Natural Law Theories

First published Mon Feb 5, 2007; substantive revision Mon Jul 25, 2011

This entry considers natural law theories only as theories of law. That is not to say that legal theory can be adequately identified and pursued independently of moral and political theory. Nor is it to deny that there are worthwhile natural law theories much more concerned with foundational issues in ethics and political theory than with law or legal theory. A sample of such wider and more foundational theories is the entry Aquinas' Moral, Political, and Legal Philosophy (Finnis 2005/2011). In the present entry, “natural law theory” is to be taken as shorthand for natural law theories just insofar as they bear on law and are theories of or about it. This focus has the important incidental effect that many historically important differences between natural law theorists can be omitted, differences which pertain more to the foundations of normativity than to the nature and functions (or “the concept”) of positive law.

Legal theorists who present or understand their theories as “positivist”, or as instances of “legal positivism”, take their theories to be opposed to, or at least clearly distinct from, natural law theory. Natural law theorists, on the other hand, did not conceive their theories in opposition to, or even as distinct from, legal positivism (contra Soper 1992 at 2395). The term “positive law” was put into wide philosophical circulation first by Aquinas, and natural law theories of his kind share, or at least make no effort to deny, many or virtually all “positivist” theses—except of course the bare thesis that natural law theories are mistaken. Natural law theory accepts that law can be considered and spoken of both as a sheer social fact of power and practice, and as a set of reasons for action that can be and often are sound as reasons and therefore normative for reasonable people addressed by them. This dual character of positive law is presupposed by the well-known slogan “Unjust laws are not laws.” Properly understood, that slogan indicates why—unless based upon some skeptical denial that there are any sound reasons for action (a denial which can be set aside because defending it is self-refuting)—positivist opposition to natural law theories is pointless, that is redundant: what positivists characteristically see as realities to be affirmed are already affirmed by natural law theory, and what they characteristically see as illusions to be dispelled are no part of natural law theory. But because legal theories conceived of by their authors as positivist are, by and large, dominant in the milieux of those likely to be reading this entry, it seems appropriate to refer to those theories along the way, in the hope of overcoming misunderstandings that (while stimulating certain clarifications and improvements of natural law theorizing) have generated some needless debate.

The point made in the preceding paragraph is made in another way by Orrego (Orrego 2007). When the accounts of adjudication and judicial reasoning proposed by contemporary mainstream legal theories are added to those theories' accounts of (the concept of) law, it becomes clear that, at the level of propositions (as distinct from names, words and formulations), those theories share (though not always without self-contradiction) the principal theses about law which are proposed by classic natural law theorists such as Aquinas: (i) that law establishes reasons for action, (ii) that its rules can and presumptively (defeasibly) do create moral obligations that did not as such exist prior to the positing of the rules, (iii) that that kind of legal-moral obligation is defeated by a posited rule's serious immorality (injustice), and (iv) that judicial and other paradigmatically legal deliberation, reasoning and judgment includes, concurrently, both natural (moral) law and (purely) positive law. Orrego's point seems to be confirmed by, e.g., the adjacent entry on Legal Positivism (Green 2003). Contemporary “positivist” theories are, it seems, natural law theories, distinguished from the main body of natural law theory (a) by their denial that the theory of law (as distinct from the theory or theories of adjudication, judicial duty, citizens' allegiance, etc.) necessarily or most appropriately tackles the related matters just listed, and accordingly (b) by the incompleteness of their theories of law, that is, the absence from them (and usually, though not always, from their accounts of those related matters) of systematic critical attention to the foundations of the moral and other normative claims that they make or presuppose.

In short: a natural law theory of (the nature of) law seeks both to give an account of the facticity of law and to answer questions that remain central to understanding law. As listed by Green 2003 (having observed that “No legal philosopher can be only a legal positivist), these further questions (which “legal positivism does not aspire to answer”) are: What kinds of things could possibly count as merits of law? What role should law play in adjudication? What claim has law on our obedience? What laws should we have? And should we have law at all? All these questions, though organized and articulated a little differently, are under consideration in the present entry.

1. Enabling positivity: social facts made reasons for action

The fulcrum and central question of natural law theories of law is: How and why can law, and its positing in legislation, judicial decisions, and customs, give its subjects sound reason for acting in accordance with it? How can a rule's, a judgment's, or an institution's legal (“formal,” “systemic”) validity, or its facticity or efficacy as a social phenomenon (e.g., of official practice), make it authoritative in its subject's deliberations?

The sense and force of these questions, and the main features of the kind of answer given by natural law theories, can be given a preliminary indication. On the one hand, natural law theory holds that law's “source-based character”—its dependence upon social facts such as legislation, custom or judicially established precedents—is a fundamental and primary element in “law's capacity to advance the common good, to secure human rights, or to govern with integrity” (cf. Green 2003). On the other hand (again cf. Green 2003), the question “whether law is of its very nature morally problematic” has from the outset been the subject of consideration by leaders of the tradition. (The first issue that Aquinas takes up about human law in his set-piece discussion of law, Summa Theologiae, I-II, q. 95 a. 1, is whether human law [positive law] is beneficial—might we not do better with exhortations and warnings, or with judges appointed simply to “do justice”, or with wise leaders ruling as they see fit? And see I.3 below.) Classic and leading contemporary texts of natural law theory treat law as morally problematic, understanding it as a normally indispensable instrument of great good but one that readily becomes an instrument of great evil unless its authors steadily and vigilantly make it good by recognizing and fulfilling their moral duties to do so, both in settling the content of its rules and principles and in the procedures and institutions by which they make and administer it. Natural law theories all understand law as a remedy against the great evils of, on the one side anarchy (lawlessness), and on the other side tyranny. And one of tyranny's characteristic forms is the co-optation of law as a mask for fundamentally lawless decisions cloaked in the forms of law and legality.

