Moses Mendelssohn

First published Tue Dec 3, 2002; substantive revision Thu Feb 17, 2011

Moses Mendelssohn (b. 1729, d. 1786) was a creative and eclectic thinker whose writings on metaphysics and aesthetics, political theory and theology, together with his Jewish heritage, placed him at the focal point of the German Enlightenment for over three decades. While Mendelssohn found himself at home with a metaphysics derived from writings of Leibniz, Wolff, and Baumgarten, he was also one of his age's most accomplished literary critics. His highly regarded pieces on works of Homer and Aesop, Pope and Burke, Maupertuis and Rousseau — to cite only a fraction of his numerous critical essays — appeared in a series of journals that he co-edited with G. E. Lessing and Friedrich Nicolai. Dubbed “the Jewish Luther,” Mendelssohn also contributed significantly to the life of the Jewish community and letters in Germany, campaigning for Jews' civil rights and translating the Pentateuch and the Psalms into German. Not surprisingly, as a Jew with an unwavering belief in the harmonizing effects of rational analysis and discourse, Mendelssohn rankled both institutional and self-appointed advocates of Christianity as well as Judaism. Thus, Johann Lavater infamously challenged him to refute the arguments of the Pietist theologian, Charles Bonnet, or convert to Christianity (a challenge that Mendelssohn effectively disabled with a plea for tolerance and a series of reasons for refraining from such religious controversy). Similarly, some Jewish thinkers took exception to Mendelssohn's Jerusalem, or on Religious Power and Judaism and its argument for conceiving Judaism as a religion founded upon reason alone. In addition to the “Lavater affair” and his work as editor and critic, Mendelssohn was probably best known to his contemporaries for his penetrating accounts of the experience of the sublime, for lucid arguments for the soul's immortality and God's existence, for his close association with G. E. Lessing and, in the protracted “pantheism dispute” (Pantheismusstreit) with Jacobi during the 1780s, for his insistence that Lessing was not the Spinozist that Jacobi portrayed him to be. To posterity he is perhaps best known as the model for Nathan der Weise, the protagonist in Lessing's famous play of the same name, championing religious tolerance.


1. Life and career

1729 born September 6 in Dessau, Anhalt-Dessau, Germany
1743 follows Rabbi Frankel to Berlin and strudies with the Maimonides scholar, Israel Samoscz
1754 becomes accountant for firm of silk manufacturer, Isaak Bernhard; begins lifelong friendship with Gotthold Ephraim Lessing
1755 publishes anonymously “Philosophical Dialogues,” “On Sentiments,” and (with Lessing) Pope, a Metaphysician!
1756 publishes anonymously Thoughts on Probability and a translation with critical evaluation of Rousseau's second Discours
1757 publishes anonymously “Considerations on the Sources and the Connections of Fine Arts and Sciences” in Library of Fine Sciences and Fine Arts which he co-edits with Lessing and Friedrich Nicolai
1758 publishes anonymously “Considerations of the Sublime and the Naïve in the Fine Sciences” in Library of Fine Sciences and Fine Arts
1760 composes Hebrew commentary on Moses Maimonides' Logical Terms
1761 publishes Philosophical Writings, containing his previously published essays together with a new essay, “Rhapsody or Additions to the Letters on the Sentiments”
1762 marries Fromet Gugenheim
1763 awarded prize by the Royal Academy of Sciences for “On Evidence in Metaphysical Sciences” (published a year later)
1767 publishes Phaedo: or On the Immortality of the Soul, in Three Dialogues
1768 completes Hebrew commentary on Ecclesiastes; assumes co-management of Bernhard firm with Bernhard's widow
1769 publishes Letter to Lavater in response to Lavater's challenge to refute or embrace Charles Bonnet's arguments for Christianity
1771 publishes second edition of Philosophical Writings; onset of illness; denial of membership in Royal Academy
1777 publishes third edition of Philosophical Writings; intervenes successfully in Dresden to prevent expulsion of needy members of Jewish community
1780 publishes translation of Genesis
1781 publishes translation of Exodus
1783 publishes Jerusalem or On Religious Power and Judaism and translations of Pentateuch and Psalms
1784 publishes “On the Question: What does ‘to enlighten’ mean?”
1785 publishes Morning Hours or Lectures on the Existence of God
1786 dies January 4; final publication To the Friends of Lessing: An Appendix to Mr. Jacobi's Correspondence on the Doctrine of Spinoza appears January 26

2. Metaphysics and epistemology

Mendelssohn's “On Evidence in Metaphysical Sciences” (the so-called Prize Essay) garnered first prize in the contest staged by the Royal Prussian Academy of Sciences on the question of whether metaphysical truths are able to have the same sort of evidence as mathematical truths. (An essay by Immanuel Kant came in second place.) In the essay, published in 1763, Mendelssohn argues that metaphysics pursues its subject matter by applying the same method that mathematics does: conceptual analysis. As he puts it, “The analysis of concepts is for the understanding nothing more than what the magnifying glass is for sight” (Philosophical Writings, p. 258). But Mendelssohn then proceeds to differentiate the kinds of evidence in mathematics and in metaphysics in the following way. Like calculus, but unlike geometry, metaphysics works with concepts that are no less certain than those of geometry, but lack the transparency and imaginative resources available to the geometer's concepts. The difference between mathematics and metaphysics lies in the difference in the content of the concepts, namely, the difference between quantity and quality. At the same time, there is a basic harmony between the two disciplines since quantity and quality are both intrinsic characteristics of finite things and neither quantity nor quality exists without the other (though qualities and not quantities are allegedly conceivable without some other thing).

