Moore's Moral Philosophy
G.E. Moore's Principia Ethica of 1903 is often considered a revolutionary work that set a new agenda for 20th-century ethics. This historical view is hard to sustain, however. In metaethics Moore's non-naturalist position was close to that defended by Henry Sidgwick and other late 19th-century philosophers such as Hastings Rashdall, Franz Brentano, and J.M.E. McTaggart; in normative ethics his ideal consequentialism likewise echoed views of Rashdall, Brentano, and McTaggart. But Principia Ethica presented its views with unusual vigor and force. In particular, it made much more of the alleged errors of metaethical naturalism than Sidgwick or Rashdall had, saying they vitiated most previous moral philosophy. For this reason, Moore's work had a disproportionate influence on 20th-century moral philosophy and remains the best-known expression of a general approach to ethics also shared with later writers such as H.A. Prichard, W.D. Ross, and C.D. Broad.
Moore's non-naturalism comprised two main theses. One was the realist thesis that moral and more generally normative judgements – like many of his contemporaries, Moore did not distinguish the two — are objectively true or false. The other was the autonomy-of-ethics thesis that moral judgements are sui generis, neither reducible to nor derivable from non-moral, that is, scientific or metaphysical judgements. It follows that our knowledge of moral truths is intuitive, in the sense that it is not arrived at by inference from non-moral truths but rests on our recognizing certain moral propositions as self-evident.
Moore expressed the realist side of his non-naturalism by saying that fundamental moral judgements ascribe the property of goodness to states of affairs. Like others of his time, he seems to have taken this realism for granted; he certainly did not defend it extensively against anti-realist alternatives. In this he was doubtless influenced by the grammar of moral judgements, which have a standard subject-predicate form. But it may also be relevant that, at least early on, the only subjectivist view he seems to have been aware of was the naturalist one according to which to say “x is good” is to report the psychological fact that one approves of x. In his 1912 book Ethics he showed that this view does not allow for moral disagreements, since my report that I approve of x and your report that you disapprove of it can both be true (Ethics 58–61). Late in life he encountered the non-cognitivist emotivism of C.L. Stevenson, which says that moral judgements express rather than report feelings and therefore can conflict. He initially conceded that this anti-realist view had as good a claim as his own to be true (“A Reply to My Critics” 544–45), but shortly after reverted to his earlier non-naturalism, saying he could not imagine what had induced him to consider abandoning it (Ewing, “G.E. Moore” 251).
Especially in Principia Ethica, Moore spent much more time defending his other non-naturalist thesis, of the autonomy of ethics, which he expressed by saying the property of goodness is simple and unanalyzable, and in particular is unanalyzable in non-moral terms. This meant the property is “non-natural,” which means that it is distinct from any of the natural properties studied by science. Views that denied this committed what he dubbed “the naturalistic fallacy,” which he found in hedonists such as Jeremy Bentham, evolutionary ethicists such as Herbert Spencer, and metaphysical ethicists such as T.H. Green. Moore's main argument against their view was what has come to be known as the “open-question argument.” Consider a particular naturalist claim, such as that “x is good” is equivalent to “x is pleasure.” If this claim were true, Moore said, the judgement “Pleasure is good” would be equivalent to “Pleasure is pleasure,” yet surely someone who asserts the former means to express more than that uninformative tautology. The same argument can be mounted against any other naturalist proposal: even if we have determined that something is what we desire to desire or is more evolved, the question whether it is good remains “open,” in the sense that it is not settled by the meaning of the word “good.” We can ask whether what we desire to desire is good, and likewise for what is more evolved, more unified, or whatever (Principia Ethica 62–69). Sidgwick had used the same argument against Bentham and Spencer, but only in passing; Moore made it central to his metaethics.
