First-order Model Theory

First published Sat Nov 10, 2001; substantive revision Tue Jul 2, 2013

First-order model theory, also known as classical model theory, is a branch of mathematics that deals with the relationships between descriptions in first-order languages and the structures that satisfy these descriptions. From one point of view, this is a vibrant area of mathematical research that brings logical methods (in particular the theory of definition) to bear on deep problems of classical mathematics. From another point of view, first-order model theory is the paradigm for the rest of model theory; it is the area in which many of the broader ideas of model theory were first worked out.


1. First-order languages and structures

Mathematical model theory carries a heavy load of notation, and HTML is not the best container for it. In what follows, syntactic objects (languages, theories, sentences) are generally written in roman or greek letters (for example L, T, φ), and set-theoretic objects such as structures and their elements are written in italic (A, a). Two exceptions are that variables are italic (x, y) and that sequences of elements are written with lower case roman letters (a, b).

We recall and refine some definitions from the entries on classical logic and model theory. A signature is a set of individual constants, predicate symbols and function symbols; each of the predicate symbols and function symbols has an arity (for example it is binary if its arity is 2). Each signature K gives rise to a first-order language, by building up formulas from the symbols in the signature together with logical symbols (including =) and punctuation.

If K is a signature, then a structure of signature K, say A, consists of the following items:

  1. A set called the domain of A and written dom(A); it is usually assumed to be nonempty;
  2. for each individual constant c in K, an element cA of dom(A);
  3. for each predicate symbol P of arity n, an n-ary relation PA on dom(A);
  4. for each function symbol F of arity n, an n-ary function FA from dom(A) to dom(A).

The elements of A are the elements of dom(A). Likewise the cardinality or power of A is the cardinality of its domain. Since we can recover the signature K from the first-order language L that it generates, we can and will refer to structures of signature K as L-structures. We think of c as a name for the element cA in the structure A, and likewise with the other symbols.

For example the field of real numbers forms a structure R whose elements are the real numbers, with signature consisting of the individual constant 0 to name the number zero, a 1-ary function symbol - for minus, and two 2-ary function symbols + and . for plus and times. At first sight we can't add a symbol to express 1/x, since all the named functions have to be defined on the whole domain of the structure, and there is no such real number as 1/0. But on second thoughts this is not a serious problem; any competent mathematician puts the condition ‘x is not zero’ before dividing by x, and so it never matters what the value of 1/0 is, and we can harmlessly take it to be 42. But most model theorists are uncomfortable with any kind of division by zero, so they stick with plus, times and minus.

If L is the first-order language of signature K, then Tarski's model-theoretic truth definition tells us when a sentence of L is true in A, and when an assignment of elements of A to variables satisfies a formula of L in A. Instead of talking of assignments satisfying a formula, model theorists often speak of the set of n-tuples of elements of A that is defined by a formula φ(v1,…,vn); the connection is that an n-tuple (a1,…,an) is in the defined set if and only if the assignment taking each vi to ai satisfies the formula.

If φ is a sentence, we write

A ⊨ φ

to mean that φ is true in A, or in other words, A is a model of φ. If φ(v1,…,vn) is a formula with free variables as shown, we write

A ⊨ φ[a]

to mean that the n-tuple a is in the set defined by φ. (The entry on classical logic uses the notation ‘A,s ⊨ φ’, where s is any assignment to all the variables of L that assigns to each variable vi free in φ the i-th element in the n-tuple a.)

Two L-structures that are models of exactly the same sentences of L are said to be elementarily equivalent. Elementary equivalence is an equivalence relation on the class of all L-structures. The set of all the sentences of L that are true in the L-structure A is called the complete theory of A, in symbols Th(A). A theory that is Th(A) for some structure A is said to be complete. (By the completeness theorem for first-order logic, for which see the entry on classical logic, a theory is complete if and only if it is maximal syntactically consistent.) The two structures A and B are elementarily equivalent if and only if Th(A) = Th(B).

To continue the example of the field R of real numbers: It is often not at all obvious whether two given structures are or are not elementarily equivalent. One of the greatest achievements of the pre-history of model theory was Tarski's description in 1930 of Th(R) (which he published in full only after the war; see his book in the Bibliography below). This description implied among other things that the structures elementarily equivalent to R are exactly the real-closed fields, a class of fields which was already known to the algebraists in its own right.

