# Model Theory

*First published Sat Nov 10, 2001; substantive revision Wed Jul 17, 2013*

Model theory began with the study of formal languages and their interpretations, and of the kinds of classification that a particular formal language can make. Mainstream model theory is now a sophisticated branch of mathematics (see the entry on first-order model theory). But in a broader sense, model theory is the study of the interpretation of any language, formal or natural, by means of set-theoretic structures, with Alfred Tarski's truth definition as a paradigm. In this broader sense, model theory meets philosophy at several points, for example in the theory of logical consequence and in the semantics of natural languages.

## 1. Basic notions of model theory

Sometimes we write or speak a sentence S that expresses nothing
either true or false, because some crucial information is missing about
what the words mean. If we go on to add this information, so that S
comes to express a true or false statement, we are said to
*interpret* S, and the added information is called an
*interpretation* of S. If the interpretation *I* happens
to make S state something true, we say that *I* is a
*model* of S, or that *I* *satisfies* S, in
symbols ‘*I* ⊨ S’. Another way of saying
that *I* is a model of S is to say that S is *true in
I*, and so we have the notion of
*model-theoretic truth*, which is truth in a particular
interpretation. But one should remember that the statement ‘S is
true in *I*’ is just a paraphrase of ‘S, when
interpreted as in *I*, is true’; so model-theoretic truth
is parasitic on plain ordinary truth, and we can always paraphrase it
away.

For example I might say

He is killing all of them,

and offer the interpretation that ‘he’ is Alfonso Arblaster
of 35 The Crescent, Beetleford, and that ‘them’ are the
pigeons in his loft. This interpretation explains (a) what objects some
expressions refer to, and (b) what classes some quantifiers range over.
(In this example there is one quantifier: ‘all of them’).
Interpretations that consist of items (a) and (b) appear very often in
model theory, and they are known as *structures*. Particular
kinds of model theory use particular kinds of structure; for example
mathematical model theory tends to use so-called *first-order
structures*, model theory of modal logics uses *Kripke
structures*, and so on.

The structure *I* in the previous paragraph involves one
fixed object and one fixed class. Since we described the structure
today, the class is the class of pigeons in Alfonso's loft today, not
those that will come tomorrow to replace them. If Alfonso Arblaster
kills all the pigeons in his loft today, then *I* satisfies the
quoted sentence today but won't satisfy it tomorrow, because Alfonso
can't kill the same pigeons twice over. Depending on what you want to
use model theory for, you may be happy to evaluate sentences today (the
default time), or you may want to record how they are satisfied at one
time and not at another. In the latter case you can relativise the
notion of model and write ‘*I*
⊨ _{t}S’ to mean that
*I* is a model of S at time *t*. The same applies to
places, or to anything else that might be picked up by other implicit
indexical features in the sentence. For example if you believe in
possible worlds, you can index ⊨ by the possible world where the
sentence is to be evaluated. Apart from using set theory, model theory
is completely agnostic about what kinds of thing exist.

Note that the objects and classes in a structure carry labels that steer them to the right expressions in the sentence. These labels are an essential part of the structure.

If the same class is used to interpret all quantifiers, the class is
called the *domain* or *universe* of the structure. But
sometimes there are quantifiers ranging over different classes. For
example if I say

One of those thingummy diseases is killing all the birds.

you will look for an interpretation that assigns a class of diseases to
‘those thingummy diseases’ and a class of birds to
‘the birds’. Interpretations that give two or more classes
for different quantifiers to range over are said to be
*many-sorted*, and the classes are sometimes called the
*sorts*.

The ideas above can still be useful if we start with a sentence S
that does say something either true or false without needing further
interpretation. (Model theorists say that such a sentence is *fully
interpreted*.) For example we can consider
*misinterpretations* *I* of a fully interpreted sentence
S. A misinterpretation of S that makes it true is known as a
*nonstandard* or *unintended* model of S. The branch of
mathematics called nonstandard analysis is based on nonstandard models
of mathematical statements about the real or complex number systems;
see
Section 4
below.

One also talks of *model-theoretic semantics* of natural
languages, which is a way of *describing* the meanings of
natural language sentences, not a way of *giving* them meanings.
The connection between this semantics and model theory is a little
indirect. It lies in Tarski's truth definition of 1933. See the entry
on
Tarski's truth definitions
for more
details.

## 2. Model-theoretic definition

A sentence S divides all its possible interpretations into two classes, those that are models of it and those that are not. In this way it defines a class, namely the class of all its models, written Mod(S). To take a legal example, the sentence

The first person has transferred the property to the second person, who thereby holds the property for the benefit of the third person.

defines a class of structures which take the form of labelled 4-tuples, as for example (writing the label on the left):

- the first person = Alfonso Arblaster;
- the property = the derelict land behind Alfonso's house;
- the second person = John Doe;
- the third person = Richard Roe.

