Global Justice

First published Fri Mar 6, 2015

On common accounts, we have a state of justice when everyone has their due. The study of justice has been concerned with what we owe one another, what obligations we might have to treat each other fairly in a range of domains, including over distributive and recognitional matters. Contemporary political philosophers had focused their theorizing about justice almost exclusively within the state, but the last twenty years or so has seen a marked extension to the global sphere, with a huge expansion in the array of topics covered. While some, such as matters of just conduct in war, have long been of concern, others are more recent and arise especially in the context of contemporary phenomena like intensified globalization, economic integration and potentially catastrophic anthropogenic climate change.

John Rawls’s Law of Peoples was an especially important work and greatly stimulated thinking about different models of global justice (Rawls 1999). Several questions soon became prominent in discussions including: What principles should guide international action? What responsibilities do we have to the global poor? Should global inequality be morally troubling? Are there types of non-liberal people who should be tolerated? What kind of foreign policy is consistent with liberal values? Is a “realistic utopia” possible in the global domain? How might we transition effectively towards a less unjust world?

Contemporary events also played an enormous role in prompting philosophical inquiries. Prominent cases of genocide, ethnic cleansing, forms of terrorism uncommon prior to 2001, intensified interest in immigration to affluent developed countries, increased dependence on the labor of those from poor developing countries, and enormous threats to well-being, security and the environment became common catalysts for further work. Philosophers began to reflect on questions such as: Is it ever permissible to engage in coercive military action for humanitarian purposes, such as to halt genocide or prevent large-scale violations of human rights? Can terrorism ever be justified? Should affluent developed countries open their borders more generously than they currently do to those from poor developing countries who would like to immigrate to them? Are our current global economic arrangements fair ones and if not, how should they be transformed? What responsibilities do we have to one another in a globalized, post-Westphalian world order? How should we allocate responsibilities for reducing global injustice in our world, such as in the case of distributing costs associated with addressing climate change?

Increased interest concerning issues of global justice has also coincided with enhanced interest in the place and value of nationalism. These explorations also track contemporary events such as nationalist clashes which have spilled over into widespread suffering (notably in the former Yugoslavia and Rwanda), increased calls for national self-determination to carry considerable weight, such as in state recognition for Palestinians or Tibetans, and also in the case of secession (prominently, Quebec). In this area global justice theorists have been concerned with a range of important questions such as: Under what conditions should claims to national self-determination be granted substantial weight? When should self-determination yield to concern for protecting human rights? Are commitments to nationalism and global justice compatible? Is genuine democracy only possible at the state level or are there robust forms of democracy that are possible in more international fora? How are ideals of democracy best incorporated into defensible global institutional arrangements? Is world justice possible without a world state?

The primary purpose of this article is to give an orientation to the enormous and rapidly expanding field of global justice. There are several entries in this encyclopedia that already cover some of the core topics well and these will be cross-referenced. But there are still many important gaps, along with some missing context as to how some topics fits together. This entry aims primarily to address these needs.

1. Some Definitional Issues

1.1 Global and International Justice

A distinction is often drawn between global and international justice. The key point of difference between these two notions involves clarifying the entities among which justice is sought. In international justice the nation or state is taken as the central entity of concern and justice among nations or states is the focus. In the domain of global justice, by contrast, theorists do not seek primarily to define justice between states or nations. Rather they drill down through the state shell and inquire about what justice among human beings consists in. Global justice inquiries take individual human beings as of primary concern and seek to give an account of what fairness among such agents involves. There are a range of actions that cut across states or involve different agents, relationships, and structures that might be invisible in an inquiry seeking justice among states exclusively. Many different kinds of interactions are not circumscribed by state membership and yet can importantly affect human beings’ most fundamental interests, so asking the question about what individual human beings owe one another often uncovers significant neglected features of relationships and structures that are of normative concern. Global justice analyses are not precluded from yielding state-level obligations; indeed, they typically do. However, they consider a wider array of possible agents and organizations that might have duties as well.

There are advantages associated with both types of inquiries. An important advantage of asking what states owe one another is that much international law presupposes the states system and requires states to perform various actions to promote justice. In this way, responsibilities often appear to be clearly allocated to particular parties thus making it quite precise who ought to do what in our actual world. One advantage of global justice inquiries is that we are not forced to take states as a fixed constraint and we can therefore consider a range of relevant relationships, capacities and roles that also structure our interactions and might be relevant to how we ought to conceptualize global responsibilities. While asking about what individuals owe each other may well have implications for states and their obligations, a range of other agents and institutions may also have relevant justice obligations. These responsibilities can become more visible when we explore what individuals owe each other. The two approaches have different strengths and can complement each other, but in contemporary debate they are often taken as rivals competing to provide the most plausible framework.

Since there is already an entry in this encyclopedia that focuses on international justice (see the entry on international distributive justice), this entry will focus on the area of global justice.

1.2 What is a Theory of Global Justice?

In general, a theory of global justice aims to give us an account of what justice on a global scale consists in and this often includes discussion of the following components:

  1. identifying what should count as important problems of global justice
  2. positing solutions to each identified problem
  3. identifying who might have responsibilities in addressing the identified problem
  4. arguing for positions about what particular agents (or collections of agents) ought to do in connection with solving each problem and
  5. providing a normative view which grounds (1)–(4).

Theories of global justice aim to help us understand our world better and what our responsibilities are in it. While some theorists aim purely at theoretical understanding, others hope also to provide an analysis that can be useful in practical policy making concerning global justice matters.

1.3 When is a Problem a Global Justice Problem?

A problem is often considered to constitute a global justice problem when one (or more) of the following conditions obtain:

  1. Actions stemming from an agent, institution, practice, activity (and so on) that can be traced to one (or more) states negatively affects residents in another state.
  2. Institutions, practices, policies, activities (and so on) in one (or more) states could bring about a benefit or reduction in harm to those resident in another state.
  3. There are normative considerations that require agents in one state to take certain actions with respect to agents or entities in another. Such actions might be mediated through institutions, policies, or norms.
  4. We cannot solve a problem that affects residents of one or more states without co-operation from other states.