The open-question argument was much discussed in the 20th century and met with many objections. One said the argument's persuasiveness depends on the “paradox of analysis”: that any definition of a concept will, if successful, appear uninformative. If an analysis does capture all its target concept's content, the sentence linking the two will be a tautology; but this is hardly a reason to reject all analyses. Moore could respond that in other cases accepting a definition leads us to see that the sentence affirming it, while seeming informative, in fact is not. But this does not happen in the case of “good” Even if we agree that only pleasure is good, no amount of reflection will make us think “Pleasure is good” equivalent to “Pleasure is pleasure.” Another objection, made later in the century, said the argument cannot support Moore's conclusions about the distinctness of goodness as a property. Science, the objection runs, uncovers many non-analytic property identities; for example, water is identical to H2O even though the terms “water” and “H2O” are not synonymous. By analogy, the property of goodness could be identical to that of pleasure even if “good” and “pleasure” have different meanings. Again, however, Moore could respond. The property of being water is that of having the underlying structure, whatever that is, of the stuff found in lakes, rivers, and so on; when this structure turns out to be H2O, the latter property “fills a gap” in the former and makes the two identical. But this explanation does not extend to the case of goodness, which is not a higher-level property with any gap needing filling: to be good is not to have whatever other property plays some functional role. If goodness is analytically distinct from all natural properties, it is metaphysically distinct as well. It is worth noting, however, that Moore did not explain the open-question argument in the way later non-cognitivists would. Following Hume, they said that moral judgements are intrinsically motivating, so sincerely accepting “x is good” requires a commitment or at least some motivation to pursue x if that is possible. But then no definition of “good” in purely natural terms can ever succeed, since it cannot capture the term's action-guiding force; nor can an evaluative conclusion be validly inferred from premises none of which have such force. Whatever the merits of this Humean explanation, Moore did not give it. On the contrary, the question whether moral judgements are intrinsically motivating is not one on which he expressed clear views or apparently thought very important.
The main elements of Moore's non-naturalism — moral realism and the autonomy of ethics — had been defended earlier by Sidgwick and were well known when Moore wrote. But Moore did add two innovations. One was his view that the fundamental moral concept is that of goodness, which he expressed by saying that goodness is simple and unanalyzable, even in moral terms. This had not been Sidgwick's view. For him the central moral concept had been ought, and he defined good in terms of ought, more specifically, as what one ought to desire. Principia Ethica took the exactly opposite view, defining ought in terms of good, so “one ought to do x” literally means “x will produce the most good possible” (76–77, 196–98). Moore was quickly persuaded by Bertrand Russell that this last view is vulnerable to his own open-question argument: in saying “one ought to do what will produce the most good” we do not mean “what will produce the most good will produce the most good.” In later work he therefore held that ought is a distinct moral property from good, and in an uncompleted Preface to a planned second edition of Principia Ethica allowed that it would not affect the essence of his non-naturalism if good were defined in moral terms, say, as what one ought to desire. But he continued to prefer the view that good is a simple concept, and there was vigorous debate on this topic in years to come, with Brentano, Broad, and A.C. Ewing defending reductive analyses similar to Sidgwick's while Ross held a non-reductive view like Moore's. On the Moorean view judgements about the goodness of states of affairs are not shorthand for judgements about how we ought to respond to those states; they are independent judgements that explain why we ought so to respond.
Moore's second innovation was his view that the intrinsic value of a state of affairs can depend only on its intrinsic properties, properties it has apart from any relations to other states. Earlier writers had distinguished between goodness as an end, which they also called intrinsic or ultimate goodness, and goodness as a means, saying the former cannot rest just on a state's causally producing goods outside itself. But they seemed to allow that goodness as an end can depend on other relational properties; thus they talked as if a belief's being true, which is necessary for its being knowledge, can increase its value, while a pleasure's being that of a bad person can make it worse. Moore did not explicitly state his more restrictive view that intrinsic goodness can depend only on intrinsic properties until “The Conception of Intrinsic Value” of 1922, but it nonetheless guided Principia Ethica at two points. One was that book's specific formulation of the principle of organic unities, to be discussed below. The other was its testing for a state's intrinsic value by the “method of isolation,” which involves asking whether a universe containing only that state and no other would be good (Principia Ethica 142, 145–47, 236, 256); the point of this method was precisely to insulate judgements of intrinsic value from facts about a state's external relations. Moore's strict view was adopted by some later writers such as Ross, while others argued that a better theory of value results if intrinsic goodness can depend on some relations. But Moore was the first to raise this issue clearly.
These two innovations, though not trivial, do not affect the core of a non-naturalist metaethics. But some critics charge that Moore did change that view fundamentally, and for the worse. They say that Sidgwick's non-naturalism was comparatively modest, holding only that there are truths about what people ought or have reason to do that we can know by reflection. But Moore, the objection runs, supplemented this modest view with an extravagant metaphysics of non-natural properties inhabiting a supersensible realm and a mysterious faculty of intuition that acquaints us with them. These additions opened non-naturalism to entirely avoidable objections and so led to its early demise.
