Omniscience

First published Mon Feb 1, 2010

Omniscience is the property of having complete or maximal knowledge. Along with omnipotence and perfect goodness it is usually taken to be one of the central divine attributes. Philosophical considerations of omniscience often derive from “perfect being theology”, the idea made famous by St. Anselm, that God is that than which nothing greater can be thought. Among the features typically taken to contribute to greatness is perfect knowledge. More specifically religious considerations typically appeal either to scriptural support (e.g., such texts as Job 12:13: “With God are wisdom and strength; he has counsel and understanding”) or to the requirements of a theological doctrine, e.g., providence or predestination. This entry will address philosophical issues concerning omniscience as a divine attribute or a perfection, without considering its potential application in theology.

1. Defining Omniscience

Since omniscience is maximal or complete knowledge, it is typically defined in terms of knowledge of all true propositions, namely, as

(D1) S is omniscient =df for every proposition p, if p is true then S knows p.

Some philosophers endorse variations on (D1). For example, Zagzebski (2007, 262) requires that for every proposition an omniscient being either knows it or knows that it is false. This is equivalent to (D1) if, as seems plausible, for every false proposition there is a true one to the effect that it is false, and, less trivially, there are no propositions without a truth value. Plantinga (1977, 68), Davis (1983, 26), Gale (1991, 57), and others require that an omniscient being not only know all true propositions but believe no falsehoods. This is also equivalent to (D1), at least if it is impossible to believe the denial of a proposition one knows to be true, knows that one knows to be true, knows is the denial of a proposition one knows, etc.

The main disputes in the literature about the definition of omniscience have focused on the scope of the quantifier in (D1), whether, for example, it includes propositions about the future, whether (D1) requires an omniscient being to change as time goes by, whether it requires enough for maximal knowledge, and whether it (falsely) presupposes that there is a set of all truths.

2. Additional Features of Divine Knowledge

Omniscience is supposed to be knowledge that is maximal or complete; perhaps knowledge of all truths captures that idea. But the knowledge of a perfect being might well have additional features. For example, van Inwagen (2006, 26) adds to his variant of (D1) that it is impossible that there is a proposition q such that S believes q and q is false. On his view, then, an omniscient being is infallible, that is, necessarily such that any proposition it believes is true. It is conceivable, however, that a being in fact knows all truths without its being the case that it could not possibly hold a false belief; so infallibility is not the same property as omniscience, if omniscience is defined by (D1).

A related feature of perfect knowledge is being essentially omniscient, that is, being omniscient but not possibly lacking omniscience. (In an influential article Nelson Pike (1965) has argued for the incompatibility of essential omniscience and voluntary human action. See Section 3.) Essential omniscience entails infallibility—a being who could not possibly fail to be omniscient could not possibly be mistaken—but the reverse does not hold, for a being who could not possibly believe a falsehood might nevertheless fail to believe all truths.

St. Thomas Aquinas attributed another feature to God's knowledge: he held that it was not “discursive” (Summa Theologiae, I, 14, 7). By this he meant, first, that God does not first think of one thing and then think of another, for “God sees all things together and not successively” and, second, that God does not derive his knowledge by deducing conclusions from other things that he knows.

Finally, William Alston held that God's knowledge is not divided into separate beliefs, that in fact God does not have beliefs (1989). On Alston's view, God has an intuitive, immediate awareness of all truth, which gives him knowledge without belief.

Whether considerations of perfection require that God's knowledge includes any of these additional features, most discussions of omniscience assume that it is distinct from infallibility, essential omniscience, being “non-discursive”, or not involving belief. Accordingly in what follows we will consider issues that arise when omniscience is understood along the lines of (D1).