1.1 Basic reasons for action and the need for governmental authority

If one thinks perceptively and carefully about what to pursue (or shun) and do (or forbear from), one can readily understand and assent to practical propositions such as that life and health, knowledge, and harmony with other people are desirable for oneself and anyone else. The intrinsic desirability of such states of affairs as one's flourishing in life and health, in knowledge and in friendly relations with others, is articulated in foundational, underived principles of practical reasoning (reasoning towards choice and action). Such first principles of practical reasoning direct one to actions and dispositions and arrangements that promote such intelligible goods, and that directiveness or normativity is expressed by “I should…” or “I ought…” in senses which although truly normative are only incipiently moral.

A natural law moral theory will give an account of the way in which first principles of practical reason take on a moral force by being considered, not one by one but in their united (“integral”) directiveness. That integral directiveness is given specific (albeit highly general) articulation in principles such as the injunction to love one's neighbor as oneself; or the Golden Rule of doing for others what you would want them to do for you and not doing to others what you would not have them do to you; or the “categorical imperatives” to respect, and treat as intrinsically valuable, humanity (the basic aspects of human flourishing) in oneself and in others, so that each of one's communities is treated as a kingdom of ends—of persons each ends in themselves. Such high-level but far from contentless moral principles can be given further specificity in two ways (1) by identifying what, given some broadly stable features of human reality, they entail (see 1.2–4), and (2) by a rational but more or less non-deductive selection among alternative specifications, a selection named by Aquinas determinatio (plural, determinationes) (see 1.5). Political communities are a kind of institution whose rational status as a normally desirable and obligatory objective of and context for collaborative action (and forbearance) can easily be seen to be entailed by the foundational practical and moral principles. In such communities, the normal means for making the needed determinationes is the institution of governmental authority acting in the first instance through legislation and other forms of law-making, i.e., acting as a social-fact source of positive (posited) law.

The political-theoretical part of natural law theory explains and elaborates the grounds and proper forms of governmental authority. It explains the similarities and differences between the practical authority of rulers (including democratic electors acting as selectors of representatives or as plebiscitary decision-makers) and the theoretical authority of experts and persons of sound judgment. It shows the grounds for instituting and accepting practical authority as an almost invariably necessary means for preventing forms of harm and neglect which, because contrary to the high-level moral principles (at least as they bear on relationships between persons), involve injustice. Political theory subsumes, as one of its branches, legal theory. As legal theory, political theory explains the normal desirability that governmental authority in political communities be exercised within the framework of (in the classic slogan) a “rule of law and not of men” (1.3).

1.1.1 Why “natural” law? Naturalistic fallacy?

What does the mainstream of natural law theory intend by using the word “natural” in that name for the theory? The shortest accurate answer is “of reason,” as in “the law of reason” or “the requirements of reason.” Aquinas is particularly clear and explicit that in this context, “natural” is predicated of something (say, a law, or a virtue) only when and because that of which it is predicated is in line with reason, practical reason, or practical reason's requirements: see Finnis 1980, 35–6. Moreover, he employs, through all his works, a methodological axiom: X's nature is understood by understanding X's capacities, which are understood by understanding their act[uation]s, which are understood by understanding their objects. But the objects of chosen acts are the intelligible intrinsic goods (aspects of human flourishing) which we are directed to by practical reason's first principles. So the equation, in this context, of “natural” and “rational” and its cognates is no mere confusion, but grounded in a sophisticated distinction between ontology and epistemology: in the order of being, what is good and reasonable for us is a resultant of what is foundational, our given nature; but in the order of coming to know, our knowledge of our nature is in significant part a resultant of our understanding of what kinds of possible objects of choice are good.

Though the core of classic and mainstream natural law theory is thus untainted by any “naturalistic fallacy” (Finnis 2005, 2.4.2), non-practical knowledge of facts counts, in that theory, in various ways. Knowledge of the factual possibility of (say) acquiring knowledge, or of losing or saving life, is a datum (not really a premise) for the understanding that such a possibility is also an opportunity—that actualizing the possibility would be good for oneself and others. Other kinds of relevant facts include the facts about certain human radical capacities and their absence in other animals—these facts are the data for the insight into the sense and bounds of the class (persons, human beings) of “others” in “good for oneself and others.” Or again, facts about the limited supply of resources and the limited strength of human will (the need for incentives, etc.) make (1.5) appropriation of resources to particular owners a normal requirement of justice to non-owners and owners alike.