When mathematicians introduce a class of structures, they like to define what they count as the basic maps between these structures. The basic maps between structures of the same signature K are called homomorphisms, defined as follows. A homomorphism from structure A to structure B is a function f from dom(A) to dom(B) with the property that for every atomic formula φ(v1,…,vn) and any n-tuple a = (a1,…,an) of elements of A,

A ⊨ φ [a] ⇒ B ⊨ φ [b]

where b is (f(a1),…,f(an)). If we have ‘⇔’ in place of ‘⇒’ in the quoted condition, we say that f is an embedding of A into B. Since the language includes =, an embedding of A into B is always one-to-one, though it need not be onto the domain of B. If it is onto, then the inverse map from dom(B) to dom(A) is also a homomorphism, and both the embedding and its inverse are said to be isomorphisms. We say that two structures are isomorphic if there is an isomorphism from one to the other. Isomorphism is an equivalence relation on the class of all structures of a fixed signature K. If two structures are isomorphic then they share all model-theoretic properties; in particular they are elementarily equivalent.

If A and B are structures of signature K with dom(A) a subset of dom(B), and the interpretations in A of the symbols in K are just the restrictions of their interpretations in B, then we say that A is a substructure of B and conversely B is an extension of A. If moreover B has some elements that are not in A, we say that A is a proper substructure of B and B is an proper extension of A. If B is a structure and X is a nonempty subset of dom(B), then there is a unique smallest substructure of B whose domain contains all of X. It is known as the substructure of B generated by X, and we find it by first adding to X all the elements cB where c are individual constants of K, and then closing off under the functions FB where F are function symbols of K.

For example the substructure of the field R generated by the number 1 consists of 1, 0 (since it is named by the constant 0), 1+1, 1+1+1 etc., −1, −2 etc., in other words the ring of integers. (There is no need to close off under multiplication too, since the set of integers is already closed under multiplication.) If we had included a symbol for 1/x too, the substructure generated by 1 would have been the field of rational numbers. So the notion of substructure is sensitive to the choice of signature.

2. Elementary maps

Let L be a first-order language and let A and B be L-structures. Suppose e is a function which takes some elements of A to elements of B. We say that e is an elementary map if whenever a sequence of elements a1, …, an in the domain of e satisfy a formula φ(x1,…,xn) of L in A, their images under e satisfy the same formula in B; in symbols

A ⊨ φ(a1,…,an) ⇒ B ⊨ φ(e(a1),…,e(an)).

We say that e is an elementary embedding of A into B if e is an elementary map and its domain is the whole domain of A. As the name implies, elementary embeddings are always embeddings.

If there is an elementary embedding from A to B then A and B are elementarily equivalent. On the other hand an embedding between elementarily equivalent structures, or even between isomorphic structures, need not be elementary. (For example, writing Z for the abelian group of the integers with signature consisting of 0 and +, the embedding from Z to Z that takes each integer n to 2n is an embedding, and of course Z is isomorphic to itself; but this embedding is not elementary, since 1 satisfies the formula ¬∃y(y + y = v1), but 2 doesn't.)

We say that A is an elementary substructure of B, and B is an elementary extension of A, if A is a substructure of B and the inclusion map is an elementary embedding. It's immediate from the definitions that an elementary extension of an elementary extension of A is again an elementary extension of A.

Elementary embeddings are natural maps to consider within first-order model theory. Around 1950 Abraham Robinson was impressed that maps between algebraic structures in general seem hardly ever to be elementary, whereas some important maps (such as embeddings between two algebraically closed fields, or between two real-closed fields) turn out to be elementary. He was also surprised to find that this fact about algebraically closed fields is another way of stating a celebrated theorem called the Hilbert Nullstellensatz. These observations of Robinson have had a huge effect on the development of model theory. In Robinson's terminology, a first-order theory is model-complete if every embedding between models of the theory is elementary. This notion has found many uses, and it often appears in applications of model theory in algebra.