Mendelssohn acknowledges that, despite the fact that the method is the same and the content in each case (mathematics and metaphysics) is an intrinsic character of things, progress in metaphysics has lagged far behind that in mathematics. He suggests three “objective” reasons for this lag: first, metaphysics' greater reliance upon arbitrary signs (signs that do not essentially coincide with what is signified); second, the holistic content of metaphysics (no quality can be defined without an adequate insight into the others); and third, metaphysics' need to establish the actual existence of what corresponds to the analyzed concepts. Thus, for Mendelssohn, mathematical truths need not suppose more than the appearances of things as long as a distinction is maintained between constant and inconstant appearances or, equivalently, between appearances that have their basis in the intrinsic, essential constitution of our senses and those that do not (e.g., those due to sickness or a faulty perspective). “Thus, even in the system of a doubter or an idealist, the value of not only pure, theoretical mathematics but even practical and applied mathematics remains, and it retains its undeniable certainty” (Philosophical Writings, p. 268). Metaphysics, by contrast, requires a resolution of the problem of idealism.

Twenty-five years after the Prize Essay, Mendelssohn continues to struggle with the issue of idealism in Morning Hours, his final metaphysical work. Although he espouses a theism that is compatible with a realist position (what he dubs “dualism” as opposed to idealism, materialism, and skepticism), he appears to be moving toward a position that straddles an idealist/non-idealist divide. He views inquiry into something “extra-conceptual” as tantamount to “investigating a concept that is actually not supposed to be a concept and thus must be something contradictory” (Gesammelte Schriften, 3/2, pp. 60f). A further tilt in the direction of idealism is apparent in his rejection of the traditional definition of truth as an agreement of things with thoughts, on the ground that the copy (the thought) cannot be compared with original (the thing). Since thoughts can be compared with one another, he turns to them for a determination of truth, though it is not clear how this move can avoid idealism. At the same time, however, he contrasts certain truths consisting in the agreement of thoughts with themselves from actual truths, determined by adherence to principles of induction and analogy in addition to the principle of noncontradiction. The latter truths are truths about facts outside us or about a causal connection, though they are relative to certain factors: the number of sensations of a single sort that agree with one another, the number of different sorts of sensations that concur, and the number of times our assessment agrees with those of others, of other species, and of even “higher entities” (Gesammelte Schriften, 3/2, pp. 15f, 54f, 59). Echoing Descartes, Mendelssohn maintains that demonstration of God's existence is necessary to certify the actual existence of things outside us.

This ambivalence can perhaps be traced to the mature Mendelssohn's growing suspicions that the entire issue separating idealists and those supporting contrasting positions is misbegotten, a product of linguistic confusion (see the discussion of Mendelssohn's views on language below). “I fear that, in the end, the famous debate among materialists, idealists, and dualists amounts to a merely verbal dispute that is more a matter for the linguist than for the speculative philosopher” (Gesammelte Schriften, 3/2, p. 61). Mention has already been made of Mendelssohn's view in the Prize Essay that metaphysics' necessary reliance upon artificial signs is one reason why its difficulties are more intractable than those of mathematics. In 1785, in Morning Hours, he goes further: “You know how much I am inclined to explain all disputes among philosophical schools as merely verbal disputes or at least to derive them originally from verbal disputes” (Gesammelte Schriften, 3/2, p. 104). In keeping with these advancing suspicions about the origin and the efficacy of the issue over idealism and dualism (realism), Mendelssohn eventually comes to assign reason a mediating role in disputes between common sense and speculation. Common sense is usually but not invariably right, he contends, and hence reason's task is to present a defense of speculation when it departs from common sense. (This appeal to reason to mediate and, if necessary, to rein in speculation also plays a significant role in Mendelssohn's account of a “refined” or “purified” pantheism in Morning Hours. On this point, see below “8. Controversy with Jacobi over Lessing's alleged pantheism”).

3. Rational psychology

In Phaedo or On the Immortality of the Soul, loosely modeled on Plato's dialogue, Mendelssohn combines a paean to Socrates with an elaboration of the dreadful personal, moral, and political implications if a person's life is her “highest good.” A best-seller of its time, running through three editions, this “classic of rational psychology,” as Dilthey put it, also contains an argument for the simplicity and immortality of the human soul, explicitly singled out for criticism by Kant in the second edition of the Critique of Pure Reason. Mendelssohn supports the notion that the soul is simple and thus indestructible by noting that certain features of the soul, namely, the unifying character of consciousness and the identity of self-consciousness, cannot be derived from anything composite, whether those composite parts be capable or not of thinking. “We would be able neither to remember nor to reflect nor to compare nor to think, indeed, we would not even be the person who we were a moment ago, if our concepts were divided among many and were not to be encountered somewhere together in their most exact combination. We must, therefore, assume at least one substance that combines all concepts of the component parts…. There is, therefore, in our body at least one sole substance that is not extended, not composed, but instead is simple, has a power of presentation, and unites all our concepts, desires, and inclinations in itself” (Gesammelte Schriften, 3/1, pp. 96f). As for the human soul's fate after death, Mendelssohn appeals to divine goodness and providence, which perhaps explains why, following the publication of the Phaedo, he finds himself needing to revisit the proofs for God's existence.

