The term “nationalism” is generally used to describe two phenomena: (1) the attitude that the members of a nation have when they care about their national identity, and (2) the actions that the members of a nation take when seeking to achieve (or sustain) self-determination. (1) raises questions about the concept of a nation (or national identity), which is often defined in terms of common origin, ethnicity, or cultural ties, and while an individual's membership in a nation is often regarded as involuntary, it is sometimes regarded as voluntary. (2) raises questions about whether self-determination must be understood as involving having full statehood with complete authority over domestic and international affairs, or whether something less is required.
It is traditional, therefore, to distinguish nations from states — whereas a nation often consists of an ethnic or cultural community, a state is a political entity with a high degree of sovereignty. While many states are nations in some sense, there are many nations which are not fully sovereign states. As an example, the Native American Iroquois constitute a nation but not a state, since they do not possess the requisite political authority over their internal or external affairs. If the members of the Iroquois nation were to strive to form a sovereign state in the effort to preserve their identity as a people, they would be exhibiting a state-focused nationalism.
Nationalism has long been ignored as a topic in political philosophy, written off as a relic from bygone times. It came into the focus of philosophical debate two decades ago, in the nineties, partly in consequence of rather spectacular and troubling nationalist clashes, such as those in Rwanda, the former Yugoslavia and the former Soviet republics. The surge of nationalism usually presents a morally ambivalent, and for this reason often fascinating, picture. “National awakening” and struggles for political independence are often both heroic and inhumanly cruel; the formation of a recognizably national state often responds to deep popular sentiment, but can and does sometimes bring in its wake inhuman consequences, including violent expulsion and “cleansing” of non-nationals, all the way to organized mass murder. The moral debate on nationalism reflects a deep moral tension between solidarity with oppressed national groups on the one hand and the repulsion people feel in the face of crimes perpetrated in the name of nationalism on the other. Moreover, the issue of nationalism points to the wider domain of problems, having to do with the treatment of ethnic and cultural differences within democratic polity, which are arguably among the most pressing problems of contemporary political theory.
In recent years the focus of the debate about nationalism has shifted towards issues in international justice, probably in response to changes on the international scene: bloody nationalist wars such as those in the former Yugoslavia have become less conspicuous, whereas the issues of terrorism, of the “clash of civilizations” and of hegemony in the international order have come to occupy public attention. One important link with earlier debates is provided by the contrast between views of international justice based on the predominance of sovereign nation-states and more cosmopolitan views that either insist upon limiting national sovereignty, or even envisage its disappearance. Another new focus for philosophers is provided by issues of territory and territorial rights, which connect the topic of nation-states (or, “the nation state”) with questions like boundaries, migrations, resource rights and vital ecological matters.
In this entry we shall first present conceptual issues of definition and classification (Sections 1 and 2), and then the arguments put forward in the debate (Section 3), dedicating more space to the arguments in favor of nationalism than to those against it, in order to give the philosophical nationalist a proper hearing.
- 1. What is a Nation?
- 2. Varieties of Nationalism
- 3. The Moral Debate
- 4. Conclusion
- Academic Tools
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- Related Entries
Although the term “nationalism” has a variety of meanings, it centrally encompasses the two phenomena noted at the outset: (1) the attitude that the members of a nation have when they care about their identity as members of that nation and (2) the actions that the members of a nation take in seeking to achieve (or sustain) some form of political sovereignty (see for example, Nielsen 1998–9, 9). Each of these aspects requires elaboration. (1) raises questions about the concept of a nation or national identity, about what it is to belong to a nation, and about how much one ought to care about one's nation. Nations and national identity may be defined in terms of common origin, ethnicity, or cultural ties, and while an individual's membership in the nation is often regarded as involuntary, it is sometimes regarded as voluntary. The degree of care for one's nation that is required by nationalists is often, but not always, taken to be very high: according to such views, the claims of one's nation take precedence over rival contenders for authority and loyalty (see Berlin 1979, Smith 1991, Levy 2000, and the discussion in Gans 2003; for a more extreme characterization see the opening pages of Crosby 2005).
(2) raises questions about whether sovereignty entails the acquisition of full statehood with complete authority for domestic and international affairs, or whether something less than statehood would suffice. Although sovereignty is often taken to mean full statehood (Gellner 1983, ch. 1), more recently possible exceptions have been recognized (Miller 1992, 87 and Miller, 2000). Some authors defend even an anarchist version of patriotism-moderate nationalism, foreshadowed by Bakunin (see Robert Sparrow, “For the Union Makes Us Strong: Anarchism and Patriotism”, in Primoratz and Pavkovic 2007).
Despite these definitional worries, there is a fair amount of agreement about what is historically the most typical, paradigmatic form of nationalism. It is the one which features the supremacy of the nation's claims over other claims to individual allegiance, and which features full sovereignty as the persistent aim of its political program. Territorial sovereignty has traditionally been seen as a defining element of state power, and essential for nationhood. It was extolled in classic modern works by Hobbes, Locke, and Rousseau, and is coming back to the center stage of the debate, though philosophers are now more questioning and skeptical (see below). It is the control of the movement of money and people (in particular immigration) and the resource rights implied in territorial sovereignty that make the topic into a politically central one in the age of globalization, and philosophically interesting for nationalists and anti-nationalists alike.
The territorial state as political unit is seen by nationalists as centrally ‘belonging’ to one ethnic-cultural group, and actively charged with protecting and promulgating its traditions. This form is exemplified by the classical, “revivalist” nationalism, that was most prominent in the 19th century in Europe and Latin America. This classical nationalism later spread across the world, and in present days still marks many contemporary nationalisms.
In its general form the issue of nationalism concerns the mapping between the ethno-cultural domain (featuring etho-cultural groups or “nations”) and the domain of political organization. In breaking the issue into its components, we have mentioned the importance of the attitude that the members of a nation have when they care about their national identity. This point raises two sorts of questions. First, the descriptive ones:
(1a) What is a nation and what is national identity? (1b) What is it to belong to a nation? (1c) What is the nature of pro-national attitude? (1d) Is membership in a nation voluntary or non-voluntary?
Second, the normative ones:
(1e) Is the attitude of caring about national identity always appropriate (1f) How much should one to care?
In this section the descriptive questions are to be discussed, starting with (1a) and (1b). (The normative questions are addressed in Section 3 on the moral debate.) If one wants to enjoin people to struggle for their national interests, one must have some idea about what a nation is and what it is to belong to a nation. So, in order to formulate and ground their evaluations, claims, and directives for action, pro-nationalist thinkers have been elaborating theories of ethnicity, culture, nation and state. Their opponents have in their turn challenged these elaborations. Now, some presuppositions about ethnic groups and nations are essential for the nationalist, while others are theoretical elaborations designed to support the essential ones. The former concern the definition and status of the target or social group, the beneficiary of the nationalist program, variously called “nation”, “ethno-nation” or “ethnic group”. Since nationalism is particularly prominent with groups that do not yet have a state, a definition of nation and nationalism purely in terms of belonging to a state is a non-starter.
Indeed, purely “civic” loyalties are often put into a separate category under the title “patriotism”, or “constitutional patriotism” (Habermas 1996; see the discussion in Markell 2000; for a wider understanding of patriotism see Primoratz and Pavkovic 2007). This leaves two extreme options, and a lot of intermediate positions. The first extreme option has been put forward by a small but distinguished band of theorists, including Renan (1882) and Weber (1970); for a recent defense see Brubaker 2004). According to their purely voluntaristic definition, a nation is any group of people aspiring to a common political state-like organization. If such a group of people succeeds in forming a state, the loyalties of the group members would be “civic” (as opposed to “ethnic”) in nature. At the other extreme, and more typically, nationalist claims are focused upon the non-voluntary community of common origin, language, tradition and culture, so that in the classical view an ethno-nation is a community of origin and culture, including prominently a language and customs. The distinction is related (although not identical) to that drawn by older schools of social and political science between “civic” and “ethnic” nationalism, the former being allegedly Western European and the latter more Central and Eastern European originating in Germany (a very prominent proponent of the distinction is Hans Kohn 1965). Philosophical discussions centered around nationalism tend to concern the ethnic-cultural variants only and this habit will be followed here. A group aspiring to nationhood on this basis will be called here an ‘ethno-nation’ in order to underscore its ethno-cultural rather than purely civic underpinnings. For the ethno-(cultural) nationalist it is one's ethnic-cultural background which determines one's membership in the community. One cannot chose to be a member; instead, membership depends on the accident of origin and early socialization. However, commonality of origin has turned out to be mythical for most contemporary candidate groups: ethnic groups have been mixing for millennia.