A notion that is closely related to model-completeness, but should not be confused with it, is elimination of quantifiers. Suppose L is a first-order language, T is a theory in L, and Φ is a set of formulas of L. We say that T has elimination of quantifiers down to Φ if for every formula φ(x1,…,xn) of L there is a formula ψ(x1,…,xn) in Φ such that in every model of T, φ and ψ are satisfied by exactly the same n-tuples of elements (a1,…,an). (The 'method of elimination of quantifiers' discussed in section 2.2 of Tarski's truth definitions) was a syntactic and pre-model-theoretic method for proving elimination of quantifiers down to a particular set of formulas.) A theory is said to have quantifier elimination if it has elimination of quantifiers down to quantifier-free formulas.

The connection between model-completeness and elimination of quantifiers is as follows. Robinson showed that a theory is model-complete if and only if it has elimination of quantifiers down to existential formulas (i.e. formulas that either are quantifier-free or consist of one or more existential quantifiers followed by a quantifier-free formula). So theories that have quantifier elimination are model-complete, but the converse need not hold. Still, showing that a theory is model-complete is sometimes a useful first step towards showing that it has quantifier elimination.

To return to elementary embeddings: They have a number of properties that make them useful. We have space for four.

The downward Loewenheim-Skolem theorem:
Suppose L is a first-order language which has κ formulas, A is an L-structure and λ is a cardinal which is at least κ but less than the cardinality of A. Suppose also that X is a set of at most λ elements of A. Then A has an elementary substructure which has cardinality exactly λ and contains all the elements in X.

There is a proof of this in the entry on classical logic, using Skolem hulls. Note that λ must be infinite since every first-order language has infinitely many formulas.

The elementary chain theorem:
Suppose that L is a first-order language and A0, A1, … is a sequence (of any length) of L-structures such that any structure in the sequence is an elementary substructure of all the later structures in the sequence. Then there is a unique smallest L-structure B which contains all the structures in the sequence as substructures; this structure B is an elementary extension of all the structures in the sequence.

The elementary amalgamation theorem:
Suppose L is a first-order language, A is an L-structure and B, C are two elementary extensions of A. Then there are an elementary extension D of B and an elementary embedding e of C into D such that (i) for each element a of A, e(a) = a, and (ii) if c is an element of C but not of A, then e(c) is not in B.

The elementary amalgamation theorem is a consequence of the compactness theorem in the next section.

The upward Loewenheim-Skolem theorem:
Suppose L is a first-order language which has κ formulas, A is an L-structure whose cardinality is an infinite cardinal μ, and λ is a cardinal which is at least as great as both κ and μ. Then A has an elementary extension whose cardinality is λ.

This also follows from the compactness theorem, as shown in the entry on classical logic. The name of the theorem is a little unfortunate, since the theorem was first proved by Tarski, and Skolem didn't even believe it (because he didn't believe in uncountable cardinals).

There is another proof using the elementary amalgamation theorem and the elementary chain theorem. One can show that the structure A has a proper elementary extension A′. (There is a proof of this using the compactness theorem and the diagram lemma — see 3.1 and 3.2 below; another proof is by ultrapowers — see 4.1 below.) Now use A′ and again A′ for the structures B and C in the elementary amalgamation theorem. Then D as in the theorem is an elementary extension of A, and by (ii) in the theorem, it must contain elements that are not in A′, so that it is a proper elementary extension. Repeat to get a proper elementary extension of D, and so on until you have an infinite elementary chain. Use the elementary chain theorem to find an elementary extension of A that sits on top of this chain. Keep repeating these moves until you have an elementary extension of A that has cardinality at least λ. Then if necessary use the downward Loewenheim-Skolem theorem to pull the cardinality down to exactly λ. This kind of argument is very common in first-order model theory. By careful choice of the amalgams at the steps in the construction, we can often ensure that the top structure has further properties that we might want (such as saturation, see 4.2 below).

3. Five grand theorems

The five theorems reported in this section are in some sense the pillars of classical model theory. All of them are theorems about first-order model theory. A great deal of the work done in the third quarter of the twentieth century was devoted to working out the consequences of these theorems within first-order model theory, and the extent to which similar theorems hold for languages that are not first-order.

3.1 The compactness theorem

If T is a first-order theory, and every finite subset of T has a model, then T has a model.

There is a proof of this theorem in the entry on classical logic. The theorem has several useful paraphrases. For example it is equivalent to the following statement:

Suppose T is a first-order theory and φ is a first-order sentence. If T ⊨ φ then there is a finite subset U of T such that U ⊨ φ.