4. Natural Theology

From the beginning of his career to the end, Mendelssohn consistently upheld the demonstrability of God's existence. However, not all arguments were equally compelling in his view. In the Prize Essay he contends that probable arguments for God's existence based upon beauty, order, and design are more eloquent and edifying but less certain and convincing than strict demonstrations. Similarly, in Morning Hours, he cites the argument that the external senses' testimony to an external world is unthinkable without a necessary, extra-worldly being, but adds that this sort of argument would hardly convince an idealist, sceptic, or solipsist. There are, however, at least two ways in which, according to Mendelssohn, God's existence can be established with certainty. The first way is through application of the principle of sufficient reason to the certain existence of contingent things. The inner testimony of one's own cogito attests to the existence of something contingent. Since the sufficient reason for the existence of contingent things must “indirectly” be a necessary being, a necessary being exists. Hence, Mendelssohn sums up this argument by saying: “I am, therefore there is a God.” (Philosophical Writings, p. 289; Gesammelte Schriften, 3/2, pp. 78, 83f).

Mendelssohn's second way of proving God's existence is based upon consideration of the idea of God together with the conditions of nonexistence. If something does not exist, then it is either impossible or merely possible. To say that something nonexistent is impossible is to say that its intrinsic properties are contradictory, e.g., a square circle. To say that something nonexistent is possible is to say that its intrinsic properties are insufficient to determine that it exists or, in other words, to say that it is contingent upon extrinsic factors that do not obtain. If God does not exist, then it is either because the idea of God is impossible or because it is merely possible, i.e., contingent. Since contingency entails dependency and independence is greater than dependence, it would contradict the essence of a perfect being for that being to be contingent. Hence, the idea of a perfect being cannot be the idea of something merely possible. But the idea of a perfect being also does not contain determinations that must be affirmed and denied at the same time; in other words, the idea is not impossible. In this way Mendelssohn concludes that God exists from the consideration that the idea of God cannot be the idea of something nonexistent. While we can conceive finite, contingent, entities as nonexistent, we cannot conceive as nonexistent an infinite, necessary entity, namely, an entity that combines all affirmative features and properties to the highest degree. “It can either not be thought at all or not be thought other than with the predicate of actual existence” (Gesammelte Schriften, 3/2, p. 154). In this connection, it deserves mention that Mendelsson rejects as quibbling the objection that existence is not a predicate. A concept of existence, he maintains, emerges in all of us in a similar way as we search for what is common to what we do and undergo, thereby enjoying a universality that is not further analyzable. Thus, Mendelssohn will allow that existence is not a predicate, that it is different from all features and properties of things, and, hence, cannot be merely added to the list of properties of the most perfect entity. Nevertheless, whether existence is the “position” of all properties of a thing or something inexplicable, Mendelssohn stands by his claim that we can only think something contingent without it. As he sums up the inference: “A God is thinkable, therefore a God is also actually present” (Gesammelte Schriften, 3/2, p. 78).

Towards the end of Morning Hours Mendelssohn introduces a further proof for God's existence, based upon our certainty of “the imperfectness of our self-knowledge” (Gesammelte Schriften 3/2, p. 147). We have certain knowledge, Mendelssohn contends, not only of ourselves but also of the limited scope of this knowledge. “I am not merely what I distinctly know of myself or, what amounts to the same, there is more to my existence than I might consciously observe of myself; and even what I know of myself is in and for itself capable of far greater development, greater distinctness, and greater completeness than I am able to give it” (Gesammelte Schriften 3/2, p. 141). From the limitations of our knowledge of ourselves (or, for that matter, of anything actual existing) together with the less plausible assumption that “that everything actual must be thought to be actual by some thinking being,” Mendelssohn infers that there is “an infinite intellect” that does represent everything to itself (Gesammelte Schriften 3/2, pp. 141ff).