Therefore, sophisticated pro-nationalists tend to stress cultural membership only, and speak of “nationality”, omitting the “ethno-” part (Miller 1992, 2000; Tamir 1993; Gans 2003). Michel Seymour in his proposal of a “socio-cultural definition” adds a political dimension to the purely cultural one. A nation is a cultural group, possibly but not necessarily united by a common descent, endowed with civic ties (Seymour 2000). This is the kind of definition that would be accepted by most parties in the debate today. So defined, nation is a somewhat mixed category, both ethno-cultural and civic, but still closer to the purely ethno-cultural than to the purely civic extreme.
The wider descriptive underpinning of nationalist claims has varied over the last two centuries. The early German elaborations talk about “the spirit of a people”, while somewhat later ones, mainly of French extraction, talk about “collective mentality”, ascribing to it specific and significant causal powers. A later descendent of this notion is the idea of a “national character” peculiar to each nation, which partly survives today under the guise of national “forms of life” and of feeling (Margalit 1997, see below). For almost a century, up to the end of the Second World War, it was customary to link nationalist views to organic metaphors of society. Isaiah Berlin, writing as late as the early seventies, proposed as a part of his definition of nationalism that it consists of the conviction that people belong to a particular human group, and that “…the characters of the individuals who compose the group are shaped by, and cannot be understood apart from, those of the group …” (first published in 1972, reprinted in Berlin, 1979: 341). The nationalist claims, according to Berlin, that “the pattern of life in a society is similar to that of a biological organism” (ibid.), and that the needs of this ‘organism’ determine the supreme goal for all of its members. Most contemporary defenders of nationalism, especially philosophers, avoid such language. The organic metaphor and talk about character have been replaced by one master metaphor: that of national identity. It is centered upon cultural membership, and used both for the identity of a group and for the socially based identity of its members, e.g., the national identity of George in so far as he is English or British. Various authors unpack the metaphor in various ways: some stress involuntary membership in the community, others the strength with which one identifies with the community, and yet others link it to the personal identity of each member of the community. Addressing these issues, the nationally-minded philosophers, such as Alisdair MacIntyre (1994), Charles Taylor (1989), and M. Seymour, have significantly contributed to introducing and maintaining important topics such as community, membership, tradition and social identity into contemporary philosophical debate.
Let us now turn to the issue of the origin and “authenticity” of ethno-cultural groups or ethno-nations. In social and political science one usually distinguishes two kinds of views. The first can be called “primordialist” views. According to them, actual ethno-cultural nations have either existed “since time immemorial” (an extreme, somewhat caricatured version, corresponding to nineteenth century nationalist rhetoric), or at least for a long time during the pre-modern period (Hastings 1997, see the discussion of his views in Nations and Nationalism, Volume 9, 2003). There is a very popular moderate version of this view championed by Anthony Smith (1991, 2001 and in the most recent version in 2008) under the name “ethnosymbolism.” For a fine development of this line see also the works of John Hutchinson, (most recently his 2005 book), and that of Roshwald (2006), debated in Nations and Nationalism 2008, Volumes 1 and 4 respectively). According to this approach, nations are like artichokes, in that they have a lot of “unimportant leaves” that can be chewed up one by one, but also have a heart, which remains after the leaves have been eaten (the metaphor stems from Stanley Hoffmann; for details and sources see the debate between Smith (2003) and Özkirimli (2003). For interesting historical details see a recent collection by Derks & Roymans 2009). The second are the modernist views, placing the origin of nations in modern times. They can be further classified according to their answer to a further question: how real is the ethno-cultural nation? The modernist realist view is that nations are real but distinctly modern creations, instrumental in the genesis of capitalism (Gellner 1983, Hobsbawn 1990, and Breuilly 2001). On the same side of the fence but more in a radical direction one finds anti-realist views. According to one such view nations are merely “imagined” but somehow still powerful entities; what is meant is that belief in them holds sway over the believers (Anderson 1965). The extreme anti-realist view claims that they are pure “constructions” (see Walker 2001, for an overview and literature) These divergent views seem to support rather divergent moral claims about nation. For an overview of nationalism in political theory see Vincent 2001.
Indeed, older authors — from great thinkers like Herder and Otto Bauer, to the propagandists who followed their footsteps — have been at great pains to ground normative claims upon firm ontological realism about nations: nations are real, bona fide entities. However, the contemporary moral debate has tried to diminish the importance of the imagined/real divide. Prominent contemporary philosophers have claimed that normative-evaluative nationalist claims are compatible with the “imagined” nature of a nation. (See, for instance, MacCormick 1982; Miller 1992, 2000; Tamir 1993; and Gans 2003.) They point out that common imaginings can tie people together, and that actual interaction resulting from togetherness can engender important moral obligations.
Let us now turn to question (1c), the nature of pro-national attitudes. The explanatory issue that has interested political and social scientists concerns ethno-nationalist sentiment, the paradigm case of a pro-national attitude. Is it as irrational, romantic and indifferent to self-interest as it might seem on the surface? The issue has divided authors who see nationalism as basically irrational and those who try to explain it as being at least in some sense rational. Authors in the first camp, who see it as irrational, propose various explanations of why people assent to irrational views. Some say, critically, that nationalism is based on “false consciousness”. But where does such false consciousness come from? The most simplistic view is that it is a result of direct manipulation of “masses” by “elites”. On the opposite side, the famous critic of nationalism, Elie Kedourie (1960) sees this irrationality as being spontaneous. Liah Greenfeld has recently gone as far as linking nationalism to mental illness in her provocative (2005) article. On the opposite side, Michael Walzer has offered a sympathetic account of nationalist passion in his (2002). Authors relying upon the Marxist tradition offer various deeper explanations. To mention one, the French structuralist Étienne Balibar sees it as a result of “production” of ideology effectuated by mechanisms which have nothing to do with spontaneous credulity of individuals, but with impersonal, structural social factors (Balibar and Wallerstein, 1992). (For an overview of Marxist approaches see Glenn 1997). Consider now the other camp, those who see nationalist sentiments as being rational, at least in a very wide sense. Some authors claim that it is often rational for individuals to become nationalists (Hardin 1985). Consider the two sides of the nationalist coin. First, identification and cohesion within the ethno-national group has to do with inter-group cooperation, and cooperation is easier for those who are part of the same ethno-national group. To take an example of ethnic ties in a multiethnic state, a Vietnamese newcomer to the States will do well to rely on his co-nationals: common language, customs and expectations might help him a lot in finding his way in new surroundings. Once the ties are established and he has become part of a network, it is rational to go on cooperating, and ethnic sentiment does secure the trust and the firm bond needed for smooth cooperation. A further issue is when it is rational to switch sides; to stay with our example, when does it become profitable for our Vietnamese to develop an all-American patriotism. This has received a detailed elaboration in David Laitin (1998, summarized in 2001; applied to language rights in Laitin and Reich 2004; see also Laitin 2007), who uses material from the former Soviet Union. The other side of the nationalist coin has to do with conflict between various ethno-nations. It concerns non-cooperation with the outsiders, which can go very far indeed. Can one rationally explain the extremes of ethno-national conflict? Authors like Russell Hardin propose to do it in terms of a general view of when hostile behavior is rational: most typically, if you have no reason to trust someone, it is reasonable to take precautions against him. If both sides take precautions, however, each will tend to see the other as being seriously inimical. It then becomes rational to start treating the other as an enemy. Mere suspicion can thus lead by small, individually rational steps, to a situation of conflict. (Such negative development is often presented as a variant of the so-called Prisoner's Dilemma.) Now, it is relatively easy to spot the circumstances in which this general pattern applies to national solidarities and conflicts. The line of thought just sketched is often called the “rational choice approach”. It has enabled the application of conceptual tools from game-theoretic and economic theories of cooperative and non-cooperative behavior to the explanation of ethno-nationalism.