This is a typical model-theoretic definition, defining a class of
structures (in this case, the class known to the lawyers as
*trusts*).

We can extend the idea of model-theoretic definition from a single
sentence S to a set T of sentences; Mod(T) is the class of all
interpretations that are simultaneously models of all the sentences in
T. When a set T of sentences is used to define a class in this way,
mathematicians say that T is a *theory* or a *set of
axioms*, and that T *axiomatises* the class Mod(T).

Take for example the following set of first-order sentences:

∀x∀y∀z(x+ (y+z) = (x+y) +z).

∀x(x+ 0 =x).

∀x(x+ (−x) = 0).

∀x∀y(x+y=y+x).

Here the labels are the addition symbol ‘+’, the minus
symbol ‘−’ and the constant symbol
‘0’. An interpretation also needs to specify a domain for
the quantifiers. With one proviso, the models of this set of sentences
are precisely the structures that mathematicians know as *abelian
groups*. The proviso is that in an abelian group *A*, the
domain should contain the interpretation of the symbol 0, and it
should be closed under the interpretations of the symbols + and
−. In mathematical model theory one builds this condition (or
the corresponding conditions for other function and constant symbols)
into the definition of a structure.

Each mathematical structure is tied to a particular first-order
language. A structure contains interpretations of certain predicate,
function and constant symbols; each predicate or function symbol has a
fixed arity. The collection K of these symbols is called the
*signature* of the structure. Symbols in the signature are often
called *nonlogical constants*, and an older name for them is
*primitives*. The first-order language of signature K is the
first-order language built up using the symbols in K, together with the
equality sign =, to build up its atomic formulas. (See the entry on
classical logic.)
If K is a signature, S
is a sentence of the language of signature K and *A* is a
structure whose signature is K, then because the symbols match up, we
know that *A* makes S either true or false. So one defines the
class of abelian groups to be the class of all those structures of
signature +, −, 0 which are models of the sentences above. Apart from
the fact that it uses a formal first-order language, this is exactly
the algebraists' usual definition of the class of abelian groups; model
theory formalises a kind of definition that is extremely common in
mathematics.

Now the defining axioms for abelian groups have three kinds of
symbol (apart from punctuation). First there is the logical symbol
*=* with a fixed meaning. Second there are the nonlogical
constants, which get their interpretation by being applied to a
particular structure; one should group the quantifier symbols with
them, because the structure also determines the domain over which the
quantifiers range. And third there are the variables *x*,
*y* etc. This three-level pattern of symbols allows us to define
classes in a second way. Instead of looking for the interpretations of
the nonlogical constants that will make a sentence true, we
*fix* the interpretations of the nonlogical constants by
choosing a particular structure *A*, and we look for assignments
of elements of *A* to variables which will make a given formula
true in *A*.

For example let * Z* be the additive group of
integers. Its elements are the integers (positive, negative and 0),
and the symbols +, −, 0 have their usual meanings. Consider the
formula

v_{1}+v_{1}=v_{2}.

If we assign the number −3 to *v*_{1} and the
number −6 to *v*_{2}, the formula works out as
true in * Z*. We express this by saying that
the pair (−3,−6)

*satisfies*this formula

*in*. Likewise (15,30) and (0,0) satisfy it, but (2,−4) and (3,3) don't. Thus the formula

**Z***defines*a binary relation on the integers, namely the set of pairs of integers that satisfy it. A relation defined in this way in a structure

*A*is called a

*first-order definable relation in A*. A useful generalisation is to allow the defining formula to use added names for some specific elements of

*A*; these elements are called

*parameters*and the relation is then

*definable with parameters*.

This second type of definition, defining relations inside a structure rather than classes of structure, also formalises a common mathematical practice. But this time the practice belongs to geometry rather than to algebra. You may recognise the relation in the field of real numbers defined by the formula

v_{1}^{2}+v_{2}^{2}= 1.

It's the circle of radius 1 around the origin in the real plane. Algebraic geometry is full of definitions of this kind.

During the 1940s it occurred to several people (chiefly Anatolii Mal'tsev in Russia, Alfred Tarski in the USA and Abraham Robinson in Britain) that the metatheorems of classical logic could be used to prove mathematical theorems about classes defined in the two ways we have just described. In 1950 both Robinson and Tarski were invited to address the International Congress of Mathematicians at Cambridge Mass. on this new discipline (which as yet had no name — Tarski proposed the name ‘theory of models’ in 1954). The conclusion of Robinson's address to that Congress is worth quoting:

[The] concrete examples produced in the present paper will have shown that contemporary symbolic logic can produce useful tools — though by no means omnipotent ones — for the development of actual mathematics, more particularly for the development of algebra and, it would appear, of algebraic geometry. This is the realisation of an ambition which was expressed by Leibniz in a letter to Huyghens as long ago as 1679.