(See the entry on model theory for the notion ⊨ of model-theoretic consequence. To derive the second statement from the first, note that ‘T ⊨ φ’ is true if and only if there is no model of the theory T ∪ {¬ φ}.)

Anatolii Mal'tsev first gave the compactness theorem in 1938 (for first-order logic of any signature), and used it in 1940/1 to prove several theorems about groups; this seems to have been the first application of model theory within classical mathematics. Leon Henkin and Abraham Robinson independently rediscovered the theorem a few years later and gave some further applications. The theorem fails badly for nearly all infinitary languages.

3.2 The diagram lemma

If A is an L-structure, then we form the diagram of A as follows. First add to L a supply of new individual constants to serve as names for all the elements of A. (This illustrates how in first-order model theory we easily find ourselves using uncountable signatures. The ‘symbols’ in these signatures are abstract set-theoretic objects, not marks on a page.) Then using L and these new constants, the diagram of A is the set of all the atomic sentences and negations of atomic sentences that are true in A.

If B′ is a model of the diagram of A, and B is B′ with the new constants removed from the signature, then there is an embedding of A into B.

Namely, if an element of A is named by a new constant c, then map that element to the element of B′ named c. A variant of this lemma is used in the proof of the elementary amalgamation theorem.

3.3 The Lyndon interpolation theorem

This theorem may have the longest pedigree of any theorem of model theory, since it generalises the Laws of Distribution for syllogisms, which go back at least to the early Renaissance. The theorem is easiest to state if we assume that our first-order languages have symbols ∧, ∨ and ¬, but not → or ⇔. Then an occurrence of a predicate symbol R in a formula φ is said to be positive (resp. negative) if it lies within the scope of an even (resp. odd) number of occurrences of ¬.

Suppose L and M are first-order languages, L ∪ M is the smallest first-order language containing both L and M, and L ∩ M is the language consisting of all the formulas which are in both L and M. Suppose T is a theory in L, U is a theory in M, and no (L ∪ M)-structure is both a model of T and a model of U. Then there is a sentence φ of L ∩ M which is true in all models of T and false in all models of U. (This sentence φ is called the interpolant.) Moreover every predicate symbol with a positive occurrence in φ has a positive occurrence in some sentence of T and a negative occurrence in some sentence of U, and conversely every predicate symbol with a negative occurrence in φ has a negative occurrence in some sentence of T and a positive occurrence in some sentence of U.

There are several proofs of this theorem, and not all of them are model-theoretic. Without the last sentence, the theorem is known as Craig's interpolation theorem, since William Craig proved this version a few years before Roger Lyndon found the full statement in 1959. As Craig noted at the time, his interpolation theorem gives a neat proof of Evert Beth's definability theorem, which runs as follows.

Suppose that L is a first-order language and M is the first-order language got by adding to L a new predicate symbol R. Suppose also that T is a theory in M. We say that T implicitly defines R if it is false that there are two M-structures which are models of T, have the same elements and interpret all the symbols of L in the same way but interpret the symbol R differently. We say that T defines R explicitly if there is a formula φ(x1,…,xn) of L such that in every model of T, the formulas φ and R(x1,…,xn) are satisfied by exactly the same n-tuples (a1,…,an) of elements. It is easy to see that if T defines R explicitly then it defines R implicitly. (This fact is known as Padoa's method; Padoa used the failure of implicit definability as a way of proving the failure of explicit definability.) Beth's theorem is the converse:

Suppose that L, M, R and T are as above. If T defines R implicitly then T defines R explicitly.

3.4 The omitting types theorem

This theorem needs some preliminary definitions. Suppose L is a first-order language, T is a complete theory in L, and Φ is a set of formulas of L which all have the free variable x (and no other free variable). We say that an L-structure A realises Φ if there is an element of A that satisfies all the formulas in Φ; if A has no such element, we say that A omits Φ. A formula ψ(x) of L, with just the free variable x, is called a support of Φ in T if the consequences of T include the sentence ∃xψ(x) and the sentence ∀x(ψ(x) → φ(x)) whenever φ(x) is a formula in Φ. It is not hard to see that if there is a support of Φ in T then every model of T realises Φ. The converse is not always true, but the omitting types theorem tells us that it is true if we restrict ourselves to countable first-order languages:
Suppose L is a first-order language which has countably many formulas. Suppose T is a complete theory in L, and Φ is a set of formulas of L which all have the free variable x. Finally suppose that every model of T with just countably many elements realises Φ. Then there is a support of Φ in T. (In other words, there is a finite reason why the ‘type’ Φ can't be omitted in any model of T.)