1.2 Political authority as remedy for anarchy, injustice and impoverishment

The texts that are earliest (e.g., the Platonic or pseudo-Platonic Minos: Lewis 2006) and most foundational (e.g., Plato's Gorgias, Republic and Laws, and Aristotle's Politics) in the tradition of natural law theory remind their readers of the evident evils of anarchy: a condition of things in which no person or body of persons efficaciously claims or is accepted widely as having authority to restrict the use of violence, theft and fraud, and in which any conventional norms of conduct are made hollow by irresolvable disputes about their content and/or their application. In such a state of affairs, the more strong, cunning and ruthless prey on the less, education of children (which calls for resources outside the family) is difficult to accomplish, and economic activity remains stunted by the insecurity of holdings and the unreliability of undertakings. There is evident need for persons who will articulate and enforce standards of conduct which will tend to promote the common good of bodily security, stable access to resources, cooperation in economic and educational activities, and rectification (by punishment, compensation and restitution) of at least the grosser inter-personal injuries of commission and neglect. To articulate that need is to state the reasons for instituting and supporting political authority, notably state government and law, on condition that these institutions carry on their legislative, executive and judicial activities substantially for the common good of the inhabitants of the relevant territory, rather than in the interests of a segment of the population unfairly indifferent or hostile to the interests and wellbeing of other segments.

1.3 Rule of law as remedy for the dangers in having rulers

Aristotle (Politics III.15.1286a–IV 4 1292a) vigorously debates the question whether political authority is better exercised through a “rule [primacy, supremacy] of law” or “a rule of men,” say of one best person, or a democratic assembly, or indeed (Rhetoric I 1 1354a32–b16) a court. He takes his arguments to suggest the answer that in almost all societies, on almost all occasions and issues, it is preferable that government be by or in accordance with law, since (i) laws are products of reason(s) not passion(s), (ii) the sovereignty of a ruler or assembly tends to tyranny (i.e., rule in interests of a section, not common good), (iii) equality demands that each mature person have some share in governing, and (iv) rotation of offices and office-holders is desirable and can hardly be managed without legal regulation. So for Aristotle, the central case of practical authority is government of a polis by law and legally regulated rulers.

Thomas Aquinas' account of human positive law treats the central case of government as the self-government of a free people by the rulers and institutions which that people has appointed for that purpose, and the central case of law is the co-ordination of willing subjects by law which, by its public character (promulgation), clarity, generality, stability and practicability, treats those subjects as partners in public reason (Summa Theologiae I-II q. 90 a. 4c; q. 95 a. 3c; q. 96 a. 1; q. 97 a. 2). For he defines law as universal (in the logician's sense of “universal”) practical propositions conceived in the reason of the ruler(s) and communicated to the reason of the ruled so that the latter will treat those propositions, at least presumptively, as reasons for action—reasons as decisive for each of them as if each had conceived and adopted them by personal judgment and choice.

Lon Fuller 1969, acknowledging Aquinas' lead in this discussion of formal and procedural aspects of legal system, pulls together Aquinas' scattered and fragmentary remarks about them into an orderly list of eight elements of the rule of law, that is of la primauté du droit, the legal system of a Rechtsstaat. He shows that these hang together as a set of desiderata (or requirements) because they are implications or specifications of the aspiration and duty to treat people as presumptively entitled—as a matter of fairness and justice—to be ruled as free persons, fundamentally the equals of their rulers, not puppets or pawns to be managed and kept in order by manipulation, uncertainty, fear, etc. The normal result of such fairness in the procedures of making and maintaining the law will be to strengthen the law's efficacy, too. Unfortunately, the surface of Fuller's text gives more prominence to effectiveness than to fairness, and many critics (e.g., Hart, Dworkin), overlooking the moral connotations of Fuller's allusions to reciprocity between rulers and ruled, thought his book's title, The Morality of Law, a misnomer. This thesis has been elaborated more carefully and on a different basis by Raz 1979 and Kramer 2004a and 2004b: although the rule of law (and compliance with it) can be morally important and even a moral virtue (because normally necessary for fully just government in a just society, and especially for alleviating dangers that arise from the existence of political authority, and of law itself), it is nonetheless in itself morally neutral since (in states which employ the forms of law) it will normally be needed even by deeply unjust rulers for advancing their immoral purposes. It is like a sharp knife, whose sharpness makes it apt for life-saving surgery but equally for stealthy callous murders (Raz 1979, 224–6).

Finnis 1980/2011, 273–4 and Simmonds 2004, 2005, 2006, 2007 have challenged the quasi-empirical claim that even vicious tyrants need or find it apt, for the efficacy of their domination, to comply with the requirements of the rule of law. The eighth of Fuller's elements of the rule of law, viz. adherence by the rulers to their own rules in their conduct of government, is especially obstructive, rather than supportive, of a tyranny's purposes. But the focus of Fuller's concern, and the most fruitful locus of debate, is not so much on historical or sociological phenomena but on the “internal,” practical reasons at stake. If the rulers somewhere do not respect the rights and interests of some of their subjects in relation to issues of substance (life, bodily security, freedom, property, and so forth), why should the rulers—what reason have they to—respect their subjects' rights or interests in the matters of procedure involved in the rule of law (giving them fair notice of what is expected of them, and adhering as rulers to the promulgated law when assessing these subjects' conduct and in other governmental dealings with those subjects)? A more or less inconsistent willingness of rulers to tie their own hands by scrupulous adherence to procedural justice while yet being substantively unjust, is of course psychologically possible. But Fuller's primary concern, like that of the wider tradition of natural law theory, is with rationality and the specific implication of fully coherent reasonableness: morally reasonable judgment and choice.

