacked the ability to be caring toward his people. Mencius's response was to try to steer the king toward seeing that a more caring policy toward the people is not only compatible with the king's desires, but actually enables their attainment in a higher form (1B1–5).

Like Confucius, Mencius regarded the transformative power of a cultivated person as the ideal basis for government. In addition, he spelled out more explicitly the idea that order in society depends upon proper attitudes within the family, which in turn depend upon cultivating oneself. Also, he made explicit the point that gaining the heart/mind of the people is the basis for legitimate government, as it is the response of the people that reveals who has the authority from Heaven to take up the position of king (5A5). Only the ruler who practices benevolent government can draw the allegiance of the people, and such a ruler will become invincible, not in the sense of superior military strength, but in the sense of being without opposition. A benevolent ruler enjoys the allegiance of the people and is unlikely to confront any hostilities; even if a few seek to oppose him, the opposition can easily be defeated with the support of the people. This idea provides one example of how Mencius would try to convince a ruler that his initial desire (viz., being invincible in the sense of superior military strength) can be accomplished in a higher form (viz., being invincible in the sense of being without opposition) through the practice of benevolent government (1A7).

5. Later Influence and Interpretations

During the Warring States Period (403 to 221 B.C.E.) Mencius's views were criticized by the Daoist Zhuangzi and by his fellow Confucian Xunzi. Zhuangzi never refers to Mencius by name, but several passages seem to clearly be directed at him. In a passage that argues against the possibility of objective ethical knowledge, Zhuangzi states, “From where I see it, the sprouts of benevolence and righteousness and the pathways of right and wrong are all snarled and jumbled” (Zhuangzi 2; Ivanhoe and Van Norden 2005, 222). The phrase “sprouts of benevolence and righteousness” (ren yi zhi duan) is quite unusual, and many translators struggle to make sense of it. The key is to remember Mencius's phrases “sprout of benevolence” (ren zhi duan) and “sprout of righteousness” (yi zhi duan) from 2A6. While Mencius compares our innate but incipient dispositions toward virtue to the sprouts of plants, which must be cultivated in order to reach maturity, Zhuangzi suggests that there is no way to disentangle “sprouts” from weeds, if there even is any non–arbitrary distinction between them. Another implicit critique of Mengzi is found in a fictional dialogue in which Zhuangzi uses “Confucius” as the spokesperson for his own views, and advises someone, “Do not listen with your heart but listen with your qi. … The heart stops with signs. Qi is empty and waits on external things. Only the Way gathers in emptiness. Emptiness is the fasting of the heart.”[6] So Zhuangzi prioritizes following the qi, the impersonal fluid that flows through all things and binds them together, over following the heart. This seems to be a deliberate inversion of Mencius's view in 2A2, where he advises, “What you do not get from your heart, do not seek for in the qi” (Van Norden 2008, 37). Notice also that, whereas Mengzi encourages us to cultivate our heart, Zhuangzi encourages us to “fast” it.[7]

Xunzi attacks Mencius by name in his essay, “Human Nature Is Bad”:

Mengzi says: When people engage in learning, this manifests the goodness of their nature. I say: This is not so. This is a case of not attaining knowledge of people's nature and of not inspecting clearly the division between people's nature and their deliberate efforts. ... Those things in people that cannot be learned and cannot be worked at are called their “nature.” Those things in people that they become capable of through learning and that they achieve through working at them are called their “deliberate efforts.” (Ivanhoe and Van Norden 2005, 299)

It is common to observe that Mencius and Xunzi are speaking at cross–purposes, because they assume different conceptions of the key term “nature” (Graham 1967). For Mengzi, a paradigmatic example of something fulfilling its nature is a sprout maturing into a full–grown plant. This process requires a healthy environment and is assisted by active cultivation on the part of the farmer. In contrast, for Xunzi, only the characteristics that something has fully and innately are part of its nature: “Now people's nature is such that their eyes can see, and their ears can hear. is clear that one does not learn these things” (Ivanhoe and Van Norden 2005, 299–300). However, is is possible that Mencius and Xunzi still have a substantive disagreement, even if Xunzi's way of framing that disagreement is misleading. As we have seen, Mencius thinks that all humans are born with innate but incipient dispositions toward virtue. Xunzi seems to explicitly deny this: “As for the way that the eyes like pretty colors, the ears like beautiful sounds, the mouth likes good flavors, the heart likes what is beneficial, and the bones and flesh like what is comfortable — these are produced from people's inborn dispositions and nature.” In contrast, “...ritual and the standards of righteousness are produced from the deliberate effort of the sage...” (Ivanhoe and Van Norden 2005, 300). The fundamentally different views of Mencius and Xunzi on human nature are reflected in their different metaphors for ethical cultivation. For Mencius, ethically cultivating human nature is like encouraging the innate tendency of a sprout to grow to maturity; for Xunzi, humans require ethical cultivation just as “crooked wood must await steaming and straightening on the shaping frame, and only then does it become straight. Blunt metal must await honing and grinding, and only then does it become sharp” (Ivanhoe and Van Norden 2005, 298).