In fact Mal'tsev had already made quite deep applications of model theory in group theory several years earlier, but under the political conditions of the time his work in Russia was not yet known in the West. By the end of the twentieth century, Robinson's hopes had been amply fulfilled; see the entry on first-order model theory.

There are at least two other kinds of definition in model theory
besides these two above. The third is known as *interpretation*
(a special case of the interpretations that we began with). Here we
start with a structure *A*, and we build another structure
*B* whose signature need not be related to that of *A*,
by defining the domain *X* of *B* and all the labelled
relations and functions of *B* to be the relations definable in
*A* by certain formulas with parameters. A further refinement is
to find a definable equivalence relation on *X* and take the
domain of *B* to be not *X* itself but the set of
equivalence classes of this relation. The structure *B* built in
this way is said to be *interpreted in* the structure
*A*.

A simple example, again from standard mathematics, is the
interpretation of the group * Z* of integers in
the structure

*consisting of the natural numbers 0, 1, 2 etc. with labels for 0, 1 and +. To construct the domain of*

**N***we first take the set*

**Z***X*of all ordered pairs of natural numbers (clearly a definable relation in

*), and on this set*

**N***X*we define the equivalence relation ∼ by

(a,b) ∼ (c,d) if and only ifa+d=b+c

(again definable). The domain of * Z* consists
of the equivalence classes of this relation. We define addition on

*by*

**Z**(a,b) + (c,d) = (e,f) if and only ifa+c+f=b+d+e.

The equivalence class of (*a*,*b*) becomes the integer
*a* − *b*.

When a structure *B* is interpreted in a structure
*A*, every first-order statement about *B* can be
translated back into a first-order statement about *A*, and in
this way we can read off the complete theory of *B* from that of
*A*. In fact if we carry out this construction not just for a
single structure *A* but for a family of models of a theory T,
always using the same defining formulas, then the resulting structures
will all be models of a theory T′ that can be read off from T and
the defining formulas. This gives a precise sense to the statement that
the theory T′ is *interpreted in* the theory T.
Philosophers of science have sometimes experimented with this notion of
interpretation as a way of making precise what it means for one theory
to be reducible to another. But realistic examples of reductions
between scientific theories seem generally to be much subtler than this
simple-minded model-theoretic idea will allow. See the entry on
intertheory relations in physics.

The fourth kind of definability is a pair of notions, implicit definability and explicit definability of a particular relation in a theory. See section 3.3 of the entry on first-order model theory.

Unfortunately there used to be a very confused theory about model-theoretic axioms, that also went under the name of implicit definition. By the end of the nineteenth century, mathematical geometry had generally ceased to be a study of space, and it had become the study of classes of structures which satisfy certain ‘geometric’ axioms. Geometric terms like ‘point’, ‘line’ and ‘between’ survived, but only as the primitive symbols in axioms; they no longer had any meaning associated with them. So the old question, whether Euclid's parallel postulate (as a statement about space) was deducible from Euclid's other assumptions about space, was no longer interesting to geometers. Instead, geometers showed that if one wrote down an up-to-date version of Euclid's other assumptions, in the form of a theory T, then it was possible to find models of T which fail to satisfy the parallel postulate. (See the entry on geometry in the 19th century for the contributions of Lobachevski and Klein to this achievement.) In 1899 David Hilbert published a book in which he constructed such models, using exactly the method of interpretation that we have just described.

Problems arose because of the way that Hilbert and others described
what they were doing. The history is complicated, but roughly the
following happened. Around the middle of the nineteenth century people
noticed, for example, that in an abelian group the minus function is
definable in terms of 0 and + (namely: −*a* is the element
*b* such that *a* + *b* = 0). Since this
description of minus is in fact one of the axioms defining abelian
groups, we can say (using a term taken from J. D. Gergonne, who should
not be held responsible for the later use made of it) that the axioms
for abelian groups *implicitly define* minus. In the jargon of
the time, one said not that the axioms define the function minus, but
that they define the *concept* minus. Now suppose we switch
around and try to define plus in terms of minus and 0. This way round
it can't be done, since one can have two abelian groups with the same 0
and minus but different plus functions. Rather than say this, the
nineteenth century mathematicians concluded that the axioms only
partially define plus in terms of minus and 0. Having swallowed that
much, they went on to say that the axioms together form an implicit
definition of the concepts plus, minus and 0 together, and that this
implicit definition is only partial but it says about these concepts
precisely as much as we need to know.