1.4 Ius gentium—ius cogens—mala in se—human rights: legal rules and rights posited because morally necessary parts of any legal system

Fuller offered a merely procedural natural law theory, though he did not deny that a substantive natural law theory is possible and appropriate. And indeed there is no sufficient reason to follow him in restricting the range of practical-theoretical reflection on what is needed for a political society worthy of the self-restraints and acceptance of responsibilities that the law requires of those to whom it applies. For it is clear that the procedures and institutions of law are in the service of substantive purposes: the restriction of violence, theft and fraud, the recovery of things misappropriated from their lawful owners or possessors, and of losses wrongfully imposed, protection of intangible goods such as reputation against unwarranted defamation, and of the immature, the mentally disabled and other vulnerable people against sexual or other exploitation, and so forth.

That portion of our positive law which consists of legal principles or rules giving effect to purposes such as those just listed was often named, by natural law theories, ius [or jus] gentium. Minted by jurists of classical Roman law such as Gaius (c. 165 AD), this name—literally “the law of peoples”—alludes to the set of rules and principles found in similar if not identical forms in virtually all legal systems. The reason for their ubiquity is, generally speaking, that any reasonable consideration of what it takes for individuals, families and other associations to live together in political society, tolerably well, will identify these principles and rules as necessary. In modern law they are picked out, in principle, by names such as “the general principles of law recognized by civilized nations” (Statute of the International Court of Justice, art. 38), ius cogens erga omnes (literally “law that is compelling [without agreement or enactment or other forms of adoption] in relation to everyone”), “higher law”, or “fundamental human rights.” In Aquinas's theory of law, they are referred to as conclusions (entailments) of the very highest-level, most general moral principles. In the common law tradition, the legal wrongs picked out by such principles have been called mala in se, as distinct from mala prohibita—things wrong in themselves as distinct from things wrong only because prohibited by (positive) law—and this distinction remains, for good reason, in use in judicial reasoning.

Some legal theories speak of these principles and rules as belonging to law by a kind of “conceptual” necessity. Hart (1961) can be so read. But even Hart's account, on closer examination, identifies the relevant necessity not as conceptual or linguistic but as an instance of the rational necessity of means needed to secure purposes which are non-optional. It was for this reason that Hart spoke of them as constituting “the minimum content of natural law.” He would have expressed his own meaning more perspicuously had he spoken instead of “the minimum content of positive law, the minimum set of principles which, because rationally necessitated —given certain fundamental “truisms” about human nature and the human predicament—for the securing of purposes shared by all survivable human societies, can be called natural law.” The fact is that these elements of our law are both positive (made and part of official practice) and natural (rationally required for at least minimal human flourishing).

These issues are discussed further in Section 3 below.

1.5 “Purely positive law”: determinationes and their legal-moral authority for citizens and judges (facts made reasons for action)

Natural law theory of law has its most distinctive characteristic in its account of purely positive law which, though “entirely” dependent for its legal status on the fact that it has been authoritatively posited by some persons(s) or institution, nonetheless shares in law's characteristic of entailing—albeit presumptively and defeasibly—a moral obligation of compliance. About these rules of a positive legal system, Aquinas says that, though they certainly should be, and be presumed to have been, “derived from natural law”, they have their legal force only from their part in this posited system (ex sola lege humana vigorem habent: ST I-II, q. 95 a. 3).

His explanation, slightly updated: this very large part of our law could reasonably have been different, in the way that every detail of a maternity hospital could have been somewhat different and large portions of the design could have been very different, even though some features (e.g., that the doors and ceilings are more than two feet high) are entailed by the commission to build a town maternity hospital, and every feature has some rational connection with the commission. The kind of rational connection that holds even where the architect has wide freedom to choose amongst indefinitely many alternatives is called by Aquinas a determinatio of principle(s)—a kind of concretization of the general, a particularization yoking the rational necessity of the principle with a freedom (of the law-maker) to choose between alternative concretizations, a freedom which includes even elements of (in a benign sense) arbitrariness.

Once the determinatio is validly made, fulfilling the criteria of validity provided by or under the relevant legal system's constitutional law, it changes the pre-existing state of the law by introducing a new or amended legal rule and proposition(s) of law. The new or amended legal rule gives judges, other officials, and citizens a new or amended reason for action (or forbearance). The fact that the new or amended rule depends upon the social-fact source constituted or employed by the act of determinatio does not entail that a normative reason (an “ought”) is being illogically derived from a bare fact (an “is”). Rather, the new or amended rule is normative, directive and (where that is its legal meaning ) obligatory because that social fact can be the second premise in a practical syllogism whose first premise is normative: “there ought to be a maternity hospital in this town,” “people ought to be protected against homicidal assault,” “people ought to be required to contribute to the public expenses of appropriate governmental functions”, “victims of assault, theft, broken contracts, negligence, etc., ought to be compensated,” “road traffic should be regulated to reduce damaging collisions,” and so forth. The moral normativity of the principle is replicated in the more specified rule created by the determinatio, even though the latter is not an entailment of the former.

That is to say: the concretized rule is (morally as well as legally) normative because such normativity is (presumptively and defeasibly) entailed by the (moral) principle that the common good (whose fundamental content is given by the foundational principles of practical reason: 1.1) requires that authoritative institutions take action to specify, apply and enforce some rules on the relevant matters. Social facts make a positive legal rule a reason for action because the desirability of authority as a means of securing common good, and the desirability of the “rule of law and not of men,” are standing and potent reasons for acknowledging such facts as an instance of valid legislation giving presumptively sufficient reason for compliance. Purely positive law that is legally valid is (presumptively and defeasibly) valid and binding morally—has the moral form or meaning of legal obligatoriness—when and because it takes its place in a scheme of practical reasoning whose proximate starting point is the moral need for justice and peace, and whose more foundational starting-point is the range of basic ways in which human wellbeing can be promoted and protected, the way picked out in practical reason's first principles.