5. Aesthetics

In On the Main Principles of the Fine Arts and Sciences, Mendelssohn sets out from the assumption that the human spirit has learned to imitate beauty, “the self-empowered mistress of all our sentiments,” in works of art. He then proceeds to ask what the arts have in common or, in other words, what beauty is. Batteux's thesis that art consists in the imitation of nature merely defers the question or, better, requires its revision to the effect that we ask what the beauties of nature and of art have in common. After rejecting Hutcheson's appeal to an aesthetic sense as a deus ex machina that forecloses inquiry, Mendelssohn contends that the common feature is a sensuously perfect representation (a contention that can be traced back to Sulzer and Baumgarten). “Sensuous” in this connection stands not simply for the fact that an object is sensed by the external senses, but also for the fact that an entire array of an object's features is perceived all at once. Unlike the distinct representation of a triangle whereby the intellect distinguishes parts and aspects of the triangle from one another, a sensuous representation is clear but indistinct, that is to say, to have a sensuous representation is to perceive something without intellectually distinguishing its parts or aspects. But we can sensuously perceive an order or harmony to those aspects without intellectually distinguishing them. Beauty or the perfect sensuous representation — whether in nature or in art — accordingly pertains to forms, orders, harmonies, and “indeed, everything capable of being represented to the senses as a perfection” (Philosophical Writings, p. 172). On this definition of art, what is represented can be ugly or repugnant as long as the representation is sensuously perfect (though Mendelssohn does address, as discussed below, the mixed sentiment that accrues when the object represented is unpleasant). From these considerations, Mendelssohn derives two necessary conditions of fine art and letters: faithfulness of the representation (“imitation”) and, far more importantly, the artistry, even “genius,” involved. In this connection, he argues that, as far as individual beauties in nature are concerned, they are inferior to the beauties produced by arts. In On the Main Principles Mendelssohn also establishes the general distinction between fine arts and fine science along the lines of the difference between natural and artificial signs. Whereas the “fine arts” (beaux arts) — music, dance, painting, sculpture, and architecture — predominantly work with natural signs, the “fine sciences” (belles lettres) — poetry and rhetoric — typically employ artificial signs. The distinction is hardly ironclad, however, and Mendelssohn ends On the Main Principles with a discussion of ways the arts may borrow from one another (e.g., allegorical painting) or combine (e.g., opera).

At one point in the dialogue On Sentiments (Mendelssohn's second publication but first publication on aesthetic matters), one of the protagonists differentiates three sorts of pleasure: sensuous, beautiful, and intellectual (a differentiation which approximates respectively the three sorts of perceptions elaborated by Leibniz and Wolff, among others, namely, confused, clear, and distinct). In this context, Mendelssohn explains how beauty affords a distinctive pleasure precisely as the unity of the multiplicity of things taken in by the senses (a view subsequently iterated, as we have seen, in On the Main Principles). Unaddressed by this differentiation of pleasures, however, are the so-called “mixed sentiments” that we seem to experience sometimes in viewing what is otherwise painful, terrifying, or, at any rate, does not exhibit the harmony or order typical of beauty. At first (namely, in On Sentiments) Mendelssohn thought that problem could still be handled by identifying some perfection in the object — e.g., the skillfulness of the gladiator, the virtue of the tragic figure — as the source of the pleasure that we feel. Six years later, in Rhapsody or additions to the Letter on sentiments, he revises his explanation of these mixed sentiments by noting that each individual representation has a subjective and an objective component. Subjectively or “as a determination of the soul,” the representation can affirm some perfection in the soul and thus be pleasing, even though objectively or “as a picture of the object,” we might find it repugnant. Tragedy is more complicated since the sympathy that we feel for the tragic figure is based upon both objective and subjective perfections (i.e., in him or her and us) as well as upon objective imperfection, the pain and injustice that befall him or her.

Mendelssohn gives another twist to his interpretation of “mixed sentiments” in the Rhapsody and then later in “On the Sublime and the Naïve in the Fine Sciences.” Experiences of the sheer immensities of things — “the unfathomable world of the sea, a far-reaching plain, the innumerable legions of stars, the eternity of time, every height and depth that exhausts us” (Philosophical Writings, p. 144) — sometimes make us tremble, but we still find them alluring. It is gratifying to experience them, though they confirm an imperfection as well as a perfection in us. In “On the Sublime,” Mendelssohn further distinguishes beauty as something bounded from immensity as something unbounded. He then distinguishes extended from non-extended (intensive) immensity. The sea's unfathomableness would be an example of extended immensity in nature; uniform repetition of temporal intervals in music would be an example of an attempt to represent the experience of an extended immensity in art. But Mendelssohn seems to be more interested in the non-extended or intensive immensities. “Power, genius, virtue have their unextended immensity that likewise arouses a spine-tingling sentiment but has the advantage of not ending, through tedious uniformity, in satiation and even disgust, as generally happens in the case of the extended immensity” (Philosophical Writings, p. 194). Mendelssohn then introduces the category of sublimity for the perfect representation of such intensive immensity, a representation that produces awe precisely because it passes beyond our customary expectations.

There is one last aspect of Mendelssohn's aesthetics that deserves mention, not least for its bearing on subsequent developments in aesthetics. It has already been noted that the pleasures of beauty and sublimity are not to be identified as purely sensuous or purely intellectual pleasures. In keeping with this differentiation, Mendelssohn differentiates the sort of approval involved in aesthetic experiences from knowledge or desire, though he insists that aesthetic feelings of pleasure can, nonetheless, serve “as the transition (Uebergang) as it were from knowing to desiring” (Gesammelte Schriften, 3/2, pp. 61f; Philosophical Writings, pp. 169, 307–310). In his adoption of three distinct capacities of the mind and in his appraisal of the aesthetic dimension as providing a bridge between matters of truth and falsity (capacities of knowing) and matters of good and evil (capacities of desiring), Mendelssohn plainly anticipates central aspects of Kant's mature, critical philosophy. A further, though less precise similarity also deserves mention, namely, the likeness between Kant's conception of the disinterested character of experience of the beautiful and Mendelssohn's conception of the experience as something affording us a pleasure that is neither simply sensuous or intellectual. “We consider the beauty of nature and art with pleasure and satisfaction, without the slightest movement of desire. Instead, it appears to be a particular mark of beauty that it is considered with tranquil satisfaction; that it pleases if we also do not possess it and we are still far removed from demanding to possess it” (Gesammelte Schriften, 3/2, p. 61; Philosophical Writings, pp. 34–51).