One wonders how it could happen that for fifty years nobody
challenged this nonsense. In fact some people did challenge it, notably
the geometer Moritz Pasch who in section 12 of his *Vorlesungen
über Neuere Geometrie* (1882) insisted that geometric axioms
tell us nothing whatever about the meanings of ‘point’,
‘line’ etc. Instead, he said, the axioms give us
*relations* between the concepts. If one thinks of a structure
as a kind of ordered *n*-tuple of sets etc., then a class Mod(T)
becomes an *n*-ary relation, and Pasch's account agrees with
ours. But he was unable to spell out the details, and there is some
evidence that his contemporaries (and some more recent commentators)
thought he was saying that the axioms may not determine the meanings of
‘point’ and ‘line’, but they do determine those
of relational terms such as ‘between’ and ‘incident
with’! Frege's demolition of the implicit definition doctrine was
masterly, but it came too late to save Hilbert from saying, at the
beginning of his *Grundlagen der Geometrie*, that his axioms
give ‘the exact and mathematically adequate description’ of
the relations ‘lie’, ‘between’ and
‘congruent’. Fortunately Hilbert's mathematics speaks for
itself, and one can simply bypass these philosophical faux pas. The
model-theoretic account that we now take as a correct description of
this line of work seems to have surfaced first in the group around
Giuseppe Peano in the 1890s, and it reached the English-speaking world
through Bertrand Russell's *Principles of Mathematics* in
1903.

## 3. Model-theoretic consequence

Suppose L is a language of signature K, T is a set of sentences of L and φ is a sentence of L. Then the relation

Mod(T) ⊆ Mod(φ)

expresses that every structure of signature K which is a model of T is
also a model of φ. This is known as the *model-theoretic
consequence relation*, and it is written for short as

T ⊨ φ

The double use of ⊨ is a misfortune. But in the particular case where L is first-order, the completeness theorem (see the entry on classical logic) tells us that ‘T ⊨ φ’ holds if and only if there is a proof of φ from T, a relation commonly written

T ⊢ φ

Since ⊨ and ⊢ express exactly the same relation in this case, model theorists often avoid the double use of ⊨ by using ⊢ for model-theoretic consequence. But since what follows is not confined to first-order languages, safety suggests we stick with ⊨ here.

Before the middle of the nineteenth century, textbooks of logic commonly taught the student how to check the validity of an argument (say in English) by showing that it has one of a number of standard forms, or by paraphrasing it into such a form. The standard forms were syntactic and/or semantic forms of argument in English. The process was hazardous: semantic forms are almost by definition not visible on the surface, and there is no purely syntactic form that guarantees validity of an argument. For this reason most of the old textbooks had a long section on ‘fallacies’ — ways in which an invalid argument may seem to be valid.

In 1847 George Boole changed this arrangement. For example, to validate the argument

All monarchs are human beings. No human beings are infallible. Therefore no infallible beings are monarchs.

Boole would interpret the symbols *P*, *Q*, *R*
as names of classes:

Pis the class of all monarchs.

Qis the class of all human beings.

Ris the class of all infallible beings.

Then he would point out that the original argument paraphrases into a set-theoretic consequence:

(P⊆Q), (Q∩R= 0) ⊨ (R∩P= 0)

(This example is from Stanley Jevons, 1869. Boole's own account is
idiosyncratic, but I believe Jevons' example represents Boole's
intentions accurately.) Today we would write
∀*x*(*Px* → *Qx*) rather
than *P* ⊆ *Q*, but this is essentially the
standard definition of *P* ⊆ *Q*, so the difference
between us and Boole is slight.

Insofar as they follow Boole, modern textbooks of logic establish that English arguments are valid by reducing them to model-theoretic consequences. Since the class of model-theoretic consequences, at least in first-order logic, has none of the vaguenesses of the old argument forms, textbooks of logic in this style have long since ceased to have a chapter on fallacies.

But there is one warning that survives from the old textbooks: If
you formalise your argument in a way that is *not* a
model-theoretic consequence, it doesn't mean the argument is *not
valid*. It may only mean that you failed to analyse the concepts in
the argument deeply enough before you formalised. The old textbooks
used to discuss this in a ragbag section called ‘topics’
(i.e. hints for finding arguments that you might have missed). Here is
an example from Peter of Spain's 13th century *Summulae
Logicales*:

’There is a father. Therefore there is a child.’ … Where does the validity of this argument come from? From the relation. The maxim is: When one of a correlated pair is posited, then so is the other.

Hilbert and Ackermann, possibly the textbook that did most to establish the modern style, discuss in their section III.3 a very similar example: ‘If there is a son, then there is a father’. They point out that any attempt to justify this by using the symbolism

∃xSx→ ∃xFx

is doomed to failure. “A proof of this statement is possible only if we analyze conceptually the meanings of the two predicates which occur”, as they go on to illustrate. And of course the analysis finds precisely the relation that Peter of Spain referred to.

On the other hand if your English argument translates into an invalid model-theoretic consequence, a counterexample to the consequence may well give clues about how you can describe a situation that would make the premises of your argument true and the conclusion false. But this is not guaranteed.