Thus, in relation to the settled positive law, natural law theory—as is acknowledged by a number of legal positivists, e.g., Raz 1980, 213; Gardner 2001, 227-- shares the principal thesis of contemporary legal positivists, that laws depend for their existence and validity on social facts.

1.5.1 “Presumptive” and “defeasible” obligatoriness

The legal-moral obligation or obligatoriness of a legal rule is counterpart to the legal-moral authority or authoritativeness of its author (enacter) or other source. The idea of authority has been clarified by contemporary legal theorists such as Raz and Hart, by reflection upon the kind of reasons for action purportedly given to potentially acting subjects by an exercise of practical authority. The relevant kind of practical reason has been variously called exclusionary, peremptory or pre-emptive, and content-independent. The core idea is that subjects are instructed to treat the proffered reason (say, a statutory provision, or a judicial order), in their deliberations towards choice and action, as a reason which does not simply add to the reasons they already have for acting one way rather another, but rather excludes and takes the place of some of those reasons. And this exclusionary, peremptory or pre-emptive force is owed not to the inherent attractiveness to reason of the (content of the) proffered reason, but to the status of its author or other source as one entitled—for example, by its role in a constitutional scheme of governance for the solution of a political community's coordination problems—to be obeyed, complied with, treated as authoritative. See e.g., Raz 1986, 35–69. This content-independence of authoritative reasons entails their presumptive obligatoriness. The defeasibility of that presumption is entailed by the dependence of such reasons' peremptory, pre-emptive or exclusionary force upon a background of presupposed basic human needs and goods, and of basic moral principles and norms, a background which entails that if a purportedly authoritative proffered (posited) reason conflicts sufficiently clearly with those standing needs, goods, principles or norms its exclusionary force is exhausted or overcome and the purported obligatoriness defeated.

Less abstractly put, both the effectiveness of laws as solutions to coordination problems and promoters of common good, and the fairness of demanding adherence to them, are dependent upon their being treated both by the subjects and the administrators of the legal system as legally and morally entitled, precisely as validly made law, to prevail against all other reasons save competing moral obligations of greater strength. It is this entitlement that is negated by the serious injustice of a law or legal system: see 3 and 4 below.

2. Human persons are not law's creatures but its proper point

Talk of human flourishing's or wellbeing's aspects, and of principles of practical reason, should not be allowed to distract attention from an important truth, implicit both in classical Greek and Roman philosophical and juristic treatments of justice and in modern juristic attributions of human rights. Indeed, the Universal Declaration of Human Rights (1948) links the two traditions of discourse by placing at the head of its articulation of human rights the core (“all human beings are born free and equal in dignity and rights”) of the Roman juristic saying (Institutes 1.2.2) that “by nature, from the outset, all human beings were born free and equal,” a saying about iustitia, justice as a ground and standard for ius, law. The same Roman law texts, promulgated as permanent law by Justinian 533–535 AD, state more than once that law's point (its “final” causa, explanatory reason) is the human persons for whose sake it is made, that is, all human persons until the time when the ius gentium, the common law of peoples, was distorted by wars and slavery. Law, fit to take a directive place in practical reasoning towards morally sound judgment, is for the sake of human persons: all the members of the community regulated by that law and all other persons within that law's ambit.

That thesis falls within those parts of legal theory that are acknowledged but not much explored by contemporary legal positivists. It was ignored and in effect denied by earlier forms of legal positivism more ambitious to cover the whole of legal philosophy, e.g., Kelsen's. Kelsen denied that persons were known either to law or to a proper legal theory or science of law, except insofar as they were made the subject of a posited legal rule. But against this restriction, which has misled some courts which have treated Kelsenian legal science as a guide to judicial reasoning, it can be said (Finnis 2000) that the fundamental equality and dignity of human beings should defended as part of a rationally sound understanding (concept) of law. This defense requires an account of the difference between capacities which are activated here and now, or are more or less ready to be so actuated, and radical capacities such as exist in the epigenetic primordia of even very young human beings, and in the genetic and somatic constitution of even the severely disabled. Though such an account makes possible a defense of the fundamental equality of human beings, and thus a humanist legal theory, the point of the account is not to privilege a biological species as such, but to affirm the juridical significance of the status of persons—substances of a rational nature—as inherently the bearers (subjects) of rights of a kind different and more respect-worthy and end-like than the rights which are often, as a matter of technical means, attributed by law to animals, idols, ships or other objects of legal proceedings.

3. Legal principles to remedy defective positive law

3.1 Adjudicating between exclusive and inclusive legal positivism

The positivist thesis that all law depends for its existence, validity and obligatoriness on its social-fact source(s) is often accompanied, as in Raz's “exclusive legal positivism” (Raz 1980, 212–24; Raz 1985), by the thesis that judges, as the “primary law-applying institutions,” have a duty (moral, if not also legal) to decide certain sorts of case (e.g., cases where the existing legal rule would by work injustice) by applying moral principles or rules which warrant amending or even abandoning part of the existing law. “Inclusive” legal positivists temper this by holding that the judicial duty and authorization to depart from existing law by applying moral rules or principles is restricted to those classes of case where an existing social-fact sourced legal rule directs the court do so; the effect of such a directive, it is said, is to include within the legal system the moral rules or principles (if any) thus pointed to.