These charges are hard to sustain, however. Principia Ethica actually downplayed the metaphysical side of its non-naturalism, saying that goodness has “being” but does not exist, as numbers do not exist, and in particular does not exist in any “supersensible reality” (161–63, 174–76). Nor did its explicit talk of properties mark a significant departure from Sidgwick: surely if the latter thought people ought to pursue pleasure, he thought pleasure has the property of being something people ought to pursue. Moore was similarly modest in his epistemology, saying several times, as Sidgwick also had, that by calling our knowledge of basic moral truths “intuitive” he means only that it was not derived by inference from other knowledge; he likewise denied that moral intuition was infallible, saying that in whatever way we can cognize a true proposition, we can cognize a false one (Principia Ethica 36, 193). Moore did sometimes make bald assertions of self-evidence, as in his claim in Ethics that it is self-evident that the right is always what most promotes the good (112), and some critics have found this baldness troubling. But the contrast with earlier non-naturalists such as Sidgwick should again not be overdrawn. It is arguable that Sidgwick, too, gave most weight to intuitions about abstract moral principles like those Moore cited in Ethics, citing more concrete judgements only in ad hominem arguments against opponents. And Moore often argued in more complex ways. In Principia Ethica he defended his claim that beauty on its own is good by appealing to intuitions about a very specific beautiful world, and criticized the view that only pleasure is good by arguing that it conflicts with other things we believe (132–47). Moore likewise insisted that before we make judgements of self-evidence we must make sure the propositions we are considering are clear; failure to do so, he claimed, explained much of the disagreement about ethics. And he took note of common opinions to the extent of trying to explain away divergent views when he found them. Overall his approach to establishing moral truths was very similar to Sidgwick's, appealing to intuitive judgements that can be made at different levels of generality and that must be brought into a coherent whole. This is not to say that his non-naturalism was beyond objection. Any such view holds that there are truths independent of natural and logical ones and knowable by some non-empirical means, and many find this pair of claims unacceptable. But Moore's version of the view was arguably no more objectionable than others. If Sidgwick's non-naturalism did not involve a problematic metaphysics and epistemology, neither did Moore's; if Moore's was hopelessly extravagant, so was a supposedly more modest one like Sidgwick's.
A final important feature of Moore's metaethics was its reductionism about normative concepts. Like Sidgwick, the Moore of Principia Ethica held that there was just one basic normative concept, though he thought it was good rather than ought; like Ross, the later Moore held that there were just two. But this conceptual reductionism, which was common throughout the period from Sidgwick to Ross, contrasts sharply with the multitude of concepts recognized in much present-day ethics. First, Moore and his contemporaries took as basic only the “thin” concepts good and ought rather than “thick” concepts such as courage and generosity; the latter, they held, combined a thin concept with some more or less determinate descriptive content. They were also reductive about the thin concepts. They did not distinguish between moral oughts and prudential or rational ones, holding that there is only the single, moral ought; this is why for them egoism was a moral view, not a challenge to morality from outside it. Nor did they recognize different types of value. For them goodness was a property only of states of affairs and not, as Kantians hold, of persons and other objects. They likewise did not accept the late 20th-century idea that there is a distinct concept of “well-being,” or of what is “good for” a person; instead, they defined a person's good as what is simply good and located in his life. Nor did they distinguish between moral and non-moral goodness, holding that the former is just ordinary goodness when possessed by certain objects, such as traits of character. The result was that all normative judgements could be expressed using the two concepts good and ought, which were therefore the only ones one needed. To some this conclusion will mean that Moore and his contemporaries ignored important conceptual distinctions; to others it will mean they avoided tedious conceptual debates. But it did free them to discuss substantive questions about what is in fact good and right. On this topic Moore's views, though not entirely novel, were again strikingly stated.
Moore's normative view again comprised two main theses. One was impersonal consequentialism, the view that what is right is always what produces the greatest total good impartially considered, or counting all people's good equally. The other was the ideal or perfectionist thesis that what is good is not only or primarily pleasure or desire-satisfaction, but certain states whose value is independent of people's attitudes to them. Moore recognized several such states, but in Principia Ethica said famously that “by far the most valuable things…are certain states of consciousness, which may roughly be described as the pleasures of human intercourse and the enjoyment of beautiful objects” (237). According to his ideal consequentialism, what is right is in large part what most promotes loving personal relationships and aesthetic appreciation by all persons everywhere.