One can raise a number of questions about whether the modern textbook procedure does really capture a sensible notion of logical consequence. For example in Boole's case the set-theoretic consequences that he relies on are all easily provable by formal proofs in first-order logic, not even using any set-theoretic axioms; and by the completeness theorem (see the entry on classical logic) the same is true for first-order logic. But for some other logics it is certainly not true. For instance the model-theoretic consequence relation for some logics of time presupposes some facts about the physical structure of time. Also, as Boole himself pointed out, his translation from an English argument to its set-theoretic form requires us to believe that for every property used in the argument, there is a corresponding class of all the things that have the property. This comes dangerously close to Frege's inconsistent comprehension axiom!

In 1936 Alfred Tarski proposed a definition of logical consequence for arguments in a fully interpreted formal language. His proposal was that an argument is valid if and only if: under any allowed reinterpretation of its nonlogical symbols, if the premises are true then so is the conclusion. Tarski assumed that the class of allowed reinterpretations could be read off from the semantics of the language, as set out in his truth definition. He left it undetermined what symbols count as nonlogical; in fact he hoped that this freedom would allow one to define different kinds of necessity, perhaps separating ‘logical’ from ‘analytic’. One thing that makes Tarski's proposal difficult to evaluate is that he completely ignores the question we discussed above, of analysing the concepts to reach all the logical connections between them. The only plausible explanation I can see for this lies in his parenthetical remark about

the necessity of eliminating any defined signs which may possibly occur in the sentences concerned, i.e. of replacing them by primitive signs.

This suggests to me that he wants his primitive signs to be *by
stipulation* unanalysable. But then by stipulation it will be
purely accidental if his notion of logical consequence captures
everything one would normally count as a logical consequence.

Historians note a resemblance between Tarski's proposal and one in
section 147 of Bernard Bolzano's *Wissenschaftslehre* of 1837.
Like Tarski, Bolzano defines the validity of a proposition in terms of
the truth of a family of related propositions. Unlike Tarski, Bolzano
makes his proposal for propositions in the vernacular, not for
sentences of a formal language with a precisely defined semantics.

On all of this section, see also the entry on logical consequence.

## 4. Expressive strength

A sentence S defines its class Mod(S) of models. Given two languages L
and L′, we can compare them by asking whether every class Mod(S),
with S a sentence of L, is also a class of the form Mod(S′) where
S′ is a sentence of L′. If the answer is Yes, we say that L
is *reducible to* L′, or that L′ is *at least as
expressive as* L.

For example if L is a first-order language with identity, whose
signature consists of 1-ary predicate symbols, and L′ is the
language whose sentences consist of the four syllogistic forms (All
*A* are *B*, Some *A* are *B*, No
*A* are *B*, Some *A* are not *B*) using
the same predicate symbols, then L′ is reducible to L, because
the syllogistic forms are expressible in first-order logic. (There are
some quarrels about which is the right way to express them; see the
entry on the traditional
square of opposition.)
But the first-order language L is certainly not
reducible to the language L′ of syllogisms, since in L we can
write down a sentence saying that exactly three elements satisfy
*Px*, and there is no way of saying this using just the
syllogistic forms. Or moving the other way, if we form a third
language L″ by adding
to L the quantifier *Qx* with the meaning “There are
uncountably many elements *x* such that …”, then
trivially L is reducible to L″, but the downward
Loewenheim-Skolem theorem shows at once that L″ is not reducible
to L.

These notions are useful for analysing the strength of database query languages. We can think of the possible states of a database as structures, and a simple Yes/No query becomes a sentence that elicits the answer Yes if the database is a model of it and No otherwise. If one database query language is not reducible to another, then the first can express some query that can't be expressed in the second.

So we need techniques for comparing the expressive strengths of
languages. One of the most powerful techniques available consists of
the back-and-forth games of Ehrenfeucht and Fraïssé between
the two players Spoiler and Duplicator; see the entry on
logic and games
for details. Imagine for
example that we play the usual first-order back-and-forth game
*G* between two structures *A* and *B*. The theory
of these games establishes that if some first-order sentence φ is
true in exactly one of *A* and *B*, then there is a
number *n*, calculable from φ, with the property that
Spoiler has a strategy for *G* that will guarantee that he wins
in at most *n* steps. So conversely, to show that first-order
logic can't distinguish between *A* and *B*, it suffices
to show that for every finite *n*, Duplicator has a strategy that
will guarantee she doesn't lose *G* in the first *n*
steps. If we succeed in showing this, it follows that any language
which does distinguish between *A* and *B* is not
reducible to the first-order language of the structures *A* and
*B*.

These back-and-forth games are immensely flexible. For a start, they make just as much sense on finite structures as they do on infinite; many other techniques of classical model theory assume that the structures are infinite. They can also be adapted smoothly to many non-first-order languages.