So, in general, a problem is one of global justice when the problem either affects agents resident in more than one state or the problem is unresolvable without their co-operation. For the problem to be considered genuinely global rather than regional it should affect more than one regional area.

2. Principles to Guide Behavior in International and Global Matters

What sorts of duties of justice, if any, exist among human beings who do not reside in the same country? If there are such duties, what grounds them? Some argue that John Rawls’s principles developed for the case of domestic justice, notably, the Fair Equality of Opportunity Principle or the Difference Principle, should apply globally (Caney 2005, Moellendorf 2002). Others maintain that the content of our duties to one another is best explored by examining alternative concepts not featured in the Rawlsian corpus, such as capabilities or human rights (Nussbaum 2006, Pogge 2008).

Much discussion about what we owe one another in the global context is influenced by the work of John Rawls, so a short synopsis is needed to situate debates. Since discussion of these issues is amply covered in the entries on international distributive justice and on John Rawls, this will be a compressed summary focusing only on the most central aspects of the debate that have a bearing on core topics of global justice.

2.1 The Influence of Rawls’s Law of Peoples

In The Law of Peoples, John Rawls argues for eight principles that he believes should regulate international interactions of peoples. For Rawls, a “people” is constituted by a group of persons who have in common sufficient characteristics such as culture, history, tradition, or sentiment. Rawls uses the term “people” in ways that relevantly correspond with how many use the term “nation”. In addition, Rawls often assumes that, for the most part, each people has a state.

The eight principles Rawls endorses acknowledge peoples’ independence and equality, that peoples have the right to self-determination along with having duties of non-intervention, that they ought to observe treaties, honor a particular list of human rights, should conduct themselves in certain appropriate ways if they engage in warfare, and that they have duties to assist other peoples in establishing institutions to enable people’s self-determination. He also advocates for international institutions governing trade, borrowing, and other international matters that are characteristically dealt with by the United Nations.

Several claims have been the subject of much debate between critics and defenders of Rawls’s position. In particular, Rawls believes that so long as all peoples have a set of institutions that enable citizens to lead decent lives, any global inequality that might remain is not morally troubling. Critics draw attention to the ways in which global inequality—perhaps in levels of power or affluence—can convert into opportunities for deprivation and disadvantage. For instance, the global advantaged can use their superior position to influence the rules that govern international institutions—such as trade practices—which can facilitate further opportunities for increased advantage and so they can indeed threaten the abilities of others in distant lands to lead decent lives (Pogge 2008).[1]

Another important issue that underlies debate between Rawls and his critics concerns different views about the nature and origins of prosperity. Rawls gives a particularly strong statement of what he takes the causes of prosperity to be. He claims that the causes of the wealth of a people can be traced to the domestic political culture, the virtues and vices of leaders, and the quality of domestic institutions. He says:

I believe that the causes of the wealth of a people and the forms it takes lie in their political culture and in the religious, philosophical, and moral traditions that support the basic structure of their political and social institutions, as well as in the industriousness and cooperative talents of its members … The crucial elements that make the difference are the political culture, the political virtues and civic society of the country (Rawls 1999, p. 108).

Critics observe that in addition to local factors there are also international ones which play an important role in prospects for well-being. Thomas Pogge prominently helps bring some of these into view. International institutions, such as the International Borrowing and Resource Privileges, are good examples of the ways in which international institutions can have profound effects on domestic factors which undeniably also play a role in promoting prosperity. According to the international borrowing privilege, governments may borrow amounts of money on behalf of the country and the country thereby incurs an obligation to repay the debt. The international resource privilege refers to a government’s ability to do what it likes with resources, including sell them to whomsoever it chooses to and at what price. Any group that exercises effective power in a state is internationally recognized as the legitimate government of that territory and enjoys the two privileges. But, Pogge argues, this sets up undesirable incentives that hamper developing countries’ abilities to flourish. These include incentivizing those strongly motivated to hold office for material gain to take power by force or exercise it in oppressive ways that help reinforce oppressive governments’ abilities to retain control. The global advantaged benefit greatly from these privileges and so have little incentive to reform them. But, according to Pogge, reforms are sorely needed. If only sufficiently legitimate governments are able to enjoy these privileges, the international community would remove one important obstacle developing countries currently face.

Defenders of Rawls’s views argue that his position is more complex than is commonly acknowledged and allows for both a principled stance on some fundamental values along with appropriate openness to alternative ways in which legitimate and decent peoples might organize their collective lives (Reidy 2004, Freeman 2006). They argue that Rawls’s position shows great sensitivity to a number of factors that must be weighed in considering right conduct in international affairs. For instance, when Rawls makes his bold claims about the causes of wealth it is useful to bear in mind the context in which he is arguing. Against an assumption that resources are enormously important for a society’s ability to flourish, Rawls emphasizes the importance of strong institutions, political culture and other local factors, in sustaining decent lives for citizens. Rawls also reflects on the difficulty of changing political culture, noting that simply transferring resources will not help. Interestingly, in a little discussed passage, Rawls ventures that an “emphasis on human rights may work to change ineffective regimes and the conduct of rulers who have been callous about the well-being of their own people” (Rawls 1999, p. 109). For more on whether Rawls provides us with a cogent model that can provide sage guidance in international matters see the entry on international distributive justice and the entry on John Rawls. See also Martin and Reidy (2006). For the purposes of this entry we need only summarize some key questions that were influential in setting the terms of discussion about global justice for some time.

Some key questions are:

  1. What principles should govern interactions among peoples at the global level?
  2. What are the causes of prosperity and are they traceable entirely to domestic factors or are international considerations relevant?
  3. What should count as the kind of prosperity or well-being that we are aiming to promote?
  4. Do we have an obligation to ensure people have their basic needs met and can otherwise lead “decent” lives, or should we be more concerned with global socio-economic equality?
  5. What duties do we have to those peoples who do not yet have what they need for self-determination or prosperity?
  6. If human rights serve an important role in world affairs, which rights should be on our list of those to endorse? What duties arise from such commitment?
  7. Can we properly hold nations to be entirely responsible for the well-being of their people and if so, in what kinds of conditions might this make sense? How do we encourage nations to take responsibility for their people’s well-being?
  8. When we consider what we owe one another, do compatriots deserve special consideration?