Principia Ethica took the consequentialist part of this view to be analytically true, since it defined the right as what most promotes the good. But once Moore abandoned this definition, he had to treat the consequentialist principle as synthetic and did so in Ethics, which allowed that deontological views which say some acts that maximize the good are wrong are perfectly coherent. But even there he did not argue at length for consequentialism, simply announcing that it is self-evident (112). This in part reflected common assumptions of his time, when a majority of philosophers accepted some consequentialist structure. But it may also be relevant that the only alternative he considered in Ethics was an absolute deontology like Kant's, according to which some acts such as killing and lying are wrong no matter what their consequences. His major ethical works did not consider a moderate deontology such as would later be developed by Ross, in which deontological prohibitions of killing and lying often outweigh considerations of good consequences but can themselves be outweighed if enough good is at stake. It is not clear what Moore's response to such a moderate deontology would have been.
Principia Ethica also took the impartialism of its view to be analytic, and in particular claimed that egoism, which says that each person should pursue only his own good, is self-contradictory. (Despite his interest in personal love, Moore never considered the intermediate view that Broad would call self-referential altruism, according to which each person should care more about the good of those close to him, such as his family and friends.) Sidgwick had argued that if an egoist confines himself to saying that each person's pleasure is good from that person's point of view, he cannot be argued out of his position. But Moore said this concept of agent-relative goodness is unintelligible (Principia Ethica 148–53), and that conclusion does follow from his view that goodness is simple and unanalyzable. If goodness is a simple property, how can a state such as person A's pleasure have it from one point of view but not another? (Compare squareness. An object cannot be square from one point of view but not from another; it either is square or not.) All that can be meant by talk of the “good for” a person is what is simply good and located in him; and simple goodness gives everyone equally reason to pursue it. In Ethics Moore abandoned this argument, saying that egoism cannot be proven false by any argument, even though he thought its falsity was self-evident (99–100). But it is not clear how he could make this concession if he still held that goodness is a simple property. Perhaps he was tacitly allowing, as he would in the draft Preface to Principia Ethica, that it would not centrally damage his position if good were analyzed in terms of ought, as it had been by Sidgwick. There is no contradiction in saying that what each person ought to desire is different, say, just his own pleasure. But if all oughts derive from a simple property of goodness, as Moore always preferred to hold, then all oughts must be impartial.
In applying this view, Moore gave it the form of what today is called “indirect” or “two-level” consequentialism. In deciding how to act, people are not to assess individual acts for their specific consequences; instead, they should follow certain general moral rules such as “Do not kill” and “Keep promises,” which are such that adhering to them will most promote the good over time. This policy will sometimes mean not performing the act with the best individual outcome, but given our human propensity to error its consequences will be better in the long run than trying to assess acts one by one. This indirect consequentialism had again been defended earlier, by Sidgwick and even John Stuart Mill, but Moore gave it a more conservative form, urging adherence to the rules even in the face of apparently compelling evidence that breaking them now would be optimific. Principia Ethica made the surprising claim that the relevant rules would the same given any commonly accepted theory of the good, for example, given either hedonism or its own ideal theory (207). This claim of extensional equivalence for different consequentialist views was not new; T.H. Green, F.H. Bradley, and McTaggart had all suggested that hedonism and ideal consequentialism have the same practical implications. But Moore was surely expressing the more plausible view when in Ethics he doubted that pleasure and ideal values always go together (145). And even when he accepted the equivalence claim, he remained intensely interested in what he called “the primary ethical question of what is good in itself” (Principia Ethica 207; see also 78, 128). Like Green, Bradley, and McTaggart, he thought the central philosophical question was what explained why good things are good, i.e., which of their properties made them good. That was the subject of his most brilliant piece of ethical writing, Chapter 6 of Principia Ethica on “The Ideal.”
One of this chapter's larger aims was to defend value-pluralism, the idea that there are many ultimate goods. Moore thought a key bar to this view was the naturalistic fallacy. He assumed, plausibly, that philosophers who treat goodness as identical to some natural property will usually make this a simple property, such as just pleasure or just evolutionary fitness, rather than a disjunctive property such as pleasure-or-evolutionary-fitness-or-knowledge. But then any naturalist view pushes us toward value-monism, or the view that only one state is good. Once naturalism is dropped, however, we can see what Moore thought self-evident: that there are irreducibly many goods. Another bar to value-pluralism was excessive demands for unity or system in ethics. Sidgwick had used such demands to argue that only pleasure can be good, since no theory with a plurality of ultimate values can justify a determinate scheme for weighing them against each other. But Moore, agreeing here with Rashdall, Ross, and others, said that “to search for ‘unity’ and ‘system,’ at the expense of truth, is not, I take it, the proper business of philosophy” (Principia Ethica 270). If intuition reveals a plurality of ultimate goods, then an adequate theory must recognize that plurality.
