Nationalism

First published Thu Nov 29, 2001; substantive revision Mon Dec 15, 2014

The term “nationalism” is generally used to describe two phenomena: (1) the attitude that the members of a nation have when they care about their national identity, and (2) the actions that the members of a nation take when seeking to achieve (or sustain) self-determination. (1) raises questions about the concept of a nation (or national identity), which is often defined in terms of common origin, ethnicity, or cultural ties, and specifically about whether an individual's membership in a nation should be regarded as non-voluntary or voluntary. (2) raises questions about whether self-determination must be understood as involving having full statehood with complete authority over domestic and international affairs, or whether something less is required.

It is traditional, therefore, to distinguish nations from states — whereas a nation often consists of an ethnic or cultural community, a state is a political entity with a high degree of sovereignty. While many states are nations in some sense, there are many nations which are not fully sovereign states. As an example, the Native American Iroquois constitute a nation but not a state, since they do not possess the requisite political authority over their internal or external affairs. If the members of the Iroquois nation were to strive to form a sovereign state in the effort to preserve their identity as a people, they would be exhibiting a state-focused nationalism.

Nationalism has long been ignored as a topic in political philosophy, written off as a relic from bygone times. It came into the focus of philosophical debate two decades ago, in the nineties, partly in consequence of rather spectacular and troubling nationalist clashes such as those in Rwanda, the former Yugoslavia and the former Soviet republics. Surges of nationalism tend to present a morally ambiguous, and for this reason often fascinating, picture. “National awakening” and struggles for political independence are often both heroic and cruel; the formation of a recognizably national state often responds to deep popular sentiment but sometimes yields inhuman consequences, from violent expulsion and “cleansing” of non-nationals to organized mass murder. The moral debate on nationalism reflects a deep moral tension between solidarity with oppressed national groups on the one hand and repulsion in the face of crimes perpetrated in the name of nationalism on the other. Moreover, the issue of nationalism points to a wider domain of problems related to the treatment of ethnic and cultural differences within democratic polity, arguably among the most pressing problems of contemporary political theory.

In the last decade the focus of the debate about nationalism has shifted towards issues in international justice, probably in response to changes on the international scene: bloody nationalist wars such as those in the former Yugoslavia have become less conspicuous, whereas the issues of terrorism, of the “clash of civilizations” and of hegemony in the international order have come to occupy public attention. One important link with earlier debates is provided by the contrast between views of international justice based on the predominance of sovereign nation-states and more cosmopolitan views that insist upon limiting national sovereignty or even envisage its disappearance. Another new focus for philosophers is provided by issues of territory and territorial rights, which connect the topic of nation-states (or, “the nation state”) with questions about boundaries, migration, resource rights and vital ecological matters.

In this entry we shall first present conceptual issues of definition and classification (Sections 1 and 2) and then the arguments put forward in the debate (Section 3), dedicating more space to the arguments in favor of nationalism than to those against it, in order to give the philosophical nationalist a proper hearing.

1. What is a Nation?

1.1 The Basic Concept of Nationalism

Although the term “nationalism” has a variety of meanings, it centrally encompasses the two phenomena noted at the outset: (1) the attitude that the members of a nation have when they care about their identity as members of that nation and (2) the actions that the members of a nation take in seeking to achieve (or sustain) some form of political sovereignty (see for example, Nielsen 1998–9, 9). Each of these aspects requires elaboration. (1) raises questions about the concept of a nation or national identity, about what it is to belong to a nation, and about how much one ought to care about one's nation. Nations and national identity may be defined in terms of common origin, ethnicity, or cultural ties, and while an individual's membership in the nation is often regarded as involuntary, it is sometimes regarded as voluntary. The degree of care for one's nation that nationalists require is often, but not always, taken to be very high: according to such views, the claims of one's nation take precedence over rival contenders for authority and loyalty (see Berlin 1979, Smith 1991, Levy 2000, and the discussion in Gans 2003; for a more extreme characterization see the opening pages of Crosby 2005, and for a recent rich and interesting discussions of nationalist attitudes see Yack 2012).

(2) raises questions about whether sovereignty requires the acquisition of full statehood with complete authority over domestic and international affairs, or whether something less than statehood suffices. Although sovereignty is often taken to mean full statehood (Gellner 1983, ch. 1; for discussion of Gellner's views see Meadwell 2012, 2014, and papers in Malesevic and Hugarard 2007), possible exceptions have been recognized (Miller 1992 (87), and Miller 2000). Some authors even defend an anarchist version of patriotism-moderate nationalism foreshadowed by Bakunin (see Robert Sparrow, “For the Union Makes Us Strong: Anarchism and Patriotism”, in Primoratz and Pavkovic 2007).

Despite these definitional worries, there is a fair amount of agreement about the historically paradigmatic form of nationalism. It typically features the supremacy of the nation's claims over other claims to individual allegiance and full sovereignty as the persistent aim of its political program. Territorial sovereignty has traditionally been seen as a defining element of state power and essential for nationhood. It was extolled in classic modern works by Hobbes, Locke, and Rousseau and is returning to center stage in the debate, though philosophers are now more skeptical (see below). Issues surrounding the control of the movement of money and people (in particular immigration) and the resource rights implied in territorial sovereignty make the topic politically center in the age of globalization and philosophically interesting for nationalists and anti-nationalists alike.

The territorial state as political unit is seen by nationalists as centrally ‘belonging’ to one ethnic-cultural group and as actively charged with protecting and promulgating its traditions. This view is exemplified by the classical, “revivalist” nationalism that was most prominent in the 19th century in Europe and Latin America. This classical nationalism later spread across the world and still marks many contemporary nationalisms.

1.2 The Concept of a Nation

In its general form the issue of nationalism concerns the mapping between the ethno-cultural domain (featuring ethno-cultural groups or “nations”) and the domain of political organization. In breaking down the issue, we have mentioned the importance of the attitude that the members of a nation have when they care about their national identity. This point raises two sorts of questions. First, the descriptive ones:

(1a)What is a nation and what is national identity?
(1b)What is it to belong to a nation?
(1c)What is the nature of pro-national attitude?
(1d)Is membership in a nation voluntary or involuntary?

Second, the normative ones:

(1e)Is the attitude of caring about national identity always appropriate?
(1f)How much should one care?

This section discusses the descriptive questions, starting with (1a) and (1b). (The normative questions are addressed in Section 3 on the moral debate.) If one wants to enjoin people to struggle for their national interests, one must have some idea about what a nation is and what it is to belong to a nation. So, in order to formulate and ground their evaluations, claims, and directives for action, pro-nationalist thinkers have expounded theories of ethnicity, culture, nation and state. Their opponents have in turn challenged these elaborations. Now, some presuppositions about ethnic groups and nations are essential for the nationalist, while others are theoretical elaborations designed to support the essential ones. The definition and status of the social group that benefits from the nationalist program, variously called the “nation”, “ethno-nation” or “ethnic group”, is essential. Since nationalism is particularly prominent with groups that do not yet have a state, a definition of nation and nationalism purely in terms of belonging to a state is a non-starter.

Indeed, purely “civic” loyalties are often categorized separately under the title “patriotism”, or “constitutional patriotism” (Habermas 1996; see the discussion in Markell 2000; for a wider understanding of patriotism see Primoratz and Pavkovic 2007). This leaves two extreme options and a number of intermediates. The first extreme option has been put forward by a small but distinguished band of theorists, including Renan 1882 and Weber 1970; for a recent defense, see Brubaker 2004 and for a comparison with religion, Brubaker 2013. According to their purely voluntaristic definition, a nation is any group of people aspiring to a common political state-like organization. If such a group of people succeeds in forming a state, the loyalties of the group members become “civic” (as opposed to “ethnic”) in nature. At the other extreme, and more typically, nationalist claims are focused upon the non-voluntary community of common origin, language, tradition and culture: the classic ethno-nation is a community of origin and culture, including prominently a language and customs. The distinction is related (although not identical) to that drawn by older schools of social and political science between “civic” and “ethnic” nationalism, the former being allegedly Western European and the latter more Central and Eastern European, originating in Germany (a very prominent proponent of the distinction is Hans Kohn 1965). Philosophical discussions centered around nationalism tend to concern the ethnic-cultural variants only, and this habit will be followed here. A group aspiring to nationhood on this basis will be called here an ‘ethno-nation’ to underscore its ethno-cultural rather than purely civic underpinnings. For the ethno-(cultural) nationalist it is one's ethnic-cultural background that determines one's membership in the community. One cannot chose to be a member; instead, membership depends on the accident of origin and early socialization. However, commonality of origin has become mythical for most contemporary candidate groups: ethnic groups have been mixing for millennia.

Sophisticated pro-nationalists therefore tend to stress cultural membership only and speak of “nationality”, omitting the “ethno-” part (Miller 1992, 2000; Tamir 1993 and 2013; Gans 2003). Michel Seymour’s proposal of a “socio-cultural definition” adds a political dimension to the purely cultural one: a nation is a cultural group, possibly but not necessarily united by a common descent, endowed with civic ties (Seymour 2000). This is the kind of definition that would be accepted by most parties in the debate today. So defined, the nation is a somewhat mixed category, both ethno-cultural and civic, but still closer to the purely ethno-cultural than to the purely civic extreme.