Natural law theory concurs with Raz and Gardner in rejecting the inclusivist restriction as ungrounded, but dissents from them in holding (as Dworkin does too: Dworkin 1978, 47) that any moral rule or principle which a court is bound or authorized to apply, precisely as a court, can reasonably be counted or acknowledged as a law, i.e., as a rule or principle which should be considered already part of our law. Against positivists generally, it holds that (i) little or nothing turns on whether or not moral principles binding on courts precisely as courts should be called part of our law; but (ii) if something does turn on the name—if, for example, it be recalled that courts cannot “take judicial notice” of any rule or principle not “part of our law” (and so, as in respect of rules of foreign law, have to hear evidence of the rule's existence and content)—it is sounder to say that judicially applicable moral rules and principles (unlike applicable foreign law) are ipso iure (i.e., precisely as morally and judicially applicable) rules of law. Such rules belong to the ius gentium portion of our law.

Does this amount to acknowledging that natural law theory is significantly less concerned than contemporary legal positivist theories to establish the precise boundaries and content of the social-fact sourced (posited, purely positive) law of our community? Not really. For (i) contemporary legal positivist theories have abandoned the thesis of “classical” legal positivists such as Bentham that judges and citizens alike should (as a matter of political-moral obligation) comply with the positive law of their community: their treatises or essays on legal theory explicitly or implicitly commend to judges as much as citizens the Hartian “This is law; but it is too iniquitous to be applied or obeyed” (Hart 1961, 203; 1994, 208) rather than the Benthamite “Under a government of laws … obey punctually and … censure freely” (Bentham 1776); so their concern to distinguish posited law from other standards for sound and legitimate adjudication turns out, in the last analysis (and despite appearances), to be merely provisional. And on the other hand (ii) natural law theories hold as strongly as any positivist theory that sound and legitimate adjudication gives priority to a conscientious and craftsmanlike attention to social-fact sources and to rules and principles pedigreed by such sources, sets them aside only if and to the extent that they are “too iniquitous to be applied”, and tailors the resultant new rule so as to cohere as far as possible with all the other (not too iniquitous) doctrines, rules and principles of the particular legal system in which the judge has jurisdiction.

3.1.1 A test case: the Nuremberg question

The persons known as major German war criminals were tried in 1945 for offenses specified in an agreement (“the London Agreement and Charter of 8 August 1945”) made between the states governing Germany since its surrender to them. The judges held that the defendants had at all relevant times been bound by (and in many instances had acted in violation of) the principles or rules specified in the London Charter, such obligations being derived not, of course, from the agreement (which was made subsequent to the acts in question), but rather, as to some of the crimes alleged, from international law and, as to the alleged “crimes against humanity,” from the “elementary dictates of humanity.” To hold the defendants responsible for violating these rules and dictates, and reject any argument that their acts' compliance with German law could make them lawful acts, was not (so the tribunal ruled) to violate the principle of law and justice that no one should be punished except for violation of law.

The result of these rulings might be accounted for (i) by exclusive positivism: the tribunal was morally authorized to apply moral rules, notwithstanding that the rules so applied were not rules of law either at the time of the crimes or the time of the prosecution. But the terms of the rulings (as just summarized) can be accounted for (ii) by inclusive positivism: the Charter was positive law for the tribunal and directed it to apply moral rules which by virtue of that legal direction were also legal rules. Still, (iii) natural law theory's account seems the most explanatory: the moral rules applied were also rules of the “higher law” applicable in all times and places (and thus in Germany and its territories, before as after the Charter) as a source of argumentation and judgment “according to law” when the social-fact sources which are the normally dominant and quasi-exclusive source of law are, in justice, inadequate and insufficient guides to fulfilling obligations such as the judicial obligation to do justice according to law, or everyone's obligation to behave with elementary humanity even when under orders not to—even if those orders have intra-systemic legal validity according to the formal or social-fact criteria of some existing legal system. And if one has doubts about victors' justice, those very doubts can likewise appeal to principles of the same higher law, ius gentium, or law of reason and humanity.

3.2 Natural law and (purely) positive law as concurrent dimensions of legal reasoning

Natural law theory of law thus finds itself, in this respect, approximated to by Ronald Dworkin's account of law and adjudication, not only in frontier situations like Nuremberg but also in the day-to-day working of a sophisticated legal system. Normal adjudication and judicial reasoning has two dimensions or criteria for distinguishing correctness from incorrectness in judgments. One dimension comprises social-fact sources (statutes, precedents, practice, etc.), called by Dworkin “legal materials.” The other dimension comprises moral standards, presumptively those prevalent in the judge's community but in the last analysis just those standards that the judge can accept as in truth morally sound. An interpretation of our law which is morally sounder will be legally correct even if it fits the legal materials less closely than alternative interpretations, provided that it fits those social-fact sources “enough.” The moral standards thus applied, which Dworkin (in line with natural law theory) treats as capable of being morally objective and true, thus function as a direct source of law and, in a certain sense, as already law, except when their fit with the whole set of social-fact sources in the relevant community is so weak that it would be more accurate (according to Dworkin) to say that judges who apply them are applying morality not law (and thus, if they said they were applying law, would be mistaken or lying—a lie which Dworkin considers sometimes commendable). Dworkin 1978, 326–7, 340.