According to a famous part of Principia Ethica one of those goods is the existence of beauty. Arguing against Sidgwick's view that all goods must be states of consciousness, Moore asked readers to imagine a beautiful world with no minds in it: is this world's existence not better than that of a horribly ugly world (135–36)? In answering yes, he anticipated some present-day environmental ethics, which likewise holds that there can be value in features of the natural environment apart from any awareness of them. But he did not insist on this view. Later in Principia Ethica he said that beauty on its own at most has little and may have no value, and in Ethics he denied that beauty on its own has value. There he held, with Sidgwick, that all intrinsic goods involve some state of consciousness (103–04, 148, 153). But he continued to hold that the existence of beauty that actually exists and causes the appreciation is better than an otherwise similar appreciation of beauty that does not exist.
Moore also gave some weight to the hedonic states of pleasure and pain. He thought the former a very minor good, saying that pleasure on its own at most has limited and may have no value. But pain was a very great evil, which there was a serious duty to prevent (Principia Ethica 260–61, 270–71). His view therefore involved an asymmetry, with pain a much greater evil than pleasure was a good. This had not been the traditional view; most hedonists had held that a pleasure of a given intensity was exactly as good as a pain of the same intensity was evil. But Moore thought it intuitively compelling that the pain was worse; if that made the theory of value less systematic, so much the worse for system.
While many ideal consequentialists treated knowledge as intrinsically good, in some cases supremely so, Principia Ethica did not, claiming that knowledge is a necessary component of the larger good of appreciating existing beauty but has little or no value in itself (247–48). Again Ethics may have reversed this view, citing knowledge several times as one ideal good that may be added to the hedonist's good of pleasure (34, 146–47). But Moore never saw any intrinsic value in achievement, for example in business or politics, or indeed in any active changing of the world. As John Maynard Keynes said, his chief goods were states of mind that “were not associated with action or achievement or with consequence. They consisted in timeless, passionate states of contemplation and communion, largely unattached to ‘before and after’” (Keynes, “My Early Beliefs,” 83).
The first of these goods was the appreciation of beauty, which for Moore combined the cognition of beautiful qualities with an appropriately positive emotion toward them, such as enjoyment or admiration. We listen to music, say, hear beautiful qualities in it, and love those qualities. But the value here was entirely contemplative; Moore saw no separate worth in what the romantics had especially valued, the active creation of beauty. Moore might claim that an artist must understand and love his work's beauty if he is to create it, perhaps even more than someone who merely enjoys it; but the value in the artist's work is still not distinctively creative. In characterizing the good of aesthetic contemplation Moore gave a further reductive analysis, this time of beauty as “that the admiring contemplation of which is good in itself” (Principia Ethica 249–50). Beauty, too, was not a distinct normative concept but analyzable in terms of goodness. He did not notice, however, that this definition again seemed to open him to an open-question argument, since it reduced the claim that it is good to contemplate beauty to the tautology that it is good to contemplate what it is good to contemplate.
Though Moore in Principia thought beauty good in itself, he did not insist on this view when valuing the appreciation of beauty; the latter might be good even if the former was not. But he still thought the existence of beauty makes a significant difference to value. More specifically, he thought the admiring contemplation of beauty that actually exists and causes one's contemplation is better than an otherwise similar contemplation of merely imaginary beauty, and better by more than can be attributed to the existence of the beauty on its own. This view involved an application of his “principle of organic unities,” according to which the value of a whole need not equal the sum of the values its parts would have on their own (Principia Ethica 78–80). If state x on its own has value a, and state y on its own has value b, the whole combining them need not have value a + b; it may have more or less. This principle had been accepted by Idealists such as Bradley, who gave it a characteristically anti-theoretical formulation. They said that if x and y combine to form the whole x-plus-y, their values, like their very identities, are dissolved in that larger whole, whose value cannot be computed from that of its parts. It was Moore's contribution to accept the principle in a way that rejected this anti-theoretical stance and allowed computation, though exactly how it did depended on his view that a state's intrinsic value can depend only on its intrinsic properties.