I trace some of the influential positions that have shaped answers to these questions next.

2.2 What Global Duties Do We Have?

One of the most visible and large-scale contemporary global justice problems we face is that of global poverty. What ought we to do for the 1 billion or so people who currently live in poverty? (This is a huge area nicely canvassed in the entry on international distributive justice.) A few seminal arguments deserve mention here as well, however. In a classic argument Peter Singer describes a so-called easy rescue case in which an infant is drowning in a shallow pond. You happen by and can save the child with minimal effort and inconvenience on your part. Singer argues that you would be obligated to assist using the principle that when it is in our power to prevent something bad from happening without sacrificing anything comparable, it is wrong not to prevent the bad from occurring. Reflecting on this principle Singer argues that it entails extensive duties to assist needy others, whether they be geographically proximate or not. We have extensive duties to assist the global poor who, with equally minimal effort on our part, can be saved from dire circumstances, since the same principle applies in both cases (Singer 1972, and for more treatment Unger 1996).

Another enormously influential contribution is that of Thomas Pogge who argues that since developed countries impose a coercive global order on the poor that foreseeably and avoidably causes great harm, they have important responsibilities to reform the global order such that it ceases to do so and instead better secures human rights (Pogge 2002, 2008, 2010). We harm the global poor when we collaborate in imposing an unjust global institutional order on them and, moreover, that order is unjust when it foreseeably perpetuates large-scale human rights deficits that can reasonably be avoided were we to make quite feasible institutional modifications (Pogge 2002, 2008, 2010). While Singer emphasizes our capacity to assist with need satisfaction, Pogge emphasizes instead our contributions to the problem as grounding our duties.

When discussing our duties to one another there is also vigorous debate about what the content and target of our duties should be, along with discussion about what are the best ways to discharge these. Traditional dominant economic approaches to promoting prosperity have focused on raising income levels or increasing Gross Domestic Product (GDP). Railing against such approaches, Amartya Sen suggested that the capabilities approach provides an improved measure of well-being and constitutes a better way to capture changes in people’s condition over time (Sen 1980). Exploring what people are able to do and be provides a more appropriate standard by which to evaluate whether their condition has improved rather than focusing exclusively on their incomes or per capita GDP. Martha Nussbaum develops this approach and argues for a list of ten capabilities that should be secured for all people in all places. This universal list can provide an important tool in persuading governments to make reforms conducive to their citizens’ flourishing. (See the entry on the capability approach for more.) What constitutes well-being and the best ways to measure it is an enormous topic both in Philosophy and in adjacent disciplines. For a good introduction see the entry well-being. Another important discourse for discussing these topics is that of human rights which is discussed in Section 2.4 below.

2.3 Cosmopolitanism, Duties to Non-Compatriots, and Compatriots

When considering what we owe one another, are compatriots special? Do we have the same duties to non-compatriots as we have to compatriots or is there some principled way in which these two sets of duties ought to differ?

Nationalists argue that we belong to national communities and any account of our global responsibilities that ignores this omits an important aspect of how we relate—and ought to relate—to one another. They argue that nations can provide a valuable grounding for social attachment, identity and meaning in life, and can ground special obligations to strengthen national life and assist co-nationals. Others defend the value of nationalism on instrumental grounds; there is nothing inherently special about our co-national relationships but state boundaries are useful in assigning important duties to particular agents (Goodin 1998). In a world of great unmet need, paying special attention to one’s co-nationals can be justified (Goodin 1998).[2]

In the words of Diogenes, widely credited as the first person to propound cosmopolitan views, cosmopolitans see themselves as “citizens of the world”. Contemporary cosmopolitans typically hold that every human being has standing as an ultimate unit of moral concern and is entitled to equal consideration of her interests no matter what other affiliations, especially national affiliations, she might have. Drawing on the idea that we all have equal moral worth, cosmopolitans seek to broaden our moral horizons so that we do not forget about the responsibilities we have to others beyond state borders, even when we have local responsibilities as well.

There are two particularly prominent contemporary accounts of cosmopolitanism. Martha Nussbaum emphasizes that, as human beings, we belong to a global community of human persons (Nussbaum 1996). Nussbaum argues that while love for one’s country might have a legitimate place in people’s conceptions of a good life, we should not overlook the many other relationships we are in which connect us to others in the world. We need to draw the global community in closer to the local one, and, more generally, aim to see ourselves as members of overlapping communities which also have important claims on us.

Thomas Pogge offers an enormously influential account that focuses on the implications of cosmopolitanism for the global institutional order. We need to ensure that global institutional structures give equal consideration to everyone’s interests. He says, “Insofar as human agents are involved in the design or administration of global rules, practices, or organizations, they ought to disregard their private and local, including national, commitments and loyalties to give equal consideration to the needs and interests of every human being on this planet” (Pogge 2013, 298). This equal-consideration-of-interests requirement only applies to such contexts. While such impartiality norms are perfectly familiar within the state, for instance, when judges operate in law courts, we have yet to realize the requirement at the global level.

It is often assumed that cosmopolitanism must necessarily be in tension with more local attachments to friends, family or compatriots. Some cosmopolitans believe such conflict is inevitable and a necessary part of understanding what cosmopolitanism entails but that this implication is unproblematic (Ypi 2013). Others argue for different ways in which the apparent tensions could be resolved (Pogge 2013, Tan 2004). As we see above, Pogge emphasizes the clear separation of spheres in which equal consideration of people’s interests applies. Kok-Chor Tan also offers a similar argument. His strategy is to show that cosmopolitan principles should govern global institutional structures that ensure people are treated as equals in their entitlements (Tan 2004). When this is the case there can be a legitimate role for patriotism that operates within such constraints. Partiality to co-nationals need not conflict with cosmopolitan obligations. Another notable strategy is to argue that we cannot achieve justice at a national level unless we attend to justice at a global level. On this view, we have at least instrumental reasons to care about global justice, even if we care deeply about social justice in our nation (Banai, Ronzoni and Schemmel 2011, Ronzoni 2013).

