Moral Anti-Realism

First published Mon Jul 30, 2007; substantive revision Wed Feb 11, 2015

It might be expected that it would suffice for the entry for “moral anti-realism” to contain only some links to other entries in this encyclopedia. It could contain a link to “moral realism” and stipulate the negation of the view there described. Alternatively, it could have links to the entries “anti-realism” and “morality” and could stipulate the conjunction of the materials contained therein. The fact that neither of these approaches would be adequate—and, more strikingly, that following the two procedures would yield substantively non-equivalent results—reveals the contentious and unsettled nature of the topic.

“Anti-realism,” “non-realism,” and “irrealism” may for most purposes be treated as synonymous. Occasionally, distinctions have been suggested for local pedagogic reasons (see, e.g., Wright 1988a; Dreier 2004), but no such distinction has generally taken hold. (“Quasi-realism” denotes something very different, to be discussed in the supplement Projectivism and quasi-realism below.) All three terms are to be defined in opposition to realism, but since there is no consensus on how “realism” is to be understood, “anti-realism” fares no better. Crispin Wright (1992: 1) comments that “if there ever was a consensus of understanding about ‘realism’, as a philosophical term of art, it has undoubtedly been fragmented by the pressures exerted by the various debates—so much so that a philosopher who asserts that she is a realist about theoretical science, for example, or ethics, has probably, for most philosophical audiences, accomplished little more than to clear her throat.” This entry doesn't purport to do justice to the intricacy and subtlety of the topic of realism; it should be acknowledged at the outset that the fragmentation of which Wright speaks renders it unlikely that the label “moral anti-realism” even succeeds in picking out a definite position. Yet perhaps we can at least make an advance on clearing our throats.

1. Characterizing Moral Anti-realism

Traditionally, to hold a realist position with respect to X is to hold that X exists in a mind-independent manner (in the relevant sense of “mind-independence”). On this view, moral anti-realism is the denial of the thesis that moral properties—or facts, objects, relations, events, etc. (whatever categories one is willing to countenance)—exist mind-independently. This could involve either (1) the denial that moral properties exist at all, or (2) the acceptance that they do exist but that existence is (in the relevant sense) mind-dependent. Barring various complications to be discussed below, there are broadly two ways of endorsing (1): moral noncognitivism and moral error theory. Proponents of (2) may be variously thought of as moral non-ojectivists, or idealists, or constructivists. Using such labels is not a precise science, nor an uncontroversial matter; here they are employed just to situate ourselves roughly. In this spirit of preliminary imprecision, these views can be initially characterized as follows:

Moral noncognitivism holds that our moral judgments are not in the business of aiming at truth. So, for example, A.J. Ayer declared that when we say “Stealing money is wrong” we do not express a proposition that can be true or false, but rather it is as if we say “Stealing money!!” with the tone of voice indicating that a special feeling of disapproval is being expressed (Ayer [1936] 1971: 110). Note how the predicate “…is wrong” has disappeared in Ayer's translation schema; thus the issues of whether the property of wrongness exists, and whether that existence is mind-dependent, also disappear.

The moral error theorist thinks that although our moral judgments aim at the truth, they systematically fail to secure it. The moral error theorist stands to morality as the atheist stands to religion. Noncognitivism regarding theistic discourse is not very plausible (though see Lovin 2005); rather, it would seem that when a theist says “God exists” (for example) she is expressing something that purports to be true. According to the atheist, however, the claim is untrue; indeed, according to her, theistic discourse in general is infected with error. The moral error theorist claims that when we say “Stealing is wrong” we are asserting that the act of stealing instantiates the property of wrongness, but in fact nothing instantiates this property (or there is no such property at all), and thus the utterance is untrue. (Why say “untrue” rather than “false”? See section 4 below.) Indeed, according to her, moral discourse in general is infected with error.

Non-objectivism (as it will be called here) allows that moral facts exist but holds that they are, in some manner to be specified, constituted by mental activity. The slogan version comes from Hamlet: “there is nothing either good or bad, but thinking makes it so.” Of course, the notion of “mind-independence” is problematically indeterminate: Something may be mind-independent in one sense and mind-dependent in another. Cars, for example, are designed and constructed by creatures with minds, and yet in another sense cars are clearly concrete, non-subjective entities. Much careful disambiguation is needed before we know how to circumscribe non-objectivism, and different philosophers disambiguate differently. Many philosophers question whether the “non-objectivism clause” is a useful component of moral anti-realism at all. Many advocate views according to which moral properties are significantly mind-dependent but which they are loath to characterize as versions of moral anti-realism. There is a concern that including the non-objectivism clause threatens to make moral anti-realism trivially true, since there is little room for doubting that the moral status of actions usually (if not always) depends in some manner on mental phenomena such as the intentions with which the action was performed or the episodes or pleasure and pain that ensue from it. The issue will be discussed below, with no pretense made of settling the matter one way or the other.

[The present discussion uses the label “non-objectivism” instead of the simple “subjectivism” since there is an entrenched usage in metaethics for using the latter to denote the thesis that in making a moral judgment one is reporting (as opposed to expressing) one's own mental attitudes (e.g., “Stealing is wrong” means “I disapprove of stealing”). So understood, subjectivism is a kind of non-objectivist theory, but, as we shall see below, there are many other kinds of non-objectivist theory, too.]

Non-objectivism must not be confused with relativism. See:

Supplement: Moral Objectivity and Moral Relativism

As a first approximation, then, moral anti-realism can be identified as the disjunction of three theses:

  1. moral noncognivitism
  2. moral error theory
  3. moral non-objectivism

One question that has exercised certain philosophers is whether realism (and thus anti-realism) should be understood as a metaphysical or as a linguistic thesis. (See Devitt 1991 and Dummett 1978 for advocacy of the respective viewpoints.) The “traditional view,” as initially expressed above, makes the matter solidly metaphysical: It concerns existence and the ontological status of that existence. But when the traditional terms of the debate were drawn up, philosophers did not have in mind 20th-century complications such as noncognitivism, which is usually defined as a thesis about moral language. Thus, most contemporary ways of drawing the distinction between moral realism and moral anti-realism begin with linguistic distinctions: It is first asked “Is moral discourse assertoric?” or “Are moral judgments truth apt?” It is not clear that starting with linguistic matters is substantively at odds with seeing the realism/anti-realism distinction as a metaphysical division. After all, if one endorses a noncognitivist view of moral language, it becomes hard to motivate the metaphysical view that moral properties (facts, etc.) exist. The resulting combination of theses, even if consistent, would be pretty eccentric. It may even be argued that noncognitivism implies that moral properties do not exist: The noncognitivist may hold that even to wonder “Does moral wrongness exist?” is to betray conceptual confusion—that the very idea of there being such a property is corrupt.

Another general debate that the above characterization prompts is whether the “non-objectivism clause” deserves to be there. Geoffrey Sayre-McCord, for example, thinks that moral realism consists of endorsing just two claims: that moral judgments are truth apt (cognitivism) and that they are often true (success theory). (See Sayre-McCord 1986; also his entry for “moral realism” in this encyclopedia.) His motivation for this is that to make “mind-independence” a requirement of realism in general would lead to counter-intuitive implications. “Independence from the mental may be a plausible requirement for realism when we're talking about macro-physical objects but it's a non-starter when it comes to realism in psychology (psychological facts won't be independent of the mental)” (1986: 3). Sayre-McCord is motivated by the desire for a realism/anti-realism “template,” which can be applied with equal coherence to any domain.

Two comments may be made against Sayre-McCord's proposal. First, note the we don't expect a univocal account of it “realism” across all uses. Consider, for example, the 19th-century French realist art movement: what does it have in common with Platonic realism about universals? We don't expect there to be a common ground of commitments made by Courbet and Plato (say), yet we hardly court confusion by calling them both “realists”. Perhaps the same holds within the discipline of philosophy. There may be little that David Brink's moral realism and R. W. Sellars' perceptual critical realism have in common, yet perhaps we may nonetheless legitimately call them both “realists.” The costs of occasional confusion when moral philosophers engage with other kinds of philosopher on the issue of “realism” may be modest in comparison to the disorder that would ensue within many disciplines if the traditional independence clause were dropped entirely.