In 1969 Per Lindström used back-and-forth games to give some abstract characterisations of first-order logic in terms of its expressive power. One of his theorems says that if L is a language with a signature K, L is closed under all the first-order syntactic operations, and L obeys the downward Loewenheim-Skolem theorem for single sentences, and the compactness theorem, then L is reducible to the first-order language of signature K. These theorems are very attractive; see Chapter XII of Ebbinghaus, Flum and Thomas for a good account. But they have never quite lived up to their promise. It has been hard to find any similar characterisations of other logics. Even for first-order logic it is a little hard to see exactly what the characterisations tell us. But very roughly speaking, they tell us that first-order logic is the unique logic with two properties: (1) we can use it to express arbitrarily complicated things about finite patterns, and (2) it is hopeless for discriminating between one infinite cardinal and another.

These two properties (1) and (2) are just the properties of
first-order logic that allowed Abraham Robinson to build his
*nonstandard analysis*. The background is that Leibniz, when he
invented differential and integral calculus, used infinitesimals, i.e.
numbers that are greater than 0 and smaller than all of 1/2, 1/3, 1/4
etc. Unfortunately there are no such real numbers. During the
nineteenth century all definitions and proofs in the Leibniz style were
rewritten to talk of limits instead of infinitesimals. Now let
* R* be the structure consisting of the field of
real numbers together with any structural features we care to give
names to: certainly plus and times, maybe the ordering, the set of
integers, the functions sin and log, etc. Let L be the first-order
language whose signature is that of

*. Because of the expressive strength of L, we can write down any number of theorems of calculus as sentences of L. Because of the expressive weakness of L, there is no way that we can express in L that*

**R***has no infinitesimals. In fact Robinson used the compactness theorem to build a structure*

**R***′ that is a model of exactly the same sentences of L as*

**R***, but which has infinitesimals. As Robinson showed, we can copy Leibniz's arguments using the infinitesimals in*

**R***′, and so prove that various theorems of calculus are true in*

**R***′. But these theorems are expressible in L, so they must also be true in*

**R***.*

**R**
Since arguments using infinitesimals are usually easier to visualise
than arguments using limits, nonstandard analysis is a helpful tool for
mathematical analysts. Jacques Fleuriot in his Ph.D. thesis (2001)
automated the proof theory of nonstandard analysis and used it to
mechanise some of the proofs in Newton's *Principia*.

## 5. Models and modelling

To *model* a phenomenon is to construct a formal theory that
describes and explains it. In a closely related sense, you
*model* a system or structure that you plan to build, by writing
a description of it. These are very different senses of
‘model’ from that in model theory: the ‘model’
of the phenomenon or the system is not a structure but a theory, often
in a formal language. The *Universal Modeling Language*, UML for
short, is a formal language designed for just this purpose. It's
reported that the Australian Navy once hired a model theorist for a job
‘modelling hydrodynamic phenomena’. (Please don't enlighten
them!)

A little history will show how the word ‘model’ came to have these two different uses. In late Latin a ‘modellus' was a measuring device, for example to measure water or milk. By the vagaries of language, the word generated three different words in English: mould, module, model. Often a device that measures out a quantity of a substance also imposes a form on the substance. We see this with a cheese mould, and also with the metal letters (called ‘moduli’ in the early 17th century) that carry ink to paper in printing. So ‘model’ comes to mean an object in hand that expresses the design of some other objects in the world: the artist's model carries the form that the artist depicts, and Christopher Wren's ‘module’ of St Paul's Cathedral serves to guide the builders.

Already by the late 17th century the word ‘model’ could mean an object that shows the form, not of real-world objects, but of mathematical constructs. Leibniz boasted that he didn't need models in order to do mathematics. Other mathematicians were happy to use plaster or metal models of interesting surfaces. The models of model theory first appeared as abstract versions of this kind of model, with theories in place of the defining equation of a surface. On the other hand one could stay with real-world objects but show their form through a theory rather than a physical copy in hand; ‘modelling’ is building such a theory.

We have a confusing halfway situation when a scientist describes a phenomenon in the world by an equation, for example a differential equation with exponential functions as solutions. Is the model the theory consisting of the equation, or are these exponential functions themselves models of the phenomenon? Examples of this kind, where theory and structures give essentially the same information, provide some support for Patrick Suppes' claim that “the meaning of the concept of model is the same in mathematics and the empirical sciences” (page 12 of his 1969 book cited below). Several philosophers of science have pursued the idea of using an informal version of model-theoretic models for scientific modelling. Sometimes the models are described as non-linguistic — this might be hard to reconcile with our definition of models in section 1 above.