The wider descriptive underpinnings of nationalist claims have varied over the last two centuries. The early German elaborations talk about “the spirit of a people”, while somewhat later ones, mainly of French extraction, talk about “collective mentality”, to which specific and significant causal powers are ascribed. A later descendent of this notion is the idea of a “national character” peculiar to each nation, which partly survives today under the guise of national “forms of life” and of feeling (Margalit 1997, see below). For almost a century, up to the end of the Second World War, it was customary to link nationalist views to organic metaphors for society. Isaiah Berlin, writing as late as the early seventies, proposed to define nationalism partly as consisting of the conviction that people belong to a particular human group, and that “…the characters of the individuals who compose the group are shaped by, and cannot be understood apart from, those of the group …” (first published in 1972, reprinted in Berlin, 1979: 341). The nationalist claims, according to Berlin, that “the pattern of life in a society is similar to that of a biological organism” (ibid.), and that the needs of this ‘organism’ determine the supreme goal for all of its members. Most contemporary defenders of nationalism, especially philosophers, avoid such language. The organic metaphor and talk about character have been replaced by one master metaphor: that of national identity. It is centered upon cultural membership, and used both for the identity of a group and for the socially based identity of its members, e.g., the national identity of George insofar as he is English or British. Various authors unpack the metaphor in various ways: some stress involuntary membership in the community, others the strength with which one identifies with the community, and yet others link it to the personal identity of each member of the community. Addressing these issues, nationalist philosophers such as Alisdair MacIntyre (1994), Charles Taylor (1989), and M. Seymour have significantly contributed to introducing and maintaining important topics such as community, membership, tradition and social identity into contemporary philosophical debate.

Let us now turn to the issue of the origin and “authenticity” of ethno-cultural groups or ethno-nations. In social and political science one usually distinguishes two kinds of views. The first can be called “primordialist” views. According to them, actual ethno-cultural nations have either existed “since time immemorial” (an extreme, somewhat caricatured version, corresponding to nineteenth century nationalist rhetoric), or at least for a long time during the pre-modern period (Hastings 1997, see the discussion of his views in Nations and Nationalism, Volume 9, 2003). Anthony Smith champions a very popular moderate version of this view (1991, 2001, 2008 and the book 2009 and paper 2011) under the name “ethnosymbolism.” For a fine development of this line see also the works of John Hutchinson (most recently his 2005 book) and of Roshwald (2006, debated in Nations and Nationalism 2008, Volumes 1 and 4 respectively). A volume dedicated to A. Smith debates his ethnno-nationalism (Leouss and Grosby, eds., 2007); recently a historical defense has been offered by Azar Gat and Alexander Yakobson (2013). According to this approach, nations are like artichokes, in that they have many “unimportant leaves” that can be chewed up one by one, but also have a heart, which remains after the leaves have been eaten (the metaphor is due to Stanley Hoffmann; for details and sources see the debate between Smith 2003 and Özkirimli 2003. For interesting historical details see a recent collection by Derks & Roymans 2009). The second are the modernist views, placing the origin of nations in modern times. They can be further classified according to their answer to an additional question: how real is the ethno-cultural nation? The modernist realist view is that nations are real but distinctly modern creations, instrumental in the genesis of capitalism (Gellner 1983, Hobsbawn 1990, and Breuilly 2001 and 2011). The realist view contrasts with more radical antirealism. According to one such view, nations are merely “imagined” but somehow still powerful entities; what is meant is that belief in them holds sway over the believers (Anderson 1965). The extreme anti-realist view claims that nations are pure “constructions” (see Walker 2001 for an overview and literature and, more recently, Malesevic 2011). These divergent views seem to support rather divergent moral claims about nations: see for instance the collections edited by Breen and O'Neill (2010) and by Lecours and Moreno (2010). For an overview of nationalism in political theory see Vincent 2001 and the encyclopedic volume edited by Delanty and Kumar (2006). For a more recent account combining political theory, history and quantitative research see (Wimmer 2013); other relevant books are De Lange 2010 and Bechhofer & McCrone 2009.

Indeed, older authors — from great thinkers like Herder and Otto Bauer to the propagandists who followed their footsteps — took great pains to ground normative claims upon firm ontological realism about nations: nations are real, bona fide entities. However, the contemporary moral debate has tried to diminish the importance of the imagined/real divide. Prominent contemporary philosophers have claimed that normative-evaluative nationalist claims are compatible with the “imagined” nature of a nation. (See, for instance, MacCormick 1982; Miller 1992, 2000; Tamir 1993, Gans 2003, Moore 2009, 2010, Dagger 2009 and, for an interesting discussion, Frost 2006.) They point out that common imaginings can tie people together, and that actual interaction resulting from togetherness can engender important moral obligations.

Let us now turn to question (1c) about the nature of pro-national attitudes. The explanatory issue that has interested political and social scientists concerns ethno-nationalist sentiment, the paradigm case of a pro-national attitude. Is it as irrational, romantic and indifferent to self-interest as it might seem on the surface? The issue has divided authors who see nationalism as basically irrational and those who try to explain it as being in some sense rational. Authors who see it as irrational propose various explanations of why people assent to irrational views. Some say, critically, that nationalism is based on “false consciousness”. But where does such false consciousness come from? The most simplistic view is that it is a result of direct manipulation of “masses” by “elites”. On the opposite side, the famous critic of nationalism Elie Kedourie (1960) thinks this irrationality is spontaneous. A decade ago Liah Greenfeld went as far as linking nationalism to mental illness in her provocative (2005) article; see also her (2006) book. On the opposite side, Michael Walzer has offered a sympathetic account of nationalist passion in his (2002). Authors relying upon the Marxist tradition offer various deeper explanations. To mention one, the French structuralist Étienne Balibar sees it as a result of the “production” of ideology effectuated by mechanisms which have nothing to do with spontaneous credulity of individuals, but with impersonal, structural social factors (Balibar and Wallerstein, 1992). (For an overview of Marxist approaches see Glenn 1997). Now we turn to those who see nationalist sentiments as being rational, at least in a very wide sense. Some authors claim that it is often rational for individuals to become nationalists (Hardin 1985). Consider the two sides of the nationalist coin. On the first side, identification and cohesion within an ethno-national group relates to inter-group cooperation, and cooperation is easier for those who are part of the same ethno-national group. To take an example of ethnic ties in a multiethnic state, a Vietnamese newcomer to the United States will do well to rely on his co-nationals: common language, customs and expectations might help him a lot in finding his way in new surroundings. Once the ties are established and he has become part of a network, it is rational to go on cooperating, and ethnic sentiment secures the trust and the firm bond needed for smooth cooperation. A further issue is when it is rational to switch sides; to stay with our example, when does it become profitable for our Vietnamese to develop an all-American patriotism? This has received a detailed elaboration in David Laitin (1998, summarized in 2001; applied to language rights in Laitin and Reich 2004; see also Laitin 2007), who uses material from the former Soviet Union. On the other side of the nationalist coin, non-cooperation with outsiders can lead to sometimes extreme conflict between various ethno-nations. Can one rationally explain the extremes of ethno-national conflict? Authors like Russell Hardin propose to do so in terms of a general view of when hostile behavior is rational: most typically, if an individual has no reason to trust someone, it is reasonable for that individual to take precautions against the other. If both sides take precautions, however, each will tend to see the other as increasingly inimical. It then becomes rational to start treating the other as an enemy. Mere suspicion can thus lead by small, individually rational steps to a situation of conflict. (Such negative development is often presented as a variant of the Prisoner's Dilemma; see the entry on prisoner's dilemma). It is relatively easy to spot the circumstances in which this general pattern applies to national solidarities and conflicts (see also Wimmer 2013). The line of thought just sketched is often called the “rational choice approach”. It has enabled the application of conceptual tools from game-theoretic and economic analyses of cooperative and non-cooperative behavior to the explanation of ethno-nationalism.

It is worth mentioning, however, that the individualist rational-choice approach, centered upon personal rationality, has serious competitors. A tradition in social psychology, initiated by Henri Tajfel (1981), shows that individuals may identify with a randomly selected group even when membership in the group brings no tangible rewards. Does rationality of any kind underlie this tendency to identification? Some authors (Sober & Wilson 1998) answer in the affirmative. They propose a non-personal, evolutionary sort of rationality: individuals who develop a sentiment of identification and sense of belonging end up better off in the evolutionary race; hence we have inherited such propensities. Initially, sentiments were reserved for kin, supporting the spreading of one's own genes. But cultural evolution has taken over the mechanisms of identification that initially developed within biological evolution. As a result, we project the sentiment originally reserved for kinship onto our cultural group. More detailed explanations from socio-biological perspectives differ greatly among themselves and constitute a wide and rather promising research program (see an overview in Goetze 2001). There is a growing literature connecting these issues with cognitive science, from Searle-White 2001 to Hogan 2009 and Yack 2012.