It is worth mentioning, however, that the individualist rational-choice approach, centered upon personal rationality, has serious competitors. A tradition in social psychology, initiated by Henri Tajfel (1981), shows that individuals may identify with a randomly selected group, even when membership in the group brings no tangible rewards. Does rationality of any kind underlie this tendency to identification? Some authors (Sober & Wilson 1998) answer in the affirmative. They propose that it is a non-personal, evolutionary rationality: individuals who develop a sentiment of identification and sense of belonging end up better off in the evolutionary race; hence we have inherited such propensities. The initial sentiments were reserved for one's own kin, thus supporting the spreading of one's own genes. Cultural evolution has taken over the mechanisms of identification that initially developed within biological evolution. As a result, we project the sentiment originally reserved for kinship to our cultural group. Further, detailed explanations from such socio-biological perspective differ greatly among themselves, and constitute a wide and rather promising research program (see an overview in Goetze 2001).
Finally, as for question (1d), the nation is typically seen as essentially a non-voluntary community to which one belongs by birth and early nurture, whereby the belonging is somehow enhanced and perhaps taken to a higher level, becoming more conscious and more complete by one's additional endorsement. Avishai Margalit and Joseph Raz express the common view when they write about belonging to a nation: “Qualification for membership is usually determined by non-voluntary criteria. One cannot choose to belong. One belongs because of who one is” (Margalit and Raz, 1990, 447). And of course, this belonging brings crucial benefits: “Belonging to a national form of life means being within a frame that offers meaning to people's choice between alternatives, thus enabling them to acquire an identity” (Margalit 1997, 83). Why is national belonging taken to be involuntary? Very often it is described starting from linguistic belonging: a child does not decide which language will become her or his mother tongue, and it is the often pointed out that one's mother tongue is the most important depository of concepts, knowledge, social and cultural significance. All these are embedded in the language, and do not exist without it. Early socialization is seen as socialization into a specific culture, and very often the culture is just assumed to be a national one. There are people who express themselves ‘Frenchly’, while others have forms of life that are expressed ‘Koreanly’ or ‘Icelandicly’ , writes Margalit (1997, 80). The resulting belonging is then to a large extent non-voluntary. (There are exceptions to this basically non-voluntaristic view, for instance, theoretical nationalists who accept voluntary changes of nationality. (See also Ernst Renan's 1882 (19) famous definition of a nation as constituted by ‘everyday plebiscite’.)
We have pointed out at the very beginning of the entry that nationalism focuses upon (1) the attitude that the members of a nation have when they care about their national identity, and (2) the actions that the members of a nation take when seeking to achieve (or sustain) some form of political sovereignty. The politically central point is (2), the actions enjoined by the nationalist. To these we now turn, beginning with sovereignty and territory, the usual foci of a national struggle for independence. They raise an important issue:
(2a) Does political sovereignty within or over a territory require statehood or something weaker?
The classical answer is that a state is required. A more liberal answer is that some form of political autonomy suffices. Once this has been discussed, we can turn to the related normative issues:
(2b) What actions are morally permitted to achieve sovereignty and to maintain it? (2c) Under what conditions is it morally permitted to take actions of this kind?
Consider first the classical nationalist answer to (2a). Political sovereignty requires a state “rightfully owned” by the ethno-nation (Oldenquist 1997, who credits the expression to the writer Czeslaw Milosz). In developing this line of thought they often state or imply specific answers to (2b), and (2c), i.e., that in a national independence struggle the use of force against the threatening central power is almost always a legitimate means for bringing about sovereignty. However, classical nationalism is not only concerned with creation of a state but also with its maintenance and strengthening. So, once the state is there, further options are opened for nationalists. They sometimes promote claims for its expansion (even at the cost of wars) and sometimes opt for isolationist policies. The expansion is often justified by appeal to the unfinished business of bringing literally all members of the nation under one state, sometimes by the interest of the nation in gaining more territory and resources. As for maintenance of sovereignty by peaceful and merely ideological means, political nationalism is closely tied to nationalism in culture. The latter insists upon the preservation and transmission of a given culture, or more accurately, of recognizably ethno-national traits of the culture in its pure form, dedicating artistic creation, education and research to this goal. Of course, the ethno-national traits can be actual or invented, partly or fully so. Again, in the classical variant the relevant norm claims that one has both a right and an obligation (“a sacred duty”) to promote such a tradition. Its force is that of a trump that wins over other interests and even over rights (a trump which is often needed in order to carry on national the independence struggle). In consequence, classical nationalism has something to say about the level of attitudes as well: as for (1e) it sees caring for one's nation a fundamental duty of each of its members, and is prone to give to it, in its answer to (1f), i.e. the question of scope, an unlimited scope. Let me list its most important features for future reference:
Classical nationalism is the political program that sees the creation and maintenance of a fully sovereign state owned by a given ethno-national group (“people” or “nation”) as a primary duty of each member of the group. Starting from the assumption that the appropriate (or “natural”) unit of culture is an ethno-nation it claims that a primary duty of each member is to abide in cultural matters by one's recognizably ethno-national culture.
Classical nationalists are usually vigilant about the kind of culture they protect and promote, and about the kind of attitude people have to their nation-state. This watchful attitude carries some potential dangers: many elements of a given culture that are universalist or simply not recognizably national might, and will sometimes, fall prey to such nationalist enthusiasms. Classical nationalism in everyday life puts various additional demands on individuals, from buying more expensive home-produced goods in preference to the cheaper imported ones, to procreating as many future members of the nation as one can manage. (See Yuval-Davies 1997.)
Besides classical nationalism (and its more radical extremist cousins), various moderate views are also nowadays classified as nationalist. Indeed, the philosophical discussion has shifted to these moderate or even ultra-moderate forms, and most philosophers who describe themselves as nationalists propose very moderate nationalist programs. Let me characterize these briefly:
Nationalism in a wider sense is any complex of attitudes, claims and directives for action ascribing a fundamental political, moral and cultural value to nation and nationality and deriving obligations (for individual members of the nation, and for any involved third parties, individual or collective) from this ascribed value.
Nationalisms, in this larger sense, can vary somewhat in their conceptions of nation (which are often left implicit in their discourse), with respect to the ground and degree of its value, and in the scope of claims and of prescribed obligations. (The term can also be applied to other cases not covered by classical nationalism, for instance, the hypothetical pre-state political forms that an ethnic identity might take). Moderate nationalism is a universalizing nationalism in the wider sense which is less demanding than classical nationalism. It sometimes goes under the name of “patriotism.” (A different usage, again, reserves “patriotism” for valuing of civic community and loyalty to state, in contrast to nationalism, centered around ethnic-cultural communities). The variations of nationalism most relevant for philosophy are those that influence the moral standing of claims and of recommended nationalist practices. The elaborate philosophical views put forward in favor of nationalism will be referred to here to as “theoretical nationalism”, the adjective serving to distinguish such views from the less sophisticated and more practical nationalist discourse. The central theoretical nationalist evaluative claims can usefully be put on the map of possible positions within political theory in the following somewhat simplified and schematic way.
Nationalist claims featuring the centrality of the nation for political action provide an answer to two crucial general questions. First, is there one kind of large social group (smaller than the whole of mankind) that is morally of central importance or not? The nationalist answer is that there is just one, namely, the nation. When an ultimate choice is to be made, nation has priority. (This answer is implied by rather standard definitions of nationalism offered by Berlin, discussed in Section 1., and Smith in his 2001.) Second, what is the ground of obligation that the individual has to the morally central group? Is it voluntary or involuntary membership in the group? The typical contemporary nationalist thinker opts for the latter, while admitting that voluntary endorsement of one's national identity is a morally important achievement. On the philosophical map, the pro-nationalist normative tastes fit nicely with the communitarian stance in general: most pro-nationalist philosophers are communitarians who choose the nation as the preferred community (in contrast to those of their fellow-communitarians who prefer more far-ranging communities, such as those defined by global religious traditions). However, some recent writers, e.g., Will Kymlicka (2001), who describe themselves as liberal nationalists, reject the communitarian underpinning.