6. Political theory

In Jerusalem, or on Religious Power and Judaism Mendelssohn distinguishes church and state in order to demonstrate the salutary harmony between them and thus the need for tolerance. In the first part of the essay he accordingly argues that neither the state nor religion can legitimately coerce human conscience and, in the second part, he maintains that this argument against “religious power” is supported by Judaism. The second point was no less controversial than the first, especially since many Jewish elders and rabbis maintained a right to excommunicate. But Mendelssohn counters — apparently erroneously — that the practice is not inherent in “ancient, original Judaism” but rather borrowed in the course of time from Christianity.

Far from separating temporal and spiritual concerns to distinguish state and church (as Locke did), Mendelssohn insists that “our welfare in this life is … one and the same as [our] eternal felicity in the future” (Jerusalem, p. 39). Nor does he base the distinction between church and state on the difference between convictions and actions. “Both state and church have as their object actions as well as convictions, the former insofar as they are based on the relations between man and nature, the latter insofar as they are based on the relations between nature and God” (Jerusalem, p. 56f). As far as convictions are concerned, neither church nor state can coerce; “for here,” as noted earlier, “the state has no other means of acting effectively than the church does. Both must teach, instruct, encourage, motivate” (Jerusalem, p. 61). What contributes mightily to their potential for mutual reinforcement is the fact that there is also no difference in the make-up of the convictions and duties themselves. The only difference between church and state in the matter of convictions is their ultimate sanction. Thus, the moral philosopher will arrive at the same system of duties as the person who sees them as expressions of the divine; religion “only gives those same duties and obligations a more exalted sanction” (Jerusalem, p. 58). Matters are different when it comes to actions where the state can and must coerce, namely, when society's size and complexity “make it impossible to govern by convictions alone, [and] the state will have to resort to public measures, coercive laws, punishments of crime, and rewards of merit” (Jerusalem, p. 43). Herein lies for Mendelssohn the basic difference between state and church: civil society has, as the product of a social contract, the right to coercion, religious society has no such right. “The state has physical power and uses it when necessary; the power of religion is love and beneficence” (Jerusalem, p. 45).

In Jerusalem, Mendelssohn argues that Judaism is, at bottom, a natural religion, containing no revealed truths not available to unaided reason. Occasionally, as Allan Arkush points out (Jerusalem, p. 20), he speaks more guardedly, restricting this claim to the “essentials” of Judaism. Even with such qualifications, however, it is apparent that Mendelssohn approaches Judaism and its history with a more or less Deist view that the original, ancient faith confirmed nothing more than rational truths. Nonetheless, he combines this rationalist approach with a conception of revelation that underscores the distinctiveness of Judaism and secures Jewish believers their destiny as God's chosen people. For, while the Sinaitic revelation contains no supernatural truths, it does prescribe a way of life, the practice of which stands to benefit all mankind. (The interpretation of revelation strictly as legislation and not as adding to the store of truths is very likely borrowed, with qualifications, from Spinoza). “Judaism boasts of no exclusive revelation of eternal truths that are indispensable to salvation, of no revealed religion in the sense in which that term is usually understood. Revealed religion is one thing, revealed legislation, another” (Jerusalem, p. 97).

7. Language

Mendelssohn's main treatments of language can be found in two places, at the beginning and at the end of his career of writing. At the outset he critically addresses Rousseau's views on the origin of language in the context of the Berlin Academy's essay competitions on language (see Sendschreiben an den Herrn Magister Lessing in Leipzig, the appendix to the translation of Rousseau's Discours sur les origins de l'inégalité (1756), and Mendelssohn's review of Michaelis’ prize-winning essay (1759) in Briefe, die neueste Literatur betreffend and “Über die Sprache” (circa 1759)). Michaelis won the Academy's prize for answering its question: “Quelle est l'influence réciproque des opinions d'un people sur le langage et du langage sur les opinions?”). Mendelssohn takes issue both with Rousseau's attempt to explain the origin of human language on the basis of a description of the natural condition that human beings share with other animals and with his neglect of any consideration of the providential character of the development of language (Gesammelte Schriften 6/2, p. 27). In these early writings on language, Mendelssohn emphasizes the interdependence of language and its development with the development of innate, divinely-endowed capacities. These capacities include not only reason as the ability to grasp conceptual connections and employ arbitrary signs (Gesammelte Schriften 6/2, pp. 9f), but also — in tandem with the development of rational capacities — the capacity for compassionate interaction in familial and social settings. Thus, on the one hand, the recurrence of auditory, visual, and gesticular phenomena enables reason to signify phenomena bearing no resemblance to them and, indeed, to do so in a way decidedly different from how other animals instinctively employ natural, imitative signs (Gesammelte Schriften 6/2, p. 10). In this manner Mendelssohn underlines the interdependence of reason and language, understood as the use of arbitrary signs. On the other hand, language develops within a process that is social as well as cognitive and the starting point for the investigation of its origins is the family rather than the individual. Borrowing from Condillac and challenging Rousseau's view of language as primarily a tool for socialization, Mendelssohn writes: “The drive to social life is equally innate in human beings and leads immediately to the occasion for exercising the capacity for language”(Gesammelte Schriften 6/2, p. 8).