Finally, as for question (1d), the nation is typically seen as an essentially non-voluntary community to which one belongs by birth and early nurture and such that the belonging is enhanced and made more complete by one’s additional conscious endorsement. Avishai Margalit and Joseph Raz express a common view when they write about belonging to a nation: “Qualification for membership is usually determined by non-voluntary criteria. One cannot choose to belong. One belongs because of who one is” (Margalit and Raz, 1990, 447). Belonging brings crucial benefits: “Belonging to a national form of life means being within a frame that offers meaning to people's choice between alternatives, thus enabling them to acquire an identity” (Margalit 1997, 83). Why is national belonging taken to be involuntary? It is often attributed to the involuntary nature of linguistic belonging: a child does not decide which language will become her or his mother tongue, and one's mother tongue is often regarded as the most important depository of concepts, knowledge, social and cultural significance. All these are embedded in the language, and do not exist without it. Early socialization is seen as socialization into a specific culture, and very often that culture is just assumed to be a national one. “There are people who express themselves ‘Frenchly’, while others have forms of life that are expressed ‘Koreanly’ or ‘Icelandicly’,” writes Margalit (1997, 80). The resulting belonging is then to a large extent non-voluntary. (There are exceptions to this basically non-voluntaristic view: for instance, theoretical nationalists who accept voluntary changes of nationality. (See also Ernst Renan's 1882 (19) famous definition of a nation as constituted by ‘everyday plebiscite’.)

2. Varieties of Nationalism

2.1 Concepts of Nationalism: Strict and Wide

We pointed out at the very beginning of the entry that nationalism focuses upon (1) the attitude that the members of a nation have when they care about their national identity, and (2) the actions that the members of a nation take when seeking to achieve (or sustain) some form of political sovereignty. The politically central point is (2): the actions enjoined by the nationalist. To these we now turn, beginning with sovereignty and territory, the usual foci of a national struggle for independence. They raise an important issue:

(2a) Does political sovereignty within or over a territory require statehood or something weaker?

The classical answer is that a state is required. A more liberal answer is that some form of political autonomy suffices. Once this has been discussed, we can turn to the related normative issues:

(2b)What actions are morally permitted to achieve sovereignty and to maintain it?
(2c)Under what conditions is it morally permitted to take actions of this kind?

Consider first the classical nationalist answer to (2a). Political sovereignty requires a state “rightfully owned” by the ethno-nation (Oldenquist 1997, who credits the expression to the writer Czeslaw Milosz). Developments of this line of thought often state or imply specific answers to (2b), and (2c), i.e., that in a national independence struggle the use of force against the threatening central power is almost always a legitimate means for bringing about sovereignty. However, classical nationalism is not only concerned with the creation of a state but also with its maintenance and strengthening. Nationalism is sometimes used to promote claims for the expansion of a state (even at the cost of wars) and for isolationist policies. Expansion is often justified by appeal to the unfinished business of bringing literally all members of the nation under one state and sometimes by territorial and resource interests. As for maintenance of sovereignty by peaceful and merely ideological means, political nationalism is closely tied to cultural nationalism. The latter insists upon the preservation and transmission of a given culture, or more accurately, of recognizably ethno-national traits of the culture in its pure form, dedicating artistic creation, education and research to this goal. Of course, the ethno-national traits to be preserved can be actual or invented, partly or fully so. Again, in the classical variant the relevant norm claims that one has both a right and an obligation (“a sacred duty”) to promote such a tradition. Its force trumps other interests and even other rights (a trump which is often needed in order to carry out the national independence struggle). In consequence, classical nationalism has something to say about the ranking of attitudes as well: in response to (1e), caring for one's nation is given the status of a fundamental duty for each of its members, and in answer to (1f), the scope is taken as unlimited. In summary, for future reference:

Classical nationalism is the political program that sees the creation and maintenance of a fully sovereign state owned by a given ethno-national group (“people” or “nation”) as a primary duty of each member of the group. Starting from the assumption that the appropriate (or “natural”) unit of culture is an ethno-nation, it claims that a primary duty of each member is to abide by one's recognizably ethno-national culture in all cultural matters.

Classical nationalists are usually vigilant about the kind of culture they protect and promote and about the kind of attitude people have to their nation-state. This watchful attitude carries some potential dangers: many elements of a given culture that are universalist or simply not recognizably national may fall prey to such nationalist enthusiasms. Classical nationalism in everyday life puts various additional demands on individuals, from buying more expensive home-produced goods in preference to cheaper imported ones to procreating as many future members of the nation as one can manage. (See Yuval-Davies 1997, and Yack 2012.)

Besides classical nationalism (and its more radical extremist cousins), various moderate views are also nowadays classified as nationalist. Indeed, the philosophical discussion has shifted to these moderate or even ultra-moderate forms, and most philosophers who describe themselves as nationalists propose very moderate nationalist programs. Let me characterize these briefly:

Nationalism in a wider sense is any complex of attitudes, claims and directives for action ascribing a fundamental political, moral and cultural value to nation and nationality and deriving obligations (for individual members of the nation, and for any involved third parties, individual or collective) from this ascribed value.

Nationalisms in this wider sense can vary somewhat in their conceptions of the nation (which are often left implicit in their discourse), in the grounds for and degree of its value, and in the scope of their prescribed obligations. (The term can also be applied to other cases not covered by classical nationalism, for instance to the hypothetical pre-state political forms that an ethnic identity might take). Moderate nationalism is less demanding than classical nationalism and sometimes goes under the name of “patriotism.” (A different usage, again, reserves “patriotism” for valuing of civic community and loyalty to state, in contrast to nationalism, centered around ethnic-cultural communities). The variations of nationalism most relevant for philosophy are those that influence the moral standing of claims and of recommended nationalist practices. The elaborate philosophical views put forward in favor of nationalism will be referred to here as “theoretical nationalism”, the adjective serving to distinguish such views from less sophisticated and more practical nationalist discourse. The central theoretical nationalist evaluative claims can be charted on the map of possible positions within political theory in the following useful but somewhat simplified and schematic way.

Nationalist claims featuring the nation as central to political action must answer two crucial general questions. First, is there one kind of large social group (smaller than the whole of mankind) that is of special moral importance? The nationalist answer is that there is just one, namely, the nation. When an ultimate choice is to be made, the nation has priority. (This answer is implied by rather standard definitions of nationalism offered by Berlin, discussed in Section 1., and Smith in his 2001.) Second, what are the grounds for an individual’s obligations to the morally central group? Are they based on voluntary or involuntary membership in the group? The typical contemporary nationalist thinker opts for the latter, while admitting that voluntary endorsement of one's national identity is a morally important achievement. On the philosophical map, pro-nationalist normative tastes fit nicely with the communitarian stance in general: most pro-nationalist philosophers are communitarians who choose the nation as the preferred community (in contrast to those of their fellow communitarians who prefer more far-ranging communities, such as those defined by global religious traditions). However, some writers who describe themselves as liberal nationalists, prominently including Will Kymlicka (2001, 2003, 2007), reject communitarian underpinning.

Before proceeding to moral claims, let me briefly sketch the issues and viewpoints connected to territory and territorial rights that are essential for nationalist political programs. (I am adapting the excellent taxonomy of A. Kollers (2009, Ch. 1) to the topic at hand.) Why is territory important for ethno-national groups, and what are the extent and grounds of territorial rights? Its primary importance resides in sovereignty and all the associated possibilities for internal control and external exclusion. Add to this the Rousseauian view that political attachments are essentially bounded and that love —or, to put it more mildly, republican civil friendship— for one’s group requires exclusion of some “other”, and the importance becomes quite obvious. What about the grounds for the demand for territorial rights? Nationalist and pro-nationalist views mostly rely on the attachment that members of a nation have to national territory and to the formative value of territory for a nation to justify territorial claims (see Miller 2000 and Meissels 2009, with some refinements discussed below). This is similar in some respects to the rationale given by proponents of indigenous peoples’ rights (Tully 2004, but see also Hendrix 2008) and in other respects to Kollers's (2009) ethno-geographical non-nationalist theory, but differs in preferring ethno-national groups as the sole carriers of the right. These attachment views stand in stark contrast to more pragmatic views about territorial rights as means for conflict resolution (e.g., Levy 2000). Another quite popular alternative is the family of individualistic views grounding territorial rights in rights and interests of individuals, for instance in their human rights (Buchanan 2004), pre-political Lockean property rights (Simmons 2001), individual resource rights (Steiner 1999), or political association rights (Wellman 2005). On the extreme end of anti-nationalist views stands the idea of Pogge (if he can be interpreted this way) that there are no specific territorial problems for political philosophy—the “dissolution approach”, as Kollers calls it. Some of the authors mentioned are cosmopolitan critics of nationalism, most prominently Buchanan and Pogge.

2.2 Moral Claims: The Centrality of Nation

We now pass to the normative dimension of nationalism. We shall first describe the very heart of the nationalist program, i.e., sketch and classify the typical normative and evaluative nationalist claims. These claims can be seen as answers to the normative subset of our initial questions about (1) pro-national attitudes and (2) actions.