Cognitive science is one area where the difference between models
and modelling tends to become blurred. A central question of cognitive
science is how we represent facts or possibilities in our minds. If one
formalises these mental representations, they become something like
‘models of phenomena’. But it is a serious hypothesis that
in fact our mental representations have a good deal in common with
simple set-theoretic structures, so that they are ‘models’
in the model-theoretic sense too. In 1983 two influential works of
cognitive science were published, both under the title *Mental
Models*. The first, edited by Dedre Gentner and Albert Stevens, was
about people's ‘conceptualizations’ of the elementary facts
of physics; it belongs squarely in the world of ‘modelling of
phenomena’. The second, by Philip Johnson-Laird, is largely about
reasoning, and makes several appeals to ‘model-theoretic
semantics’ in our sense. Researchers in the Johnson-Laird
tradition tend to refer to their approach as ‘model
theory’, and to see it as allied in some sense to what we have
called model theory.

Pictures and diagrams seem at first to hover in the middle ground between theories and models. In practice model theorists often draw themselves pictures of structures, and use the pictures to think about the structures. On the other hand pictures don't generally carry the labelling that is an essential feature of model-theoretic structures. There is a fast growing body of work on reasoning with diagrams, and the overwhelming tendency of this work is to see pictures and diagrams as a form of language rather than as a form of structure. For example Eric Hammer and Norman Danner (in the book edited by Allwein and Barwise, see the Bibliography) describe a ‘model theory of Venn diagrams’; the Venn diagrams themselves are the syntax, and the model theory is a set-theoretical explanation of their meaning.

The model theorist Yuri Gurevich introduced *abstract state
machines* (ASMs) as a way of using model-theoretic ideas for
specification in computer science. According to the Abstract State
Machine website (see Other Internet Resources below),

any algorithm can be modeled at its natural abstraction level by an appropriate ASM. … ASMs use classical mathematical structures to describe states of a computation; structures are well-understood, precise models.

The book of Börger and Stärk cited below is an authoritative account of ASMs and their uses.

Today you can make your name and fortune by finding a good representation system. There is no reason to expect that every such system will fit neatly into the syntax/semantics framework of model theory, but it will be surprising if model-theoretic ideas don't continue to make a major contribution in this area.

## Bibliography

### Introductory texts

- Doets, K., 1996,
*Basic Model Theory*, Stanford: CSLI Publications. - Hodges, W., 1997,
*A Shorter Model Theory*, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press. - Manzano, M., 1999,
*Model Theory*, Oxford: Oxford University Press. - Rothmaler, P., 2000,
*Introduction to Model Theory*, Amsterdam: Gordon and Breach.

### Model-theoretic definition

- Frege, G., 1906, “Grundlagen der Geometrie”,
*Jahresbericht der deutschen Mathematikervereinigung*, 15: 293–309, 377–403, 423–430. - Gergonne, J., 1818, “Essai sur la théorie de la
définition”,
*Annales de Mathématiques Pures et Appliquées*, 9: 1–35. - Hilbert, D., 1899,
*Grundlagen der Geometrie*, Leipzig: Teubner. - Hodges, W., 2008, “Tarski's theory of definition”, in Patterson, D.
*New Essays on Tarski and Philosophy*, Oxford: Oxford University Press, pp. 94–132. - Lascar, D., 1998, “Perspective historique sur les rapports entre
la théorie des modèles et l'algèbre”,
*Revue d'histoire des mathématiques*, 4: 237–260. - Mancosu, P., Zach, R. and Badesa, C., 2009, “The development
of mathematical logic from Russell to Tarski”, in L. Haaparanta
(ed.),
*The Development of Modern Logic*, Oxford: Oxford University Press, pp. 318–470. - Pasch, M., 1882,
*Vorlesungen über Neuere Geometrie*, Berlin: Springer-Verlag. - Robinson, A., 1952, “On the application of symbolic logic to
algebra”,
*Proceedings of the International Congress of Mathematicians*(Cambridge, MA, 1950, Volume 1), Providence, RI: American Mathematical Society, pp. 686–694. - Suppes, P., 1957, “Theory of definition” in
*Introduction to Logic*(Chapter 8), Princeton, NJ: Van Nostrand. - Tarski, A., 1954, “Contributions to the theory of models, I”,
*Indagationes Mathematicae*, 16: 572–581.