3. Foreknowledge and Human Free Action

Knowledge of all true propositions would seem to include knowledge of all truths about the future, at least if there are truths about the future. Thus omniscience would seem to include foreknowledge. There is a long tradition of philosophers who have thought that divine foreknowledge was incompatible with human free action, or, at any rate, they took arguments for the incompatibility seriously enough so as to require either disarming them or clarifying what is involved in divine omniscience. Early discussions include ones by St. Augustine (On Free Choice of the Will, Bk. III, ch. 3) and Boethius (The Consolation of Philosophy, Bk. V). They each considered an argument that may be represented as:

(1) If God has foreknowledge that S will do A, then it is necessary that S will do A.
(2) If it is necessary that S will do A, then S is not free with respect to doing A.

Therefore,

(3) If God has foreknowledge that S will do A, then S is not free with respect to doing A.

It is somewhat controversial exactly what Augustine's response to this argument is. An influential interpretation has been given by Rowe (1964) and criticized by Hopkins (1977). An alternative interpretation has been defended by Wierenga (1989, 60–63). Boethius, on the other hand, accepts the argument but denies that omniscience includes foreknowledge. Instead, God's perspective is that of eternity, that is, “the whole, simultaneous and perfect possession of unbounded life.” In other words, God sees everything that ever happens all at once, so he does not, strictly speaking, know things ahead of time. (For a more recent defense of this view, see Stump and Kretzmann 1981.)

Subsequent philosophers, however, beginning at least as early as Aquinas, identified a flaw in the argument. According to Aquinas (Summa contra Gentiles, I, 67, 10), the first premiss is ambiguous between the “necessity of the consequence” and the “necessity of the consequent.” That is, (1) may be interpreted as

(1′) It is necessary that if God foreknows that S will do A, then S will do A.

or as

(1″) If God foreknows that S will do A, then it is a necessary truth that S will do A.

On the former interpretation the premiss is true, but under that interpretation the argument is invalid, that is, the conclusion does not follow. Interpreting the premiss in the second way results in an argument that is valid, but this premiss is false. Just because God knows a proposition, it does not follow that the proposition is a necessary truth; God knows contingent truths, as well. In either case, the argument fails.

There is a second, more difficult argument for the incompatibility of divine foreknowledge and human free action. An early version was given by Pike (1965), and it has occasioned a voluminous recent literature. (For some of this literature, see the papers and bibliography included in Fisher 1989.) Subsequent developments of the argument typically draw on the following claims:

(4) A proposition reporting an event in the past is forever afterwards “fixed” or “unalterable” or accidentally necessary.

(5) A contingent proposition that is entailed by an accidentally necessary proposition is itself accidentally necessary (accidental necessity is closed under entailment).

(6) If a proposition is accidentally necessary at a time, no one is able at any later time to make it false.

In virtue of (4), propositions reporting God's past beliefs are accidentally necessary. Accordingly, a proposition reporting what God believed 80 years ago about some person's action tomorrow, say (to use Pike's example), that Jones will mow his lawn tomorrow, is now accidentally necessary. Now from the assumptions that God is omniscient and that God believes p, it follows that p. If we strengthen the first assumption to hold either that God is essentially omniscient or that he is infallible (see section 3 above), the proposition God believes p by itself entails p, that is, it is not possible that God believe p and p be false. Let us develop the argument under one of these stronger assumptions. Then since God believes that Jones will mow his lawn tomorrow entails Jones will mow his lawn tomorrow, given that the former is accidentally necessary and that the latter is contingent, it follows with the help of (5) that Jones will mow his lawn tomorrow is also accidentally necessary. But then, in view of (6), no one, not even Jones himself, is able to make it false that Jones will mow his lawn tomorrow. If there is nothing Jones can do to avoid mowing his lawn tomorrow, then he does not do so freely. This action was chosen arbitrarily, and so the argument is supposed to show that no action that God knows ahead of time will be performed is free; divine foreknowledge is incompatible with human free action.