The omitting types theorem goes back to the mid 1950s. It very definitely depends on the language being first-order and countable. It has several useful generalisations, for example model-theoretic forcing, which is an analogue of the forcing construction in set theory. In fact the games used for model-theoretic forcing (see the entry on logic and games) can be adapted to prove the omitting types theorem too. There are similar but more complicated theorems for uncountable first-order languages; some of these can be paraphrased as omitting types theorems for infinitary languages.

3.5 The initial model theorem

A quantifier-free formula is said to be a Horn formula (after Alfred Horn) if it has one of the three forms

  • ψ,
  • φ1 ∧ … ∧ φn → ψ,
  • ¬(φ1 ∧ … ∧ φn),

where the formulas φ1, …, φn, ψ are all atomic. A universal Horn sentence (also known to the computer scientists as a Horn clause) is a sentence that consists of universal quantifiers followed by a quantifier-free Horn formula; it is said to be strict if no negation sign occurs in it (i.e. if it doesn't come from a quantifier-free Horn formula of the third kind).

Let T be a theory consisting of strict universal Horn sentences. Then T has a model A with the property that for every model B of T there is a unique homomorphism from A to B. (Such a model A is called an initial model of T. It is unique up to isomorphism.)

This theorem is a generalisation, due to Mal'tsev, of a group-theoretic construction called construction by generators and relations. It is the main idea behind algebraic specification, which is one approach to the specification of systems in computer science. The required behaviour of the system is written down as a set of strict universal Horn sentences, and then the initial model of these sentences is an abstract version of the required system.

4. Three useful constructions

A construction is a procedure for building a structure. We have already seen several constructions in the theorems above: for example the omitting types construction and the initial model construction. Here are three more.

4.1 Products and reduced products

If A and B are L-structures, we form their product C = A × B as follows. The elements of C are the ordered pairs (a,b) where a is an element of A and b is an element of B. The predicate symbols are interpreted ‘pointwise’, i.e. so that for example

(a,b) is in PC if and only if a is in PA and b is in PB.

The structures A and B are called the factors of A × B. In the same way we can form products of any number of structures. If all the factors of a product are the same structure A, the product is called a power of A. A theorem called the Feferman-Vaught theorem tells us how to work out the complete theory of the product from the complete theories of its factors.

This construction has some variants. We can define an equivalence relation on the domain of a product C, and then take a structure D whose elements are the equivalence classes; the predicate symbols are interpreted in D so as to make the natural map from dom(C) to dom(D) a homomorphism. In this case the structure D is called a reduced product of the factors of C. It is a reduced power of A if all the factors are equal to A; in this case the diagonal map from A to D is the one got by taking each element a to the equivalence class of the element (a,a,…).

Suppose we use a set I to index the factors in a product C. An ultrafilter over I is a set U of subsets of I with the properties

  • if sets X and Y are in U then so is their intersection X ∩ Y;
  • if X is in U and X ⊆ Y ⊆ I then Y is in U;
  • for each subset X of I, exactly one of X and its complement I \ X is in U.

If we have an ultrafilter U over I, then we can construct a reduced product from C by making two elements of C equivalent if and only if the set of indices at which they are equal is a set in the ultrafilter U. This is indeed an equivalence relation on the domain of C, and the resulting reduced product is called an ultraproduct of the factors of C. If C is a power of A then this ultraproduct is called an ultrapower of A, and it is sometimes written U-prod A. A theorem called Łoś's theorem describes what sentences are true in an ultraproduct. Its most useful consequence is the following:

If U is an ultrafilter then the diagonal map from A to U-prod A is an elementary embedding.

If the ultrafilter U is nonprincipal, i.e. contains no finite sets, then the diagonal map is not onto the domain of U-prod A, and in fact U-prod A is generally much larger than A. So we have a way of constructing large elementary extensions. The axiom of choice guarantees that every infinite set has many nonprincipal ultrafilters over it. Ultrapowers are an essential tool for handling large cardinals in set theory (see the entry on set theory).