We will see that these claims recommend various courses of action: centrally, those meant to secure and sustain a political organization — preferably a state — for the given ethno-cultural national community (thereby making more specific the answers to our normative questions (1e), (1f), (2b), and (2c)). Further, they enjoin the community’s members to promulgate recognizable ethno-cultural contents as central features of the cultural life within such a state. Finally, we shall discuss various lines of pro-nationalist thought that have been put forward in defense of these claims. To begin, let us return to the claims concerning the furthering of the national state and culture. These are proposed by the nationalist as norms of conduct. The philosophically most important variations concern three aspects of such normative claims:

(i) The normative nature and strength of the claim: does it promote merely a right (say, to have and maintain a form of political self-government, preferably and typically a state, or have cultural life centered upon a recognizably ethno-national culture), or a moral obligation (to get and maintain one), or a moral, legal and political obligation? The strongest claim is typical of classical nationalism; its typical norms are both moral and, once the nation-state is in place, legally enforceable obligations for all parties concerned, including for the individual members of the ethno-nation. A weaker but still quite demanding version speaks only of moral obligation (“sacred duty”). A more liberal version is satisfied with a claim-right to having a state “rightfully owned” by the ethno-nation.

(ii) The strength of the nationalist claim in relation to various external interests and rights: to give a real example, is the use of the domestic language so important that even international conferences should be held in it, at the cost of losing the most interesting participants from abroad? The force of the nationalist claim is here being weighed against the force of other claims, including those of individual or group interests or rights. Variations in comparative strength of nationalist claims take place on a continuum between two extremes. At one rather unpalatable extreme, nation-focused claims take precedence over any other claims, including over human rights. Further towards the center is the classical nationalism that gives nation-centered claims precedence over individual interests and many needs (including pragmatic collective utility), but not necessarily over general human rights. (See, for example, McIntyre 1994, Oldenquist 1997.) On the opposite end, which is mild, humane and liberal, the central nationalist claims are accorded prima facie status only (see Tamir 1993, Gans 2003, and most recently Miller's 2013 book, which looks for a compromise).

(iii) For which groups are the nationalist claims meant to be valid? What is their scope? One approach claims that they are valid for every ethno-nation and thereby universal. An example would be the claim “every ethno-nation should have its own state”. To put it more officially

Universalizing nationalism is the political program that claims that every ethno-nation should have a state that it should rightfully own and the interests of which it should promote.

Alternatively, a claim may be particularistic, such as the claim “Group X ought to have a state”, where this implies nothing about any other group:

Particularistic nationalism is the political program claiming that some ethno-nation should have its state, without extending the claim to all ethno-nations. It claims thus either
  1. by omission (unreflective particularistic nationalism), or
  2. by explicitly specifying who is excluded: “Group X ought to have a state, but group Y should not” (invidious nationalism).

The most difficult and indeed chauvinistic sub-case of particularism, i.e., (B), has been called “invidious” since it explicitly denies the privilege of having a state to some peoples. T. Pogge (1997) proposes a further division of (B) into the “high” stance, which denies it to some types of groups, and the “low” one which denies it to some particular groups. Serious theoretical nationalists usually defend only the universalist variety, whereas the nationalist-in-the-street most often defends the egoistic indeterminate one (“Some nations should have a state, above all mine!”). Classical nationalism comes in both particularistic and universalistic varieties.

Although the three dimensions of variation — internal strength, comparative strength, and scope — are logically independent, they are psychologically and politically intertwined. People who are radical in one respect tend also to be radical in other respects. In other words, certain clusters of attitudes appear to be most stable, so that extreme (or moderate) attitudes on one dimension psychologically and politically belong with extreme (or moderate) ones on others. Pairing extreme attitudes on one dimension with moderate ones on the others is psychologically and socially unstable.

The nationalist picture of morality traditionally has been quite close to the dominant view in the theory of international relations called “realism”. Put starkly, the view is that morality ends at the boundaries of the nation-state; beyond there is nothing but anarchy. The view is explicit in Friederich Meinecke (1965, Introduction) and Raymond Aron (1962) and very close to the surface in Hans Morgenthau (1946); for interesting links with contemporary nationalisms, see the paper by Michael C. Williams (2007) and the book edited by Duncan Bell (2008). It nicely complements the main classical nationalist claim about nation-state, i.e., that each ethno-nation or people should have a state of its own, and suggests what happens next: nation-states enter into competition in the name of their constitutive peoples.

3. The Moral Debate

3.1 Classical and liberal nationalisms

Let us return to our initial normative question centered around (1) attitudes and (2) actions. Is national partiality justified, and to what extent? What actions are appropriate to bring about sovereignty? In particular, are ethno-national states and institutionally protected (ethno-)national cultures goods independent from the individual will of their members, and how far may one go in protecting them? The philosophical debate for and against nationalism is a debate about the moral validity of its central claims. In particular the ultimate moral issue is the following: is any form of nationalism morally permissible or justified, and, if not, how bad are particular forms of it? (For debates on partiality in general, see Chatterjee and Smith 2003 and, more recently, Feltham and Cottingham 2010.)

Why do nationalist claims require a defense? In some situations they seem plausible: for instance, the plight of some stateless national groups — the history of Jews and Armenians, the historical and contemporary misfortunes of Kurds — lends credence to the idea that having their own state would have solved the worst problems. Still, there are good reasons to examine nationalist claims more carefully. The most general reason is that it should first be shown that the political form of nation state has some value as such, that a national community has a particular, or even central, moral and political value, and that claims in its favor have normative validity. Once this is established, a further defense is needed. Some classical nationalist claims appear to clash — at least under normal circumstances of contemporary life — with various values that people tend to accept. Some of these values are considered essential to liberal-democratic societies, while others are important specifically for the flourishing of creativity and culture. The main values in the first set are individual autonomy and benevolent impartiality (most prominently towards members of groups culturally different from one's own). The alleged special duties towards one's ethno-national culture can and often do interfere with individuals' right to autonomy. Also, construed too strictly these duties can interfere with other individual rights, e.g., the right to privacy. Many feminist authors have noted that the typical nationalist suggestion that women have a moral obligation to give birth to new members of the nation and to nurture them for the sake of the nation clashes with both the autonomy and the privacy of these women (Yuval-Davis 1997, Moller-Okin 1999, 2002 and 2005, and the discussion in the volume on Okin, Satz et al. 2009). Another endangered value is diversity within the ethno-national community, which can also be thwarted by the homogeneity of a central national culture.

Nation-oriented duties also interfere with the value of unconstrained creativity. For example, telling writers, musicians or philosophers that they have a special duty to promote national heritage interferes with the freedom of creation. The question here is not whether these individuals have the right to promote their national heritage, but whether they have a duty to do so.

Between these two sets of endangered values, the autonomy-centered and creativity-centered ones, fall values that seem to arise from ordinary needs of people living under ordinary circumstances (Barry 2001). In many modern states, citizens of different ethnic background live together and very often value this kind of life. The very fact of cohabitation seems to be a good that should be upheld. Nationalism does not tend to foster this kind of multiculturalism and pluralism, judging from both theory (especially the classical nationalist one) and experience. But the problems get worse. In practice, it does not seem accidental that the invidious particularistic form of nationalism, claiming rights for one's own people and denying them to others, is so widespread. The source of the problem is the competition for scarce resources: as Ernst Gellner (1983) famously pointed out, there is too little territory for all candidate ethnic groups to have a state, and the same goes for other goods demanded by nationalists for the exclusive use of their co-nationals. According to some authors (McCabe 1997), the invidious variant is more coherent than any other form of nationalism: if one values one's own ethnic group highly the simplest way is to value it tout court. If one definitely prefers one's own culture in all respects to any foreign one, it is a waste of time and attention to bother about others. The universalist, non-invidious variant introduces enormous psychological and political complications. These arise from a tension between spontaneous attachment to one's own community and the demand to regard all communities with an equal eye. This tension might make the humane, non-invidious position psychologically unstable, difficult to uphold in situations of conflict and crisis, and politically less efficient.

Philosophers sympathetic to nationalism are aware of the evils that historical nationalism has produced and usually distance themselves from these. They usually speak of “various accretions that have given nationalism a bad name”, and they are eager to “separate the idea of nationality itself from these excesses” (Miller 1992, 87 and Miller, 2000). Such thoughtful pro-nationalist writers have participated in an ongoing philosophical dialogue between proponents and opponents of the claim (see the anthologies McKim & McMahan 1997, Couture, Nielsen, & Seymour 1998, Miscevic 2000 and Primoratz and Pavkovic 2007). In order to help the reader find his or her way through this involved debate, we shall briefly summarize the considerations which are open to the ethno-nationalist to defend his or her case. (Compare the useful overview in Lichtenberg 1997.) Further lines of thought built upon these considerations can be used to defend very different varieties of nationalism, from radical to very moderate ones.

It is important to offer a warning concerning the key assumptions and premises figuring in each of the lines of thought summarized below: namely, that the assumptions often live an independent life in the philosophical literature. Some of them figure in the proposed defenses of various traditional views which have little to do with the concept of a nation in particular.

For brevity, I shall reduce each line of thought to a brief argument; the actual debate is more involved than one can represent in a sketch. I shall indicate, in brackets, some prominent lines of criticism that have been put forward in the debate. (These are discussed in greater detail in Miscevic 2001.) The main arguments in favor of nationalism purporting to establish its fundamental claims about state and culture will be divided into two sets. The first set of arguments defends the claim that national communities have a high value, often seen as non-instrumental and independent of the wishes and choices of their individual members, and argues that they should therefore be protected by means of state and official statist policies. The second set is less deeply ‘philosophical’ (or ‘comprehensive’), and encompasses arguments from the requirements of justice, independent from substantial assumptions about culture and cultural values.