This argument requires a cluster of nontrivial assumptions. So there is no lack of places for an objector to attack, and, in fact, philosophers have tried various ways of discrediting the argument, none of them entirely convincing. Ockhamists (named after William of Ockham, from whom the term accidental necessity derives) try to defend the claim that many propositions apparently reporting God's past beliefs are not wholly about the past, and thus are not accidentally necessary. Accordingly, Plantinga (1986) and some of the authors of the papers in Fisher (1989) on the distinction between “hard” facts and “soft” facts deny (4). But it has proven remarkably difficult to provide clear and persuasive principles for determining which propositions, although apparently about the past, are not completely or really about the past.

An alternative defended by the sixteenth-century Jesuit, Luis de Molina, is to deny (5), the principle that accidental necessity is closed under entailment of contingent propositions (Freddoso, 1988, 58). Of the assumptions required for the argument, however, (5) has seemed to many to be the least controversial, at least if we really do grasp the modality of accidental necessity.

Finally, it remains open to deny (6), to hold that even if it is already accidentally necessary that Jones mow his lawn tomorrow, he nevertheless has it within his power to do something, for example, spend the day indoors, which is such that if he were to do it, it would be false that he mows his lawn tomorrow and it would not have been true that 80 years ago God foreknew that Jones will mow his lawn tomorrow (Plantinga, 1986, 257). Jones can remain indoors tomorrow, and if he were to do that, the past would have been different; in particular, God would never have believed then that Jones would mow his lawn tomorrow. Some philosophers object, however, to this sort of counterfactual power over the past.

We have just looked at three strategies for rejecting the argument. Some theistic philosophers, however, are happy to accept it. One position accepts the argument and gives the Boethian response, like that given to the first argument above, that God's mode of existence is eternity, so he does not have foreknowledge. On this view, God is omniscient and human beings have free will; it does not matter that divine foreknowledge is incompatible with free human action, because God's omniscience does not include foreknowledge (see, for example, Stump and Kretzmann 1991). Other philosophers have objected that regardless of whether God is eternal rather than everlasting, it does not suffice to reply to the argument simply by appealing to God's eternity. Plantinga (1986), Zagzebski (1991) and others claim that an exactly analogous argument could be constructed using the premiss that 80 years ago it was then true, and so now accidentally necessary, that God eternally knows that Jones mows his lawn tomorrow. According to this revision of the argument, divine eternal knowledge would be as incompatible with human free action as divine foreknowledge is; so the Boethian response leaves the argument unchallenged.

In recent years perhaps the most widely accepted response to the argument is to accept it but to deny that omniscience extends to knowledge of the future. Peter Geach (1977) held that apart from “present trends and tendencies” there is no future to be known. Swinburne (1993) agrees that, at least if God is a contingent being, he does not have foreknowledge of future free actions. Hoffman and Rosenkrantz (2002) give a careful account of omniscience, intentionally limiting God's foreknowledge to truths that are “causally inevitable”, where causally inevitable events are not free actions. Indeed a recent movement within philosophy of religion, so-called Open Theism, has been developed with the explicit aim of leaving the future “open”, and thus unknown to God, precisely so as to leave room for human freedom. William Hasker (1989, 2004) has been a leading figure in this group, as have been the contributors to Pinnock (1994).

For a fuller discussion of these issues, see the entries on foreknowledge and free will and medieval theories of future contingents.

4. Further Difficulties for Omniscience

Philosophical issues involving foreknowledge and free action are of long-standing interest, with a history of discussion from late antiquity through the present day. Several other questions about omniscience are of more recent vintage, some of them raising more technical issues. This section will consider four more recent objections.