This strict view implies that when x and y enter into the relations that constitute the whole x-plus-y, their own values cannot be changed by those relations. Moore recognized this, saying, “The part of a valuable whole retains exactly the same value when it is, as when it is not, a part of that whole” (Principia Ethica 81). Any additional value in the whole x-plus-y must therefore be attributed to it as a distinct entity from its parts, and with the relations between those parts internal to it. Moore called this additional value the value of a whole “as a whole,” and said it needed to be added to the value in the parts to arrive at the whole's value “on the whole” 0 (Principia Ethica 263–64). Thus, if x and y have values a and b on their own, and x-plus-y has value c as a whole, the value of x-plus-y on the whole is a + b + c. (The value of the whole is therefore not equal to the sum of the values of its parts, but is equal to a sum of which those values are constituents.) This “holistic” formulation of the principle of organic unities is not the only possible one. One could relax the conditions on intrinsic value so it can be affected by external relations, and say that when x and y enter into a whole their own values change, so that, say, x's value becomes a + c. This “variability” formulation can always reach the same final conclusions as the holistic one, since whatever positive or negative value the latter finds in the whole as a whole the former can add to one of the parts. But the two formulations locate the additional value in different places, and sometimes one and sometimes the other gives the intuitively better explanation of an organic value. Moore, however, was forced by his strict view of intrinsic goodness to use only the holistic formulation. In the aesthetic case, he held that the admiring contemplation of beauty considered apart from the existence of its object always has the same (moderate) value a, while the existence of beauty always has the same (minimal) value b. But when the two are combined so a person admiringly contemplates beauty that exists and causes his contemplation, the resulting whole has the significant additional value c as a whole. The existence of the beauty is therefore necessary for the significant value c, but that value is not intrinsic to it, belonging instead to the larger whole of which it is part.
Moore made several other uses of the principle of organic unities, including in response to an argument of Sidgwick's for hedonism. Sidgwick had claimed that there would be no value in a world without consciousness and, more specifically, pleasure, and had concluded that therefore pleasure is the only good. Given Principia Ethica's view about the value of beauty, Moore rejected the premise of Sidgwick's argument, but he also argued that, even granting that premise, Sidgwick's conclusion does not follow. It might be that pleasure is a necessary condition for any value, but that once pleasure is present, other states such as the awareness of beauty or love increase the value of the resulting whole even though alone they have no worth (Principia Ethica 144–45). And of course this was precisely Moore's later view. Another application of the principle was in explicating claims about desert. Moore endorsed the retributive view that when a person is morally vicious it is good if he is punished, and he expressed this view by saying that although the person's vice is bad and his suffering pain is bad, the combination of vice and pain in the same life is good as a whole, and sufficiently so to make the situation on the whole better than if there were vice and no pain (Principia Ethica 263–64). This is in fact a point where Moore's holistic formulation of the principle is especially appealing. The alternative variability view must say that when a person is vicious, his suffering pain switches from being purely bad to purely good. But this implies that the morally appropriate response to deserved suffering is simple pleasure, which does not seem right; the better response mixes satisfaction that justice is being done with pain at the infliction of pain, as Moore's view implies.
Moore's other chief good of personal love also involved admiring contemplation, but now of objects that are not just beautiful but also intrinsically good (Principia Ethica 251). Since for Moore the main intrinsic goods were mental qualities, such love involved primarily the admiring contemplation of another's good states of mind. In so characterizing love Moore was applying one of four recursive principles he used to generate higher-level intrinsic goods and evils from an initial set of such goods and evils. The first such principle says that if state x is intrinsically good, admiringly contemplating, or loving, x for itself is also intrinsically good. Thus, if person A's admiringly contemplating beauty is good, person B's admiringly contemplating A's admiration is a further good, as is C's admiration of B's admiration, and so on. A second principle says that if x is intrinsically evil, hating x for itself is intrinsically good; thus, B's feeling compassionate pain at A's pain is good. And two final principles say that loving for itself what is evil, as in sadistic pleasure in another's pain, and hating for itself what is good, as in envious pain at his pleasure, are evil. Though Moore stated these four principles separately, they all make morally appropriate attitudes to intrinsic goods and evils further goods and morally inappropriate attitudes further evils. The principles were by no means unique to Moore; they had been defended earlier by Rashdall and Brentano and would be defended later by Ross. But Moore's formulation was in one respect distinctive. Rashdall and Ross called the higher-level values they generated virtues and vices, as indeed it is plausible to do; surely benevolence and compassion are virtuous and sadism vicious. But Moore defined the virtues instrumentally, as traits that cause goods and prevent evils, and said that as such they lacked intrinsic worth (Principia Ethica 220–26).