There is an important debate among egalitarian theorists about whether our concern with equality should be confined to members of the same state or whether it should extend to all globally. Some theorists argue that careful consideration of notions such as reciprocity, coercion, or fair terms of co-operation mandate that we give special weighting to the interests of compatriots. Others, by contrast, argue that these concerns, when properly understood, point in the direction of equally strong duties to non-compatriots. One form of the argument that we have special duties to compatriots that are not shared with non-compatriots, draws on the coercive legal structure that applies within states and claims that such coercive structures do not apply outside of them (R. Miller 1998, Blake 2001). Another highly influential version claims that there is a difference in the authority to enforce justice within and outside the state (Nagel 2005). There are many important challenges to such positions. One important line of argument maintains that coercion is indeed relevant in triggering duties of egalitarian justice, but since this is rampant at the global level it activates global not just national egalitarian duties (Cohen and Sabel 2006, Abizadeh 2007). In addition, some argue that the same ingredients Nagel identifies as crucial in generating state authority exist at the global level as well (Cohen and Sabel 2006). See the entry on international distributive justice for more on these issues. For comprehensive treatment of nationalism and cosmopolitanism see the entries on nationalism and on cosmopolitanism, respectively.

2.4 Human Rights Fulfillment

Discussion of global justice matters often invokes concern for human rights. In fact, for all their differences, both nationalists and cosmopolitans frequently agree that a good way to think about some of our duties to one another is via human rights. Human rights can and does therefore serve as an important discourse for furthering discussion about our global responsibilities.

Respecting human rights is an important requirement in much international law and can be a key criterion in evaluating whether governments are considered legitimate by the international community. The United Nations Universal Declaration of Human Rights is a highly influential account of all human beings’ basic entitlements and this document often plays an important role in real world debates about justice matters. See the comprehensive entry on human rights for more detail. Here I have space to discuss only two issues that have been prominent in debates about global justice.

The first concerns the kinds of duties we have in relation to human rights. Against a conventional view widespread before 1980, Henry Shue argues that if rights to physical security are basic, so are rights to subsistence (Shue 1980). A careful analysis of the duties associated with human rights indicates that the commonly held distinction between positive and negative duties cannot be maintained. All rights have a range of both positive and negative duties associated with them.

Thomas Pogge offers an enormously influential account of duties with respect to human rights. Our current global order perpetuates global poverty on a massive scale, but since feasible reforms to that order could avert this harm, our failure to make reforms not only implicates us in the misery but also in the violation of the rights of the poor.[3] We therefore have extensive obligations to reform our global order so that the rights of the poor can be fulfilled.

For more treatment of issues, especially concerning what human rights are, which rights are rightly construed as human rights, and how human rights function in international law, see the entry human rights.

3. The Proper Use of Force, Military Intervention, and its Aftermath

3.1 War and Just Conduct

Within the field of global justice, issues concerning war have one of the longest histories. The just war framework has been influential in setting the terms of much debate about the proper use of force in international affairs. Aristotle, Cicero, Augustine and Thomas Aquinas offered some of the earliest accounts of the criteria that should be met for war to be justified. Two areas have been especially thoroughly studied (1) the conditions under which entry into the war is justified (Jus Ad Bellum) and (2) the conditions for fair conduct within the war (Jus In Bello). While having a just cause is standardly held to be a necessary condition for a war to be justified, it is not sufficient. Theorists often disagree about which additional conditions must be satisfied for a war to be characterized as a just war. The most common additional conditions proposed are that the war should be undertaken by a proper authority, with the right intentions, when the war would follow requirements of proportionality (the ends to be secured would warrant going to war), only as a last resort, and when there are reasonable prospects of success. On traditional accounts of just war theory all conditions must be met, but more contemporary theorists challenge whether they are all necessary (Mellow 2006, Moellendorf 2002).

Once the fighting begins two central principles guide evaluation of whether the war is being conducted fairly: one which respects the distinction between combatants and noncombatants (The Principle of Non-Combatant Immunity) and another that governs what counts as the proportional use of force (Proportionality). On the first, it is not legitimate to use force against civilians and, even though some collateral civilian damage may occur, it is wrong to deliberately target non-combatants. On the second, combatants may only use the force necessary to achieve their ends -- the force used must be proportional to the ends that are to be secured in conducting the war. There are further requirements governing fairness, such as requirements to comply with international laws and treat prisoners fairly, but the two featured principles are the most commonly invoked in normative analyses of Jus In Bello.

The third part of just war theory (Jus Post Bellum) concerns how the war concludes and the transition back to a situation of peace. It deals with issues such as compensation, punishment, and reform. More recently a further component has been suggested especially in light of engagements in Iraq and Afghanistan in the years 2001-2011, namely, justice in exiting the war (Jus Ex Bello), which concerns when it is appropriate to end a war (Moellendorf 2008, Rodin 2008).

There are many contemporary global justice issues concerning the appropriate use of force and its aftermath that currently command attention including: Is drone warfare permissible? Can terrorism ever be justified? Are “targeted assassinations” (where leaders who are primarily responsible for decisions to go to war are targeted for assassination) justifiable? May we engage in a war in order to prevent an anticipated “worse war” (as proponents of the “Bush Doctrine” maintain)? Is torture to contain major global threats permissible? Is the attempt to contain nuclear weapons development by those who have them already fraught with hypocrisy? How should we deal best with societies in a state of transitional justice? Is there a place for “Truth and Reconciliation Committees”? When are political apologies for historic injustice in warfare appropriate?

Here we consider very briefly only two further issues that have widespread current interest in the global justice literature: Humanitarian Intervention and Terrorism. See the entry on terrorism for an extended analysis of such questions. See the entry on war for a comprehensive overview of issues concerning justice in war.

3.2 Humanitarian Intervention

Under what conditions, if any, may we engage in military intervention aimed at stopping genocide? In recent years this issue has become salient as large-scale human rights violations and suffering unfolded in Rwanda, the Sudan, the former Yugoslavia, and Libya. Against the traditional understanding that respecting state sovereignty requires non-interference, successful arguments were marshaled that there are important responsibilities to protect the vulnerable (International Commission on Intervention and State Sovereignty 2001). Leaning heavily on the conventional conditions contained in the just war framework, the International Commission on Intervention and State Sovereignty argued that we may engage in war aimed at protecting those who suffer at the hands of governments unwilling or unable to stop large-scale human rights abuses. The commission produced an influential report “The Responsibility to Protect” which was accepted by the United Nations in 2005, and the principles contained in the report have guided decisions about recent cases, such as Libya in 2011 and Syria in 2012.