Confucianism became a state–sponsored ideology during the Han dynasty (202 B.C.E.–220 C.E.), but it was a syncretic form of the philosophy that included elements of Daoism, Legalism, and the cosmological notions of yin–yang and the Five Phases. Mencius's writings were only one of many influences in this period. After the fall of the Han, Buddhism became increasingly influential socially and intellectually, reaching a peak in the Tang dynasty (618–907). This provoked a Confucian revivalist movement, the Learning of the Way (Daoxue), conventionally referred to in English as Neo–Confucianism. The polemical anti–Buddhist writings of Han Yu (768–824) are often seen as the flashpoint for the Confucian revival. In addition to denouncing Buddhist practices as unnatural and antithetical to the well being of the state, Han Yu singles out Mencius as the “most pure” of the followers of Confucius. Neo–Confucianism only comes to philosophical maturity, though, during the Song and Southern Song dynasties (960–1279). The major intellectual competitors to Confucianism at this time were Buddhism and Daoism. Neo–Confucians compared Mozi's impartial caring to Buddhist universal compassion. Similarly, Yang Zhu's egoism was seen as anticipating the Daoist search for individual immortality. Consequently, Neo–Confucians availed themselves of Mencius's arguments against his contemporaries to combat their own intellectual rivals. As a result, Neo–Confucians came to regard Mencius as having a particularly profound grasp of the true meaning of the teachings of Confucius, elevating him to the status of the “Second Sage.” Zhu Xi (1130–1200) grouped the Mengzi along with three other Confucian classics (the Great Learning, Analects, and Mean) as the Four Books, and wrote clear, detailed commentaries on each. The Four Books as interpreted by Zhu Xi became the basis of the civil service examinations in China, and continue to have an immense influence, even today.[8]

Ironically, due to the pervasive influence of Buddhism, Neo–Confucian philosophers often reinterpreted Mencius's views in the light of Buddhist metaphysical and ethical concepts. Confucians adopted the view that ethical cultivation was a matter of becoming enlightened (wu) about the fundamental Pattern (li, also translated principle) of the universe and thereby overcoming the selfishness (si) of human desires (ren yu) and forming one body (yi ti) with everyone and everything else. However, these terms are either absent or used in different senses in the texts of Confucius and Mencius.[9] A similar argument was made within the Chinese tradition by later Confucians such as Dai Zhen (1724–1777), who argued that, due to Buddhist influence, the Neo–Confucians understood terms like “Pattern” in anachronistic ways, and were led to an ethics that unnaturally devalued physical human desires.

In the early 20th century, many Chinese intellectuals became part of the May 4th Movement, which called for China to rapidly Westernize and modernize. As a result, Mencius's intellectual reputation suffered along with the rest of Confucianism. This trend continued during the rule of Mao Zedong, when Confucianism was dismissed as a decadent part of China's “feudal past.”[10] However, interest in Mencius continued in Hong Kong and Taiwan as part of the movement known as New Confucianism. New Confucianism is a diverse movement and it is difficult to find a commonly agreed–upon characterization of what is central to it. However, many New Confucians are influenced by the views of Mou Zongsan (1909–1995), who argued that Mencius and the Neo–Confucian Wang Yangming (1472–1529) accurately explicated what is implicit in the views of Confucius. In addition, Mou saw Kant as providing a way of understanding what is distinctive about the Mencian conception of morality, but also thought that Confucian ethics transcends certain limitations of Kant's thought.[11]

Since the death of Mao, there has been a resurgence of interest in Confucianism in mainland China. As a result, Mencius has become embroiled in contemporary debates over the role of Confucianism in Chinese ethics and political philosophy. In two much–debated passages, Mencius endorses the actions of a ruler who seems to put loyalty to his family over the welfare of the state (5A3, 7A35). Some argue that this illustrates that Mencius (and Confucianism in general) is committed to a form of nepotism that encourages corruption (see, e.g., Liu 2007). Others have argued for alternative interpretations of the significance of these passages (e.g., Guo 2007). Mencius is also at the center of the larger debate about whether Confucianism is consistent with democracy.[12] Mencius has been invoked as providing a potential foundation for democracy (Bai 2008), but others have cautioned about overestimating the extent to which he champions the will of the people as the source of political authority (Tiwald 2008).