Second, it is not clear that maintaining the “mind-independence” clause as a defining feature of the realism/anti-realism division really does make psychological realism a “non-starter.” Perhaps all that is needed is a more careful understanding of the type of independence relation in question. Certainly there is a trivial sense in which the truth or falsity of a psychological claim like “Mary believes that p” depends on a mental fact: whether Mary does believe that p. On the other hand, there is also a sense in which whether Mary has this belief is a mind-independent affair: The fact of Mary's believing that p is not constituted or determined by any of our practices of judging that she does so believe. We could all judge that Mary believes that p and be mistaken. Most people would accept that even Mary might be mistaken about this—erroneously judging herself to believe that p. In the same way, although the moral claim “Mary's action was morally wrong” may be true only in virtue of the pain that Mary's action caused (or because of Mary's wicked intentions), this may not be the right kind of mind-dependence to satisfy the non-objectivist clause.

In deference to the influence that Sayre-McCord's views have had on recent metaethics, perhaps the judicious terminological decision is to distinguish minimal moral realism—which denies (i) and (ii)—from robust moral realism—which in addition denies (iii). (See Rosen 1994 for this distinction.) In what follows, however, “moral realism” will continue to be used to denote the robust version.

2. Who Bears the Burden of Proof?

It is widely assumed that moral realism enjoys some sort of presumption in its favor that the anti-realist has to work to overcome. Jonathan Dancy writes that “we take moral value to be part of the fabric of the world; ... and we should take it in the absence of contrary considerations that actions and agents do have the sorts of moral properties we experience in them” (1986: 172). In a similar vein, David McNaughton claims “The realist's contention is that he has only to rebut the arguments designed to persuade us that moral realism is philosophically untenable in order to have made out his case” (1988: 40–41). David Brink concurs: “We begin as (tacit) cognitivists and realists about ethics. ... Moral Realism should be our metaethical starting point, and we should give it up only if it does involve unacceptable metaphysical and epistemological commitments” (1989: 23–24). Of course, anyone can issue a burden-of-proof challenge; philosophical opponents often trade blows in such terms, each trying to shift the burden onto the other. But on occasion such challenges are accepted; both parties acknowledge that one theory faces a special challenge, that it has extra work to do. Here we are interested in whether either moral realism or moral anti-realism bears a burden of proof in this latter sense—that is, whether either is widely acknowledged by both proponents and opponents to have a presumption in its favor.

There are certainly instances of participants in this debate accepting such prima facie burdens (and then attempting to discharge them). John Mackie, for instance, acknowledges that since his moral error theory “goes against assumptions ingrained in our thought and built into some of the ways in which language is used, since it conflicts with what is sometimes called common sense, it needs very solid support” (1977: 35). He seems to be saying that the very fact that it clashes with common sense represents a methodological handicap for his brand of moral skepticism, and thus that the arguments in its favor need to be even more convincing than do those of the opponent if they are to command assent. It is not clear, however, that Mackie was required to shoulder this burden. It appears that for any such charge that one party bears the burden of proof, there is plenty of argumentative space for denying the allegation.

We should delineate two ways that a philosophical position might bear a “burden of proof.” First, there may be a consensus of folk opinion (or “intuition”) that favors the opposing view. Second, there may be a phenomenon, or range of phenomena, for which the position in question appears to suffer a clear disadvantage when it comes to offering an explanation. That these two are distinct is brought out by considering that theory X might do a much better job than theory Y of explaining phenomenon P, even though X is more counter-intuitive than Y. Perhaps Newtonian physics is more intuitive than Einsteinian, but there are observable data—e.g., those gathered during the famous solar eclipse experiments of 1919—that the latter theory is much better equipped to explain.

Supplement: Moral Anti-realism vs. Realism: Intuitions
Supplement: Moral Anti-realism vs. Realism: Explanatory Power

In short, attempts to establish the burden of proof are as slippery and indecisive in the debate between the moral realist and the moral anti-realist as they tend to be generally in philosophy. The matter is complicated by the fact that there are two kinds of burden-of-proof case that can be pressed, and here they tend to pull against each other. On the one hand, moral realists face a cluster of explanatory challenges concerning the nature of moral facts (how they relate to naturalistic facts, how we have access to them, why they have practical importance)—challenges that simply don't arise for either the noncognitivist or the error theorist. On the other hand, it is widely assumed that intuitions strongly favor the moral realist. This tension between what is considered to be the intuitive position and what is considered to be the empirically, metaphysically, and epistemologically defensible position, motivates and animates much of the debate between the moral realist and moral anti-realist.

Let us now discuss in turn the three specific forms of moral anti-realism in more detail.

3. Noncognitivism

On the face of it, when we make a public moral judgment, like “That act of stealing was wrong,” what we are doing is asserting that the act of stealing in question instantiates a certain property: wrongness. This raises a number of extremely thorny metaethical questions: What kind of property is wrongness? How does it relate to the natural properties instantiated by the action? How do we have epistemic access to the property? How do we confirm whether something does or does not instantiate the property? (And so on.) The difficulty of answering such questions may lead one to reject the presupposition that prompted them: One might deny that in making a moral judgment we are engaging in the assignment of properties at all. Such a rejection, roughly speaking, is the noncognitivist proposal. Not only does the noncognitivist sidestep these nasty puzzles, but may also claim the advantages of doing a better job of explaining the apparent motivational efficacy of moral judgment (see Stevenson 1937; Blackburn 1984; Smith 1994a: chapters 1–2), of more readily accounting for certain aspects of moral disagreement (e.g., its vehemence and intractability) (see Stevenson 1944; 1963: essays 1 and 2), or of accommodating our unwillingness to defer to moral experts (see McGrath 2008).

It is impossible to characterize noncognitivism in a way that will please everyone. Etymologically speaking, moral noncognitivism is the view that there is no such thing as moral knowledge. But it is rarely considered in these terms. Traditionally, it is presented as the view that moral judgments are neither true nor false. This characterization is indeterminate and problematic in several ways. First, it leaves it unclear what category of thing a “moral judgment” is; in particular, is it a mental state or a linguistic entity? If moral judgments are considered to be mental states, then noncognitivism is the view that they are a type of mental state that is neither true nor false, which is equivalent (most assume) to the denial that moral judgments are beliefs. There are at least two ways of treating a moral judgment as a type of “linguistic entity”: We could think of it as a type of sentence (generally, one that involves a moral predicate, such as “…is morally good” or “…is evil”) or we could think of it as a type of speech act. On the former disambiguation, noncognitivism is the semantic view that moral judgments are a type of sentence that is neither true nor false, which is equivalent (most assume) to saying that the underlying grammar of the sentence—its logical form—is such that it fails to express a proposition (in the same way as, say, “Is the cat brown?” and “Shut the door!” are sentences that fail to express propositions). On the latter disambiguation, noncognitivism is the pragmatic view that moral judgments are a type of speech act that is neither true nor false, which is equivalent (most assume) to the denial that moral judgments are assertions (i.e., the denial that moral judgments express belief states). (For discussion of the semantic/pragmatic distinction, see the entry on pragmatics, section 4.) In all cases, note, noncognitivism is principally a view of what moral judgments are not—thus leaving open space for many different forms of noncognitivism claiming what moral judgments are.

There are also problems inherent in characterizing noncognitivism in terms of truth value—if for no other reason than that there is much deep and ongoing philosophical debate about the nature of truth and the nature of truth value. There are number of reasons for thinking that the category of “being neither true nor false” does not align as neatly as often assumed with the categories of “being something other than a belief” (when applied to mental states) or “being something that does not express a proposition” (when applied to sentence types) or “being something other than an assertion” (when applied to speech acts). For example, according to Strawson (1956), if someone were today to utter “The present king of France is wise,” she would have failed to say anything true or false, due to the referential failure of the subject term of the sentence. Yet surely the utterance is not barred from counting as an assertion, and surely the speaker, if she falsely believes that there exists a present king of France, can believe that he is wise. Similarly, it has frequently been argued (though also frequently denied) that sentences manifesting forms of sortal incorrectness (e.g., “The color of copper is forgetful”) are neither true nor false; yet these too are, arguably, assertible. It has also been claimed that vague predicates, when applied to gray-area objects, result in sentences neither true nor false; yet, again, such sentences seem assertible and believable. None of these is an unproblematic position to adopt, but together they at least indicate that it may be preferable to characterize noncognitivism in a manner that does not make essential reference to truth value gaps. There is also pressure in favor of this decision coming from the other direction. It is not unusual for modern versions of noncognitivism to acknowledge the possibility of moral truth and moral falsity via an embrace of a minimalist theory of truth (see Blackburn 1984, 1993a; Smith 1994b), according to which if one is licensed in uttering a sentence “S” with surface indicative grammar, then so too is one licensed in uttering “‘S’ is true.” Thus, regardless of whether the underlying grammar of the sentence “Stealing is wrong” expresses a proposition, regardless of whether the utterance of this sentence is typically used to express a belief, so long as someone is licensed in uttering the sentence then the appending of the truth predicate will not be inappropriate.