A remarkable (but in practice not terribly useful) theorem of Saharon Shelah tells us that a pair of structures A and B are elementarily equivalent if and only if they have ultrapowers that are isomorphic to each other.

4.2 Saturation

Suppose A is an L-structure, X is a set of elements of A, B is an elementary extension of A and b, c are two elements of B. Then b and c are said to have the same type over X if for every formula φ(v1,…,vn+1) of L and every n-tuple d of elements of X,

B ⊨ φ[b,d] ⇔ B ⊨ φ[c,d].

We say that A is saturated if whenever X is a set of elements of A, of cardinality less than that of A, and B is any elementary extension of A, we always have that every element of B has the same type over X as some element already in A.

This rather heavy definition gives little clue how useful saturated structures are. If every structure had a saturated elementary extension, many of the results of model theory would be much easier to prove. Unfortunately the existence of saturated elementary extensions depends on features of the surrounding universe of sets. There are technical ways around this obstacle, for example using weakenings of the notion of saturation. We have two main ways of constructing elementary extensions with some degree of saturation. One is by ultrapowers, using cleverly constructed ultrafilters. The other is by taking unions of elementary chains, generalising the proof we gave for the upward Loewenheim-Skolem theorem.

The existence of partially saturated elementary extensions of the field R of real numbers is the main technical fact behind Abraham Robinson's nonstandard analysis. See Section 4 of the entry on model theory for more information on this. Though model theory provided the first steps in nonstandard analysis, this branch of analysis rapidly became a subject in its own right, and its links with first-order model theory today are rather slim.

4.3 Ehrenfeucht-Mostowski models

Let A be an L-structure, X a set of elements of A and < a linear ordering of X (not necessarily definable by a first-order formula). We say that (X,<) is an indiscernible sequence in A if for every natural number n, and all elements a1,…,an,b 1,…,b n of A such that a1 < … < an and b1 < … < bn, the map taking each ai to the corresponding bi is an elementary map. If T is a theory with infinite models, then T has models that are the Skolem hulls (see the entry on classical logic) of indiscernible sequences. These models are known as Ehrenfeucht-Mostowski models, after the two Polish model theorists who first carried out this construction in the mid 1950s. These models tend to be the opposite of saturated; we can arrange that very few types over sets of elements are represented among their elements. Some important distinctions between different models of set theory can be expressed in terms of the indiscernible sequences within these models; see the entry on set theory.

5. Three successful programmes

Every healthy branch of mathematics needs a set of problems that form a serious challenge for its researchers. We close with a brief introduction to some of the research programmes that drove first-order model theory forwards in the second half of the twentieth century. The book of Marcja and Toffalori in the bibliography gives further information about these programmes. There are other current programmes besides these; see for example the handbook edited by Yuri Ershov, which is about model theory when the structures are built recursively.

5.1. Categoricity and classification

In 1904 Oswald Veblen stole a term from Kant and described a theory as categorical if it has just one model up to isomorphism (i.e. it has a model and all its models are isomorphic to each other). The depressing news is that there are no categorical first-order theories with infinite models; we can see this at once from the upward Loewenheim-Skolem theorem. In fact if T is a first-order theory with infinite models, then the strongest kind of categoricity we can hope for in T is that for certain infinite cardinals κ, T has exactly one model of cardinality κ, up to isomorphism. This property of T is called κ-categoricity.

Now there is a heuristic principle that many people have used, though it seems to have no simple formulation. We suggest ‘Few is beautiful’. The principle says that if a first-order theory T constrains its models (of a particular cardinality) to be all similar to each other, this can only be because the models of T have few irregularities and asymmetries. So there should be a good structural description of these models. One should expect that they are ‘good structures’ from the point of view of classical mathematics. As a first step, one easily sees from the upward and downward Loewenheim-Skolem theorems that if T is κ-categorical for some κ at least as large as the number of formulas in the language of T, then T must be a complete theory. From now on, T is a complete theory with infinite models; and for simplicity we will assume that the language of T is countable.