Before proceeding to moral claims, let me briefly sketch the issues and viewpoints, connected to territory and territorial rights, essential for nationalist political programs. (I am adapting the excellent taxonomy of A. Kollers (2009, Ch. 1) to the topic at hand.) Why is territory important for ethno-national groups, and what is the extent, and what the grounds, of territorial rights? The primary importance resides in sovereignty, and all the possibilities of internal control and external exclusion that it brings in its wake. Add to it the Rousseauian view that political attachments are essentially bounded and that love for one group—or, to put it more mildly, republican civil friendship—requires exclusion of some “other”, and the importance becomes quite obvious. What about the grounds of territorial rights demanded? Nationalist and pro-nationalist views mostly revert to the attachment that members of a nation have to its territory and to the formative value of territory for a nation as justifiers for territorial claims (Miller 2000, Meissels 2009 (with some refinements discussed below)). This is in some respects similar to the rationale of proponents of indigenous peoples rights (Tully 2004, but see also Hendrix 2008), and in some respect Kollers's (2009) ethno-geographical non-nationalist theory), but differs in preferring ethno-national groups as the sole carriers of the right. These attachment views stand in stark contrast to more pragmatic views about territorial rights as means for conflict resolution (e.g. Levy 2000). A further, and quite popular alternative is the family of individualistic views grounding territorial rights in rights of interests of individuals, for instance in their human rights (Buchanan 2004), pre-political Lockean property rights (Simmons 2001), their individual rights in resources Steiner 1999) or in political association rights (Wellman 2005). On the extreme end of anti-nationalist views stands the idea of Pogge (if he can be interpreted this way) that there are no specific territorial problems for political philosophy—the “dissolution approach”, as Koller calls it. Some of the authors mentioned are cosmopolitan critics of nationalism, most prominently Buchanan and Pogge.
We now pass to the normative dimension of nationalism. We shall first describe the very heart of the nationalist program, i.e., sketch and classify the typical normative and evaluative nationalist claims. These claims can be seen as answers to the normative subset of our initial questions about (1) pro-national attitudes and (2) actions.
The claims thus recommend various courses of action, centrally those meant to secure and sustain the political organization — preferably a state — for the given ethno-cultural national community (thereby making more specific the answers to our normative questions (1e), (1f), (2b), and (2c)). Further, they enjoin the members of the community to promulgate recognizable ethno-cultural contents as central features of the cultural life within such a state. Finally, we shall discuss various lines of pro-nationalist thought that have been put forward in defense of these claims. For starters, let us return to the claims concerning the furthering of the national state and culture. These are proposed by the nationalist as a guide and a norm of conduct. Philosophically the most important variations concern three aspects of such normative claims:
(i) The normative nature and strength of the claim: does it promote merely a right (say, to have and maintain a form of political self-government, preferably and typically a state, or have cultural life centered upon a recognizably ethno-national culture), or a moral obligation (to get and maintain one), or a moral, legal and political obligation? The strongest claim is typical of classical nationalism: its typical norms are both moral and, once the nation-state is in place, legally enforceable obligations in regard to all parties concerned, including the individual members of the ethno-nation. A weaker, but still quite demanding version speaks only of moral obligation (“sacred duty”). A more liberal version is satisfied with a claim-right to having a state that would be “rightfully owned” by the ethno-nation.
(ii) The strength of the nationalist claim in relation to various external interests and rights: to give a real example, is the use of the domestic language so important that even international conferences should be held in it, at the cost of losing the most interesting participants from abroad? The force of the nationalist claim is here being weighed against the force of other claims, those of individual or group interests, or rights. Variations in comparative strength of the claims take place on a continuum between two extremes. At one rather unpalatable extreme the nation-focused claims are seen as trumps that take precedence over any other claims, even over human rights. Further towards the center is the classical nationalism that gives nation-centered claims precedence over individual interest and many needs (including pragmatic collective utility), but not necessarily over general human rights. (See, for example, McIntyre 1994, Oldenquist 1997.) On the opposite end, which is mild, humane and liberal, the central nationalist claims are accorded prima facie status only (see Tamir 1993, Gans 2003).
(iii) For which groups are the nationalist claims meant to be valid? What is their scope? First, they can be valid for every ethno-nation and thereby universal. An example would be the claim “every ethno-nation should have its own state”. To put it more officially
Universalizing nationalism is the political program that claims that every ethno-nation should have its state which it should rightfully own, and whose interests it should promote.
Alternatively, a claim may be particularistic, such as the claim “Group X ought to have a state”, where this implies nothing about any other group:
Particularistic nationalism is the political program claiming that some ethno-nation should have its state, without extending the claim to all ethno-nations. It does it either
- by omission (unreflective particularistic nationalism), or
- by explicitly specifying who is excluded: “Group X ought to have a state, but group Y should not”. (invidious nationalism).
The most difficult and indeed chauvinistic sub-case of particularism, i.e. (B), has been called “invidious” since it explicitly denies the privilege of having a state to some peoples. T. Pogge (1997) proposes a further division of (B) into the “high” stance, which denies it to some types of groups, and the “low” one which denies it to some particular groups. Serious theoretical nationalists usually defend only the universalist variety, whereas the nationalist-in-the-street most often defends the egoistic indeterminate one (“Some nations should have a state, above all mine!”). Classical nationalism comes in both particularistic and universalistic varieties.
Although the three dimensions of variation — internal strength, comparative strength, and scope — are logically independent, they are psychologically and politically intertwined. People who are radical in one respect on the nationality issue tend also to be radical in other respects. In other words, attitudes tend to cluster together in stable clusters, so that extreme (or moderate) attitudes on one dimension psychologically and politically belong with extreme (or moderate) ones on others. The hybrids of extreme attitude on one dimension with moderate on the others are psychologically and socially unstable.
The nationalist picture of morality has been traditionally quite close to the dominant view in theory of international relations, called “realism”. To put the point of classical realism starkly, morality ends at the boundaries of the nation-state; beyond the boundaries there is nothing but anarchy. The view is explicit in Friederich Meinecke (1965, Introduction) and Raymond Aron (1962), and very close to the surface in Hans Morgenthau (1946); for interesting links with contemporary nationalisms, see the paper by Michael C. Williams (2007) and the book edited by Duncan Bell (2008). It nicely complements the main classical nationalist claim about nation-state, i.e. that each ethno-nation or people should have a state of its own and suggests what happens next: nation-states enter in competition in the name of their constitutive peoples.
Let us return to our initial normative question, centered around (1) attitudes and (2) actions. Is national partiality justified and to what extent? What actions are appropriate to bringing sovereignty about? In particular, are ethno-national states and institutionally protected (ethno-)national cultures goods independent from the individual will of the members, and how far may one go in protecting them? The philosophical debate for and against nationalism is a debate about the moral validity of its central claims. In particular the ultimate moral issue is the following: is any form of nationalism morally permissible or justified, and, if not, how bad are particular forms of it? (For a recent debate on partiality in general, see Chatterjee and Smith 2003.)
Why do nationalist claims require a defense? In some situations they seem plausible: for instance the plight of some stateless national groups — the history of Jews and Armenians, the misfortunes of Kurds — makes one spontaneously endorse the idea that having their own state would have solved the worst problems. Still, there are good reasons to examine the nationalist claims more carefully. The most general reason is that it should first be shown that the political form of nation state has some value as such, that a national community has a particular, or even central, moral and political value, and that claims in its favor have normative validity. Once this is established, a further defense is needed. Some classical nationalist claims appear to clash — at least under normal circumstances of contemporary life — with various values that people tend to accept. Some of these values are considered essential to liberal-democratic societies, while others are important specifically for the flourishing of culture and creativity. The main values in the first set are individual autonomy and benevolent impartiality (most prominently towards members of groups culturally different from one's own). The alleged special duties towards one's ethno-national culture can interfere, and often do interfere, with individuals' right to autonomy. Also, if these duties are construed very strictly they can interfere with other individual rights, e.g., the right to privacy. Many feminist authors have noted that a suggestion typically offered by the nationalist, namely that women have a moral obligation to give birth to new members of the nation and to nurture them for the sake of the nation, clashes with both the autonomy and the privacy of these women (Yuval-Davis 1997, Moller-Okin 1999, 2002 and 2005). Another endangered value is diversity within the ethno-national community, which can also be thwarted by the homogeneity of a central national culture.
The nation-oriented duties also interfere with the value of unconstrained creativity, e.g., telling writers or musicians or philosophers that they have a special duty to promote national heritage does interfere with the freedom of creation. The question here is not whether these individuals have the right to promote their national heritage, but whether they have a duty to do so.