The first set will be presented here in more detail, since it has formed the core of the debate. It depicts the community as the deep source of value or as the unique transmission device connecting its members to some important values. In this sense, the arguments from this set are communitarian in a particularly “deep” sense, since they are grounded in basic features of the human condition. Here is a characterization.

The deep communitarian perspective is a theoretical perspective on political issues (in the case under consideration, on nationalism) that justifies a given political arrangement (here, a nation-state) by appeal to deep philosophical assumptions about human nature, language, community ties and identity (in a deeper, philosophical sense).

The general form of deep communitarian arguments is as follows. First, the communitarian premise: there is some uncontroversial good (e.g., a person's identity), and some kind of community is essential for acquisition and preservation of it. Then comes the claim that the ethno-cultural nation is the kind of community ideally suited for this task. Unfortunately, this crucial claim is rarely defended in detail in the literature. But here is a sample from Margalit, whose last sentence has been already quoted above:

The idea is that people make use of different styles to express their humanity. The styles are generally determined by the communities to which they belong. There are people who express themselves ‘Frenchly’, while others have forms of life that are expressed ‘Koreanly’ or … ‘Icelandicly’. (1997, 80)

Then follows the statist conclusion: in order for such a community to preserve its own identity and support the identity of its members, it has to assume (always or at least normally) the political form of a state. The conclusion of this type of argument is that the ethno-national community has the right to an ethno-national state and the citizens of the state have the right and obligation to favor their own ethnic culture in relation to any other.

Although the deeper philosophical assumptions in the arguments stem from the communitarian tradition, weakened forms have also been proposed by more liberal philosophers. The original communitarian lines of thought in favor of nationalism suggest that there is some value in preserving ethno-national cultural traditions, in feelings of belonging to a common nation, and in solidarity between a nation's members. A liberal nationalist might claim that these are not the central values of political life but are values nevertheless. Moreover, the diametrically opposing views, pure individualism and cosmopolitanism, do seem arid, abstract, and unmotivated by comparison. By cosmopolitanism I shall understand a moral and political doctrine of the following sort:

Cosmopolitanism is the view that
  1. one's primary moral obligations are directed to all human beings (regardless of geographical or cultural distance), and
  2. political arrangements should faithfully reflect this universal moral obligation (in the form of supra-statist arrangements that take precedence over nation-states).

Critics of cosmopolitanism sometimes argue that these two claims are incoherent, since human beings generally strive best under some global institutional arrangement (like ours) that concentrates power and authority at the level of states.

Confronted with opposing forces of nationalism and cosmopolitanism, many philosophers opt for a mixture of liberalism-cosmopolitanism and patriotism-nationalism. In his writings B. Barber glorifies “a remarkable mixture of cosmopolitanism and parochialism” that in his view characterizes American national identity (in Cohen 1996, 31). Charles Taylor claims that “we have no choice but to be cosmopolitan and patriots” (ibid, 121). Hilary Putnam proposes loyalty to what is best in the multiple traditions in which each of us participates, apparently a middle way between a narrow-minded patriotism and an overly abstract cosmopolitanism (ibid, 114). The compromise has been foreshadowed by Berlin (1979), and Taylor (1989, 1993) and its various versions worked out in considerable detail by authors such as Yael Tamir (1993), David Miller (1995, 2000, 2007), Kai Nielsen (1998), Michel Seymour (2000) and Chaim Gans (2003). (See also the debate around Miller's work in De Schutter and Tinnevelt 2011.) In the last two decades it has occupied center stage in the debate and even provoked re-readings of historical nationalism in its light, for instance in Miller (2005a), Sung Ho Kim (2002) or Brian Vick (2007). Most liberal nationalist authors accept various weakened versions of the arguments we list below, taking them to support moderate or ultra-moderate nationalist claims.

It is important to mention here a more utopian proposal due to Chandran Kukathas (2003), which nicely combines multicultural pluralism with the distinctiveness of particular communities that classical nationalism celebrates. His “liberal archipelago” consists of units called “islands” that vary greatly amongst each other but are for the most part internally culturally homogenous. Some of these individual islands might be quite unpleasant by liberal standards; what makes the archipelago liberal overall is that each community guarantees its dissenting members the right to exit (which might have a high price, if former members have nowhere to go with any prospect for a decent life). The first level of political organization might thus be non-liberal (Kukathas hopes it will not turn out to be so), while the second level would be strongly liberal. The proposal nicely combines the traditional features of classical nationalism with very liberal, almost anarchic traits of the whole. Unfortunately, it is hard to see what would keep such an archipelago together without a strong unifying state, which Kukathas would not have. A clear danger is a slide towards a multipolar achipelago, with some big and powerful islands (say, a huge Islamic island, a huge EU-type island, and so on).

Let me return to the main line of exposition. Here are the main weakenings of classical ethno-nationalism that liberal, limited-liberal and cosmopolitan nationalists propose. First, ethno-national claims have only prima facie strength, and cannot trump individual rights. Second, legitimate ethno-national claims do not in themselves automatically amount to the right to a state, but rather to the right to a certain level of cultural autonomy. The main models of autonomy are either territorial or non-territorial: the first involves territorial devolution; the second, cultural autonomy granted to individuals regardless of their domicile within the state. (For a very stimulating discussion of comparative advantages and disadvantages of each, see the papers by Reiner Bauböck and Will Kymlicka in Dieckoff 2004; the former defends the non-territorial, and the latter the territorial option.) Third, ethno-nationalism is subordinate to civic patriotism, which has little or nothing to do with ethnic criteria. Fourth, ethno-national mythologies and similar “important falsehoods” are to be tolerated only if benign and inoffensive, in which case they are morally permissible despite their falsity. Finally, any legitimacy that ethno-national claims may have is to be derived from choices the concerned individuals are free to make.

3.2 Arguments in favor of nationalism: the deep need for community

Consider now the particular arguments from the first set. The first argument depends on assumptions that also appear in the subsequent ones, but it further ascribes to the community an intrinsic value. The later arguments point more towards an instrumental value of nation, derived from the value of individual flourishing, moral understanding, firm identity and the like.

(1) The Argument From Intrinsic Value. Each ethno-national community is valuable in and of itself since it is only within the natural encompassing framework of various cultural traditions that important meanings and values are produced and transmitted. The members of such communities share a special cultural proximity to each other. By speaking the same language and sharing customs and traditions, the members of these communities are typically closer to one another in various ways than they are to those who don't share the same culture. The community thereby becomes a network of morally connected agents, i.e., a moral community, with special, very strong ties of obligation. A prominent obligation of each individual concerns the underlying traits of the ethnic community, above all language and customs: they ought to be cherished, protected, preserved and reinforced. The general assumption that moral obligations increase with cultural proximity is often criticized as problematic. Moreover, even if we grant this general assumption in theory, it breaks down in practice. Nationalist activism is most often turned against close (and substantially similar) neighbors rather than against distant strangers, so that in many important contexts the appeal to proximity will not work. It might, however, retain its potential force against culturally distant groups.

(2) The Argument from Flourishing. The ethno-national community is essential for each of its members to flourish. In particular, it is only within such a community that an individual can acquire concepts and values crucial for understanding the community's cultural life in general and the individual's own life in particular. There has been much debate on the pro-nationalist side about whether divergence of values is essential for separateness of national groups. The Canadian liberal nationalists Seymour (1999), Taylor, and Kymlicka pointed out that the ‘divergences of value between different regions of Canada’ that aspire to separate nationhood are ‘minimal’. Taylor (1993, 155) concluded that it is not separateness of value that matters. This result is still compatible with the argument from flourishing if ‘concepts and values’ are not taken to be specifically national as communitarian nationalists (MacIntyre 1994, Margalit 1997) have claimed. Critics of nationalism point out that flourishing might have too high a price, especially in the form of aggressiveness towards neighbors. B. Yack notes the danger in situations where various factors combine against neighbors: “calculations of interest, feelings of social friendship and beliefs about justice” (2012, 221); see also the discussion of Yack in Hearn et al. 2014.

(3) The Argument from Identity. Communitarian philosophers emphasize nurture over nature as the principal force determining our identity as people — we come to be who we are because of the social settings and contexts in which we mature. This claim certainly has some plausibility. The very identity of each person depends upon his/her participation in communal life (see MacIntyre 1994, Nielsen, 1998, and Lagerspetz 2000). For example, Nielsen writes:

We are, to put it crudely, lost if we cannot identify ourselves with some part of an objective social reality: a nation, though not necessarily a state, with its distinctive traditions. What we find in people — and as deeply embedded as the need to develop their talents — is the need not only to be able to say what they can do but to say who they are. This is found, not created, and is found in the identification with others in a shared culture based on nationality or race or religion or some slice or amalgam thereof…. Under modern conditions, this securing and nourishing of a national consciousness can only be achieved with a nation-state that corresponds to that national consciousness (1993, 32).

Given that an individual's morality depends upon their having a mature and stable personal identity, the communal conditions that foster the development of personal identity must be preserved and encouraged. (For the opposite line, denying the importance of fixed and homogenous identity and proposing hybrid identities, see the papers in Iyall Smith and Leavy 2008.) Philosophical nationalists claim that the nation is the right format for preserving and encouraging such identity-providing communities. Therefore, communal life should be organized around particular national cultures. The classical nationalist proposes that cultures should be given their own states, while the liberal nationalist proposes that cultures should get at least some form of political protection. (For a discussion of linguistic issues, often tied to identity, see Kymlicka & Patten 2003 and Patten 2003.)