In Jerusalem, toward the end of his career, Mendelssohn returns to the subject of language in the context of articulating the sense in which Judaism is — for good reasons — a religion of the spoken rather than the written word, relying on an a living tradition to transmit and interpret divine legislation. In this context Mendelssohn again emphasizes the fundamentally social character of language in the context of the performance of rituals, while calling attention to the insecurity of reference over time and the feebleness of ostensive definition. In the course of arguing that human reason does not need supernatural revelation in order to recognize the eternal truths indispensable to its happiness, Mendelssohn notes that Judaism relies, not upon written phrases or formulations that are “established forever, immutable,” but instead upon a “living tradition passed on by oral instruction,” capable of keeping pace with changing times and circumstances (Gesammelte Schriften 8, pp. 160, 168). Judaism is thus for Mendelssohn primarily a religion of the spoken word precisely as a means of maintaining its relevance to real life in changing, historical contexts and maintaining the personal bonds and Jewish identity among its members.

Mendelssohn adds a further reason for insisting that Judaism is a religion of the spoken word, precisely as a supernatural legislation rather than a revealed religion. The constant attention paid to the written word not only can isolate human beings from one another and speculation from practice, but also can induce a kind of idolatry. Frozen in time, the written word can become an idol itself, obscuring the distinction between itself and what it is meant to signify.

In this connection Mendelssohn conjectures that written language emerged in the course of the development of visible signs, beginning with a form of synecdoche where a concrete object reawakens the thought of a particular characteristic, e.g., a dog as a sign of fidelity. While the move from these objects to images of them and ultimately to hieroglyphics seems natural enough, Mendelssohn muses that the transition from hieroglyphics to a written alphabet “required a leap,” far beyond ordinary human powers (Gesammelte Schriften 8, p. 174). Nonetheless, it is written language's hieroglyphic origins that Mendelssohn credits with the potential for superstition, idolatry, and speculative excess. Because hieroglyphic signs have no prototype in nature, they provided potent material for superstition and, indeed, Mendelssohn refers to the need for written signs as “the first occasion for idolatry” (Gesammelte Schriften 8, p. 179).

In the second chapter of Jerusalem, this general account of language and its development figures prominently in an argument that Judaism is a form of supernatural legislation rather than revelation. By regarding language as primarily a living dialogue between persons, Judaism does not lose sight of its communicative function for the sake of thought. As a result, theory and speculation remain tied to historical practice and concrete action. Not coincidentally, the language of Judaism is primarily prescriptive rather than descriptive; even its written prescriptions are “largely incomprehensible without unwritten commentaries … transmitted by oral instruction.” Hence, the use of language in Judaism — its script and ceremonial laws — fends off the all too human tendency to idolize the language itself.

The appeal to tradition (oral instruction) is necessary, Mendelssohn adds, given the fact that, over the course of time, the laws themselves become unintelligible “since no words or letters retain their sense unchanged from one generation to the next” (Gesammelte Schriften 8, p. 193). In chapter 1 of Jerusalem he makes a similar claim after noting (a) the elusiveness of inner perceptions to the perceiver herself and (b) the impossibility of two people using the same words to express the same “inner perceptions” (Gesammelte Schriften 8, pp. 133f). Where the words in question designate inner perceptions, there is no possibility of ostensive definition, no more when uttered today than when uttered ages ago. Indeed, in a passage that suggests both the inscrutability and endless deferral of reference, Mendelssohn observes that “words cannot be explained [erläutert] by things. Instead, we must again have recourse to signs and words and, ultimately, to metaphors” (Gesammelte Schriften 8, pp. 133f). Nonetheless, Mendelssohn is more confident about words designating objects of external perceptions and about the prospects for mutual understanding in regard to them. Not incidentally, ceremonial law's ritualized character calls for a recurrent context (including specific objects and persons) available to external perception in the course of an exchange between persons (including God). Notably, ‘you’ and ‘we’ take precedence over ‘I’ and ‘it’ in such contexts, as the living references of the former indexicals enables one to refer effectively to oneself and to things generally.

Thus, in Jerusalem Mendelssohn stresses the ritual and performative character of language, thereby complementing his view of the inextricability of language and a reason that tempers speculation with common sense. The mature Mendelssohn, keenly aware of the perils of ostension in determining reference, tempers the claims of speculation with those of common sense and is more concerned with bridging theory and practice in the rites of language than in the claims of pure theory. Nor should it be forgotten that Mendelssohn's recognition of language's basically ritualistic and empathic character, as a springboard to reason, is rooted in what he regards as the possibilities of Judaism.