But if we cease to characterize noncognitivism by reference to truth value, how shall we do so? The above three characterizationd can each be revised so as to drop mention of truth values, as follows:

  • If moral judgments are considered to be mental states, then noncognitivism is the denial that moral judgments are beliefs.
  • If moral judgments are considered to be sentence types, then noncognitivism is the denial that moral judgments have an underlying grammar that expresses a proposition.
  • If moral judgments are considered to be speech acts, then noncognitivism is the denial that moral judgments are assertions.

How much progress this avoidance buys us remains to be seen. It would not be unreasonable to characterize noncognitivism as the conjunction of these three denials, though there would be something stipulative about insisting upon this. In fact, generally these different strands of noncognitivism simply aren’t sufficiently teased apart.

What, then, are the noncognitivist's options regarding positive views?

  1. If moral judgments are taken to be mental states, but not beliefs, then the likely contenders for being moral judgments are: desires, emotions, attitudes, and, in general, some specifiable kind of conative state. The noncognitivist may want to present something more specific, such as (dis)approval, or desire that the action in question (not) be performed, or subscription to a normative framework [to be specified], or desire that transgressors be punished, etc. The range of options is open-ended.
  2. If moral judgments are taken to be sentences, but ones whose underlying grammar is not proposition-expressing, then the noncognitivist must provide an account of the “true” logical structure of the moral sentence which reflects this. One traditionally dominant such form of noncognitivism once went by the name “the Boo/Hurrah” theory; it is now known as “emotivism.” According to this theory, the real meaning of a sentence like “Stealing is wrong” is something like the interjection “Stealing: Boo!” (It is important to distinguish this view—according to which moral sentences express one's feelings—from a view according to which moral sentences report one's feelings. Expressing one's disapproval toward X through saying “X: yuk!” is different from asserting “I feel disapproval of X.”) Another influential kind of noncognitivism called “prescriptivism” claims that this sentence is really a veiled command whose true meaning should be captured using the imperative mood: “Don't steal!” (see Carnap 1935: 24–25). R.M. Hare (1952, 1963) restricted this to commands that one is willing to universalize. Since there are many kinds of non-proposition-expressing sentence, there are many such possibilities for a noncognitivist. A certain kind of fictionalist might claim that the real meaning of “Stealing is wrong” should be rendered in the cohortative mood (which in English is not grammatically distinguished from imperative): “Let's pretend that stealing is wrong.” One might claim that the sentence really articulates a wish: “Would that no one would steal!” (optative-subjunctive mood). The thing to notice is that in all the translation schemata offered (but one) the predicate “…is wrong” gets translated away, thus obviating the philosophical puzzles surrounding the need to explain the nature of moral properties. This evasion of a cluster of thorny philosophical problems represents noncognitivism's greatest theoretical attraction. (The one view in which the predicate does not disappear is the fictionalist offering, but here the predicate is embedded in a “Let's pretend that…” context, thus removing any ontological commitment to the instantiation or even existence of the property. This fictionalist does, however, owe us some kind of account of what this property would be like, in order that the content of the fiction can be understood.)
  3. If moral judgments are taken to be speech acts, but not assertions, then the likely contenders for being moral judgments appear very similar to those described under (ii): Moral judgments may be used to express emotion, or to voice commands, or to initiate an act of make-believe, or to express a wish, etc. The difference is that this kind of noncognitivist sees these possibilities as in terms of what moral language is used for, not as a matter of the meaning or grammar of moral language, and thus has no need to offer a translation schema into a different grammatical mood. (Whether one uses the sentence “The frog was green” to make an assertion or utters it with assertoric force withheld in the course of telling a fairy tale, the meaning and grammar of the sentence remain the same.) The critical (and often overlooked) point is that assertion is not a grammatical or semantic category. It makes no sense to ask whether the sentence “The frog was green” is an assertion. It can certainly be used to make an assertion, but it might also be uttered as a line of a play, or dripping with tones of sarcasm, or as an example of a 4-word English sentence—and in none of these cases would it be asserted. The match between grammatical categories and speech acts is a rough one. One can assert something not only using the indicative mood, but also with the interrogative mood (“Is the pope Catholic?” meaning Yes) or the imperative mood (“Get outta here!” meaning No); one can command something not only with the imperative mood, but also with the interrogative mood (“Will you come here right now, young man?”) or the optative-subjunctive mood (“Would that you would come here!”); and so on. The noncognitivist making a claim about the use of moral sentences (as opposed to a claim about their meaning) can allow that the meaning of the sentence “Stealing is wrong” is just what it appears to be (here she can accept whatever the moral cognitivist says on the matter); but this noncognitivist maintains that the primary usage of this sentence is not to make an assertion, despite its being formed in the indicative mood. Since there are a great many kinds of speech act other than assertion (admonishing, commanding, exclaiming, promising, requesting, pretending, warning, undertaking, etc., etc.)—and since no one has yet proposed an exhaustive list—the noncognitivist has many positive options. (For more on speech act theory, see Austin 1962; Searle 1969.)

In short, the range of possible positive moral noncognitivist theories is large, though the level of plausibility among the members will vary greatly. (For futher discussion of noncognitivism, see the entry on moral cognitivism vs. non-cognitivism.) Modern noncognitivism is widely associated with the work of Blackburn, who also uses the terms “projectivism” and “quasi-realism” for the position he advocates. These three labels, however, can all be teased apart.

Supplement: Projectivism and Quasi-realism

Occasionally (though less so these days) one sees noncognitivism characterized as the view that moral judgments are meaningless. This is an inaccurate description, but it is instructive to recount why someone might be led to assert it. One of the first clear statements of moral noncognitivism came from Ayer in 1936. According to Ayer's influential brand of logical positivism, all meaningful statements are either analytic or empirically verifiable. Since moral utterances appear to be neither, Ayer concluded that they were not meaningful statements. But it does not follow that moral judgments are meaningless. Ayer's preferred conclusion is that they are not statements, but are, rather, ways of evincing one's emotions and issuing commands. (Ayer did claim that the moral predicates are not really predicates at all, that they do not pick out properties, and thus that they cannot logically be nominalized. Since wrongness, for Ayer, is a pseudo-concept, it may reasonably be claimed that Ayer took the word “wrongness,” and all other moral nouns, to be meaningless.)

[Historical aside: though Ayer is often credited with the first clear formulation of emotivism, it had been suggested to him earlier by Austin Duncan-Jones. (Duncan-Jones did not publish anything on the topic until his review of C.L. Stevenson's Ethics and Language in Mind 54 (1945); however, his views were described in C.D. Broad's article “Is goodness the name of a non-natural quality?” Proceedings of the Aristotelian Society 34 (1933–34).) Ayer admits his debt to Duncan-Jones in his autobiography. Emotivism had also been clearly presented in C.K. Ogden and I.A. Richards' 1923 book The Meaning of Meaning. Ogden and Richards write of a use of the word “good” which is...

...a purely emotive use. When so used the word stands for nothing whatsoever, and has no symbolic function. Thus, when we so use it in the sentence, ‘This is good’, we merely refer to this, and the addition of ‘is good’ makes no difference whatever to our reference … it serves only as an emotive sign expressing our attitude to this, and perhaps evoking similar attitudes in other persons, or inciting them to actions of one kind or another. (125)

Ayer later wrote: “I must confess that I had read The Meaning of Meaning some years before I wrote Language, Truth and Logic, but I believe that my plagiarism was unconscious” (1984: 28). Ogden and Richards were in turn picking up on a distinction between the denoting and emotive qualities of language that can be traced back at least to Frege's 1897 essay “Logic,” and even to J.S. Mill's 1843 System of Logic (book 6). Stephen Satris (1987) tracks the Continental origins of emotivism back to the work of Hermann Lotze in the 19th Century.]

Noncognitivism is generally presented as a descriptive characterization of moral thought or language, though occasionally it is presented in a prescriptive spirit: It may be held that moral cognitivism is as a matter of fact true, but that (for various reasons) it would be a good idea if we changed our attitudes and/or language in such a way that noncognitivism became true. (See Joyce 2001; West 2010.)