One frequently voiced concern about humanitarian interventions is whether they are just another form of imperialism. How will interveners be held accountable for their actions? Taking such concerns seriously Allen Buchanan and Robert Keohane advocate for a series of innovative mechanisms of accountability, both before and after the proposed intervention takes place, to allay fears about abuse (Buchanan and Keohane 2004).

3.3 Terrorism

What kinds of violence count as terrorism? Is there a difference between state terrorism and that perpetrated by insurgent organizations? Might terrorism be justified under certain circumstances? Terrorism centrally involves either using or threatening to use violence against people, commonly taken to be innocent, in order to produce results that would not otherwise occur (Coady and O’Keefe 2002, Primoratz 2013). Some challenge that the targets are innocent. As terrorists often point out about citizen complicity in atrocities, citizens pay taxes and vote, and their governments undertake actions that they can be said to sanction and from which they benefit, so it is coherent to hold citizens responsible for their governments’ actions. On this argument, citizens can be legitimate targets of violence. In addition, there is relevant precedent from governments targeting civilians when they perceive the situation to be one of a “supreme emergency”, as happened in the case of Britain targeting German civilians in the Second World War. So when governments judge that some moral disaster is sufficiently likely, it can be repelled using unorthodox and otherwise repugnant means.

4. Global Economic Injustice

Possibly the next most prominent global justice issue after considerations of proper use of force concerns the impact of, and responsibilities created by, globalization. Globalization is a complex phenomenon with many facets. For our purposes we need note only some of its characteristic central features. These include (i) an increasingly globally integrated economy, (ii) dominated by transnational corporations engaged in activities (such as production and distribution) that span multiple countries, (iii) increasing regulation of economic matters by supranational institutions (such as the World Trade Organization), (iv) general commitment to removal of barriers to “free trade,” and (v) higher levels of economic interdependence. While there is much debate about the long-term effects of globalization and whether they are on balance good or bad, at this stage, the effects of globalization have been mixed. For some, globalization has brought improvements, while it has worsened the position of others (Singer 2002).

Philosophers have been concerned with answers to a range of questions such as: What kinds of economic arrangements are just? Should our international institutions be reformed to better reflect fair terms of co-operation in our globalized world? Can globalization be better managed so that it works to assist the global poor more effectively? Are protectionist policies in trade justified or, rather, is free trade required by considerations of justice? Should poor working conditions in developing countries be a matter of concern for citizens and consumers in affluent, developed countries? If so, how might harmful employment conditions be effectively improved?

While Thomas Pogge argues that globalization has harmed the poor on a massive scale, Mathias Risse argues that this is not at all clear (Pogge 2010, Risse 2005). Risse argues that in many ways the global order must be credited with benefiting the global poor as well. He challenges Pogge’s claim that there are feasible alternatives to our global order that could be easily implemented and would avert the harm to which Pogge draws attention.

The World Trade Organization has been an important focal point for discussion about global economic justice. In particular, critics argue that some of its policies, such as those that generally advocate free trade but allow protectionism in affluent developed countries, involve grave hypocrisy and unfairness to some of the world’s most vulnerable people (Pogge 2001, Moellendorf 2002). There are also large disparities in the resources at the disposal of various parties such that weaker parties often suffer huge disadvantages in being able to negotiate agreements that work well for them. In these sorts of ways agents in developed countries (such as governments, citizens or firms) can take unfair advantage of those in developing countries (R. Miller 2010).

More generally, there are concerns related to the extraordinary power of multinationals and the undue influence they are able to exercise in negotiating deals favorable to them at the expense of the interests of the most vulnerable. So-called sweatshops (in which workers typically labor under harsh and hazardous conditions) are also a frequently raised example of how western consumers are implicated in far away suffering, given the high level of dependence in high-income countries on labor from low-income ones. When we purchase products manufactured in sweatshops are we guilty of contributing to exploitation and if so, what ought we to do to mitigate these unfairnesses? Christian Barry and Sanjay Reddy offer an innovative proposal to incentivize improvements in labor standards and wage levels in poor developing countries (Barry and Reddy 2008). This “Just Linkage” proposal offers some additional desirable opportunities for enhanced international trade to those who meet higher standards.

In this domain philosophers have also examined a range of other issues including obligations to forgive odious debt (Barry, Herman and Tomitova 2007) and whether micro-finance is to be welcomed as a positive force for the global poor (Sorrell and Cabrera, 2015). Other more general concerns about exploitation and economic justice can be found at the entries on exploitation and economics and economic justice. See also the entry on globalization.

5. Global Gender Justice

The effects of poverty do not fall equally on men and women, nor on boys and girls. In general, poverty makes the lives of women and girls harder than their male counterparts, as cultural expectations often dictate that women and girls do more care and domestic work or go without (or much less) when resources are scarce. This can significantly thwart women and girls’ well-being, as education, health care, and food are routinely withheld in favor of distribution to men and boys. Alison Jaggar prominently argues that various structures create and recreate transnational gendered vulnerabilities and she illustrates with practices common in domestic work and the sex industry (Jaggar 2009).

Cultural perceptions of gender roles can often lead to practices highly damaging to the most fundamental interests of women and girls. These include “honor killings” (where it is believed culturally permissible to kill a girl or woman who is perceived to have brought shame to the family), genital mutilation, infanticide, forced prostitution, arranged marriage, and legal recognition of property and inheritance rights that significantly disadvantage women and girls. Poverty can exacerbate such vulnerabilities so we have further reasons to address it as a matter of urgency (Jaggar 2009, 2014). Martha Nussbaum has argued for a list of ten capabilities that all human persons, no matter what their gender, ought to be positioned to exercise. She argues that this approach offers a powerful tool for persuasion in cases where girls and women are denied these opportunities by local actors in different cultures.