8. Controversy with Jacobi over Lessing's alleged pantheism

Mendelssohn enjoyed, as noted at the outset, a lifelong friendship with G. E. Lessing. In addition to their work as co-editors, Lessing anonymously published Mendelssohn's earliest works and collaborated with him on the piece: Pope, a Metaphysician! Through his popular plays, his influential work as a dramaturg, and his stormy public debates with orthodox Lutheran clergy, Lessing was a particularly daunting and engaging spokesman for the German Enlightenment, making him all the more dangerous to its opponents. His final work, Nathan the Wiseman, fittingly portrays a Jewish sage (presumably modeled on Mendelssohn) who makes a poignant plea for tolerance by arguing that the differences among religions are essentially matters of history and not reason. Along with Mendelssohn, Lessing embraced the idea of a purely rational religion and would endorse Mendelssohn's declaration: “My religion recognizes no obligation to resolve doubt other than through rational means; and it commands no mere faith in eternal truths” (Gesammelte Schriften, Volume 3/2, p. 205). To pietists of the day, such declarations were scandalous subterfuges of an Enlightenment project of assimilating religion to natural reason. Mention has already been made of Lavater's attempt to draw Mendelssohn into religious debate. While Mendelssohn skillfully avoided that confrontation, he found himself reluctantly unable to remain silent when, after Lessing's death, F. H. Jacobi contended that Lessing embraced Spinoza's pantheism and thus exemplified the Enlightenment's supposedly inevitable descent into irreligion.

Following private correspondence with Jacobi on the issue and an extended period when Jacobi (in personal straits at the time) did not respond to his objections, Mendelssohn attempted to set the record straight about Lessing's Spinozism in Morning Hours. Learning of Mendelssohn's plans incensed Jacobi who expected to be consulted first and who accordingly responded by publishing, without Mendelssohn's consent, their correspondence — On the Teaching of Spinoza in Letters to Mr. Moses Mendelssohn — a month before the publication of Morning Hours. Distressed on personal as well as intellectual levels by the controversy over his departed friend's pantheism, Mendelssohn countered with a hastily composed piece, To the Friends of Lessing: an Appendix to Mr. Jacobi's Correspondence on the Teaching of Spinoza. According to legend, so anxious was Mendelssohn to get the manuscript to the publisher that, forgetting his overcoat on a bitterly cold New Year's eve, he delivered the manuscript on foot to the publisher. That night he came down with a cold from which he died four days later, prompting his friends to charge Jacobi with responsibility for Mendelssohn's death.

The sensationalist character of the controversy should not obscure the substance and importance of Mendelssohn's debate with Jacobi. Jacobi had contended that Spinozism is the only consistent position for a metaphysics based upon reason alone and that the only solution to this metaphysics so detrimental to religion and morality is a leap of faith, that salto mortale that poor Lessing famously refused to make. Mendelssohn counters Jacobi's first contention by attempting to demonstrate the metaphysical inconsistency of Spinozism. He takes aim at Jacobi's second contention by demonstrating how the “purified Spinozism” or “refined pantheism” embraced by Lessing is, in the end, only nominally different from theism and thus a threat neither to religion nor to morality.

Mendelssohn's criticisms of Spinoza are discussed below but first the complexity of his relationship to Spinoza should be noted. In his first publication, Dialogues (1761) he argued that many of Spinoza's views were compatible with “true philosophy and religion.” In Mendelssohn's mind, Leibniz may have given that “true philosophy” its sharpest formulation but in all likelihood by deriving its central idea of a preestablished harmony from Spinoza. Moreover, as Mendelssohn puts it, Spinoza does not so much deny the distinctiveness of the actual world as construe it as it is in the mind of God before the creation, existing only as a part of God (Philosophical Writings, 102ff, 108ff). A quarter of a century later, Mendelssohn recapitulates the latter argument as the key to understanding a “purified” or “refined” Spinozism that Lessing, at least in the realm of philosophical debate, would not have dismissed out of hand.

Nevertheless, as noted above, part of his response to Jacobi consists in demonstrating the shortcomings of Spinoza's philosophy. As might be expected, he criticizes Spinoza's idea that there is only one, infinite, and necessary substance. The idea is arbitrary, Mendelssohn contends, since one can legitimately distinguish between what is independent or self-standing (das Selbständige) and what obtains or persists for itself (das Fürsichbestehende). “Instead of proving that everything obtaining for itself is only one, he [Spinoza] establishes in the end only that everything independent is one. Instead of demonstrating that the entire aggregate of everything finite constitutes a single self-standing substance, he merely shows that this aggregate must depend upon the sole infinite substance” (Gesammelte Schriften, 3/2, p. 107).