A theory of law which, unlike Dworkin's, places itself plainly in the tradition of natural law theorizing will be likely to depart from these positions in two ways. (i) It will not accept Dworkin's thesis that even in very hard cases there is one uniquely correct answer in law; it will deny his assumption that there is a uniquely correct and rationally identifiable measure of how much fit with existing legal materials (social-fact sources) is “enough” (necessary and sufficient) to license using moral standards to identify the legally correct interpretation of the law. In the absence of such a single measure, legal reasoning must often—and in very hard cases, usually—be content to show that two or three alternative interpretations are distinguished from an indefinitely large number of other interpretations by being correct, that is, not wrong (albeit not uniquely correct). (ii) When judges, in order to avoid grave injustice, depart from the settled understanding of the law (and perhaps from the clear terms of a decree) and apply an alternative, morally mandated interpretation, regarding themselves as licensed to do so by the higher law of reason, nature and humanity, they need not be lying if they say that in doing so they are both rectifying and applying the law (of their state). See 4 below.

3.3 Implications of the rule-of-law need for positivity

In line with Dworkin's two-dimensions account (thus qualified), natural law theory will assent to the thesis that Green makes characteristic of legal positivism:

[1] the fact that a policy would be just, wise, efficient, or prudent is never sufficient reason for thinking that it is actually the law, and [2] the fact that [a law] is unjust, unwise, inefficient or imprudent is never sufficient reason for doubting [that it is law].

For as to [1]: what the rule of law and not of men calls for is the institution of legal system, a corpus iuris, and so what a principle of morality (natural law) or ius gentium implies would be an appropriate rule of law is, nevertheless, not yet a part of our law—still less is a mere “policy” made law by being “prudent” or “efficient—unless its content, conceptualization and form are so shaped, whether in judicial or other juristic thinking or in judgment or legislation, as to cohere with the other parts (especially neighboring parts) of our law.

As to [2]: A natural law theory, mindful of the normal desirability of a rule of law and not of judges (see 1.3), may well be more cautious than Dworkin himself is in departing from the settled (social-fact source-based) law. On those occasions where such a departure is morally warranted, the theory will suggest that the judge is authorized to proceed according to the higher and perennial law of humanity, the ius gentium or set of universal principles of law and justice common to all civilized peoples, which deprives settled law—more precisely, what has been accepted in the jurisdiction as being settled law—of its directiveness for subjects and judges alike. Is this moral authorization also “legal” and “according to law”? Is the settled law which the judge is morally authorized to set aside thereby being treated, even prior to the judge's handing down of judgment, as not law? The following section argues that that question should be answered both Yes and No.

4. “Lex iniusta non est lex”? Do seriously unjust laws bind? Legally?

In such a case, does the law as settled by social-fact sources, in losing its directiveness for judges and citizens, lose also its legal validity? The answer depends upon the discursive context in which the question arises. If a course of reflection or discourse makes it appropriate to acknowledge the rule's “settled” or “posited” character as cognizable by reference to social-fact sources, one can say that it is legally valid though too unjust to be obeyed or applied. Or if the discursive context makes it appropriate instead to point up its lack of directiveness for judges and subjects alike, one can say that the rule, despite its links to social-fact sources, is not only not morally directive but is also legally invalid. Each way of speaking tells an important part of the truth, or rather, tells the truth with an emphasis which differs from the other's.

The meaning of “an unjust law is not a law” is essentially identical to Hart's “This is law but too iniquitous to be applied or obeyed” (or availed of as a defense). The excitement and hostility aroused amongst modern legal theorists (notably Hart) by the former way of speaking is unwarranted. No one has difficulty in understanding locutions such as “an invalid argument is no argument,” “a disloyal friend is not a friend,” “a quack medicine is not medicine,” and so forth. “Lex iniusta non est lex” has the same logic; it acknowledges, in its opening words, that what is in question is in certain important respects—perhaps normally and presumptively decisive respects—a law, but then in its withdrawal or denial of that predicate it affirms that, since justice is the very point of having and respecting law at all, this particular law's deficiency in justice deprives it of the decisive significance which all law purports to have. It is thus law only in a sense that should be judged—especially when law is regarded, as by Hart himself, as a kind of reason or purported reason for action—to be a distorted and secondary, non-central sense.

Note: Classical political theory, as expounded by Plato, Aristotle and Aquinas, makes regular use of this distinction between central and perverted or otherwise marginal instances of an analogical concept or term, and so Aquinas never says simply “unjust law is not law” but rather “unjust law is not straightforwardly or unqualifiedly [simpliciter] law” or “is a perversion of law”, and similar statements. Still, he does elsewhere say that “an unjust judgment [of a court] is not a judgment” and it seems clear that he might similarly have used the simplified or slogan-form locution, about law, as short-hand.

All this seems to have been overlooked by Hart in his polemic (Hart 1961, 204–7; 1994, 208–12) against “lex iniusta non est lex.” Hart's argument that use of the slogan must tend to discourage or confuse the moral critique of law seems historically and logically indefensible. The slogan is unintelligible save as an expression of and incitement to engaging in such critiques; it can scarcely be rejected without first misquoting it, as Hart and those who employ his argument almost invariably do, averting their gaze from the slogan's first predicate and implied assertion: that the unjust rule in question is a rule of law.