In recent English–language scholarship, there has been considerable discussion of the role of “extension” in Mencius's philosophy. This debate has a long history, going back at least as far as Neo–Confucian arguments over the proper way to understand Mencius's claim that we must “extend” (tui, ji, da) or “fill out” (kuo, chong) our innate but incipient virtuous reactions (1A7, 2A6, 7A15, 7B31). Zhu Xi seems to understand this as a matter of discovering the universal Pattern, which is fully present in each thing that exists. We begin from the parts of the Pattern that are already clear to us, and infer (seemingly by an analogical process) to the manifestations of the Pattern in other cases. This issue was revived in Western scholarship by Nivison (1980). In a paradigmatic example (1A7), Mencius draws a ruler's attention to the fact that he had shown compassion for an ox being led to slaughter by sparing it. Mencius then invites the king to “extend” his compassion to his own subjects, who suffer due to the ruler's wars of conquest and exorbitant taxation. Nivison's work raises the issue of how the cognitive and motivational aspects of Mencian extension are related. What is the connection between the king perceiving the logical similarity of the suffering of the ox to the suffering of his own people and the king actually being motivated to act to help his people?[13]

Another recent trend in the study of Mencius and other Confucian philosophers has been the application of the framework of virtue ethics, beginning with Yearley (1990).[14] Mencius does seem similar to some major virtue ethicists such as Aristotle in emphasizing wisdom as a flexible responsiveness to complex situations, the cultivation of virtue over action–guiding rules, and nuanced discussions of the differences between genuine virtues and semblances or counterfeits of them (e.g., 7B37). However, as advocates of virtue ethics interpretations acknowledge, there are also substantial differences between Mencius and any Western virtue ethics. For example, Western virtue ethicists such as Aristotle place great value on purely theoretical contemplation, which Confucians typically regard as lacking intrinsic value. An additional contrast is that Confucians like Mencius see familial life as an important and intrinsic component of living well, whereas Aristotelians (arguably) see the family as, at best, a necessary means to supporting virtuous action.

New Confucian and virtue ethics interpreters of the Mencius have both been criticized for projecting an alien vocabulary onto the text. Indeed, sometimes advocates of the two approaches make these objections against one another (see Yu 2008, and Angle and Slote 2013). However, any interpreter must bring to the text her own vocabulary for explicating what seems obscure. This is true whether the commentators are Song dynasty Confucians using Buddhist–influenced terms in Middle Chinese, New Confucians availing themselves of Kantian notions while writing in contemporary Mandarin, or English–language scholars employing the vocabulary of virtue ethics. Consequently, the only real issue is whether they have provided the most plausible explanation of what is implicit in the texts they interpret. The ongoing debates on these issues promise to be exciting and productive.