In between these two sets of endangered values, the autonomy-centered and creativity-centered ones, are the values that seem to arise from ordinary needs of people living under ordinary circumstances (Barry 2001). In many modern states, citizens of different ethnic background live together, and very often value this kind of life. This very fact of cohabitation seems to be a good that should be upheld. Nationalism does not tend to foster this kind of multiculturalism and pluralism, judging from both theory (especially the classical nationalist one) and experience. But the problems get worse. In practice, a widespread variant of nationalism is the invidious particularistic form claiming rights for one's own people and denying them to others, for reasons that seem to be far from accidental. The source of the problem is the competition for scarce resources: as Ernst Gellner (1983) has famously pointed out, there is too little territory for all candidate ethnic groups to have a state and the same goes for other goods demanded by nationalists for the exclusive use of their co-nationals. According to some authors (McCabe 1997) the invidious variant is more coherent than any other form of nationalism: if one values one's own ethnic group highly the simplest way is to value it tout court. If one definitely prefers one's own culture in all respects to any foreign one, it is a waste of time and attention to bother about others. The universalist, non-invidious variant introduces enormous psychological and political complications. These arise from a tension between spontaneous attachment to one's own community and the demand to regard all communities with an equal eye. This tension might make the humane, non-invidious position psychologically unstable, and difficult to uphold in situations of conflict and crisis. This psychological weakness renders it politically less efficient.
The philosophical authors sympathetic to nationalism are aware of the evils that historical nationalism has produced, and usually distance themselves from these. They usually speak of “various accretions that have given nationalism a bad name,” and they are eager to “separate the idea of nationality itself from these excesses” (Miller 1992, 87 and Miller, 2000). Such thoughtful pro-nationalist writers have participated in an ongoing philosophical dialogue between the proponents and the opponents of the claim (see the anthologies McKim & McMahan 1997, Couture, Nielsen, & Seymour 1998, Miscevic 2000 and Primoratz and Pavkovic 2007). In order to help the reader find his or her way through the involved debate, we shall briefly summarize the considerations which are open to the ethno-nationalist to defend his or her case. (Compare the useful overview in Lichtenberg 1997.) The considerations and lines of thought built upon them can be used to defend very different varieties of nationalism, from radical to very moderate ones.
It is important to offer a warning concerning the key assumptions and premises which figure within each of the lines of thought summarized below, namely, that the assumptions often live an independent life in the philosophical literature. Some of them figure in the proposed defenses of various traditional views which have little to do with the concept of a nation in particular.
For brevity, I shall reduce each line of thought to a brief argument; the actual debate is, however, more involved than one can represent in a sketch. I shall indicate, in brackets, some prominent lines of criticism that have been put forward in the debate. (These are discussed in greater detail in Miscevic 2001.) The main arguments in favor of nationalism, which purport to establish its fundamental claims about state and culture, will be divided into two sets. The first set of arguments defends the claim that national communities have a high value, often seen as non-instrumental and independent of the wishes and choices of their individual members, and argues that they should therefore be protected by means of state and official statist policies. The second set is less deeply ‘philosophical’ (or ‘comprehensive’), and encompasses arguments from the requirements of justice, rather independent from substantial assumptions about culture and cultural values.
The first set will be presented here in more detail, since it has formed the center of the debate. It depicts the community as the deep source of value or as the unique transmission device that connects the members to some important values. In this sense, the arguments from this set are communitarian in a particularly “deep” sense, since they are grounded in basic features of the human condition. Here is a characterization.
The deep communitarian perspective is a theoretical perspective on political issues (in the case under consideration on nationalism) that justifies a given political arrangement (here, a nation-state) by appeal to deep philosophical assumptions about human nature, language, community ties and identity (in a deeper, philosophical sense).
The general form of deep communitarian arguments is the following. First, the communitarian premise: there is some uncontroversial good (e.g. a person's identity), and some kind of community is essential for acquisition and preservation of it. Then comes the claim that the ethno-cultural nation is the kind of community ideally suited for this task. Unfortunately, this crucial claim is rarely defended in detail in the literature. But here is a sample from Margalit, whose last sentence has been already quoted above:
The idea is that people make use of different styles to express their humanity. The styles are generally determined by the communities to which they belong. There are people who express themselves ‘Frenchly’, while others have forms of life that are expressed ‘Koreanly’ or … ‘Icelandicly’. (1997, 80)
Then follows the statist conclusion: in order that such a community should preserve its own identity and support the identity of its members, it has to assume (always or at least normally) the political form of a state. The conclusion of this type of argument is that the ethno-national community has the right, in respect to any third party and to its own members, to have an ethno-national state, and the citizens of the state have the right and obligation to favor their own ethnic culture in relation to any other.
Although the deeper philosophical assumptions in the arguments stem from the communitarian tradition, weakened forms have also been proposed by more liberally minded philosophers. The original communitarian lines of thought in favor of nationalism suggest that there is some value in preserving ethno-national cultural traditions, in feelings of belonging to a common nation and in solidarity between a nation's members. A liberal nationalist might accept that these may not be the central values of political life, but claim that they are values nevertheless. Moreover, the diametrically opposite views, pure individualism and cosmopolitanism, do seem arid and abstract, and seem unmotivated by comparison. By cosmopolitanism I shall understand a moral and political doctrine of the following sort:
Cosmopolitanism is the view that
- one's primary moral obligations are directed to all human beings (regardless of geographical or cultural distance), and
- political arrangements should faithfully reflect this universal moral obligation (in the form of supra-statist arrangements that take precedence over nation-states).
The critics of cosmopolitanism sometimes argue that these two claims are incoherent since human beings generally strive best under some global institutional arrangement (like ours) that concentrates power and authority at the level of states.
Confronted with opposing forces of nationalism and cosmopolitanism, many philosophers opt for a mixture of liberalism-cosmopolitanism and patriotism-nationalism. In his writings B. Barber glorifies “a remarkable mixture of cosmopolitanism and parochialism” which, in his view characterizes American national identity (in Cohen 1996, 31). Charles Taylor claims that “we have no choice but to be cosmopolitan and patriots” (ibid, 121). Hilary Putnam proposes loyalty to what is best in the multiple traditions that each of us participates in; apparently a middle way between a narrow-minded patriotism and a too abstract cosmopolitanism (ibid, 114). The compromise has been foreshadowed by Berlin (1979), and Taylor (1989, 1993), and its various versions worked out in considerable detail by authors such as Yael Tamir (1993), David Miller (1995, 2000), Kai Nielsen (1998), Michel Seymour (2000) and Chaim Gans (2003). In recent years it has occupied the center stage of the debate, and even provoked re-readings of historical nationalism in its light, for instance in Miller (2005), Sung Ho Kim (2002) or Brian Vick (2007). Most liberal nationalist authors accept various weakened versions of the arguments we list below, taking them to support moderate or ultra-moderate nationalist claims.
Here are the main weakenings of classical ethno-nationalism that the liberal, limited-liberal and cosmopolitan nationalists propose. First, ethno-national claims have only prima facie strength, and cannot trump individual rights. Second, legitimate ethno-national claims do not in themselves and automatically amount to the right to a state, but rather to the right to a certain level of cultural autonomy. The main models of autonomy are the territorial and the non-territorial one: the first involves territorial devolution, the second cultural autonomy granted to individuals regardless of their domicile within the state (for a very stimulating discussion of comparative advantages and disadvantages of each see the papers by Reiner Bauböck and Will Kymlicka in Dieckoff (2004); the former defends the non-territorial, and the latter the territorial option). Third, ethno-nationalism is subordinate to civic patriotism, and this has little or nothing to do with ethnic criteria. Fourth, ethno-national mythologies and similar “important falsehoods” are to be tolerated only if benign and inoffensive, in which case they are morally permissible in spite of their falsity. Finally, any legitimacy that ethno-national claims may have is to be derived from the choices the concerned individuals should be free to make.
Consider now the particular arguments from the first set. The first argument depends on assumptions that also appear in the subsequent ones, but it ascribes to the community an intrinsic value, while the following ones point more towards an instrumental value of nation derived from the value of individual flourishing, moral understanding, firm identity and the like.