In 1954 Jerzy Łoś announced that he could only find three kinds of example of theories T that are κ-categorical. Namely:

  • T is totally categorical if it is κ-categorical for every infinite cardinal κ. A typical example is the complete theory of an infinite-dimensional vector space over a finite field.
  • T is uncountably categorical (but not totally categorical) if it is κ-categorical precisely when κ is uncountable. Essentially the only example that Łoś could find was the complete theory of an algebraically closed field; this is uncountably categorical by a well-known theorem of Steinitz.
  • T is countably categorical (but not uncountably categorical) if it is κ-categorical precisely when κ is countable. A typical example is the complete theory of a dense linear ordering with no first or last element; this is countably categorical by a well-known theorem of Cantor.

Łoś asked whether there are any other possibilities besides these three. (Of course most complete theories are not κ-categorical for any κ.)

This question of Łoś was a tremendous stimulus to research, and it led to a classic paper of Michael Morley in 1965 which showed that Łoś's three possibilities are in fact the only ones. One central idea of Morley's analysis was that models of an uncountably categorical theory have the smallest possible number of types of element; this led directly to the branch of model theory called stability theory, which studies theories that have a limited number of element types. These theories have the remarkable property that every infinite indiscernible sequence in any of their models is indiscernible under any linear ordering whatever; so these sequences are a kind of generalisation of bases of vector spaces. Another idea implicit in Morley's work, but much clarified by later work of William Marsh, John Baldwin and Alistair Lachlan, was that in any model of an uncountably categorical theory there is a central core (called a strongly minimal set) which carries a dependence relation obeying similar laws to linear dependence in vector spaces. In terms of this dependence relation one can define a dimension for the model, and what remains of the model outside the core is so closely tied to the core that the dimension determines the model up to isomorphism.

Saharon Shelah developed Morley's ideas with great resourcefulness and energy. His main aim was to stretch the ‘Few is beautiful’ idea by showing that there are clear dividing lines between kinds of theory T. On one side of a dividing line are theories with some good structural property that forces the number of nonisomorphic models of a given cardinality to be small. On the other side, every theory has (for example) two models of the same cardinality that are not isomorphic but are extremely hard to tell apart. Shelah coined the name classification theory for this research. The text of Lascar listed below is an elegant introduction to this whole programme, from Łoś to Shelah. Meanwhile Shelah himself has extended it far beyond first-order logic. Even in the first-order case, Shelah had to invent new set-theoretic techniques (such as proper forcing) to carry out his constructions.

Classification theory has two related though fundamentally distinct aims: to classify the models of a theory (or to show that such a classification is impossible) by some relatively simple combinatorial invariants and to classify theories themselves by the presence or absence of some fundamental structures within their models. With the second edition of Classification Theory, Shelah dropped the subtitle “And the number of non-isomorphic models” in order to emphasize the broader goals of the project. In general, a class of theories may be recognized as classification theoretically robust if it admits characterizations both in terms of cardinals and with respect to some absolute condition on formulae relative to the theory. For example, by definition, a theory T in a language L is stable if there is some cardinal κ ≥ |L| so that for every model M of T of cardinality at most κ, the number of 1-types over M is at most κ. Equivalently, a theory T is stable if no formula has the order property relative to T. That is, there is no L-formula φ(x;y) (where x and y may be tuples of variables) so that for each natural number n it is consistent with T that there be a1, …, an; b1, …, bn so that φ(ai,bj) holds just in case ij.

5.2. Geometric model theory

Geometric model theory grew out of Michael Morley's 1965 paper, but in a different direction from Shelah's work (though today it makes regular use of technical tools developed by Shelah in his classification programme). Morley had shown that models of an uncountably categorical theory have structural properties that are interesting in their own right, regardless of the complete theory of the structure; so it became the custom to talk of uncountably categorical structures, meaning models of uncountably categorical theories. (And likewise totally categorical structures.) Independently Boris Zilber in Siberia and Greg Cherlin in the United States noticed that any infinite group that is definable in an uncountably categorical structure must have many features in common with the algebraic groups studied by algebraic geometers. Zilber in particular showed that many methods from algebraic geometry generalise to the model-theoretic case. His secret weapon was Bezout's Theorem from geometry, which he used to guide him to solutions of very difficult model theoretic problems; for example his theorem that no totally categorical theory can be axiomatised by a finite number of axioms. (It was secret in the sense that it guided his intuition but never appeared explicitly in his results.) Zilber also noticed an important difference between the first and second of Łoś's examples above. Namely, in a vector space the subspaces (i.e. the subsets closed under linear dependence) form a modular lattice; but the algebraically closed subsets of an algebraically closed field form a lattice that is not modular.