Works by and about Mencius

  • Bai, Tongdong, 2008, “A Mencian Version of Limited Democracy,” Res Publica, 14: 19–34.
  • Chan, Alan K. L. (ed.), 2002, Mencius: Contexts and Interpretations, Honolulu: University of Hawaii Press.
  • Gardner, Daniel K. (trans.), 2007, The Four Books: The Basic Teachings of the Later Confucian Tradition, Indianapolis: Hackett Publishing.
  • Graham, A. C., 1967, “The Background of the Mencian Theory of Human Nature,” Tsing Hua Journal of Chinese Studies, 6: 215–71. Reprinted in idem, Studies in Chinese Philosophy and Philosophical Literature, Albany: State University of New York Press, 1990, pp. 7–66.
  • Graham, A. C., 1989, Disputers of the Tao: Philosophical Argument in Ancient China, La Salle, Illinois: Open Court.
  • Guo, Qiyong, 2007, “Is Confucian Ethics a ‘Consanguinism’?” Dao, 6.1 (March): 21–37. (See also the essay by Liu [2007], and the two special issues of Dao [7(1) (March 2008) and 7(2) (June 2008)] devoted to articles commenting on their exchange.)
  • Ivanhoe, Philip J., 2002, Ethics in the Confucian Tradition: The Thought of Mencius and Wang Yangming, 2nd edition, Indianapolis: Hackett Publishing.
  • Lau, D. C. (trans.), 1970, Mencius, New York: Penguin.
  • Lau, D.C. (trans.), 2003, Mencius, rev. bilingual edition, Hong Kong: Chinese University Press.
  • Legge, James (trans.), 1895, The Works of Mencius, 2nd edition, Oxford: Clarendon Press.
  • Liu, Qinping, 2007, “Confucianism and Corruption: An Analysis of Shun's Two Actions Described by Mencius,” Dao, 6(1) (March): 1–19. (See also the reply by Guo [2007], and the two special issues of Dao [7(1) (March 2008) and 7(2) (June 2008)] devoted to articles commenting on their exchange.)
  • Liu, Xiusheng, 2003, Mencius, Hume, and the Foundations of Ethics, Burlintgon, VT: Ashgate Publishing.
  • Liu, Xiusheng and Philip J. Ivanhoe (eds.), 2002, Essays on the Moral Philosophy of Mengzi, Indianapolis: Hackett Publishing.
  • Nivison, David S., 1980, “Mencius and Motivation,” Journal of the American Academy of Religion, Thematic Issue S, supplement to Journal of the American Academy of Religion, 47(3) (September): 417–432. (The full version of the essay is reprinted in Nivison [1996].)
  • Nivison, David S., 1996, The Ways of Confucianism: Investigations in Chinese Philosophy, La Salle, Illinois: Open Court.
  • Schwartz, Benjamin, 1985, The World of Thought in Ancient China, Cambridge, MA: Belknap Press.
  • Schwitzgebel, Eric, 2007, “Human Nature and Moral Education in Mencius, Xunzi, Hobbes, and Rousseau,” History of Philosophy Quarterly, 24(2) (April): 147–168
  • Shun, Kwong–loi, 1997, Mencius and Early Chinese Thought, Stanford: Stanford University Press.
  • Tiwald, Justin, 2008, “A Right of Rebellion in the Mengzi?” Dao, 7: 269–282.
  • Van Norden, Bryan W. (trans.), 2008, Mengzi: With Selections from Traditional Commentaries, Indianapolis: Hackett Publishing.
  • Wong, David, 1989, “Universalism vs. Love with Distinctions: An Ancient Debate Revived,” Journal of Chinese Philosophy, 16(3–4): 251–272.
  • Wong, David, 2013, “Chinese Ethics,” The Stanford Encyclopedia of Philosophy (Spring 2013 Edition), Edward N. Zalta (ed.), URL = <>.
  • Yearley, Lee H., 1990, Mencius and Aquinas: Theories of Virtue and Conceptions of Courage, Albany: State University of New York Press.

Other Works Cited

  • Angle, Stephen and Michael Slote (eds.), 2013, Virtue Ethics and Confucianism, New York: Routledge.
  • Chan, Joseph, 1999, “Confucian Perspective on Human Rights from Contemporary China,” in The East Asian Challenge for Human Rights, Joanne R. Bauer and Daniel A. Bell (eds.), New York: Cambridge University Press, pp. 212–237.
  • Ivanhoe, Philip J. and Bryan W. Van Norden (eds.), 2005, Readings in Classical Chinese Philosophy, 2nd edition, Indianapolis: Hackett Publishing.
  • Liu, Shaoqi, 1939, How to Be a Good Communist, in vol. 1 of Selected Works of Liu Shaoqi, Beijing: Foreign Language Press [Available Online].
  • Makeham, John (ed.), 2003, New Confucianism, Palgrave Macmillan.
  • Nivison, David S., 1956, “Communist Ethics and Chinese Tradition,” Journal of Asian Studies, 16(1): 51–74.
  • Sim, May, 2007, Remastering Morals with Aristotle and Confucius, New York: Cambridge University Press.
  • Tiwald, Justin and Bryan W. Van Norden (eds.), 2014, Readings in Later Chinese Philosophy, Indianapolis: Hackett Publishing.
  • Van Norden, Bryan W., 2007, Virtue Ethics and Consequentialism in Early Chinese Philosophy, New York: Cambridge University Press.
  • Wang, Robin R. (ed.), 2003, Images of Women in Chinese Thought and Culture: Writings from the Pre–Qin Period through the Song Dynasty, Indianapolis: Hackett Publishing. (See the translation of the stories about Mencius's mother on pp. 150–155.)
  • Yu, Jiyuan, 2007, The Ethics of Confucius and Aristotle, New York: Routledge.
  • Yu, Jiyuan, 2008, “The ‘Manifesto’ of New Confucianism and Revival of Virtue Ethics,” Frontiers of Philosophy in China, 3(3) (September): 317–334.

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Kwong Loi Shun

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