(1) The Argument From Intrinsic Value. Each ethno-national community is valuable in and of itself since it is only within the natural encompassing framework of various cultural traditions that important meanings and values are produced and transmitted. The members of such communities share a special cultural proximity to each other. By speaking the same language and sharing customs and traditions, the members of these communities are typically closer to one another in various ways than they are to those who don't share the culture. The community thereby becomes a network of morally connected agents, i.e., a moral community, with special, very strong ties of obligation. A prominent obligation of each individual concerns the underlying traits of the ethnic community, above all language and customs: they ought to be cherished, protected, preserved and reinforced. The general assumption that moral obligations increase with cultural proximity is often criticized as problematic. Moreover, even if we grant this general assumption in theory, it breaks down in practice. Nationalist activism is most often turned against close (and substantially similar) neighbors rather than against distant strangers, so that in many important contexts the appeal to proximity will not work. It might however retain its potential force against culturally distant groups.
(2) The Argument from Flourishing. The ethno-national community is essential for each of its members to flourish. In particular, it is only within such a community that an individual can acquire concepts and values crucial for understanding the community's cultural life in general and the individual's own life in particular. There has been much debate on the pro-nationalist side about whether divergence of values is essential for separateness of national groups. The Canadian liberal nationalists, Seymour (1999), Taylor, and Kymlicka, pointed out that the ‘divergences of value between different regions of Canada’ that aspire to separate nationhood are ‘minimal’. Taylor (1993, 155) concluded that it is not separateness of value that matters. This result is still compatible with the argument from flourishing, if ‘concepts and values’ are not taken to be specifically national, as communitarian nationalists (MacIntyre 1994, Margalit 1997) have claimed.
(3) The Argument from Identity. Communitarian philosophers emphasize nurture over nature as the principal force determining our identity as persons — we come to be the persons we are because of the social settings and contexts in which we mature. The claim certainly has some plausibility. The very identity of each person depends upon his/her participation in communal life (see MacIntyre 1994, Nielsen, 1998, and Lagerspetz 2000). For example, Nielsen writes:
We are, to put it crudely, lost if we cannot identify ourselves with some part of an objective social reality: a nation, though not necessarily a state, with its distinctive traditions. What we find in people — and as deeply embedded as the need to develop their talents — is the need not only to be able to say what they can do but to say who they are. This is found, not created, and is found in the identification with others in a shared culture based on nationality or race or religion or some slice or amalgam thereof…. Under modern conditions, this securing and nourishing of a national consciousness can only be achieved with a nation-state that corresponds to that national consciousness (1993, 32).
Given that an individual's morality depends upon their having a mature and stable personal identity, the communal conditions which foster the development of such personal identity have to be preserved and encouraged. The philosophical nationalists claim that the national format is the right format for preserving and encouraging such identity-providing communities. Therefore, communal life should be organized around particular national cultures. The classical nationalist proposes that cultures should be given their states, while the liberal nationalist proposes that cultures should get at least some form of political protection. (For a discussion of linguistic issues, often tied to identity, see Kymlicka and Patten 2003 and Patten 2003.)
(4) The Argument from Moral Understanding. A particularly important variety of value is moral value. Some values are universal, e.g. freedom and equality, but these are too abstract and “thin”. The rich, “thick” moral values are discernible only within particular traditions, to those who have wholeheartedly endorsed the norms and standards of the given tradition. As Charles Taylor puts it, “the language we have come to accept articulates the issues of the good for us” (1989, 35). The nation offers a natural framework for moral traditions, and thereby for moral understanding; it is the primary school of morals. (I note in fairness that Taylor himself is ambivalent about the national format of morality.) An often-noticed problem with this line of thought is that particular nations do not each have a special morality of their own. Also, the detailed, “thick” morality may vary more across other divisions, such as class or gender divisions, than across ethno-national groups. (For a sophisticated and intriguing recent discussion of some surprising consequences of the claim that there are “national values” and of what happens when classical liberal values are counted as “national values” see Laegard (2007).)
(5) The Argument from Diversity. Each national culture contributes in a unique way to the diversity of human cultures. The most famous twentieth century proponent of the idea, Isaiah Berlin (interpreting Herder, who first saw this idea as significant) writes:
The ‘physiognomies’ of cultures are unique: each presents a wonderful exfoliation of human potentialities in its own time and place and environment. We are forbidden to make judgments of comparative value, for that is measuring the incommensurable. (1976, 206)
The carrier of basic value is thus the totality of cultures, from which each national culture and style of life that contributes to the totality derives its own value. The argument from diversity is therefore pluralistic: it ascribes value to each particular culture from the viewpoint of the totality of cultures available. Assuming that the (ethno-)nation is the natural unit of culture, the preservation of cultural diversity amounts to institutionally protecting the purity of (ethno-)national culture. The plurality of styles can be preserved and enhanced by tying the styles to ethno-national “forms of life”. A pragmatic inconsistency might threaten this argument. The issue is who can legitimately propose ethno-national diversity as ideal: the nationalist is much too tied to his or her own culture to do it, while the cosmopolitan is too eager to preserve intercultural links that go beyond the idea of having a single nation-state. Moreover, is diversity a value such that it deserves to be protected whenever it exists? Should the protection of diversity be restricted to certain aspects of culture(s) of proposed in full generality? (For a more restricted moderate version of the argument from diversity, appealing to the analogy with bio-diversity, but focusing exclusively upon linguistic diversity see François Grin in Kymlicka and Patten (2003)).
The line of thought (1) is not individualistic. And (5) can be presented without reference to individuals: Diversity may be good in its own right, or may be good for nations. But other lines of thought in the set just presented are all linked to the importance of community life in relation to the individual. They emerged from the perspective of “deep” communitarian thought, and a recurrent theme is the importance of the fact that membership in the community is not chosen but rather involuntary. In each argument, there is a general communitarian premise (a community, to which one has no choice whether or not to belong, is crucial for one's identity, or for flourishing or for some other important good). This premise is coupled with the more narrow nation-centered descriptive claim that the ethno-nation is precisely the kind of community ideally suited for the task. However, liberal nationalists do not find these arguments completely persuasive. In their view, the premises of the arguments may not support the full package of nationalist ambitions, and may not be unconditionally valid. Still, there is a lot to these arguments, and they might support liberal nationalism and a more modest stance in favor of national cultures.
The arguments in the second set concern political justice and do not rely on metaphysical claims about identity, flourishing and cultural values. They appeal to (actual or alleged) circumstances which would make nationalist policies reasonable (or permissible or even mandatory), such as (a) the fact that a large part of the world is organized into nation states (so that each new group aspiring to create a nation-state just follows an established pattern), or (b) the circumstances of group self-defense or of redress of past injustice that might justify nationalist policies (to take a special case). Some of the arguments also present nationhood as conducive to important political goods, such as equality.
(1) The Argument From the Right to Collective Self-determination. A group of people of a sufficient size has a prima facie right to govern itself and decide its future membership, if the members of the group so wish. It is fundamentally the democratic will of the members themselves that grounds the right to an ethno-national state and to ethno-centric cultural institutions and practices. This argument presents the justification of (ethno-)national claims as deriving from the will of the members of the nation. It is therefore highly suitable for liberal nationalism but not appealing to a deep communitarian, who sees the demands of the nation as being independent from, and prior to, the choices of particular individuals. (For extended discussion of this argument, see Buchanan 1991, which has become a contemporary classic, Moore 1998, and Gans 2003. For recent exchanges, see J. Levy in Dieckoff 2004, and the volume on secession by Pavković and Radan 2007).
(2) The Argument From the Right to Self-defense and to Redress Past Injustices. Oppression and injustice give the victim group a just cause and the right to secede. If a minority group is oppressed by the majority, so that almost every minority member is worse off than most majority ones, simply in virtue of belonging to the minority, then the nationalist minority claims are morally plausible, and may even be compelling. The argument implies a restrictive answer to our questions (2b) and (2c): the use of force in order to achieve sovereignty is legitimate only in the cases of self-defense and redress. Of course, there is a whole lot of work to be done specifying whom force may legitimately be used against, and how much damage may be done to how many. It establishes a typical remedial right, which is acceptable from a liberal standpoint. (See the discussion in Kukathas and Poole 2000, also Buchanan 1991. For past injustices see Waldron 1992).