(4) The Argument from Moral Understanding. A particularly important variety of value is moral value. Some values are universal, e.g., freedom and equality, but these are too abstract and “thin”. The rich, “thick” moral values are discernible only within particular traditions, to those who have wholeheartedly endorsed the norms and standards of the given tradition. As Charles Taylor puts it, “the language we have come to accept articulates the issues of the good for us” (1989, 35). The nation offers a natural framework for moral traditions, and thereby for moral understanding; it is the primary school of morals. (I note in fairness that Taylor himself is ambivalent about the national format of morality.) An often-noticed problem with this line of thought is that particular nations do not each have a special morality of their own. Also, detailed, “thick” morality may vary more across other divisions, such as class or gender divisions, than across ethno-national groups. (For a sophisticated and intriguing recent discussion of some surprising consequences of the claim that there are “national values”, and of what happens when classical liberal values are counted as “national values”, see Laegard (2007).)

(5) The Argument from Diversity. Each national culture contributes uniquely to the diversity of human cultures. The most famous twentieth century proponent of the idea, Isaiah Berlin (interpreting Herder, who first saw this idea as significant), writes:

The ‘physiognomies’ of cultures are unique: each presents a wonderful exfoliation of human potentialities in its own time and place and environment. We are forbidden to make judgments of comparative value, for that is measuring the incommensurable. (1976, 206)

The carrier of basic value is thus the totality of cultures, from which each national culture and style of life that contributes to the totality derives its own value. The argument from diversity is therefore pluralistic: it ascribes value to each particular culture from the viewpoint of the collective totality of cultures. Assuming that the (ethno-)nation is the natural unit of culture, the preservation of cultural diversity amounts to institutionally protecting the purity of (ethno-)national culture. The plurality of cultural styles can be preserved and enhanced by tying them to ethno-national “forms of life”. A pragmatic inconsistency might threaten this argument. The issue is who can legitimately propose ethno-national diversity as ideal: the nationalist is much too tied to his or her own culture to do it, while the cosmopolitan is too eager to preserve intercultural links that go beyond the idea of having a single nation-state. Moreover, is diversity a value such that it deserves to be protected whenever it exists? Should the protection of diversity be restricted to certain aspects of culture(s) proposed in full generality? (For a more restricted, moderate version of the argument from diversity, appealing to the analogy with bio-diversity but focusing exclusively upon linguistic diversity, see François Grin in Kymlicka and Patten (2003)).

The line of thought (1) is not individualistic. And (5) can be presented without reference to individuals: diversity may be good in its own right, or may be good for nations. But the other lines of thought in the set just presented are all linked to the importance of community life in relation to the individual. They emerged from the “deep” communitarian perspective, and a recurrent theme is the importance of the fact that membership in the community is not chosen but rather involuntary. In each argument, there is a general communitarian premise (a community, to which one has no choice whether or not to belong, is crucial for one's identity, or for flourishing or some other important good). This premise is coupled with the more narrow, nation-centered descriptive claim that the ethno-nation is precisely the kind of community ideally suited for the task. However, liberal nationalists do not find these arguments completely persuasive. In their view, the premises of the arguments may not support the full package of nationalist ambitions and may not be unconditionally valid. For an even more skeptical view stemming from social science, see Hale (2008). Hale's conclusion is worth quoting: “Ethnicity is driven by uncertainty reduction, whereas ethnic politics are driven by interest” (2008, 241). Still, there is a lot to these arguments, and they might support liberal nationalism and a more modest stance in favor of national cultures.

We conclude this sub-section by pointing to an interesting and sophisticated pro-national stance that developed by David Miller over the course of decades, from his work of 1990 to the most recent work of 2013. He accepts multicultural diversity within a society but stresses an overarching national identity, taking as his prime example British national identity, which encompasses the English, Scottish and other ethnic identities. He demands an “inclusive identity, accessible to members of all cultural groups” (2013, 91). Such identity is necessary for basic social solidarity, and it goes far beyond simple constitutional patriotism, Miller claims. A skeptic could note the following. The problem with multicultural society is that national identity has historically been a matter of ethno-national ties and has required sameness in the weighted majority of cultural traits (common language, common “history-as-remembered”, customs, religion and so on). However, multi-cultural states typically bring together groups with very different histories, languages, religions, even quite contrasting appearances. Now, how is the overarching “national identity” to be achieved starting from the very thin identity of common belonging to a state? One seems to have a dilemma. Grounding social solidarity in national identity requires the latter to be rather thin and seems likely to end up as full-on, unitary cultural identity. Thick constitutional patriotism may be the only possible attitude that can ground such solidarity while preserving the original cultural diversity.

3.3 Arguments in favor of nationalism: issues of justice

Arguments in the second set concern political justice and do not rely on metaphysical claims about identity, flourishing and cultural values. They appeal to (actual or alleged) circumstances that would make nationalist policies reasonable (or permissible or even mandatory), such as (a) the fact that a large part of the world is organized into nation states (so that each new group aspiring to create a nation-state just follows an established pattern), or (b) the circumstances of group self-defense or of redressing past injustice that might justify nationalist policies (to take a special case). Some of the arguments also present nationhood as conducive to important political goods, such as equality.

(1) The Argument From the Right to Collective Self-determination. A group of people of a sufficient size has a prima facie right to govern itself and decide its future membership, if the members of the group so wish. It is fundamentally the democratic will of the members themselves that grounds the right to an ethno-national state and to ethno-centric cultural institutions and practices. This argument presents the justification of (ethno-)national claims as deriving from the will of the members of the nation. It is therefore highly suitable for liberal nationalism but not appealing to a deep communitarian who sees the demands of the nation as independent from, and prior to, the choices of particular individuals. (For extended discussion of this argument, see Buchanan 1991, which has become a contemporary classic; Moore 1998; and Gans 2003. For some exchanges of arguments, see J. Levy in Dieckoff 2004, and the volume on secession by Pavković and Radan 2007, and the work of Christopher Heath Wellman 2005. An interesting volume from a legal perspective is Kohen 2006, and some interesting case studies are presented in Casertano 2013. For an extremely negative judgment see Yack 2012, Ch. 10.)

(2) The Argument From the Right to Self-defense and to Redress Past Injustices. Oppression and injustice give the victimized group a just cause and the right to secede. If a minority group is oppressed by the majority to the extent that almost every minority member is worse off than most members of the majority simply in virtue of belonging to the minority, then nationalist claims on behalf of the minority are morally plausible and potentially compelling. This argument implies a restrictive answer to our questions (2b) and (2c): the use of force in order to achieve sovereignty is legitimate only in the cases of self-defense and redress. Of course, there is a whole lot of work to be done specifying against whom force may legitimately be used, and how much damage may be done to how many. It establishes a typical remedial right, acceptable from a liberal standpoint. (See the discussion in Kukathas and Poole 2000, also Buchanan 1991. For past injustices see Waldron 1992).

(3) The Argument From Equality. Members of a minority group are often disadvantaged in relation to a dominant culture because they have to rely on those with the same language and culture to conduct the affairs of daily life. Since freedom to conduct one's daily life is a primary good, and it is difficult to change or give up reliance upon one's minority culture to attain that good, this reliance can lead to certain inequalities if special measures are not taken. Spontaneous nation-building by the majority has to be moderated. Therefore, liberal neutrality itself requires that the majority provide certain basic cultural goods, i.e., granting differential rights. (See Kymlicka 1995b, 2001 and 2003.) Institutional protections and the right to the minority group's own institutional structure are remedies that restore equality and turn the resulting nation-state into a more moderate multicultural one. (See Kymlicka 2001, 2003.) (We note an interesting recent proposal by Robert E. Goodin (2006), who distinguishes two motivations for multiculturalism and two possible resultant kinds: polyglot multiculturalism and protective multiculturalism. The latter is of Kymlicka's cast, focused upon protecting the interests of the minority from disregard by the majority; the former is inspired by ideals of diversity and the value of variety, the availabity of which in a given country “expands the choice set of autonomous agents” (2006, 290).)

(4) The Argument From Success. The nation-state has in the past succeeded in promoting equality and democracy. As Craig Calhoun writes in his recent book, “(…) imagining democracy requires thinking of ”the people“ as active and coherent and oneself as both a member and an agent. Liberalism informs the notion of individual agency, but provides weak purchase at best on membership and on the collective cohesion and capacity of the demos. In the modern era, the discursive formation that has most influentially underwritten these dimensions of democracy is nationalism” (2007, 147). Ethno-national solidarity is a powerful motive for a more egalitarian distribution of goods (Miller 1995, Canovan 1996, 2000). The nation-state also seems to be essential to safeguard the moral life of communities in the future, since it is the only form of political institution capable of protecting communities from the threats of globalization and assimilationism. (For a detailed critical discussion of this argument see Mason 1999.) Calhoun himself is acutely aware of the limitations of his praise of nationalism, mentioning some on the same page as that from which we quoted above.