The recursive principles are clearly relevant to personal love, which centrally involves concern for another's good. But Moore's particular application of the principles led to a curiously restricted picture of love. First, as in the aesthetic case, he took the main valuable attitude to be contemplative, involving the admiration of another's already existing good qualities rather than any active engagement with them. This applied even to the love of another's physical beauty. Though he did think this a crucial part of love, he took it to involve mere passive admiration of another's beauty, as it were from the other side of the room. There was no desire to possess or interact physically with her beauty, that is, no active eroticism. And the same point applied more generally: the loving attitude was one of appreciating goods in another's life rather than acting to produce or help her achieve them. One did not do anything for or with a loved one; one simply admired. Moreover, the list of admired goods was seriously truncated. It did not include pleasure or happiness, since that was not a significant good, nor even knowledge or achievement. Instead, it centered on another's admiring contemplation of beauty, as if the supreme expression of love were “What fine taste in music you have.” Finally, Moore took the qualities one admired in a loved one to be simply and therefore impartially good. But this meant his account had no room for the special attachments many take to be central to personal love. If I love a friend for qualities x, y, and z, and a stranger comes along with the same qualities to a higher degree, then on Moore's theory I should love the stranger more. This is not to say that a more adequate account of love cannot be constructed with the same basic structure as Moore's; it can. It will hold that personal love involves a wider range of positive attitudes, including actively promoting as well as contemplating, to a wider range of goods, including happiness, knowledge, and achievement, and where those goods in a loved one's life have greater value from a lover's point of view than do similar states of strangers. But Moore was prevented from giving this account by other features of his view: his general emphasis on contemplative forms of love, his restricted list of initial intrinsic goods, and his strict impartialism about value.
Despite not containing many large new ideas, Moore's ethical writings, and especially Principia Ethica, were extremely influential, both outside and within philosophy. Outside philosophy their main influence was through the literary and artistic figures in the Bloomsbury Group, such as Keynes, Lytton Strachey, and Leonard and Virginia Woolf, several of whom had come under Moore's influence while members with him of the Apostles society at Cambridge. They were most impressed by the last chapter of Principia Ethica, whose identification of aesthetic appreciation and personal love as the highest goods very much fit their predilections. Many of them — the gay men in particular — sexualized Moore's account of love, adding an erotic element not present in his formulations. And by their own later admission, they tended to ignore the impartial consequentialism within which Moore embedded those goods, and so concentrated on pursuing them in their own lives rather than encouraging their wider spread in society. Also important for Principia Ethica's extra-philosophical appeal was its brash iconoclasm, its claiming, however, inaccurately, to sweep away all past moral philosophy. This tone entirely fit its time, when the death of Victoria had led many in Britain to think a new, more progressive age was beginning.
The book's influence within philosophy was even greater. On the normative side, views close to its ideal consequentialism remained prominent and even dominant through the 1930s, though it is hard to know how far this is attributable to Moore, since similar views had been widely accepted before him. In metaethics his non-naturalism likewise remained dominant for several decades, though here Moore played a larger role, especially for later generations, because of the vigor with which he presented the view. He said more about its metaphysics than predecessors such as Sidgwick had, if only by making explicit its commitment to non-natural properties. And he defended it more extensively, by placing more weight on the open-question argument. When Sidgwick had noticed Bentham or Spencer equating goodness with a natural property such as pleasure, he thought it a minor slip that in charity should be ignored; Moore thought it vitiated the philosopher's entire system. By so emphasizing the two elements of non-naturalism — its realism and commitment to the autonomy of ethics — Moore helped initiate a sequence of developments in 20th-century metaethics.
The first reaction to non-naturalism, other than simple acceptance, came from philosophers who accepted the autonomy of ethics but, often under the influence of logical positivism, rejected its moral realism, holding that there are no facts other than natural facts and no modes of knowing other than the empirical and the strictly logical. They therefore developed various versions of non-cognitivism, which hold that moral judgements are not true or false but express attitudes (emotivism) or issue something like imperatives (prescriptivism). These views allow for moral disagreement, since attitudes and imperatives can oppose each other. They also, their proponents claimed, give a better explanation of the open-question argument, since they find a distinctive emotive or action-guiding force in moral concepts and judgements that is not present in non-moral ones. Non-cognitivism can also explain why morality matters to us as it does. Non-naturalism implies that moral judgements concern a mysterious type of property, but why should facts about that property be important to us or influence our behavior? If such judgements express deep-seated attitudes, the question answers itself.