If noncognitivism is defined as the negation of cognitivism—as a theory about what moral judgments are not—then the two theories are not just contraries but contradictories. However, a degree of benign relaxation of criteria allows for the possibility of “mixed” theories. If we consider noncognitivism not as a purely negative thesis, but as a range of positive proposals, then it becomes possible that the nature of moral judgments combines both cognitivist and noncognitivist elements. For example, moral judgments (as speech acts) may be two things: They may be assertions and ways of issuing commands. (By analogy: To call someone a “kraut” is both to assert that he is German and to express a derogatory attitude toward people of this nationality.) C.L. Stevenson held such a mixed view; for modern versions, see Copp 2001; Schroeder 2010 chapter 10; Svoboda 2011.

4. Error Theory

Understanding the nature of an error theory is best done initially by example: It is the attitude that sensible people take toward phlogiston, that levelheaded people take toward astrology, that reasonable people take toward the Loch Ness monster, and that atheists take toward the existence of gods. An error theorist doesn't believe in such things; she takes talk of such things to be a load of bunk. The moral error theorist doesn't believe in such things as moral obligation, moral value, moral desert, moral virtue, and moral permission; she takes talk of such things to be bunk. This much allows one to get a fairly good intuitive grasp on the error theoretic position, though the details of how the stance should best be made precise are unresolved.

One might be tempted to express the error theory in negative existential terms: as the view that X doesn't exist. Some qualifications may be necessary depending on whether X is taken to be an object or a property. If it is an object, the error theorist simply denies its existence; but if it is a property it is somewhat less clear how to articulate the error theorist's denial. Does she deny that the property exists, or deny that it is instantiated at the actual world? It is a task for metaphysicians to decide the best way that we should speak of the status of the property of being phlogiston, say. One might allow that the property exists—even that it exists at the actual world—but deny that it is instantiated.

The problem with characterizing the error theory in negative existential terms is that it doesn't distinguish the position from noncognitivism, for the noncognitivist also denies that moral qualities exist (discounting the linguistic permissions that may be achieved via the quasi-realist program—see the supplementary document Projectivism and Quasi-realism. The difference between the noncognitivist and the error theorist is that the latter takes moral judgment as a mental phenomenon to be a matter of belief, and moral judgment as a linguistic phenomenon to be assertoric. Nobody thinks that when a 17th-century chemist said “Phlogiston resides in combustible materials” he was doing anything other than making an assertion; i.e., nobody is a noncognitivist about 17th-century phlogiston discourse. But we think that such assertions were systematically untrue, since there is no phlogiston. Similarly, the moral error theorist thinks that moral utterances are typically assertions (i.e., the error theorist is a cognitivist) but they are systematically untrue, since there are no moral properties to make them true. Strictly speaking, then, the object of an error theoretic stance is a discourse: We are error theorists about phlogiston discourse, not about phlogiston. In practice, however, philosophers often describe the error theory in the latter ontological manner, and this causes no obvious confusion. The common phrase “an error theory about morality” fudges this distinction.

Just as we obviously don't think that every sentence containing the word “phlogiston” is untrue (consider “Phlogiston doesn't exist” and “17th-century chemists believed in phlogiston”), nor does the moral error theorist hold that every sentence containing a moral term is untrue; indeed, the use of such terms is surely essential to articulating and advocating the error theory. Rather, the error theorist focuses on a proper subset of sentences containing the problematic terms: those that imply or presuppose the instantiation of a moral property. “Stealing pears is morally wrong” will be such a sentence; “Augustine believed that stealing pears is wrong” will not be. Let us call such sentences “atomic moral sentences.” The error theorist is typically characterized as holding that all atomic moral sentences are false. (See Pigden 2010.) As a quick characterization this is probably adequate, but speaking more carefully there may be grounds for revision. Consider, say, discourse about Babylonian gods, and consider in particular those sentences that imply or presuppose the existence of these gods (e.g., “Ishtar traveled to the underworld” but not “The Babylonians believed that Ishtar traveled to the underworld”). We rightly do not believe in Ishtar and all the rest of the Babylonian pantheon, and this should make us error theorists about this discourse. However, it is not obvious that a sentence like “Ishtar traveled to the underworld” comes out as false. As mentioned earlier, Strawson (1956) argued that such a sentence—where the subject term suffers from referential failure—is best considered neither true nor false. Were we to adopt this Strawsonian view, we should not be forced to accept noncognitivism about this erroneous discourse, for we saw in section 3 several reasons for rejecting the popular characterization of noncognitivism as the claim that moral judgments are neither true nor false. We can both maintain the distinction between the error theoretic position and noncognitivism, and accommodate the Strawsonian complication, if the error theoretic position is defined as the view that the relevant sentences of the discourse in question are, though typically asserted, untrue.

Not only is endorsing a moral error theory consistent with the continued use of moral terms (as in “Nothing is morally wrong”), it is even consistent with the continued use of atomic moral claims (such as “Stealing pears is wrong”). It is typically assumed that the moral error theorist must be a moral eliminativist: advocating the abolition of all atomic moral sentences. But in fact what the error theorist decides to do with the erroneous moral language is a matter logically independent of the truth of the moral error theory. Perhaps the moral error theorist will carry on asserting moral judgments although she believes none of them—in which case she will be lying to her audience (assuming her audience consists of moral believers). If lying is a fault only in a moral sense, the error theorist may remain unperturbed by this accusation. Or perhaps the moral error theorist carries on uttering moral sentences but finds some way of removing assertoric force from these utterances, in which case she is not lying, and need not be committing a moral or epistemological sin any more than does an actor reciting the lines of a play. (The error theorist who advocates maintaining moral language in this way is a kind of fictionalist. See Joyce 2001; Kalderon 2005; West 2010. See the entry on fictionalism.) Such possibilities suffice to show that the moral error theorist need not be an eliminativist about moral language, and counter the popular assumption that if we catch a professed moral error theorist employing moral talk then we can triumphantly cry “Aha!” Furthermore, even if it were true that by employing moral language the moral error theorist opens herself to accusations of hypocrisy, disingenuousness, bad faith, or vacillating between belief and disbelief, all such charges amount to criticisms of her—and to suppose that this somehow undermines the possibility of the moral error theory being true is to commit an ad hominem fallacy.

Although one could be a moral error theorist by implication—either because one endorses a radical global error theory (thus being skeptical of morality along with modality, colors, other minds, cats and dogs, etc.), or because one endorses an error theory about all normative phenomena—typically the moral error theorist thinks that there is something especially problematic about morality, and does not harbor the same doubts about normativity in general. The moral error theorist usually allows that we can still deliberate about how to act, she thinks that we can still make sense of actions harming or advancing our own welfare (and others' welfare), and thus she thinks that we can continue to make sense of various kinds of non-moral “ought”s, such as prudential ones (see Joyce 2007). Thus the moral error theorist can without embarrassment assert a claim like “One ought not harm others,” so long as it is clear that it is not a moral “ought” that is being employed. (In the same way, an atheist can assert that one ought not covet one's neighbor's wife, so long as it clear that this isn't an “…according to God” prescription.)

Holding a moral error theoretic position does not imply any degree of tolerance for those actions we generally abhor on moral grounds. Although the moral error theorist will deny (when pressed in all seriousness) that the Nazis' actions were morally wrong, she also denies that they were morally right or morally permissible; she denies that they were morally anything. This does not prevent her from despising and opposing the Nazis' actions as vehemently as anyone else. (See Joyce 2001, 2007; Garner 2010.) Thinking that the moral error theorist must be “soft on crime” is like thinking that the atheist must be.

Mackie, who coined the term “error theory” and advocated the view most clearly (1977), described it as a form of “moral skepticism.” Whether this label is acceptable depends on how broad or specific a definition of “skepticism” is being employed. If one thinks of skepticism as the state of being unsure, then Mackie is no skeptic: his position is not one of epistemic agnosticism with respect to moral claims, but rather of positive disbelief. (He is an “atheist” about morality, not an “agnostic.”) However, if one thinks of skepticism as the claim that there is no moral knowledge, and, moreover, thinks that a proposition must be true to be known, then Mackie's denial of moral truth can properly be called “skepticism.” (See the entry on skepticism.) Even so, the moral error theorist may still dislike the term “skeptic” for the connotations it brings that her position is somehow to be defined in opposition to a mainstream, and that she thus starts off shouldering a burden of proof. (Even the term “anti-realist” may be disliked for these reasons.) After all, if being “skeptical” is used in one of its vernacular modes to denote being in a state of disbelief, then the moral error theorist is no more deserving of the label than the moral realist, for the realist is a skeptic regarding the non-existence of moral properties. (Cf. definition of “theist”: “One who denies that God does not exist.”)