A much more deflating view of the nation-state’s success was recently offered by A. Roshwald in his (2006) book, which cited the paradoxical and contradictory nature of nationalist claims. To quote a fine summary given by A. Smith:

For Roshwald, nationalism is at once ancient and very modern; it employs twin conceptions of time, cyclical and linear; it seeks self-determination while manifesting a sense of victimhood; it insists on the nation's particularity of chosenness while claiming a universal mission; and finally, it reveals a symbiosis of kindred and mingled blood, of ethnic and civic nationhood. Through these antinomies, nationalism is constantly able to renew itself and adapt to different situations …. (Smith 2008b, 638)

Pro-capitalists might derive an even more problematic kind of appeal to success from the theory of Liah Greenfeld, according to whom “the factor responsible for the reorientation of economic activity toward growth is nationalism”, and “the unprecedented position of the economic sphere in the modern consciousness is a product of the dynamics of American society, in turn shaped by the singular characteristics of American nationalism” (2001, 1). Greenfeld herself is very critical of nationalism, but someone might contemplate incorporating her theory (cleansed of her critical attitude) into a defense of nationalism.

These political arguments can be combined with deep communitarian ones. However, taken in isolation, their perspective offers a “liberal culturalism” that is more suitable for ethno-culturally plural societies. More remote from classical nationalism than the liberal nationalism of Tamir and Nielsen, it eschews any communitarian philosophical underpinning (see the detailed presentation and defense in Kymlicka 2001; his recent, truly encyclopedic work (2007) that still occasionally calls such culturalism ‘nationalist’; a short summary in Kymlicka 2003; and Gans 2003). The idea of moderate nation-building points to an open multi-culturalism, in which every group receives its share of remedial rights but, instead of walling itself off from others, participates in a common, overlapping civic culture and in open communication with other sub-communities. Given the variety of pluralistic societies and intensity of trans-national interactions, such openness seems to many to be the only guarantee of stable social and political life (see the debate in Shapiro and Kymlicka 1997). Openness is important to avoid the trap Margaret Canovan calls “the paradox of the prowling cats” (2001). She warns that “new nationalist theories inadvertently contain perverse incentives to do the exact opposite of what theorists intend to authorize”. The only solution seems to be extreme moderation. The dialectics of moderating nationalist claims in the context of pluralistic societies might thus lead to a stance respectful of cultural differences, but liberal and potentially cosmopolitan in its ultimate goals.

The liberal nationalist stance is mild and civil, and there is much to be said in favor of it. It tries to reconcile our intuitions in favor of some sort of political protection of cultural communities with a liberal political morality. Of course, this raises issues of compatibility between liberal universal principles and the particular attachments to one's ethno-cultural nation. Very liberal nationalists such as Tamir divorce ethno-cultural nationhood from statehood. Also, the kind of love for country they suggest is tempered by all kinds of universalist considerations, which in the last instance trump national interest (Tamir 1993, 115; see also Moore 2001 and Gans 2003). There is an ongoing debate among philosophical nationalists about how much weakening and compromising is still compatible with a stance's being nationalist at all. (For example, Canovan 1996 (ch. 10) presents Tamir as having abandoned the ideal of ‘nation-state’, and thereby nationhood as such; Seymour (1999) criticizes Taylor and Kymlicka for turning their backs on genuine nationalist programs, and proposing multiculturalism instead of nationalism.) There is also a streak of cosmopolitan interest present in the work of some liberal nationalists (Nielsen 1998/9). For a more sociological approach to the dialectic of the global and the ethno-national, see the Introduction to Delanty and Kumar 2006 and Delanty's contribution to that volume.

In recent years issues of nationalism have been increasingly integrated into the debate about the international order (see the entries on globalization and cosmopolitanism). The main conceptual link is the claim that nation-states are natural, stable and suitable units of the international order. It is underpinned by the assumption that to each nation-state corresponds a “people”, a culturally homogenous population whose members are prone to solidarity with their compatriots. Central to the recent debate is the view set out in John Rawls' “Law of Peoples” (1999), which ascribes a great deal of political promise and a high moral value to the international system composed of liberal and decent nation-states. More cosmopolitan critics of Rawls argue against such a high status for nation-states and criticize the assumption of homogenous “peoples” (Pogge 2001, 2002; O'Neil 2000; Nussbaum 2002 (Other Internet Resources), Barry, 1999). A related debate concerns the role of minorities in the processes of globalization (see Kaldor, 2004). Philosophers’ interest in the morality of the international order has generated interesting proposals about alternative sub-national and supra-national units, which could play a role distinct from that of nation-states and might even come to supplement them (for a fine summary see Held 2003, and for an interesting recent overview of alternatives see Walzer 2004, chapter 12). Moreover, the two approaches might ultimately converge: a multiculturalist liberal nationalism and a moderate, difference-respecting cosmopolitanism have a lot in common. One investigation in this direction has been undertaken by Kok-Chor Tan (2004, see in particular ch. 5). However, he is quite skeptical about the convergence in his later 2011 paper (see also his 2012 book).

3.4 Nation-state in global context

Let me start by briefly returning to the recent debates on territory and nation and then pass to issues of global justice. Liberal nationalists (Miller 2000, 2007; Gans 2003; Meissels 2009) try to preserve the traditional nationalist link between ethnic “ownership” of the state and sovereignty and territorial control, but in a much more flexible and sophisticated setting. Tamar Meissels thus argues in favor of “taking existing national settlements into account as a central factor in demarcating territorial boundaries” since this line “ has both liberal foundations” (i.e., in the work of John Locke) and liberal-national appeal (2009, 159) grounded in its affinity with the liberal doctrine of national self-determination. She combines it with Chaim Gans' interpretation of ‘historical right’ claims as ‘the right to formative territories’ (Gans 2003, Ch. 4). She thus combines “historical arguments, understood as claims to formative territories”, with her argument from settlement and insists on their interplay and mutual reinforcement, presenting them as being “most closely related to, and based on, liberal nationalist assumptions and underlying ideas” (Meissels 2009, 160). She nevertheless stresses that more than one ethnic group can have formative ties to a given territory, and that there might be competing claims based on settlement. (Yack (2012, 203ff) starts from the same point to derive much more pessimistic conclusions.)

But, given the ethno-national conflicts of the twentieth century, one can safely assume that culturally plural states divided into isolated and closed sub-communities glued together merely by arrangements of modus vivendi are inherently unstable. Stability might therefore require that the pluralist society envisioned by liberal culturalists promote quite intense intra-state interaction between cultural groups in order to forestall mistrust, reduce prejudice, and create a solid basis for cohabitation.

On the opposite end of the spectrum, more cosmopolitan authors (Buchanan 2003, Waldron 2005, Other Internet Resources) also point to the fact of multiple settlements in roughly the same territory and to the importance of the proximity of various ethno-cultural groups. They stress internal cultural pluralism: for reasons of peace and security, state borders should bring together distinct cultural groups (typically ethno-national ones), and they in fact most often do so. Combining the cultural motivation to foster open multiculturalism and Waldron's security-based motivation to structure states for the purpose of resolving conflicts and establishing justice, forming a state becomes a duty we owe to anyone with whom we are likely to come into endemic conflict. (Waldron 2005, Other Internet Resources).

But where should one stop? The question arises since there are a lot of geographically open, interacting territories of various sizes. Consider first the geographical openness of big continental planes, then add the modern ease of interaction (“No island is an island any more”, one could say), and, finally and dramatically, the substantial ecological interconnectedness of land and climate. The cosmopolitan logic regarding the interests of peace and security therefore suggests joining together bigger and bigger units in a kind of recursive scheme. For instance, the EU was created to secure lasting peace, and other supra-statal and macro-regional might follow its lead. Ultimately, the combination of ethno-cultural and security-focused considerations might thus point in a clearly cosmopolitan direction when formulating and resolving dilemmas about matters of territory. This brings us to the wider issue concerning cosmopolitanism.

What are the obligations of nations and nation-states towards neighbors, and even more distant Others? This issue is regaining prominence in recent debates on nationalism. (Again, see the entries on globalization and cosmopolitanism.) It encompasses a range of sub-topics: national responsibility to non-nationals, reparations and distributive justice beyond the state, individual states’ obligations with regard to global ecological problems like waste and climate change, and finally, immigration and responsibilities of nation-states towards potential immigrants.

Since the present entry is on nationalism, we stress the pro-national accounts, taking Miller (2007, 2013) as our paradigm. In principle one might think of intermediate positions falling between two extremes: on one extreme, completely closed nation-states, like in Fichte's early nineteenth century utopia of Closed commercial state; on the other, completely opened borders, like in the arrangement proposed by Joseph Carens (2013). However, the tough nationalistic line is no longer proposed seriously in ethical debates, so the furthest pro-national extreme is in fact a relatively moderate stance, exemplified by Miller in the works listed. Here is a typical proposal of his concerning global justice based on nation states:

It might become a matter of national pride to have set aside a certain percentage of GDP for developmental goals – perhaps for projects in one particular country or group of countries … . (2013, 182)

A similar proposal might work for the reduction of the emission of greenhouse gasses, he continues. It is a challenging idea, and a critic might ask how it would fare under normal circumstances. Imagine the proposal is accepted by leading industrial countries, and each chooses its beneficiaries. Suppose a benefactor state B1 adopts a beneficiary state C1 and proceeds to deliver aid. What if a political faction in C1 that is hostile to B1 pushes its co-nationals to turn to some other benefactor? Would B1 allow opponent factions in C1 to act freely, or would it “gently” intervene (in a situation where there is no global regulatory power)? Similarly, if B1 needed international support in its dealings with some other powerful country B2, it would certainly count on C1 to give it. This arrangement is beginning to look somewhat colonial. (Even worse things might happen in a situation of economic crisis: if B1 has been feeding C1 for ten years, during a crisis it might become greedy for C1's resources; what would prevent it from blackmailing C1?)