Some important policy has been influential in international discourse concerning combating gender injustice. The Millennium Development Goals includes as a third goal the promotion of gender equality and the empowerment of women. The 1995 Beijing Platform for Action set the stage for several International Covenants and before that the United Nations Convention on the Elimination of All Forms of Discrimination Against Women afforded some important protection for women’s human rights. Some feminist theorists are suspicious of human rights language and are inclined to reject what they perceive as a masculine discourse that trumpets individual autonomy in a way that fails to acknowledge adequately our fundamental human interdependence. While there certainly is a place for discussion of these important themes, others argue that we should not lose sight of the important victories human rights have also been able to secure, despite still having a long way to go (and other failings). The rhetoric of human rights has enabled substantial gains for promoting gender equality and protection of women’s fundamental interests, so it has at least strategic value.

6. Immigration

There are a large number of issues debated in the global justice literature concerning migration, whether temporary, permanent, legal or illegal. These include: Should states have the right to control their borders? Even if they have such a right, should states be more generous in admitting would-be migrants, especially considering the facts about global disparities in life prospects? When affluent developed states refuse to open their borders to the economically disadvantaged, is this equivalent to members of the aristocracy unjustly protecting their privilege as was the case in feudal times? What responsibilities are there to admit more refugees? Can illegal immigration be justified under certain circumstances? What sorts of criteria may affluent developed countries use when selecting migrants from the pool of applicants for citizenship? May they legitimately consider how prospective migrants would fit in with current citizens, favoring certain religious, linguistic, or ethnic affiliations to manage compatibility? When making migrant selection decisions, should they consider the effects on those who remain in countries of origin and if so, is this fair to the would-be migrants who would be excluded on grounds of the alleged negative impacts for home country citizens? If states admit migrant workers, are there moral constraints on how they should be treated? Would admitting temporary workers without simultaneously allowing them a pathway to citizenship be unjust? What responsibilities do we have in relation to human trafficking?

There are several now classic defenses of state’s rights to control borders. David Miller (Miller 2005, 2007), Michael Walzer (Walzer 1983) and Christopher Wellman (Wellman and Cole 2011) have been particularly important. Joseph Carens is the most influential proponent of the alternative “Open Borders” position (Carens 1987, 2013, but see also Cole 2000 and Wellman and Cole 2011). While many theorists discuss the responsibilities to refugees and guest workers, Walzer’s treatment is particularly influential, especially in arguing for his view that guest worker programs are only justified when they offer such “guests” a proper pathway to full and equal citizenship (Walzer 1983). Wellman offers comprehensive discussion of defensible admission criteria (Wellman and Cole 2011). Whether brain drain issues should be salient for migration decisions has been the subject of recent discussion (Carens 2013, Oberman 2012, Brock and Blake 2015). For detailed coverage of issues concerning whether borders should be more or less open, what our obligations are to refugees or guest workers, and issues concerning the ethics of recruiting immigrants away from poor, developing countries, see the entry on immigration.

7. Global Environmental Issues

Patterns of human behavior that destroy habitats, accelerate species extinction, exacerbate toxic levels of pollution, contribute to ozone layer destruction, or increase population levels are all issues of global environmental concern. However, although there are many global environmental topics that are rightly concerns of global justice, there is one that dominates discussion and that concerns our responsibilities with respect to climate change. Here we focus exclusively on this issue.

Among the scientific community it is no longer controversial that anthropogenic climate change is real and a significant threat to the well-being of both current and future generations. But it is also widely acknowledged that human development is an important way to address high levels of global poverty, that such development is energy intensive, and the cheapest sources of energy available are not likely to be clean energy types. These considerations significantly affect efforts to deal with problems presented by climate change. There is much discussion about the principles that should inform a fair treaty aimed at dealing with addressing climate change that also gives appropriate weight to concerns for human development. Some of the main contenders include principles that recognize causal responsibility for high emission levels, principles that are sensitive to ability to pay, and ones according to which those who have benefited from emissions should now be expected to absorb more costs.

We have not all contributed equally to the problems created by emissions; industrialized nations have contributed historically at much higher levels than those that are still developing. And so we should endorse the guidelines that those who have polluted more should pay more to help redress current problems (The Polluter Pays Principle). However critics argue that this principle unfairly holds some responsible when they did not know they were causing harm, since it was not widely known that greenhouse gases could result in climate change prior to 1990. So on this view, responsibility for emissions prior to 1990 should not conform with the Polluter Pays Principle, even if it is used to allocate costs after 1990. A second principle that is often discussed is The Beneficiary Pays Principle. Those who live in industrialized countries have typically benefited greatly from high levels of emissions so it is not unfair if they are expected to pay a higher proportion of costs. Critics object that a history of benefiting is an insufficiently strong consideration for assigning responsibilities now: in many cases whether or not people benefit is largely outside of their control. According to a third popular principle, The Ability to Pay Principle, the capacity of agents to pay for costs associated with mitigating climate change should be relevant.

Comprehensive treatment of climate justice requires addressing the issue of responsibilities to future generations. For important treatment of our responsibilities to other generations see the entry on intergenerational justice.

8. Global Health Issues

One striking feature of the state of global health is that there are large inequalities in health outcomes and opportunities for health. Consider that life expectancy can vary a great deal. A person born in Sierra Leone can expect to live about 40 years whereas one born in Japan can expect to live for 80 years. Malaria has been almost entirely eradicated in high-income countries, but it still kills about a million people in developing countries (United Nations 2009). A woman in the Niger has a 1 in 7 chance of dying in childbirth, whereas this is 1 in 11 000 for women in Canada (Benatar and Brock 2011). The global burden of disease is by no means evenly spread nor does workforce capability correspond with areas of highest need. In fact many of the countries that suffer from the greatest burdens of disease have the fewest skilled healthcare workers. In addition, pharmaceutical companies do not spend their research and development budgets in ways that match where the needs are greatest. Rather, seeking the most profitable ventures, they are much more likely to spend resources developing drugs for lucrative markets where the payoffs are greatest, even when the marginal benefits to consumers are small. One example is the research and development resources pharmaceutical companies frequently spend on developing drugs that are similar to others already available, rather than developing treatments for diseases for which there are no cures. It is estimated that drug companies spend approximately 90% of their research and development resources in seeking treatment for about 10% of diseases (Drugs for Neglected Diseases Working Group 2001).