(3) The Argument From Equality. Members of minority group are often disadvantaged in relation to a dominant culture because they have to rely on those with the same language and culture to conduct the affairs of daily life. Since freedom to conduct one's daily life is a primary good, and it is difficult to change or give up reliance on one's minority culture to attain that good, this reliance can lead to certain inequalities if special measures are not taken. Spontaneous nation-building by the majority has to be moderated. Therefore, liberal neutrality itself requires that the majority provide certain basic cultural goods, i.e., granting differential rights. (See Kymlicka 1995b, 2001 and 2003.) Institutional protections and the right to the minority group's own institutional structure are remedies that restore equality and turn the resulting nation-state into a more moderate multicultural one. (See Kymlicka 2001, 2003.) (We note an interesting recent proposal by Robert E. Goodin (2006), who distinguishes two motivations for multiculturalism and two possible resultant kinds, polyglot multiculturalism and protective multiculturalism. The latter is of Kymlicka's cast, focused upon protecting the interest of minority from majority; the former is inspired by ideals of diversity and the value of variety, the availabity of which in a given country “expands the choice set of autonomous agents” (2006, 290).)
(4) The Argument From Success. The nation-state has been successful in the past, promoting equality and democracy. As Craig Calhoun writes, in his recent book, “(…) imagining democracy requires thinking of ”the people“ as active and coherent and oneself as both a member and an agent. Liberalism informs the notion of individual agency, but provides weak purchase at best on membership and on the collective cohesion and capacity of the demos. In the modern era, the discursive formation that has most influentially underwritten these dimensions of democracy is nationalism” (2007, 147). Ethno-national solidarity is a powerful motive for a more egalitarian distribution of goods (Miller 1995, Canovan 1996, 2000). The nation-state also seems to be essential to safeguard the moral life of communities in the future since it is the only form of political institution capable of protecting communities from the threats of globalization and assimilationism. (For a detailed critical discussion of this argument see Mason 1999.) Calhoun himself is acutely aware of the limitations of his praise of nationalism, mentioning them literally on the same page as that from which our quotation is taken.
A much more deflating diagnosis of the success has been recently offered by A. Roshwald in his (2006) book, where it is ascribed to paradoxical and contradictory nation of nationalist claims. To quote a fine summary given by A. Smith:
For Roshwald, nationalism is at once ancient and very modern; it employs twin conceptions of time, cyclical and linear; it seeks self-determination while manifesting a sense of victimhood; it insists on the nation's particularity of chosenness while claiming a universal mission; and finally, it reveals a symbiosis of kindred and mingled blood, of ethnic and civic nationhood. Through these antinomies, nationalism is constantly able to renew itself and adapt to different situations …. (Smith 2008b, 638)
An even more problematic kind of appeal to success is the one that a pro-capitalists might derive from the recent theory of Liah Greenfeld, according to which “the factor responsible for the reorientation of economic activity toward growth is nationalism”, and “the unprecedented position of the economic sphere in the modern consciousness is a product of the dynamics of American society, in turn shaped by the singular characteristics of American nationalism” (2001, 1). Greenfeld herself is very critical of nationalism, but someone might contemplate incorporating her theory (cleaned of her critical attitude) into a defense of nationalism.
These political arguments can be combined with deep communitarian ones. However, taken in isolation, they offer the more interesting perspective of a “liberal culturalism” that is more suitable for ethno-culturally plural societies. It is more remote from classical nationalism than the liberal nationalism of Tamir and Nielsen, since it eschews any communitarian philosophical underpinning (see the detailed presentation and defense in Kymlicka 2001, and his recent truly encyclopedic work which still occasionally calls such culturalism ‘nationalist’, and a short summary in Kymlicka 2003, and Gans 2003). The idea of moderate nation-building points to an open multi-culturalism, in which every group receives its share of remedial rights, but instead of walling itself up against others, participates in a common, overlapping civic culture and in open communication with other sub-communities. Given the variety of pluralistic societies, and intense trans-national interactions, such openness seems to many to be the only guarantee of stable social and political life (see the debate in Shapiro and Kymlicka 1997). The openness is important to avoid the trap called by Margaret Canovan “the paradox of the prowling cats” (2001). She warns that “new nationalist theories inadvertently contain perverse incentives to nationalists to do the exact opposite of what the theorist intends to authorize”. The only solution seems to be extreme moderation. The dialectics of moderating nationalist claims in the context of pluralistic societies might thus lead to a stance that is respectful of cultural differences, but liberal and potentially cosmopolitan in its ultimate goals.
The liberal nationalist stance is mild and civil, and there is much to be said in favor of it. It trives to reconcile our intuitions in favor of some sort of political protection of cultural communities, with a liberal political morality. Of course, this raises issues of compatibility between liberal universal principles and the particular attachments to one's ethno-cultural nation. Very liberal nationalists such as Tamir divorce ethno-cultural nationhood from statehood. Also, the kind of love for country they suggest is tempered by all kinds of universalist considerations, which in the last instance trump national interest (Tamir 1993, 115; see also Moore 2001 and Gans 2003). There is an ongoing debate among philosophical nationalists about how much weakening and compromising is still compatible with a stance's being nationalist at all. (For example, Canovan 1996 (ch. 10) presents Tamir as having abandoned the ideal of ‘nation-state’, and thereby nationhood as such; Seymour (1999) criticizes Taylor and Kymlicka for turning their backs on genuine nationalist programs, and proposing multiculturalism instead of nationalism.) There is also a streak of cosmopolitan interest present in the work of some liberal nationalists (Nielsen 1998/9).
In recent years the issues of nationalism have also been increasingly integrated into the debate on international order (see the entries on globalization and cosmopolitanism). The main conceptual link is the claim that nation-states are natural, stable and suitable units of international order. It is underpinned by the assumption that to each nation-state corresponds its “people”, a culturally homogenous population whose members are prone to solidarity with their compatriots. The center stage of the recent debate is John Rawls' view set out in his “Law of Peoples” (1999), which ascribes a great deal of political promise and a high moral value to the international system composed of liberal and decent nation-states. More cosmopolitan critics of Rawls argue against such a high status for nation-states, and the assumption of homogenous “peoples” (Pogge 2001, 2002; O'Neil 2000; Nussbaum 2002 (Other Internet Resources), Barry, 1999). A related debate concerns the role of minorities in the processes of globalization (see Kaldor, 2004). The interest of philosophers in the morality of international order has generated interesting proposals about alternative sub-national and supra-national units, which could play a role besides nation-states, and might even come to supplement them (for a fine summary see Held 2003, for an interesting recent overview of alternatives see Walzer 2004, chapter 12). Moreover, the two approaches might ultimately converge: a multiculturalist liberal nationalism and a moderate, difference-respecting cosmopolitanism have a lot in common. One investigation in this direction has been undertaken by Kok-Chor Tan (2004, see in particular ch. 5).
Let me illustrate the same point by briefly reverting to the recent debates on territory and nation. Liberal nationalists (Miller 2000, 2007; Gans 2003; Meissels 2009) try to preserve the traditional nationalist link between the ethnic “ownership” of the state, sovereignty and territorial control, but in a much more flexible and sophisticated setting. Tamar Meissels thus argues in favor of “taking existing national settlements into account as a central factor in demarcating territorial boundaries” since this line “ has both liberal foundations” (i.e. in the work of John Locke) and liberal-national appeal (2009, 159) on the ground of its affinity with the liberal doctrine of national self-determination. She combines it with Chaim Gans' interpretation of ‘historical right’ claims as ‘the right to formative territories’ (Gans 2003, Ch. 4). She thus combines “historical arguments, understood as claims to formative territories” with her argument from settlement and insists on their interplay and mutual reinforcement presenting them as being “most closely related to, and based on, liberal nationalist assumptions and underlying ideas” (Meissels 2009, 160). However, she stresses that more than one ethnic group can have formative ties to a given territory, and that there might be competing claims based on settlement.
But, given the experiences of the twentieth century ethno-national conflicts, one can safely assume that culturally plural states divided into isolated and closed sub-communities glued together only by arrangements of mere modus vivendi are inherently unstable. Stability might therefore require that the plural society envisioned by liberal culturalists promote quite intense within-state interaction between cultural groups in order to forestall mistrust, reduce prejudice and create a solid basis for cohabitation.