There are many possible routes to a moral error theory, and one mustn't assume that the metaethical position is refuted if one argumentative strategy in its favor falters. Perhaps the error theorist thinks that for something to be morally bad (for example) would imply or presuppose that human actions enjoy a kind of unrestricted autonomy, while thinking that in fact the universe supplies no such autonomy (see Caruso 2013; Blackmore 2013). Perhaps she thinks that for something to be morally bad would imply or presuppose a kind of inescapable, authoritative imperative against pursuing that thing, while thinking that in fact the universe supplies no such imperatives (Mackie 1977; Joyce 2001; Olson 2011, 2014). Perhaps she thinks that for something to be morally bad would imply or presuppose that human moral attitudes manifest a kind of uniformity, while thinking that in fact attitudes do not converge (Burgess [1978] 2007; see also Smith 1994a: 187–189, 2006, 2010). Perhaps she thinks that there exists no phenomenon whose explanation requires that the property of moral badness be instantiated, while thinking that explanatory redundancy is good ground for disbelief (Hinckfuss 1987). Perhaps she thinks that tracing the history of the concept moral badness back to its origins reveals a basis in supernatural and magical forces and bonds—a defective metaphysical framework outside which the concept makes no sense (Anscombe 1958; Hägerström 1953; see Petersson 2011). Perhaps she is both a Divine Command Theorist and an atheist. Perhaps she thinks all these things and more besides. Perhaps she is impressed by a number of little or medium-sized considerations against morality—none of which by itself would ground an error theory, but all of which together constitute sufficient grounds for skepticism.

Most opposition to the moral error theoretic position targets particular arguments in its favor, and since the range of such arguments is open-ended, so too is the opposition. Discussion has focused heavily on Mackie's 1977 presentation, and in particular on his two arguments in favor of the error theory: the Argument from Relativity and the Argument from Queerness.

Supplement: Mackie's Arguments for the Moral Error Theory

For discussion of Mackie's position, see papers in Honderich 1985 and in Joyce & Kirchin 2010. See also Brink 1984; Garner 1990; Daly & Liggins 2010; Miller 2013, ch.6; Olson 2011, 2014. It is important to remember, however, that Mackie's are not the only, nor necessarily the strongest, considerations in favor of the moral error theory.

The typical argument for the error theory has two steps: the conceptual and the ontological. First the error theorist tries to establish that moral discourse is centrally committed to some thesis X. The phrase “centrally committed” is supposed to indicate that to deny X would be to cease to participate competently in that discourse. Imagine a phlogiston theorist who, upon hearing of the success of oxygen theory, claims that his theory has been vindicated; he asserts that he has been talking about oxygen all along but just by a different name. When the important differences between the two substances are pointed out to him (that phlogiston is stored in flammable materials and released during combustion, while oxygen combines from the atmosphere with flammable materials and is destroyed during combustion), he admits that he's had some false beliefs about the nature of the substance, but remains adamant that he was still talking about oxygen all along. This seems unacceptable, roughly because the thesis about being stored and released is a “central commitment” of phlogiston talk; to deny this thesis with respect to some substance is to cease to talk about phlogiston.

The ontological step of the error theorist's argument is to establish that thesis X (whatever it may be) is false. This may be achieved either through a priori means (demonstrating X to be incoherent, say) or through a posteriori methods (investigating the world and coming to the conclusion that nothing satisfies X). Which method is appropriate depends on the nature of the error that has been attributed to moral discourse. Sometimes the moral error theorist will hold that there is something impossible or incoherent about moral properties, such that the error theory is necessarily true. But it suffices for being an error theorist to hold that the non-instantiation of moral properties is a merely contingent affair. (Mackie, for example, though often interpreted in the former way, seems to prefer the latter. He concedes that if theism were true, then “a kind of objective ethical prescriptivity could be introduced” (1977, p. 48), and, though an avowed atheist, Mackie did not, apparently, maintain that theism is necessarily false. Thus on the basis of this passage we must conclude that he took the moral error theory to be only contingently true.)

The error theorist pressing this form of argument thus faces two kinds of opponent. The challenger may acknowledge that the putatively problematic attribute that the error theorist assigns to morality really is problematic, but deny that this attribute is an essential component of morality; a normative framework stripped of the troublesome element will still count as a morality. Alternatively, the opponent may accept that the putatively problematic attribute is a non-negotiable component of anything deserving the name “morality,” but deny that it really is problematic. So, for example, if the error theorist claims that moral properties require a kind of pure autonomy which the universe does not supply, then one type of opponent will insist that morality requires nothing of the sort, while another will insist that the universe does indeed contain such autonomy.

The error theorist must be prepared to defend herself on both fronts. This job is made difficult by the fact that it may be hard to articulate precisely what it is that is so troubling about morality. This failure need not be due to a lack of clear thinking or imagination on the error theorist's part, for the thing that is troubling her may be that there is something deeply mysterious about morality. The moral error theorist may, for example, perceive that moral imperatives are imbued with a kind of mystical practical authority—a quality that, being mysterious, of course cannot be articulated in terms satisfactory to an analytic philosopher. Such an error theorist is forced to fall back on vague metaphors in presenting her case: Moral properties have a “to-be-pursuedness” to them (Mackie 1977: 40), moral facts would require that “the universe takes sides” (Burgess [1978] 2007), moral believers are committed to “demands as real as trees and as authoritative as orders from headquarters” (Garner 1994: 61), and so on. Indeed, it may be the vague, equivocal, quasi-mystical, and/or ineliminably metaphorical imponderabilia of moral discourse that so troubles the error theorist. (See Hussain 2004.)

Even if the error theorist can articulate a clear and determinate (putatively) problematic feature of morality, the dispute over whether this quality should count as a “non-negotiable component” of morality has a tendency to lead quickly to impasse, for there is no accepted methodology for deciding when a discourse is “centrally committed” to a given thesis. What is needed is a workable model of the identity criteria for concepts (allowing us confidently to either affirm or deny such claims as “The concept of moral obligation is the concept of an institution-transcendent requirement”)—but we have no such model, and there is no consensus even on what approximate shape such a model would take. It is also possible that the most reasonable account of conceptual content will leave many concepts with significantly indistinct borders. There may simply be no fact of the matter about whether the concept of moral obligation is, or is not, the concept of an institution-transcendent requirement (for example). Thinking along these lines, David Lewis makes use of the distinction between speaking strictly and speaking loosely: “Strictly speaking, Mackie is right: genuine values would have to meet an impossible condition, so it is an error to think there are any. Loosely speaking, the name may go to a claimant that deserves it imperfectly … What to make of the situation is mainly a matter of temperament” (Lewis [1989] 2000: 93).

Lewis's own temperament leads him to want to vindicate moral discourse, and he thinks that this can be done by supporting a kind of dispositional theory of value. He argues that certain dispositional properties, properly understood, are adequate contenders for being identified with values, and he applies this account to the moral realm (Lewis 2005: 320), thus defending the existence of moral facts (though not mind-independent moral facts). But he admits that this works only if one is willing to “speak loosely” about morality. If, on the other hand, one insists on speaking strictly, then (Lewis admits) one is forced to acknowledge that there are desiderata of moral values (such as the authoritative practical oomph that Mackie goes to such efforts to articulate) that these dispositions do not satisfy. And what is wrong with insisting on speaking strictly, or wrong with antecedently preferring to support theories that disrupt and challenge rather than vindicate ordinary belief systems? Nothing, according to Lewis. If this is correct, then the dispute between the moral error theorist and her many detractors may in fact be fundamentally undecidable—there may simply be no fact of the matter about who is correct. (See Joyce 2012.)

5. Non-objectivism

To deny both noncognitivism and the moral error theory suffices to make one a minimal moral realist. Traditionally, however, moral realism has required the denial of a further thesis: the mind-dependence of morality. There is no generally accepted label for theories that deny both noncognitivism and the moral error theory but maintain that moral facts are mind-dependent; here I shall use the term “non-objectivism.” Thus, “moral non-objectivism” denotes the view that moral facts exist and are mind-dependent (in the relevant sense), while “moral objectivism” holds that they exist and are mind-independent. (Note that this nomenclature makes the two contraries rather than contradictories; the error theorist and the noncognitivist count as neither objectivists nor non-objectivists. The error theorist may, however, be an objectivist in a different sense: in holding that moral facts are conceptually objective facts.) Let us say that if one is a moral cognitivist and a moral success theorist and a moral objectivist, then one is a robust moral realist. In this section, the third condition will be discussed.