A still later generation turned against non-cognitivism, in part for flouting the grammar of moral judgements and our natural response to them, both of which suggest realism, but also for a reason shared with non-naturalism. When Moore and the other non-naturalists defended substantive moral judgements, they often said baldly that the judgements were self-evident, so anyone who denied them was morally blind. To the later generation this was unacceptably dogmatic, and the failing was even more plainly present in non-cognitivism, which pictured moral debate as the mere venting of emotions or issuing of commands. These philosophers therefore sought an account of ethics that would better allow for rational moral discussion. While many alternatives were canvassed, one that came to prominence in the late 1950s was a neo-Aristotelian view according to which, if it is true that one ought, say, to relieve others' pain, this is because doing so will contribute to one's own flourishing as a human being. Since such flourishing was to be understood in terms of humans' biological nature, this view at least implicitly challenged the autonomy of ethics. Many of its partisans also rejected the calculating side of Moore's consequentialism, which identified right acts by adding up the goods and evils in their effects. Moral principles, they said, cannot be codified or theorized in that way. And even philosophers who did accept calculation tended to reject Moore's ideal consequentialist values as unacceptably extravagant; if right acts promoted goods, those had to be less contentious and more empirically measurable ones such as preference-satisfaction. By the 1960s, it seems fair to say, Moore's moral philosophy was about as dead as it is possible to be. It was still important to read Principia Ethica, as having started the sequence of developments that led to the current views, but from the standpoint of those views Moore's approach to ethics was hopelessly mistaken.
Forty years later the situation is more favorable to Moore. A growing body of philosophers now defend non-naturalism, some claiming to do so with less ontological extravagance than Moore, but all embracing some account of moral truth that separates it from scientific truth. In normative ethics, too, there is increasing sympathy for accounts of the good with an ideal or perfectionist content, and admiration for particular features of Moore's view, such as his valuing of personal love and his principle of organic unities. Even Moore's style of defending moral claims, which so outraged philosophers of the 1950s and 1960s, is in effect the standard style of contemporary normative ethics, though it tends to take a more complex and circumspect form. Whereas Moore sometimes claimed that certain moral propositions are self-evident when considered on their own, philosophers today are more likely to give coherence arguments, appealing to intuitive judgements at different levels of generality and if possible on different topics, to arrive at an overall position with intuitive support at many points. But the basis of this more complex procedure, which Moore also sometimes used, is essentially the same appeal to intuitive moral judgements. And it is possible to see it as, not arrogant, but philosophically modest. Moore and his contemporaries from Sidgwick in the 1870s to Ross in the 1930s believed that if one asked, for example, why we should relieve others' pain, there was no answer: we simply should. The duty to promote others' good was an underivative one for which no deeper explanation could be given and which could only be recognized by intuition. In taking this stance they assumed that the more grandiose justifications offered by philosophers, such as the neo-Aristotelian argument that benefitting others is necessary for one's own flourishing, or the Kantian argument that maxims contrary to it cannot be universalized, can never succeed. There is no moral philosopher's stone, or no way of escaping the need for direct moral judgement. Their moral methodology therefore reflected a modest belief about what philosophy can accomplish in normative ethics, as against the intuitive reflection that is also exercised, if less systematically, by non-philosophers. This philosophical modesty freed them to look more closely at the details of substantive moral views than philosophers seeking grand justifications usually do and to uncover more of their underlying structure. In this respect contemporary ethics, which has spent several decades remaking many of their discoveries, is returning to their path. This is another way in which, however slowly, contemporary ethics is coming back to Moore.
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- Sidgwick, Henry, 1907, The Methods of Ethics, London, Macmillan, 7th edition.
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- Warnock, Mary, 1978, Ethics Since 1900, 3rd ed., Oxford: Oxford University Press, Ch. 1.
- Ethics, 113/3 (2003): special volume for the centenary of Principia Ethica.
- Journal of Value Inquiry, 37/3 (2003): special volume for the centenary of Principia Ethica.
- Southern Journal of Philosophy, 41 (2003) Supplement: special volume for the centenary of Principia Ethica.
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autonomy: in moral and political philosophy | consequentialism | desert | egoism | hedonism | love | mathematics, philosophy of: intuitionism | Moore, George Edward | moral realism | Sidgwick, Henry | value: intrinsic vs. extrinsic