On the opposite end of the spectrum, the more cosmopolitan authors (Buchanan 2003, Waldron 2005 (Other Internet Resources) also point to the fact of multiple settlements in roughly the same territory and the importance of the vicinity of various ethno-cultural groups. They stress internal cultural pluralism: for reasons of peace and security borders should bring together distinct cultural groups (typically ethno-national ones), and they actually most often do so. One can then combine the two motivations, the one of culture suggesting open multiculturalism and the one of security supporting the Waldronian line according to which the point of the state is to resolve conflicts and establish justice, so that forming a state is a duty we owe to anyone with whom we are likely to come into endemic conflict. (Waldron 2005, Other Internet Resources).
But where should one stop? The question arises since there are a lot of geographically and interactionally open territories of various sizes. First, geographical openness of big continental planes, then openness for interaction (“No island is an island any more”, one could say) and finally and dramatically, the massive eco-openness concerning ground and climate. So, if we follow the cosmopolitan logic of the interests of peace and security, this would suggest joining together bigger and bigger units in a kind of recursive scheme. For instance, EU was created to secure lasting peace, and other supra-statal and macro-regional might follow its lead. Ultimately, the combination of ethno-cultural and security focused considerations might thus point in a clearly cosmopolitan direction in formulating and solving dilemmas about the matters of territory.
The philosophy of nationalism nowadays does not concern itself much with the aggressive and dangerous form of invidious nationalism that often occupies center stage in the news and in sociological research. Although this pernicious form can be of significant instrumental value mobilizing oppressed people and giving them a sense of dignity, its moral costs are usually taken by philosophers to outweigh its benefits. Nationalist-minded philosophers distance themselves from such aggressive nationalism, and mainly seek to construct and defend very moderate versions; these have therefore come to be the main focus of recent philosophical debate.
In presenting the claims that nationalists defend, we have started from more radical ones and have moved towards liberal nationalist alternatives. In examining the argument for these claims, we have first presented metaphysically demanding communitarian arguments, resting upon deep communitarian assumptions about culture, such as the premise that the ethno-cultural nation is universally the central and most important community for each human individual. This is an interesting and respectable claim, but its plausibility has not yet been established. The moral debate about nationalism has resulted in various weakenings of the cultural arguments, proposed by liberal nationalists, which render the arguments less ambitious but much more plausible. Having abandoned the old nationalist ideal of a state owned by its ethno-cultural dominant group, liberal nationalists have become receptive to the idea that identification with a plurality of cultures and communities is important for a person's social identity. They have equally become sensitive to trans-national issues, and more willing to embrace a partly cosmopolitan perspective.
Liberal nationalism has also brought to the fore more modest, less philosophically or metaphysically charged arguments grounded in the concerns of justice. These stress the practical importance of ethno-cultural membership, various rights to redress injustice, democratic rights of political association, and the role that ethno-cultural ties and associations can play in promoting just social arrangements. Liberal culturalists such as Kymlicka have proposed minimal and pluralistic versions of nationalism built around such arguments. In these minimal versions, the project of building classical nation-states is moderated or abandoned, and replaced by a more sensitive form of national identity which can thrive in a multicultural society. This new project, however, might demand a further widening of moral perspectives. Given the experiences of the twentieth century, one can safely assume that culturally-plural states divided into isolated and closed sub-communities glued together only by arrangements of mere modus vivendi are inherently unstable. Stability might therefore require that the plural society envisioned by liberal culturalists promote quite intense interaction between cultural groups in order to forestall mistrust, reduce prejudice and create a solid basis for cohabitation. On the other hand, as we noted above in connection with issues of territorial justice, once membership in multiple cultures and communities is admitted as legitimate, social groups will spread beyond the borders of a single state (e.g. groups bound by religious or racial ties) as well as within them, thus creating an opening for at least a minimal cosmopolitan perspective. The internal dialectic of the concern for ethno-cultural identity might thus lead to pluralistic and potentially cosmopolitan political arrangements that are rather distant from what was classically understood as nationalism.
This is a short list of books on nationalism that are readable and useful as introductions to the literature. First, the two opposing social science contemporary classics:
- Gellner, E., 1983, Nations and Nationalism, Oxford: Blackwell.
- Smith, A. D., 1991, National Identity, Harmondsworth: Penguin.
The two best recent anthologies of high-quality philosophical papers on the morality of nationalism, are:
- McKim, R. and McMahan, J. (eds), 1997, The Morality of Nationalism, Oxford: Oxford University Press.
- Couture, J., Nielsen, K. and Seymour, M. (eds.), 1998, Rethinking Nationalism, Canadian Journal of Philosophy, Suplement Volume 22.
The debate continues in:
- Miscevic, N. (ed), 2000, Nationalism and Ethnic Conflict. Philosophical Perspectives. La Salle and Chicago: Open Court.
- Dieckoff, A. (ed.), 2004, The Politics of Belonging: Nationalism, Liberalism, and Pluralism, Lanham: Lexington.
- Primoratz, I. and Pavković, A., 2007, Patriotism, Philosophical and Political Perspectives, London: Ashgate.
A good brief sociological introduction to nationalism in general is
Crosby, S.E., 2005, Nationalism: A Very Short Introduction, Oxford: Oxford University Press.
and to the gender-inspired criticism of nationalism is:
- Yuval-Davis, N., 1997, Gender & Nation, London: Sage Publications.
and more recently the chapter on
- Heur, J., 2008, “Gender and Nationalism,” in Herb and Kaplan 2008.
The best general introduction to the communitarian-individualist debate is still:
- Avineri, Shlomo and de-Shalit, Avner (eds.), 1992, Communitarianism and Individualism, Oxford: Oxford University Press.
For a non-nationalist defense of culturalist claims see
- Kymlicka, W. (ed.), 1995, The Rights of Minority Cultures, Oxford: Oxford University Press.
Three very readable philosophical defenses of very moderate nationalism are:
- Miller, D., 1995, On Nationality, Oxford: Oxford University Press.
- Tamir, Y., 1993, Liberal Nationalism, Press, Princeton, NJ: Princeton University Press.
- Gans, C., 2003, The Limits of Nationalism, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.
A polemical, witty and thoughtful criticism is offered in
- Barry, B., 2001, Culture and Equality, Cambridge: Polity Press.
An influential critical analysis of group solidarity in general and nationalism in particular, written in the tradition of rational choice theory is:
- Hardin, R., 1985, One for All, The Logic of Group Conflict, Princeton, NJ: Princeton University Press.
There is a wide offer of interesting sociological and political science work on nationalism, which is beginning to be summarized in
- Motyl, A. (ed.) 2001, Encyclopedia of Nationalism, Volume I, New York: Academic Press.
A recent encyclopedic overview is
- Herb, G.H. and D.H. Kaplan (2008), Nations and Nationalism: a Global Historical Overview, four volumes, Santa Barbara, CA: ABC Clio.
A detailed sociological study of life under nationalist rule is:
- Billig, M., 1995, Banal Nationalism, London: Sage Publications.
The most readable short anthology of brief papers for and against cosmopolitanism (and nationalism) by leading authors in the field is:
- Cohen, J. (ed.), 1996, Martha Nussbaum and respondents, For Love of Country: Debating the Limits of Patriotism, Boston: Beacon Press
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How to cite this entry. Preview the PDF version of this entry at the Friends of the SEP Society. Look up this entry topic at the Indiana Philosophy Ontology Project (InPhO). Enhanced bibliography for this entry at PhilPapers, with links to its database.
- Nussbaum, M. C. 2002, “Beyond the Social Contract: Toward Global Justice,” Tanner Lecture, Australian National University.
- Waldron, J., 2005, “Proximity as the Basis of Political Community.”
- The Warwick Debates, debate between E. Gellner and A. Smith at the London School of Economics.
- ARENA: Centre for European Studies. ARENA is a research centre at the University of Oslo studying the dynamics of the evolving European systems of governance. This site contains a good selection of papers on ethics of international relations.
- Global Policy Forum, has papers on the future of nation-states.
- Academy of European Law, at the European University Institute.
- Territory and Justice network: repository of pre-publication papers.
The editors would like to thank Ben Wolfson for his efforts in copy-editing this entry.