The poor in developing countries are also often more vulnerable to disease and less able to resist disease because of poor living conditions related to poverty. Lack of clean water, clean energy sources, inadequate nutrition, and other social determinants of health play a key role in explaining this increased vulnerability. Living in overcrowded houses can facilitate the spread of infectious diseases, such as tuberculosis. So, a number of issues that sustain poverty or exacerbate people’s vulnerability to disease as a result of poverty should be of concern (Benatar and Brock 2011). As Norman Daniels argues, health inequalities among different social groups can be considered unjust when they result from unjust distribution in factors that are socially controllable that affect population health (Daniels 2011, 101). On this view many of the health inequalities that exist are ones that ought to be of concern as they meet this criterion. How should responsibilities for improving this situation be allocated? In many ways, but here I pick out just a few that have received considerable attention in the philosophical literature.

The current system of intellectual property rights is one troubling area. The World Trade Organization grants product patents for a twenty year period which effectively renders many new medicines unaffordable for the vast majority of the world’s population and those in greatest need. There are a number of innovative proposals aimed at addressing these issues. One prominent example is the Health Impact Fund proposal developed by Thomas Pogge, which offers alternative ways to reward pharmaceutical companies, notably by how much impact they have on actually curing diseases (Pogge 2008). The greater their impact, the larger the share of the rewards they would receive from the Health Impact Fund. Nicole Hassoun proposes a certification program for rating pharmaceutical companies’ contributions to the global poor, “Fair Trade Bio” (Hassoun 2012). Companies would compete for the gold star rankings which could significantly affect consumption choices and thereby expected profits. In both cases the aim is to create important incentives for key players to care about how their products affect the global poor.

There are many other issues that concern philosophers in the domain of global health. There are increasingly worrying practices of experimentation on disadvantaged subjects in developing countries. Increasingly, clinical research has been outsourced to poor, developing countries with populations that are often highly vulnerable. We might wonder about whether these populations are being exploited and whether the participants have compromised abilities to consent to drug trials. In many cases the trials bring considerable health benefits that would not come their way were it not in the interests of pharmaceutical companies to do clinical research in those locations. If sufficient benefits accrue for local populations some argue that these cases need not be of concern (London 2011).

New infectious diseases and the threat of pandemics are creating further questions about our responsibilities. Often the case is made that national interests in public health in developed countries mandate concern for infectious diseases that originate in developing countries. But more recently, this argument appears to have striking limitations. The Ebola outbreak in West Africa in 2014 raises questions about what we ought to do to help the victims who, because of the ways in which the disease spreads, are unlikely to threaten large segments of the population in affluent developed countries outside of Africa. The national interests of affluent developed countries do not easily converge with public health demands in developing ones in this case and yet we might still have important responsibilities to assist.

9. Some Issues that Cut Across Several Themes

9.1 Natural Resources and Global Justice

Discussion of natural resources often figure prominently in several topics of global justice. Some relevant questions include: Are national communities entitled to the resources they find on their territories? Should principles of global justice apply to our arrangements for justly distributing natural resources? Charles Beitz was an early proponent of a resource distribution principle, according to which natural resources should be allocated such that each society is able to provide adequately for its population (Beitz 1975). We saw in Section 2 that Rawls believes that resources are not important to prosperity in the ways many imagine. Rather, institutional resilience matters more. By contrast, Thomas Pogge highlights the ways in which international practices concerning the distribution of resources create considerable obstacles for prosperity in developing countries. In short, these practices create incentives for the wrong kinds of people to take power through illegitimate means and to focus on retaining power at the expense of other goals governments should have, such as trying to improve the well-being of their citizens. We need to modify these international practices so they do not create such an unfavorable environment. In addition, Pogge proposes a Global Resources Dividend as one measure by which practices concerning natural resource distribution would work in some small way to the benefit of the global poor. On this Global Resources Dividend proposal there would be a small tax on resource extraction, payable by the consumers of resources, and available for projects that would assist in helping everyone to be able to meet their basic needs with dignity (Pogge 2008).

Leif Wenar is also concerned with prevailing practices governing the sale of natural resources and their products (Wenar 2010). When consumers in wealthy states buy goods from developing countries, this is often similar to consciously receiving stolen goods. Legitimate resource sales require general agreement from citizens. Evidence of agreement requires that: (i) owners must be informed about sales, (ii) owners must be able to express dissent freely should they have doubts about sales, and (iii) owners should be able to stop resource sales without fearing grave consequences such as violence and intimidation. In these sorts of ways, Wenar aims to outlaw dispossession of citizens’ resources.

For various reasons (including strategic ones) Thomas Pogge and Leif Wenar do not directly challenge the right of nations to own resources on their territories. Policy recommendations, for instance, are much more likely to be effective if they can fit within the main structures of international conventions. However, other theorists do take up this issue including Hillel Steiner, Tim Hayward and Mathias Risse. Steiner argues that all inhabitants of the world are entitled to an equal share in the value of all land and he advocates for the “Global Fund” which aims to ensure that equal share entitlements can be secured. The Global Fund would constitute a clearing house for payments and disbursements (Steiner 2005).

Appealing to accounts of ownership of resources, some philosophers draw out important implications for diverse global justice debates. Mathias Risse argues that we all, collectively, own the resources of the earth and this has profound implications for a range of global justice issues, including immigration. When people are under-utilizing their “rightful shares” of territory, they cannot complain when co-owners would like to occupy some of it. Some theorists concerned with environmental issues also discuss our rights with respect to natural resources. Some argue that we have equal rights to access the earth’s resources. Tim Hayward, for instance, argues that we have equal rights to ecological space (Hayward 2005). This is often appealed to when there is a perception that we have exceeded our share, such as in levels of carbon emissions and consumption more generally.

Accounts according to which we have equal rights to resources, land, ecological space and so on, are often accused of suffering from an important common problem. It is difficult to defend a clear and compelling account of the value of resources as these can vary considerably in different social, cultural and technological contexts. But we need to be able to quantify resource values to some plausible extent, if we are to determine whether people are enjoying or exceeding their equal shares.