Yet this third condition, even more than the first two, introduces a great deal of messiness into the dialectic, and the line between the realist and the anti-realist becomes obscure (and, one might think, less interesting). The basic problem is that there are many non-equivalent ways of understanding the relation of mind-(in)dependence, and thus one philosopher's realism becomes another philosopher's anti-realism. At least one philosopher, Gideon Rosen, is pessimistic that the relevant notion of objectivity can be sharpened to a useful philosophical point:

To be sure, we do have “intuitions” of a sort about when the rhetoric of objectivity is appropriate and when it isn't. But these intuitions are fragile, and every effort I know to find the principle that underlies them collapses. We sense that there is a heady metaphysical thesis at stake in these debates over realism … [b]ut after a point, when every attempt to say just what the issue is has come up empty, we have no real choice but to conclude that despite all the wonderful, suggestive imagery, there is ultimately nothing in the neighborhood to discuss. (1994: 279. See also Dworkin 1996.)

As Rosen says, metaphors to mark subjectivism from objectivism are easy to come by and easy to motivate in the uninitiated. The objectivist about X likens our X-oriented activity to astronomy, geography, or exploration; the subjectivist likens it to sculpture or imaginative writing. (These are Michael Dummett's metaphors (1978: xxv).) The objectivist sees the goal of our inquiries as being to “carve the beast of reality at the joints” (as the popular paraphrase of Plato's Phaedrus puts it); the subjectivist sees our inquiries as the application of a “cookie cutter”: imposing a noncompulsory conceptual framework onto an undifferentiated reality (to use Hilary Putnam's equally memorable image (1987: 19)). The objectivist sees inquiry as a process of detection, our judgments aiming to reflect the extension of the truth predicate with respect to a certain subject; the subjectivist sees inquiry as a process of projection, our judgments determining the extension of the truth predicate regarding that subject.

The claim “X is mind-(in)dependent” is certainly too coarse-grained to do serious work in capturing these powerful metaphors; it is, perhaps, better thought of as a slogan or as a piece of shorthand. There are two conspicuous points at which the phrase requires precisification. First, we need to decide what exactly the word “mind” stands for. It can be construed strictly and literally, to mean mental activity, or it can be understood in a more liberal manner, to include such things as conceptual schemes, theories, methods of proof, linguistic practices, conventions, sentences, institutions, culture, means of epistemic access, etc. Were the moral facts to depend on any of these anthropocentric things, the anti-realist imagery of moral judges qua inventors may seem more apt than that of moral judges qua discoverers. Second, we need to decide what kind of relation is denoted by “(in)dependent.” Consider the following possibilities, concerning any of which it might be claimed that it makes goodness depend on mental activity (in this case, for simplicity, John's attitude of approval):

X is good iff John approves of X

X is good iff John would approve of X (in such-and-such circumstances)

X is good iff X merits John's approval

The catalog can be made longer, depending on whether the “iff” is construed as necessary or contingent, conceptual, a priori, or a posteriori.

To illustrate further the ubiquity of and variation among mind-dependence relations on the menu of moral theories, consider the following:

  • According to classic utilitarianism, one is obligated to act so as to maximize moral goodness, and moral goodness is identical to happiness. Happiness is a mental phenomenon.
  • According to Kant, one's moral obligations are determined by which maxims can be consistently willed as universal laws; moreover, the only thing that is good in itself is a good will. Willing is a mental activity, and the will is a mental faculty.
  • According to John Rawls (1971), fairness is determined by the results of an imaginary collective decision, wherein self-interested agents negotiate principles of distribution behind a veil of ignorance. Decision-making, negotiation, and agency all require mental activity.
  • According to Michael Smith (1994a), the morally right action for a person to perform is determined by what advice would be given to that person by her epistemically and rationally idealized counterpart. (See also Railton 1986.) Epistemic improvement and rational improvement are mental phenomena.
  • According to Richard Boyd (1988), moral goodness is identical to a cluster of properties conducive to the satisfaction of human needs, which tend to occur together and promote each other. Human needs may not all be mental, but the needs that depend in no way on the existence of mental activity are surely few.
  • According to Frank Jackson (1998), ethical terms pick out properties that play a certain role in the conceptual network determined by mature folk morality. “The folk” necessarily have minds, and the relevant process of “maturing” is presumably one that implicates a variety of psychological events.

Indeed, it is difficult to think of a serious version of moral success theory for which the moral facts depend in no way on mental activity. Yet to conclude that the distinction between minimal and robust realism cannot be upheld would be hasty. Many metaethicists who reject noncognitivism and the error theory, and thus count as minimal realists, continue to define their position (often under the label “constructivism”) in contrast to a realist view. (See Bagnoli 2002; Ronzoni 2010; Street 2010, 2012. See also the entry on constructivism in metaethics.) The challenge is to pick among the various mind-(in)dependence relations in the hope of drawing a distinction that is philosophically interesting and meshes satisfactorily with our preexisting philosophical taxonomy, such that some success theorists count as realists and some do not. Whether this aspiration can be satisfied remains to be seen, and thus Rosen's challenge is a real one. Answering this challenge is certainly not something that is aspired to here, though some preliminary thoughts will be offered.

There are unquestionably forms of mind-dependence that need to be excluded. Consider 21st-century global warming, and assume, as the scientific consensus declares, that this phenomenon is caused largely by human activity. The activities in question—driving vehicles, heavy industry, etc.—are largely intentional behaviors, hence had our minds been different—had humanity been inclined to lead a pastoral existence involving solar electricity and lots of bicycles—there would be no global warming. Thus the sentence “Global warming is occurring” is true thanks in part to human minds. And, indeed, to the extent that our actions might yet still reverse the phenomenon of global warming, by changing our minds we can render the sentence false. Yet, for all this, there certainly would seem to be something wrongheaded in claiming that global warming is “just subjective.” The straightforward kind of causal connection between mental activity and global warming (or, for that matter, airplanes, books, computers, drycleaners, etc.) is evidently not the right kind of mind-dependence that determines the objectivism/non-objectivism divide.

Compare a different case. Suppose I have a nugget of gold in one hand and a thousand dollar bill in the other. Let us say that it is a fact that (here and now) the nugget of gold is worth the same as the rectangular flat object, just as it is a fact that the thing in my left hand is made of metal and the thing in my right hand is made of paper. Yet the status of these facts seems different. The former fact, concerning the comparative value of the held objects, is not merely causally dependent on human mental activity, but seems somehow sustained and perhaps even constituted by that activity. Were the relevant authorities to decide that the nugget is worth twice the piece of paper, then it would cease to be true that they are worth the same—and it would, plausibly, cease to be true immediately, not via this decision having set into motion various worldly events that will eventually cause the value to change. By comparison, were we all to come to believe that the nugget is not made of gold, or that the rectangular flat object is not made of paper, this would have no effect on material constitution of the items. Were we all to die tomorrow, the nugget would carry on being made of gold, the flat rectangular object would carry on being made out of paper, but it would cease to be true that the nugget of gold is worth the same as the thousand dollar bill.

But this is all more suggestive than edifying. The exact nature of the mind-dependence relation exemplified by the value-of-gold example is obscure, and it remains to be seen whether this relation would be a reasonable explication of the one invoked by moral non-objectivists. Rosen would doubt that the example illustrates a useful notion of mind-dependence at all. His argument might be reconstructed as follows. First, we need to avoid being distracted by the indexical elements, so let us consider the sentence “Nugget of gold X is worth the same as this piece of paper Y, at noon, January 1, 2014, in the USA.” Rosen would argue that investigating whether this sentence is true should be a perfectly straightforward empirical pursuit, that in no sense have we abrogated “the Realist's rhetoric of objectivity, already-thereness, discovery and detection” (293). An anthropologist from another world who wanted to know whether the sentence is true would set about investigating a set of sociological facts; from the anthropologist's perspective, facts about the monetary value of gold are mind-dependent “only in the sense that they supervene directly on facts about our minds … [but] this has no tendency to undermine their objectivity” (302).

It is, of course, a truism that whenever one can talk of something's being invented, talk of discovery comes along for free, for it is always possible for someone else to make discoveries about any act of invention. (One could discover that the pavlova dessert was invented in Australia rather than New Zealand.) But it would be a mistake to allow this platitude to lead us to doubt that a distinction can be upheld, for although invention-talk entails the possibility of discovery-talk, the reverse is not true. (The chemical constitution of Jupiter is something we discover and is in no sense invented by anyone.) One might, therefore, still contrast non-objective facts—for which the imageries of both invention and discovery are available—with objective facts—for which only the imagery of discovery is appropriate. It might be complained that this distinction is somehow metaphysically uninteresting, but, even if this is true, it might nevertheless be a distinction that (for whatever reason) metaethicists choose to employ as a guiding piece of basic taxonomy. And indeed it would seem that by and large they do. The conviction that there is a distinction between objectivist and non-objectivist accounts of moral facts motivates a great deal of metaethical debate.