4.1 Omniscience and Immutability

In a provocative paper, Norman Kretzmann (1966) argued that being omniscient requires knowing different things at different times, and thus is incompatible with being immutable. This would constitute an objection to classical theism, according to which omniscience and immutability are both taken to be central attributes of God. Kreztmann's argument was anticipated by Franz Brentano in the following passage (not published until 1976):

If anything changes, then it is not the case that all truths are eternal. God knows all truths, hence also those which are such only for today. He could not apprehend these truths yesterday, since at that time they were not truths—but there were other truths instead of them. Thus he knows, for example, that I write down these thoughts, but yesterday he knew not that, but rather that I was going to write them down later. And similarly he will know tomorrow that I have written them down. (Brentano, Philosophische Untersuchungen, English translation in Chisholm, 1979, 347)

According to this objection, then, some propositions change their truth values over time, and a being who knows all true propositions accordingly changes beliefs. Philosophers who endorse this objection include Davis (1983), Kenny (1979), Prior (1962), and Wolterstorff (1975). Philosophers who have objected to the argument include Castañeda (1967), Kretzmann himself, subsequently Stump and Kretzmann (1981), Kvanvig (1986), Pike (1970), Swinburne (1993), and Wierenga (1989, 2001).

This argument, which appeals to temporal indexicals such as the present tense and the words ‘now’ and ‘yesterday’, has an analogue in an argument that appeals to first-person indexicals. That is the subject of the next section; it will be convenient to consider replies to the two arguments together.

4.2 Omniscience and Knowledge de se

Kretzmann (1966) raised a second problem for omniscience. He held that each of us possesses special “first-person” knowledge, knowledge not available to anyone else. He illustrates this with the example of what Jones knows when he knows that he himself is in the hospital. What Jones knows is not simply the proposition that Jones is in the hospital, for he might fail to believe this proposition if his hospitalization is for amnesia. Conversely, Jones could know that Jones is in the hospital by reading an account in a newspaper but fail to know that he is in the hospital, if he is mistaken about not only who he is but where he is. Thus, what Jones knows is supposed to be something other than the proposition that Jones is in the hospital and something that no one other than Jones can know. Accordingly, if omniscience requires knowing everything that anyone knows, God cannot be omniscient without being identical to Jones. Kretzmann took this to show the incompatibility of divine omniscience with “the doctrine of a personal God distinct from other persons” (1966, 420). Put more carefully, the objection purports to show the incompatibility of divine omniscience with the existence of persons distinct from God who have self-knowledge. In the version advocated by Grim (1985), given that we do have first-person or de se knowledge, there is no omniscient God.

Given the structural similarity between the objection from present-time knowledge and the objection from first-person knowledge it is not surprising that philosophers have given parallel replies. (See Sosa 1983a, 1983b on the analogy between first-person and present-time knowledge.) What is perhaps more surprising is that it has, for the most part, been opponents of the argument who have attempted to supply the details of exactly what the objects of knowledge and belief are in the case of knowledge of the present and of oneself. On the one hand, perhaps the propositions we know when we know what day it is are eternally true. In this case, what changes is our access to the propositions in question, rather than the propositions themselves. Kvanvig (1986) holds that such knowledge involves a “direct grasp” of a proposition, which leaves it open that God could believe the same propositions without thereby ending up with present-time knowledge or first-person knowledge of someone else. Wierenga (1989) has proposed an account of the objects of present-time and first-person belief according to which these propositions involve haecceities or individual essences of persons and times. On this view, one gets a first-person belief by believing a proposition including his or her own haecceity, and one gets a present-time belief by believing a proposition involving the haecceity of a moment of time at the time in question. This leaves it open that God believes the same propositions we do. He does not get a first-person belief about someone else, because the relevant propositions do not include his own haecceity. And whether he gets a present-time belief depends on whether he believes these propositions involving the haecceities of moments of time at their times or at his eternal perspective. It is not knowing the propositions that makes him temporal; it is whether he believes in time or out of time. For criticism of this proposal, see Craig (2000) and Torre (2006).