9.2 Allocating Responsibilities for Global Problems

There are a number of global justice problems that require remedying, and this raises the issue of remedial responsibilities. Who should do what to reduce global injustices? Several different agents, groups, organizations and institutions could play a role. Which responsibilities should devolve to corporations, governments, consumers, citizens, international organizations or social movements? Several guidelines that are often discussed include issues concerning the contribution agents have made to a problem, their patterns of benefit from the problem, and their capacity to take constructive action now. Two influential frameworks deserve more extended treatment, notably that of Iris Marion Young concerning a social connection model for allocating responsibilities for structural injustice and that of David Miller concerning remedial responsibility (Young 2011, Miller 2007).

In contrast to the idea of responsibility as involving finding fault and individual liability, Iris Marion Young develops a forward-looking model which she argues is more appropriate. She draws on the idea that participation via institutions sometimes produces injustice, so we have particular responsibilities to address injustice. We share responsibility for remedying injustice but we may have different degrees and kinds of responsibility. She offers different parameters of reasoning that can help individuals and organizations decide what might make the most sense for them to do in efforts to remedy injustice, given that there are so many injustices, whereas time and resources are limited. Using the case study of the global apparel industry she illustrates how the fact that we are positioned differently can entail varying but important responsibilities for all who participate in activities that sustain sweatshops. There are at least four parameters that agents can use in their reasoning:

  1. Power: we have different levels of influence and capacities to change processes. We should focus on those areas where we have greater capacities to change worrisome structural processes. This might mean focusing on a few key players who have both greater capacity to make changes themselves and to influence others.
  2. Privilege: some people have more privilege than others in relation to structures. So middle-class clothing consumers have more discretionary income, choice and ability to absorb costs—they can change their clothing purchasing practices more easily than those who earn minimum wage, have little discretionary income, and little ability to absorb further costs.
  3. Interest: All who have an interest in changing oppressive structures have responsibilities in connection with remedying these. This entails that “victims” too have important responsibilities since they have a great interest in eliminating oppression. In a nuanced analysis she argues that they might have responsibilities in certain contexts, such as to speak out about the harsh conditions in which they work. They must take some responsibility for resisting and challenging the structures. Without their participation the need for reforms may be rationalized away or reforms may not take the required form. These obligations may not always exist, especially when the costs of resistance would require extraordinary sacrifices.
  4. Collective ability: In some cases we already have collective organization capacities and resources that are well established. Sometimes it just makes good practical sense to draw on these. So, for instance, sometimes student associations, faith-based organizations, unions, or stockholder groups already exercise significant power in being able to coordinate like-minded members who are willing to take certain actions. She encourages us to harness organizational resources where doing so would prove effective.

In summary, Young encourages us to think about how we can best take responsibility for reducing structural injustice by reflecting on these four parameters—different positions of power, privilege, interest and collective ability.

David Miller offers a tremendously influential connection theory of responsibility that also discusses our remedial responsibilities. There are six ways in which we can be connected to someone, P, who needs help and so be held remedially responsible for assisting. These connections give rise to six ways in which remedial responsibility can be identified. We might be morally responsible for P’s condition; we might be outcome or causally responsible for P’s condition; we might have had no causal role in their condition but have benefited from it; we might have capacity to assist P; or we might be connected to P through ties of community.[4]

In the global justice literature there are also important concerns about the distribution of responsibilities among collective and individual agents. Prominently, can we hold nations responsible for global injustices or remedying such injustices? This raises important questions about collective responsibility that are well treated elsewhere in this encyclopedia (see the entry on collective responsibility.

9.3 Authority in the Global Domain: Do We Need a World State to Secure Global Justice?

Is it possible to have global justice in the absence of a world state? Hobbes argues that this is not possible since there is no global authority that can secure and enforce the requirements of justice. He presents the classic so-called realist case, which is highly influential in international politics, such that there is a state of nature in the international realm. All states compete in pursuing their own advantage and since there is no global authority there can be no justice in international affairs.

Others are more optimistic. Since we already have a high level of interaction among states, organizations and other agents, this has generated various norms and expectations about appropriate conduct which guide behavior in the international sphere (Beitz 1999). Moreover, we have a strong interest in co-operation when this is necessary to deal practically with a range of problems that have global reach. Global governance is concerned with how we manage interests affecting the residents of more than one state in the absence of a world state. There is already a high level of co-operation among a variety of networks, organizations and other groups of interested parties at the sub-state level, and this is powerfully influencing the redesign of best practice norms in particular domains (Anne-Marie Slaughter 2004).

Other change agents that can and have exercised considerable reform pressures include global social movements, such as the anti-sweatshop movement, the fair trade movement, and other ethical consumption movements. Global activism has been an important source of incremental change. These simple examples show that much more is possible in the absence of a world state than realists acknowledge.

For more on issues of world government, see the entry world government, which provides extended treatment of this issue.

10. The Contribution to Public Policy

Philosophers are contributing in important ways to discussions of global justice policy issues. As illustrations, in this entry we have canvassed several institutional reform proposals for addressing global injustices which have enjoyed widespread attention, both within the academy and beyond. These include Thomas Pogge’s Health Impact Fund proposal (Section 8) along with his proposal for a Global Resources Dividend (Section 9.1), Christian Barry and Sanjay Reddy’s Just Linkage Proposal to help improve working conditions (Section 4), and Allan Buchanan and Robert Keohane’s institutional innovations to secure accountability in the use of military force (Section 3.2). There is also the innovative work of Leif Wenar concerning proposals for clean trade (Section 9.1).

In addition to those illustrations already highlighted in this article, philosophers are also having an impact on policy discussions in a wide range of areas including climate change, reforming the United Nations, and suggesting the new priorities that should replace the Millennium Development Goals which expire in 2015. Philosophers have also contributed to influential international multi-disciplinary projects that seek alternative ways to measure quality of life or poverty (Nussbaum and Sen 1993, Pogge 2014). One area recently drawing increased attention concerns tax and accounting matters. Philosophers have discussed rampant abusive tax practices by corporations and wealthy individuals and how this deprives developing countries of much-needed income for human development in developing countries. There has also been discussion of global income taxes, carbon taxes, financial transaction taxes and Tobin Taxes (Moellendorf 2009, Caney 2005b, Brock 2009).

Philosophers continue to make an important contribution to policy debates and this is also likely to be an area in which considerable useful future work on global justice will concentrate.


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