So much for issues of aid. On the opposite extreme one finds strong cosmopolitans, like Thomas Pogge, who blame the global order for injustices committed against the poor and recommend a considerable redistribution of goods as a remedy to restore justice. In between we find authors like Mathias Risse (2013), who proposes a highly structured conception of justice that preserves the statist order of international politics but accepts common ownership of the Earth and places considerable duties on states: inequalities are allowed, but only if all inhabitants of the Earth have enough to satisfy their basic needs.

Miller has also put forward the most thoughtful pro-nationalist proposal concerning immigration. His proposal allows refugees to seek asylum temporarily until the situation in their country of origin improves; it also limits economic migration. Miller argues against the defensibility of a global standard for equality, opportunity, welfare, etc., because measures of just equality are context-bound. People do have the right to a minimum standard of living, but the right to migrate only activates as a last resort after all other measures within a candidate-migrant’s country of origin have been tried.

As mentioned, the opposite extreme is occupied by those like Joseph Carens (2013) who defend completely open borders. Many recent views seem to converge to the middle ground. There, we find proposals like those of Thomas Christiano (2012), Mathias Risse (2013) and Michael Blake (2013). Christiano, for example, proposes working from the relatively just system of existing norms that oblige cooperation between states. He thinks that the right way to proceed is to negotiate consensus agreements satisfying individual beneficiary and benefactor states as well as international legal norms. A poor state might send a number of workers to a rich state on a temporary basis; these workers would then return to their country of origin to foster development. International law would provide a framework of legitimacy, and negotiations between states would provide concrete, and hopefully just, solutions.

4. Conclusion

The philosophy of nationalism nowadays does not concern itself much with the aggressive and dangerous form of invidious nationalism that often occupies center stage in the news and in sociological research. Although this pernicious form can be of significant instrumental value in mobilizing oppressed people and restoring their sense of dignity, its moral costs are usually taken by philosophers to outweigh its benefits. Nationalist philosophers distance themselves from such aggressive forms of nationalism and mainly seek to construct and defend very moderate versions; these have therefore come to be the main focus of recent philosophical debate.

The debate carries an interesting methodological message overlooked in the literature. Authors defending the importance of ethno-national and cultural considerations standardly point to their enormous practical impact, and underlying factual, social and historical factors. It is no wonder that the prominent pro-nationalist thinker D. Miller insists on the importance of social and historical facts for political philosophy and moral decisions (2013, chapters 1 and 2). Indeed, when drawing from the usual resources for theorizing in political philosophy — principles, facts (including presumed facts), and intuitions from thought experiments — cosmopolitan authors typically stress the importance of principles, while pro-nationalists stress that of facts. Miller’s demand for “attention to factual presuppositions of our principles” (2013, 26) is characteristic of pro-nationalist methodology.

In presenting the claims that nationalists defend, we have proceeded from the more radical towards more liberal nationalist alternatives. In examining the arguments for these claims, we have presented metaphysically demanding communitarian arguments resting upon deep communitarian assumptions about culture, such as the premise that the ethno-cultural nation is the most important community for all individuals. This is an interesting and respectable claim, but its plausibility has not yet been established. The moral debate about nationalism has resulted in various weakenings of culture-based arguments, proposed by liberal nationalists, which render the arguments less ambitious but much more plausible. Having abandoned the old nationalist ideal of a state owned by a single dominant ethno-cultural group, liberal nationalists have become receptive to the idea that identification with a plurality of cultures and communities is important for a person's social identity. They have equally become sensitive to trans-national issues and more willing to embrace a partly cosmopolitan perspective.

Liberal nationalism has also brought to the fore more modest, less philosophically or metaphysically charged arguments grounded in concerns about justice. These stress the practical importance of ethno-cultural membership, ethno-cultural groups’ rights to have injustices redressed, democratic rights of political association, and the role that ethno-cultural ties and associations can play in promoting just social arrangements. Liberal culturalists such as Kymlicka have proposed minimal and pluralistic versions of nationalism built around such arguments. In these minimal versions, the project of building classical nation-states is tempered or abandoned and replaced by a more sensitive form of national identity that can thrive in a multicultural society. This new project, however, might demand a further widening of our moral perspectives. The twentieth century has taught us that culturally-plural states divided into isolated and closed sub-communities glued together only by arrangements of mere modus vivendi are inherently unstable. Stability might therefore require that the plural society envisioned by liberal culturalists promote quite intense interaction between cultural groups in order to forestall mistrust, reduce prejudice and create a solid basis for cohabitation. On the other hand, as noted above in connection with issues of territorial justice, once membership in multiple cultures and communities is legitimized, social groups will spread beyond the borders of a single state (e.g., groups bound by religious or racial ties), thus creating an opening for at least a minimal cosmopolitan perspective. The internal dialectic driven by concern for ethno-cultural identity might in this way lead to pluralistic and potentially cosmopolitan political arrangements that are rather distant from what was classically understood as nationalism.

Bibliography

The Beginner's Guide to the Literature

This is a short list of books on nationalism that are readable and useful introductions to the literature. First, two contemporary classics of social science with opposing views are:

  • Gellner, E., 1983, Nations and Nationalism, Oxford: Blackwell.
  • Smith, A. D., 1991, National Identity, Harmondsworth: Penguin.

Two short and readable introductions are:

  • Özkirimli, U., 2010, Theories of Nationalism, London: Palgrave Macmillan.
  • Spencer, P. and Wollman, H., 2002, Nationalism, A Critical Introduction, London: Sage.

The two best recent anthologies of high-quality philosophical papers on the morality of nationalism are:

  • McKim, R. and McMahan, J. (eds), 1997, The Morality of Nationalism, Oxford: Oxford University Press.
  • Couture, J., Nielsen, K. and Seymour, M. (eds.), 1998, Rethinking Nationalism, Canadian Journal of Philosophy, Suplement Volume 22.

The debate continues in:

  • Miscevic, N. (ed), 2000, Nationalism and Ethnic Conflict. Philosophical Perspectives. La Salle and Chicago: Open Court.
  • Dieckoff, A. (ed.), 2004, The Politics of Belonging: Nationalism, Liberalism, and Pluralism, Lanham: Lexington.
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  • Breen, K. and O'Neill, S. (eds.), 2010, After the Nation? Critical Reflections on Nationalism and Postnationalism, London: Palgrave Macmillan.

A good brief sociological introduction to nationalism in general is:

  • Crosby, S.E., 2005, Nationalism: A Very Short Introduction, Oxford: Oxford University Press.

and to the gender-inspired criticism of nationalism is:

  • Yuval-Davis, N., 1997, Gender & Nation, London: Sage Publications.

and more recently:

  • Heur, J., 2008, “Gender and Nationalism,” in Herb and Kaplan 2008.
  • Hogan, J., 2009, Gender, Race and nation, London: Routledge.

The best general introduction to the communitarian-individualist debate is still:

  • Avineri, Shlomo and de-Shalit, Avner (eds.), 1992, Communitarianism and Individualism, Oxford: Oxford University Press.

For a non-nationalist defense of culturalist claims see:

  • Kymlicka, W. (ed.), 1995, The Rights of Minority Cultures, Oxford: Oxford University Press.

Three very readable philosophical defenses of very moderate nationalism are:

  • Miller, D., 1995, On Nationality, Oxford: Oxford University Press.
  • Tamir, Y., 1993, Liberal Nationalism, Press, Princeton, NJ: Princeton University Press.
  • Gans, C., 2003, The Limits of Nationalism, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.

A polemical, witty and thoughtful critique is offered in:

  • Barry, B., 2001, Culture and Equality, Cambridge: Polity Press.

Interesting critical analyses of group solidarity in general and nationalism in particular, written in the traditions of rational choice theory and motivation analysis, are:

  • Hardin, R., 1985, One for All, The Logic of Group Conflict, Princeton, NJ: Princeton University Press.
  • Yack, B., 2012, Nationalism and the Moral Psychology of Community, Chicago: University of Chicago Press.

There is a wide offering of interesting sociological and political science work on nationalism, which is beginning to be summarized in:

  • Motyl, A. (ed.) 2001, Encyclopedia of Nationalism, Volumes I and II, New York: Academic Press.

A recent encyclopedic overview is:

  • Herb, G.H. and D.H. Kaplan (2008), Nations and Nationalism: a Global Historical Overview, four volumes, Santa Barbara, CA: ABC Clio.

A detailed sociological study of life under nationalist rule is:

  • Billig, M., 1995, Banal Nationalism, London: Sage Publications.

The most readable short anthology of brief papers for and against cosmopolitanism (and nationalism) by leading authors in the field is:

  • Cohen, J. (ed.), 1996, Martha Nussbaum and respondents, For Love of Country: Debating the Limits of Patriotism, Boston: Beacon Press

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