On a “deeper level,” as Mendelssohn puts it, he also takes issue with Spinoza for failing to account for what Mendelssohn deems the “formal” aspects of both corporeal and spiritual worlds. Thus, Spinoza's conception of extension in terms of impenetrability may explain “the essence of matter,” but it leaves unexplained, Mendelssohn contends, the particular organization and movement of bodies. What is unclear to Mendelssohn is how parts can be in motion if the whole upon which they completely depend (Spinoza's substance) is not in motion. Similarly, he wants to know how, on the basis of Spinoza's account of the supposedly underlying attribute of extension, those parts come to have the particular form and organization of motions and forces that they have, that is to say, as organic, self-regulating entities. “Where can the origin of this [motion and form] be found?” he asks. “Not in the whole, since the whole has no movement. The sum [Sämmtliche] of all bodies, untied into a single substance, cannot change place and has neither organization nor figure…. Whence the form in the parts, if the whole provides no source for this?” (Gesammelte Schriften, 3/2, p. 108).

Just as Spinoza explains the matter but not the form of the physical world, so, too, Mendelssohn charges, he gives an account of the matter but not the form of the spiritual world. In this connection it is helpful to recall Mendelssohn's differentiation of knowing, approving, and desiring from one another. Truth and falsity, corresponding to knowing, provide the matter of the spiritual world. While they may, as Spinoza maintains, have their origin in thought as the attribute of a single, infinite substance, categories corresponding not to knowledge but to approving or desiring must have some other source. Thus, according to Mendelssohn, Spinoza leaves unexplained “the difference between good and evil, desirable and undesirable, pleasure and pain” (Gesammelte Schriften, III/2, p. 109).

Yet, while some of these criticisms of Spinoza may be compelling, they do not, Mendelssohn recognizes, carry the day for a refined Spinozist or pantheist. Mendelssohn observes that the Spinozist's inability to explain how movement and values derive from the attributes of the one, infinite substance does not automatically establish the theist explanation. Accordingly, in Morning Hours Mendelssohn casts Lessing as the spokesperson for a refined pantheism — a move that figures prominently in this contribution to the Pantheismusstreit. Lessing is portrayed as someone who, while agreeing with Mendelssohn's theist position, has a knack for giving every reasonable argument its full due. In this context Lessing presents a pantheism that characterizes the one and only substance, not only as a source of motion and desire, but also as capable of representing every possibility to itself and approving that possibility that constitutes “the best and most perfect series of things” (Gesammelte Schriften 3/2, p. 115). In other words, refined pantheism includes every aspect of the entire metaphysical system of theism but casts it solely as the object of divine intellect. As a result, a refined Spinozist might wonder how different the positions are since the theist purports to explain these seemingly recalcitrant phenomena merely by appealing to the divine will. A refined pantheist might accept the difference between the world (thought) and God (thinker) at a certain level, but insist that, in the end, it is a level of mere abstraction since thinking and thought can only be distinguished as long as one is not actually thinking. After all, “who is to tell us that we ourselves and the world surrounding us have something more to them than the thoughts of God and modifications of his original power?” (Gesammelte Schriften, 3/2, p. 116). To pretend to show that there is something that can be predicated of things outside God that cannot be predicated of the divine thoughts of those things is to deny divine omniscience.

But, without further qualifications, this pantheist line of reasoning is faulty, Mendelssohn submits, for at least three reasons. In the first place, it abolishes a distinction presupposed by any truthful statement, i.e., the distinction between original and copy. Secondly, there are indefeasible marks that distinguish a finite self-consciousness (as an object and original) from the divine representation (copy) of it. “Consciousness of myself, combined with complete ignorance of everything that does not fall within my sphere of thinking, is the most telling proof of my substantiality outside God, of my original existence” (Gesammelte Schriften, 3/2, p. 118). Finally, the pantheist confuses divine knowledge with divine approval. God knows perfectly well my shortcomings without approving them and requiring their existence. Moreover, that they are thinkable hardly explains their existence since the opposite of them is just as thinkable. The problem for the pantheist, Mendelssohn submits, is explaining their existence, i.e., explaining what privileges some divine thoughts over others.

For the theist, by contrast, there is a ready solution to the problem. “The thoughts of God that come to reality to the exclusion of the rest will have this prerogative by virtue of their relative goodness and purposiveness, insofar, namely, as they correspond thus and not otherwise, here and now, to the idea of the perfect and best” (Gesammelte Schriften 3/2, p. 122).

Still, the difference between the theist and a refined pantheist is by no means this simple, Mendelssohn is quick to add. To be sure, Spinoza conceived intellect and will as one and the same. Nevertheless, at least as Lessing understood him, Spinoza also differentiated acquaintance with what is true from acquaintance with what is good and identified knowledge of the good with the “will” insofar as through it one thought does have a prerogative over another. Pantheism, so refined, secures religion and morality no less than theism does, leading Mendelssohn to ask: “where then does the system defended by my friend [Lessing] differ from ours?” (Gesammelte Schriften, 3/2, p. 123). Seen in this light, the difference between theism and refined pantheism turns in the end, on a speculative subtlety without practical consequences, namely, on different interpretations of the metaphor of divine light. Mendelssohn accordingly concludes that, like many another dispute in metaphysics and epistemology, the dispute between refined pantheists and traditional theists is purely verbal.

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German Philosophy: in the 18th century, prior to Kant | Jacobi, Friedrich Heinrich | Kant, Immanuel | Leibniz, Gottfried Wilhelm | Spinoza, Baruch

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