### Model-theoretic consequence

- Blanchette, P., 1996, “Frege and Hilbert on consistency”,
*The Journal of Philosophy*, 93: 317–336. - Blanchette, P., 2012,
*Frege's Conception of Logic*, New York: Oxford University Press. - Boole, G., 1847,
*The Mathematical Analysis of Logic*, Cambridge: Macmillan, Barclay and Macmillan. - Etchemendy, J., 1990,
*The Concept of Logical Consequence*, Cambridge, MA: Harvard University Press. - Frege, G., 1971,
*On the Foundations of Geometry, and Formal Theories of Arithmetic*, E. Kluge (trans.), New Haven: Yale University Press. - Gómez-Torrente, M., 1996, “Tarski on logical consequence”,
*Notre Dame Journal of Formal Logic*, 37: 125–151. - Hodges, W. 2004, “The importance and neglect of conceptual
analysis: Hilbert-Ackermann iii.3”, in V. Hendricks
*et al*. (eds.),*First-Order Logic Revisited*, Berlin: Logos, pp. 129–153. - Kreisel, G., 1969, “Informal rigour and completeness proofs”, in
J. Hintikka (ed.),
*The Philosophy of Mathematics*, London: Oxford University Press, pp. 78–94. - Tarski, A., 1983, “On the concept of logical consequence”,
translated in A. Tarski,
*Logic, Semantics, Metamathematics*, J. Corcoran (ed.), Indianapolis: Hackett, pp. 409–420. - Van Benthem, J., 1991 [1983],
*The Logic of Time: A Model-Theoretic Investigation into the Varieties of Temporal Ontology and Temporal Discourse*, Dordrecht: Reidel, 1983; second edition, Springer, 1991.

### Expressive strength

- Cutland, N., 2009,
*Nonstandard Analysis and its Applications*, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press. - Ebbinghaus, H.-D., and Flum, J., 1999,
*Finite Model Theory*, Berlin: Springer-Verlag. - Ebbinghaus, H.-D., Flum, J. and Thomas, W., 1984,
*Mathematical Logic*, New York: Springer-Verlag. - Fleuriot, J., 2001,
*A Combination of Geometry Theorem Proving and Nonstandard Analysis, with Application to Newton's Principia*, New York: Springer-Verlag. - Immerman, N., 1999,
*Descriptive Complexity*, New York: Springer-Verlag. - Libkin, L., 2004,
*Elements of Finite Model Theory*, Berlin: Springer-Verlag. - Loeb, P. and Wolff, M. (eds.), 2000,
*Nonstandard Analysis for the Working Mathematician*, Dordrecht: Kluwer. - Robinson, A., 1967, “The metaphysics of the calculus”, in
*Problems in the Philosophy of Mathematics*, I. Lakatos (ed.), Amsterdam : North-Holland, pp. 28-40.

### Models and modelling

- Allwein, G. and Barwise, J. (eds.), 1996,
*Logical Reasoning with Diagrams*, New York: Oxford University Press. - Börger, E. and Stärk, R., 2003,
*Abstract State Machines: A Method for High-Level System Design and Analysis*, Berlin: Springer-Verlag. - Fowler, M., 2000,
*UML Distilled*, Boston: Addison-Wesley. - Garnham, A., 2001,
*Mental Models and the Interpretation of Anaphora*, Philadelphia: Taylor and Francis. - Gentner, D. and Stevens, A. (eds.), 1983,
*Mental Models*, Hillsdale, NJ: Lawrence Erlbaum. - Johnson-Laird, P., 1983,
*Mental Models: Towards a cognitive science of language, inference, and consciousness*, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press. - Meijers, A. (ed.), 2009,
*Philosophy of Technology and Engineering Sciences*, Amsterdam: Elsevier; see chapters W. Hodges, “Functional modelling and mathematical models”; R. Müller, “The notion of a model, theories of models and history”; and N. Nersessian, “Model based reasoning in interdisciplinary engineering”. - Moktefi, A. and Shin, S.-J. (eds.), 2013,
*Visual Reasoning with Diagrams*, Basel: Birkhäuser. - Morgan, M. S. and Morrison, M. (eds.), 1999,
*Models as Mediators*, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press. - Pullum, G. K. and Scholz, B. C., 2001, “On the distinction
between model-theoretic and generative-enumerative syntactic
frameworks”, in
*Logical Aspects of Computational Linguistics*(Lecture Notes in Computer Science: Volume 2099), P. De Groote*et al*. (eds.), Berlin: Springer-Verlag, pp. 17-43. - Stenning, K., 2002,
*Seeing Reason*, Oxford: Oxford University Press. - Suppes, P., 1969,
*Studies in the Methodology and Foundations of Science*, Dordrecht: Reidel.

## Academic Tools

How to cite this entry. Preview the PDF version of this entry at the Friends of the SEP Society. Look up this entry topic at the Indiana Philosophy Ontology Project (InPhO). Enhanced bibliography for this entry at PhilPapers, with links to its database.

## Other Internet Resources

- mentalmodelsblog: Mental Models in Human Thinking and Reasoning, by Ruth Byrne.
- Algorithmic Model Theory, by E. Graedel, D. Berwanger and F. Abu Zaid (Mathematische Grundlagen der Informatik, RWTH Aachen)
- Abstract State Machines, by Jim Huggins

## Related Entries

diagrams | geometry: in the 19th century | logic: classical | logical consequence | logical truth | models in science | physics: intertheory relations in | physics: structuralism in | square of opposition | Tarski, Alfred | Tarski, Alfred: truth definitions