One popular way of clarifying the mind-dependence relation is to see certain properties and/or concepts as response-dependent. (In the interests of brevity and of bringing some varying theories into conformity, in what follows I reluctantly fudge the distinction between whether the issue concerns concepts or properties.) Roderick Firth's version of ideal observer theory (1952) is a good example of such a theory, but in more recent times the idea has been discussed at length by Mark Johnston (1989, 1991, 1992, 1993), David Lewis ([1989] 2000), Crispin Wright (1988b), Philip Pettit (1991), and Ralph Wedgwood (1997). There are different formulations, but Johnston's can be considered canonical.

For Johnston, a property is response-dependent if it can be “adequately represented only by concepts whose conditions of application essentially involve conditions of human response” (Johnston 1991: 143). Response-dependent concepts are understood as follows:

Concept F = the concept of the disposition to produce R in S under C

where R is some response that essentially involves mental activity, S is some subject or group of subjects, and C are some specified conditions under which R is produced in S. (Further, it is stipulated that this identity may not hold trivially in virtue of R or S or C being given a “whatever it takes” specification (e.g., the concept cat = the concept of the disposition to produce the response “It's a cat” in perfect cat-spotters in optimal cat-spotting conditions).)

Johnston denies that our moral concepts are in fact response-dependent. He thinks that we should adopt an error theory about our actual defective response-independent moral discourse. However, he believes that we have available to us an array of response-dependent “surrogate” moral concepts regarding which we may hold a success theory. Echoing Lewis on speaking strictly versus loosely, Johnston claims that “ever so inclusively speaking” the moral error theorist is correct; but “more or less inclusively speaking” moral values exist. (These phrases are from his 1992 paper concerning color, but he makes it quite clear in his 1989 and 1993 articles that the same pattern is supposed to hold for moral value.) I will not discuss the details of Johnston's version here, but to note the general point that the acceptability of the surrogates must depend on how “close” they are to the original response-independent concepts. One may grant that nothing satisfies all of our desiderata regarding moral concepts, but the question remains whether any response-dependent concepts will satisfy enough of those desiderata to count as worthy and practicable surrogates.

Response-dependent concepts may or may not be relativistic: “S” may be replaced by an indexical (e.g., “us”) or by a non-indexical referring term (e.g., “Julius Caesar”). An example of a relativistic response-dependent moral theory is Jesse Prinz's (2007), while an example of a non-relativistic response-dependent moral theory is Firth's (1952) ideal observer theory. Here I will focus on the latter. Put in Johnston's terms, Firth's analysis of moral goodness is as follows:

The concept moral goodness = the concept of the disposition to produce approval in the ideal observer (in adequate viewing conditions)

The ideal observer is defined as having the following characteristics: He is omniscient with respect of the non-ethical facts, omnipercipient, disinterested, dispassionate, consistent, and in all other respects normal. See Firth 1952 for discussion of these qualities; see also Brandt 1954 and Firth 1954. (Note that Firth doesn't actually mention “viewing conditions,” since all the necessary properties are attributed to the observer himself. Often it doesn't make any difference whether a quality is predicated of the subject or the viewing conditions—e.g., the two descriptions “the approval felt by a fully-informed agent” and “the approval felt by an agent in circumstances that provide him with full information” are co-referential. I have here harmlessly included the parenthetical reference to “adequate viewing conditions” just to bring Firth's analysis more explicitly into line with Johnston's format.)

Not only is Firth's analysis non-relativistic (since it contains no ineliminable indexical element), but it is also, he declares, objectivist. He claims this on the grounds that it construes ethical statements in such a way that it is not the case “that they would all be false by definition if there existed no experiencing subjects (past, present, or future)” (1952: 322). In other words, Firth draws the objectivist/non-objectivist line according to an existential dependence that holds “by definition.” This claim to a certain kind of objectivity is a feature of all response-dependence theories. Response-dependent properties do not depend for their instantiation on the existence of a single conscious entity in the whole universe; what they depend upon is the presence of a disposition. Just as a vase may remain fragile in virtue of having a disposition to break (in C) even if it never has been, and never will be, broken, so too the disposition to produce R in S in C may be instantiated even if no token of R ever occurs (past, present or future), no token of S ever exists (past, present or future), and no token of C ever obtains (past, present or future). Thus Firth's theory at no point implies that any character with the idealized qualities exists.

Advocates of response-dependent theories for moral properties/concepts are eager to make much of this claim to objectivity. Pettit (1991) sets out to reassure realists that embracing response-dependency will upset little of their traditional desiderata, while Johnston claims that response-dependency promises to be a good candidate “for an appropriately qualified realism” (1993: 106). Nevertheless, although analyzing morality in a response-dependent manner without doubt makes morality existentially mind-independent, it with equal certainty renders it conceptually mind-dependent. And this may be enough to leave those with realist leanings uneasy. Although it may be true that the non-objectivist has traditionally expressed her commitments by reference to an existential relation, this may simply be due to the paucity of well-formed alternatives having been articulated in that tradition. Once conceptual mind-dependence is elucidated, the realist may find herself equally opposed. After all, in a sense all that has been altered is a modal variable: Instead of

X is good iff the ideal observer approves of X,

we have

X is good iff the ideal observer would approve of X.

If one's opposition to the former was based on an intuitive hostility to the mind-dependence relation it embodies, it seems unlikely that the tweaking of that relation in the manner of the latter will make one less inclined to balk.

Firth's and Johnston's versions of a response-dependent morality may be categorized as non-normative, in contrast with a rather different way of understanding the response-dependent relation. Normative response-dependent theories of morality (also known as “fitting attitude accounts”) claim something like the following:

The concept moral goodness = the concept of something's warranting R in S under C

The key change is the presence of the normative notion of warranting (or meriting or justifying or some such similar notion). The principal challenge for such theories is to explicate this normative notion in a non-circular way that does not undermine the need for a response-dependent theory in the first place. Normative response-dependent theories are advocated by McDowell 1985, Wiggins 1987, and McNaughton 1988.

Critics of response-dependent theories of morality include Wright 1988b; Blackburn 1993b, 1998, ch.4; Cuneo 2001; Zangwill 2003; Koons 2003; LeBar 2005; Miller 2013, ch.7. See also papers in Casati and Tappolet 1998.

A quite different way of drawing the objective/non-objective distinction comes from Crispin Wright (1992). He discriminates between phenomena that play a wide cosmological role and those that play only a narrow role. A subject matter has wide cosmological role if the kinds of things with which it deals figure in a variety of explanatory contexts—specifically, if they explain things other than (or other than via) our judgments concerning them. So, for example, the rectangular shape of my door can explain many things: my tendency to think “The door is rectangular,” the shape of the shadow it casts, the absence of drafts in the office when the door is shut, etc. By comparison, something with narrow cosmological role fails to figure in explanations except concerning our judgments. Perhaps funniness is such a property. It need not be denied that there are facts about which things have this property, but it is hard to imagine that the funniness of something can explain the occurrence of any other phenomenon in the world without our tendencies to think it funny playing an intermediary role.

Wright doubts that moral facts have wide cosmological role, and thus—in this respect at least—comes down on the side of the moral anti-realist (1992: 197-8). It must be noted, however, that Wright's broader project is to establish a certain complex pluralism regarding realism and objectivity, and thus he allows that there are other equally valid objective/non-objective partitions (which won't be discussed here) that may tilt matters back in the moral realist's favor. (For another pluralistic approach to realism, see Pettit 1991.)

There are other ways one might try to cash out the objective/non-objective distinction in a manner that makes interesting sense of the traditional realist/anti-realist division in the moral realm. One might, for example, understand moral objectivity using the template provided by Michael Dummett (1978 and 1993): Atomic moral sentences are such that, though we think of them as determinately true or false, we nevertheless know of no method that represents either a proof or a disproof of such sentences; they are potentially “recognition transcendent.” The robust moral realist, accordingly, would think that a sentence like “Stealing is morally wrong” is either true or false, but that its truth value potentially outruns any means we know of for ascertaining it. There are several objections to this way of understanding realism (see Devitt 1991), but perhaps the most salient in the present context is that many philosophers who think of themselves as robust moral realists—and, indeed, are categorized so by such a consensus of their fellows that they must be considered almost canonical examples of the view—would reject Dummett's semantic construal.