A second kind of reply is available, one that does not appeal to a special kind of grasping or an exotic type of proposition. Rather, it takes its cue from recent work on indexicals, according to which some propositions are perspectival, that is, true at some perspectives or indices and false at others. On this view, the proposition, I am in the hospital, which Jones believed at t when he was then in the hospital is true at the index of ⟨Jones, t⟩ but false at many other indices, such as ⟨Smith, t⟩ or ⟨Jones, t + one month⟩. Anyone can believe the eternal truth that this perspectival proposition is true at ⟨Jones, t⟩, but only Jones is able to believe the perspectival proposition at ⟨Jones, t⟩. More generally, one can believe perspectival propositions only at the perspectives or indices one is at. Wierenga (2001, 155) suggests that if something like this is the correct account of first-person and present-time beliefs, then the definition of omniscience, (D1) above, should be replaced with

(D2) S is omniscient =df for every proposition p and perspective ⟨x, t⟩, (i) if p is true at ⟨x, t⟩ then S knows that p is true at ⟨x, t⟩, and (ii) if S is at ⟨x, t⟩ and p is true at ⟨x, t⟩, then at ⟨x, tS knows p.

According to this definition, God can be omniscient without having the de se beliefs of others, and whether his knowledge changes over time depends, not on the mere fact of his omniscience, but on the further question of whether he has his beliefs at temporal indices.

4.3 Omniscience and Knowledge de re

Another question about omniscience is whether it is really complete knowledge unless it is extended to de re knowledge, that is, knowledge with respect to specific individuals that they have certain properties (or with respect to particular pairs of individuals that they stand in certain relations, etc.). This issue has not received much discussion in the literature, but Prior (1962) called attention to it by taking the claim that God is omniscient to entail

(7) For every f and x, if f(x) then God knows that f(x).

Prior read (7) as “God knows everything about everything” but it could be given a more explicitly de re formulation as “every property and every individual is such that if the individual has the property then God knows of that individual and property that the former has the latter.” Despite the woodenness of the expression, it does seem, as Prior says, that this is a proposition “which a believer in God's omniscience would wish to maintain.” The question then becomes whether (D1) (or (D2)) includes such knowledge de re.

Of course, if (D1) does not capture de re knowledge, it would be simple enough to add an another clause to it

… and for every thing x and every property P, if x has P, then x is such that S knows that x has P.

On the other hand, perhaps no such emendation is necessary. Many philosophers have defended an account of de re belief about an object in terms of having some de dicto belief about that object while also bearing a relation of acquaintance to it, while being epistemically en rapport with the object. (See Chisholm 1976, Lewis 1979, and Kaplan 1968.) Perhaps, God has an immediate or direct awareness of everything and that relation is sufficiently intimate to put him into epistemic rapport with everything. In that case, if de re knowledge is thus reducible to de dicto, then God's satisfying (D1) (or (D2)), would give him complete de re knowledge. On this last point, see Wierenga (2009, 134).

4.4 Omniscience and Cardinality

Patrick Grim (1988) has objected to the possibility of omniscience on the basis of an argument that concludes that there is no set of all truths. The argument (by reductio) that there is no set T of all truths goes by way of Cantor's Theorem. Suppose there were such a set. Then consider its power set, ℘(T), that is, the set of all subsets of T. Now take some truth t1. For each member of ℘(T), either t1 is a member of that set or it is not. There will thus correspond to each member of ℘(T) a further truth, specifying whether t1 is or is not a member of that set. Accordingly, there are at least as many truths as there are members of ℘(T). But Cantor's Theorem tells us that there must be more members of ℘(T) than there are of T. So T is not the set of all truths, after all. The assumption that it is leads to the conclusion that it is not. Now Grim thinks that this is a problem for omniscience because he thinks that a being could know all truths only if there were a set of all truths. In reply, Plantinga (Grim and Plantinga, 1993) holds that knowledge of all truths does not require the existence of a set of all truths. He notes that a parallel argument shows that there is no set of all propositions, yet it is intelligible to say, for example, that every proposition is either true or false. A more technical reply in terms of levels of sets has been given by Simmons (1993), but it goes beyond the scope of this entry. See also Wainwright (2010, 50–51).

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