Partly because of the difficulty of communications between Siberia and the West, these results of Zilber took some time to digest, and in part they had to be rediscovered in the West. But when the message did finally get through, the result was a new branch of model theory which has come to be known as geometric model theory. The programme is broadly to classify structures according to (a) what groups or fields are interpretable in them (in the sense sketched in the entry on model theory) and (b) whether or not the structures have ‘modular geometries’; and then to use this classification to solve problems in model theory and geometry. From the mid 1980s the leader of this research was Ehud Hrushovski. In the early 1990s, using joint work with Zilber, Hrushovski gave a model-theoretic proof (the first complete proof to be found) of the geometric Mordell-Lang conjecture in all characteristics; this was a conjecture in classical diophantine geometry. Bouscaren (ed.) 1998 is devoted to Hrushovski's proof and the necessary background in model theory. Both (a) and (b) are fundamental to Hrushovski's argument.

5.3. O-minimality

Of the three programmes described here, this is the oldest, since it grew out of Tarski's description of the complete theory of the field of real numbers (which he proved by the method of quantifier elimination). In the course of giving this description, Tarski had shown that every first-order formula φ(x) in the relevant language, possibly with parameters, is satisfied by exactly the same assignments as some boolean combination of formulas of the form x < s or t < x where s, t are constant terms naming parameters. Another way of saying this is that

Every set of elements definable by a first-order formula is a finite union of open intervals with named endpoints, together with some finite set of elements.

A linearly ordered structure with this property is said to be o-minimal. (The idea of the name is that o-minimality is an analogue of ‘strong minimality’, in a form that makes sense for structures that carry a linear ordering, whence ‘o-’ for ordering.)

In 1982 Lou van den Dries showed that the fact that the field of real numbers is o-minimal gives a large amount of useful information about the definable sets of higher dimension, such as the family of definable subsets of the real plane. Soon after this, Julia Knight, Anand Pillay and Charles Steinhorn noticed that if a structure A is o-minimal, then so is any structure elementarily equivalent to A, and that van den Dries' analysis of higher-dimensional definable set applies to all these structures. These results led to much activity on the frontier between model theory and function theory. Several old problems from model theory and function theory were solved. Alex Wilkie showed that the field of real numbers with a symbol for exponentiation is o-minimal and has a model-complete complete theory, and thereby gave a positive answer to Tarski's old problem of whether this structure allows a quantifier elimination, though his method was very far from the syntactic analysis that Tarski had in mind. (This is one case where we need to remember the difference between being model-complete and having quantifier elimination; see section 2 above. The question whether this particular theory has quantifier elimination is much harder and is closely related to a deep conjecture of number theory called Schanuel's conjecture; see the paper of Macintyre and Wilkie.) We now know a wide range of ways of adding interesting features to the field of real numbers in such a way that the resulting structure is still o-minimal (and hence in some sense mathematically tractable). Van den Dries has urged that o-minimal structures provide a good setting for developing the ‘tame topology’ programme of Alexander Grothendieck.

In 2006, Jonathan Pila and Alex Wilkie showed that provided one removes the subsets defined using only polynomial inequalities, subsets of Rn definable in an o-minimal expansion of the real field have few rational points. Subsequently, following a strategy first employed by Pila and Umberto Zannier to reprove the Manin-Mumford conjecture various authors have used this o-minimal counting theorem to solve some important open problems in diophantine geometry.

All three of these programmes generated new techniques for proof, construction or classification. As we should expect, researchers have explored the range of application of each technique. One result of this has been the emergence of several useful classes of first-order theories which relate to more than one of the three programmes. For example a central tool of Shelah's classification theory was his notion of forking, a far-reaching generalisation of earlier algebraic notions of dependence relation. The class of simple theories is defined by the fact that forking has certain nice properties while the class of rosy theories is characterised by the existence of a good notion of independence coming from a further generalisation of forking called þ-forking; several natural examples of simple theories came to light in geometric model theory, and the complete theories of o-minimal structures are examples of rosy theories. In parallel with these technical advances, first-order model theory continues to grow more closely involved with problems in number theory, functional analysis and other branches of pure mathematics.

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