One important thing to notice about these ways of drawing the objective/non-objective distinction is that they promise to defuse Sayre-McCord's contention that “mind-dependence” has no place as a criterion of anti-realism since it would make psychological realism a non-starter (see section 1). Suppose what is under contention is a mental state like pain. Consider, first, non-objectivism as response-dependence. Perhaps a response-dependent account of pain could be advocated, but it certainly doesn't seem mandatory (to say the least). Even if it were true that for any x, x is in pain if and only x believes/judges/etc. herself to be in pain, it would not follow that the concept pain is response-dependent. Therefore, under these terms the debate between the pain objectivist and the pain non-objectivist (and, more broadly, the psychological realist and the psychological anti-realist) can be a substantive one. Consider, second, non-objectivism as narrow cosmological role. It suffices here to note that pain may or may not have wide cosmological role—the question requires delicate discussion—therefore, again, psychological anti-realism is by no means trivially excluded just in virtue of the subject matter in question concerning a psychological phenomenon. Consider, last, non-objectivism in Dummettian terms. It is not trivially false that sentences of the form “X is in pain” are determinately true or false but potentially “recognition transcendent,” therefore it is not trivially the case that such sentences fail Dummett's test of objectivity, therefore the non-objectivism clause, so understood, does not render psychological realism a “non-starter,” as Sayre-McCord fears.


So many debates in philosophy revolve around the issue of objectivity versus non-objectivity that one may be forgiven for assuming that someone somewhere understands this distinction. There certainly exists a widespread intuitive imagery associated with the duality that is sufficiently vivid to motivate heartfelt philosophical commitments, but, once approached directly, the distinction nevertheless proves extremely difficult to nail down. It is likely that part of what is causing confusion is that there are a number of non-equivalent ways of drawing the distinction, some of which are better suited to certain subject areas than others. Expecting a monolithic theory that applies to all cases is probably an unreasonable aspiration. Perhaps, in the end, Rosen's pessimism will be borne out, in which case we will face a choice about how to confront the realism/anti-realism debate: Either we can go Sayre-McCord's route—dropping the muddled non-objectivism clause from our understanding of anti-realism (thus insisting that minimal realism is the only realism there is)—or we can accept that the weight of tradition makes non-objectivism an essential component of anti-realism, thus acknowledging that the realism/anti-realism debate is itself muddled (thus, presumably, adopting Rosen's quietist attitude). But either conclusion, at present, seems premature, since there is enough interesting work on the topic underway to provide hope that sensible and viable versions of the objectivism/non-objectivism distinction may yet be drawn up.

One further comment that should be made is to voice the suspicion that much of the knee-jerk opposition to non-objectivism is based on an impoverished understanding of the kind of resources available to a sophisticated non-objectivist. It is often assumed that “moral non-objectivism” must denote a kind of lumpish relativism according to which whatever sentiments an individual happens to have determine the moral truth for that person; it is often assumed that moral non-objectivism would therefore render incoherent the ideas of moral improvement, moral criticism, and moral disagreement. It is feared that such a stance would force upon us a kind of tolerance of all manner of undesirable behaviors, from acts of rudeness to Nazi atrocities.

There is much that is confused in such apprehensions. Moral non-objectivism is not the view the wrongness of genocide, say, is just a matter of opinion (in the way that preferring chocolate ice cream over vanilla is a matter of opinion), and an undue focus on that sort of silly subjectivism—whether explicitly or tacitly and unthinkingly—has injected a fair degree of straw-mannishness into proceedings. Moral non-objectivism need not be relativistic (see the supplementary document Moral Objectivity and Moral Relativism), and even when it is so, it need not be tied to the whims of the individual. There are sophisticated versions of moral relativism that make sense of moral improvement, moral criticism, and moral disagreement (see Harman 1975, 1996; Wong 2006; Prinz 2007). Furthermore (as has been noted on numerous occasions), there is no obvious route from relativism—no matter how rampant—to an attitude of tolerance. If relativism is true, then the value of tolerance is no more absolute than any other. Consider a kind of tolerance we think desirable: say, allowing other adults to decide what clothes they will wear. If I happen to find myself with sentiments in favor of this kind of tolerance, then, according to naive individualistic moral relativism, it is true (relative to me) that choosing one's own clothes is permissible. Were I, however, to find myself with vehemently intolerant attitudes toward other people's clothing autonomy, an individualistic moral relativism would be no less supportive of my values. (Indeed, if someone were to say to me “You should be more tolerant of people's choice of dress; don't you know that moral relativism is true?”, relativism would provide me with the resources to counter “But my perspective happens to be an intolerant one, and there is no perspective-transcendent viewpoint from which this point of view may be legitimately criticized.”) Alternatively, consider a kind of tolerance we think undesirable: say, that of feeling no compulsion to take action against Nazi genocide. If I happen to find myself with sentiments opposed to this kind of tolerance—if I think that Nazi savagery is a crime that must be prevented by extreme intervention—then, according to naive individualistic moral relativism, it is true (relative to me) that an indifferent attitude toward Nazism is unacceptable. Were I, however, to find myself unresponsive when confronted with Nazi genocidal programs—were I, indeed, to find myself with sympathetic leanings—an individualistic moral relativism would be no less supportive of my values. In short, whether we are drawn to relativism in the hope that it will encourage desirable kinds of tolerance, or we are repelled by relativism for fear that it will promote undesirable kinds of tolerance, both the hope and the fear are misplaced.

6. Conclusion

This entry has not attempted to adjudicate the rich and noisy debate between the moral realist and moral anti-realist, but rather has attempted to clarify just what their debate is about. But even this much more modest task is doomed to lead to unsatisfactory results, for there is much confusion—perhaps a hopeless confusion—about how the terms of the debate should be drawn up. It is entirely possible that when subjected to acute critical examination, the traditional dialectic between the moral realist and the moral anti-realist will crumble into a bunch of evocative metaphors from which well-formed philosophical theses cannot be extracted. If this is true, it would not follow that metaethics is bankrupt; far from it—it may be more accurate to think that modern metaethics has prospered to such an extent that the old terms no longer fit its sophisticated landscape.

But for present, at least, the terms “moral realist” and “moral anti-realist” seem firmly entrenched. With so much ill-defined, however, it would seem close to pointless to conduct metaethical debate under these terms. If someone tells us that she is a moral cognitivist then we comprehend, roughly, what she means. If someone presents an argument designed to support a moral error theory then we know what to expect. If someone articulates an objection to the ideal observer theory then we understand what we are dealing with. But if someone purports to be a moral anti-realist, or a moral realist, then although we can immediately exclude certain possibilities, a great deal of indeterminacy remains. This latitude means that the terms “moral realist” and “moral anti-realist” are free to be bandied with rhetorical force—more as badges of honor or terms of abuse (as the case may be) than as useful descriptive labels. Rather like tiresome arguments over whether some avant-garde gallery installation does or does not count as “art ” taxonomic bickering over whether a given philosopher is or is not a “moral realist” is an activity as unsightly as it is fruitless.

Just as important as gaining a clear and distinct understanding of these labels is gaining an appreciation of what of real consequence turns on the debate. This seems particularly pressing here because a natural suspicion is that much of the opposition to moral anti-realism develops from a nebulous but nagging practical concern about what might happen—to individuals, to the community, to social order—if moral anti-realism, in one guise or another, were widely adopted. The embrace of moral anti-realism, it is assumed, will have a pernicious influence. This concern presupposes that most of the folk are already pretheoretically inclined toward moral realism—an assumption that was queried in the supplementary document Moral Anti-realism vs. Realism: Intuitions. But even if it is true that most people are naive moral realists, the question of what would happen if they ceased to be so is an empirical matter, concerning which neither optimism nor pessimism seems prima facie more warranted than the other. As with the opposition to moral non-objectivism, the opposition to moral anti-realism is frequently based on an under-estimation of the resources available to the anti-realist—on an unexamined assumption that the silliest, crudest, and/or most insidious version will stand as a good representative of a whole range of extremely varied and often sophisticated theories.


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The SEP would like to congratulate the National Endowment for the Humanities on its 50th anniversary and express our indebtedness for the five generous grants it awarded our project from 1997 to 2007. Readers who have benefited from the SEP are encouraged to examine the NEH’s anniversary page and, if inspired to do so, send a testimonial to