Some theories have adopted certain main tenets of natural law theory, and professed to be natural law theories, but have asserted that even the most unjust laws create an obligation to obey which is both legal and moral. Kant's (see Alexy 2002, 117–121) is such a theory: a legal system can consist entirely of positive law but must be “preceded by a natural law that establishe[s] the legislator's authority…to bind others simply by his arbitrary action.” But this purported natural-law basic norm looks not to the justice of the content of the posited legal rules, but exclusively to the need for legal certainty and civic peace, which Kant takes to exclude any right to resist unjust laws and any denial that they are fully legal. Alexy has pointed out the confusions and inconsistencies in Kant's attempts to evade the classic position that laws whose injustice is sufficiently grave can and should be denied to have the legal character predicable of laws that citizens and courts, precisely as courts, are morally and juridically entitled to treat as—or as if they are—not law. In this as in many other respects, seventeenth and eighteenth century philosophical developments (like their twentieth and twenty-first century counterparts) were not so much progress as regress.

5. Can general theories of law be value-free? moral-value-free?

Descriptions of the valuations made by particular persons or societies can of course be value-free. Doubtless the historian, detective or other observer thinks there is some value in making the investigation and resultant description, but that valuation in no way need enter into the description. Still less need the description either approve or disapprove of the valuations which it reports. But the situation is different if one's aspiration is to offer a general account of human practices or institutions, such as law, friendship, constitutions, and so forth. Here one confronts the necessity of selecting and prioritizing not merely the investigation itself but rather some one set of concepts (and corresponding terms) from among (or over and above) the range of terms and concepts already employed in the self-understanding of the individuals and groups under (or available for) study.

Where the subject-matter of the projected descriptive general account is some practice or institution devised by (more or less adequate exercises of) reason, and addressed to the rational deliberations of individuals and groups, there will normally be no good reason not to prioritise those forms of the practice or institution which are more rational, more reasonable, more responsive to reasons, than other forms of the “same” or analogous practices and institutions. The standard for assessing reasonableness for this theoretical purpose is, in the last analysis, the set of criteria of reasonableness that the descriptive theorist would use in dealing with similar practical issues in his or her own life.

This necessity of value-laden selection of concepts and terms for use in a general theory of social realities such as law is evidenced in the work of Max Weber, prophet of “value-free” social science. His account, for example, of forms of domination (Herrschaft) identifies three pure, central, characteristic types (Idealtypen): charismatic, traditional, and rational (bureaucratic, legal). But the accounts of the first two types are almost entirely in terms of how they differ from the rational type, whose rationality is self-evident to Weber and his readers on the basis of their own knowledge of human goods (basic aspects of human wellbeing) and related practical truths. See Finnis 1985, 170–72. Natural law theory, as one sees it practiced already in Aristotle's Ethics and Politics, makes these valuations by the theorist overt and explicit (not hidden and embarrassed), and subjects them to rational scrutiny and debate.

Raz, Dickson, and others accept that some such valuation is necessary, but deny that it is moral: Dickson 2001. But once one begins to deal in reasons, can anything other than good reasons count? If moral reason is nothing more than practical reason at full stretch, fully critical and adequate as reason, moral reasons will have a decisive place in concept-formation in social science including descriptive general theory of law. And this will not have the effect feared by Hart, viz. of leaving the study of wicked laws or institutions to some other discipline: Hart 1961, 205; 1994, 209. On the contrary, they are a subject of lively attention in such a theory, precisely because of their opposition to legal systems of a (substantively and procedurally) morally good kind. Aristotle's Politics, though not methodologically flawless overall, is a primary witness to this sort of clear-eyed acknowledgment and depiction of unreasonable social forms, practices and institutions within a descriptive theory oriented by the moral judgments of the theorist.

Still, descriptive social theory is only a subordinate aspect of natural law theories of law. Their primary focus is typically on identifying the conditions under which law is justified, both in the sense in which law can and should be preferable to anarchy or tyranny or even benevolent “rule of men,” and in the sense in which this or that legal principle, institution or rule can be judged to be preferable to alternative reasons or purported reasons for action. As Green 2003 says:

Evaluative argument is, of course, central to the philosophy of law more generally. No legal philosopher can be only a legal positivist. A complete theory of law requires also an account of what kinds of things could possibly count as merits of law (must law be efficient or elegant as well as just?); of what role law should play in adjudication (should valid law always be applied?); of what claim law has on our obedience (is there a duty to obey?); and also of the pivotal questions of what laws we should have and whether we should have law at all. Legal positivism does not aspire to answer these questions, though its claim that the existence and content of law depends only on social facts does give them shape.

Might it not be better to say: no legal philosopher need, or should, be a legal positivist? For law's dependence upon social facts is fully acknowledged, and also accounted for, in natural law theories of law. And this is not a “concession” by natural law theorists, for their main positions were clearly articulated by Aquinas, many centuries before legal positivism emerged with its challenge to (what it took to be) natural law theory. Positivist critiques of natural law theory, when they do not rest upon scepticism about the possibility of moral judgment, a scepticism implicitly disavowed in the above passage, rest on misunderstanding of passages from the works of natural law theorists. On such misunderstandings, see Finnis 1980, 23–55; Soper 1992.

Again: How could such fundamental questions as “Should we have law at all?” be “given shape” by the positivist thesis that law's existence and content depends only on social facts? Does not Green's claim invert the reasonable order of inquiry and reflection? Basic human needs and circumstances powerfully suggest to people in virtually all times and places that they should make and uphold some norms of the kind we call law, norms which will depend directly and for the most part on social facts such as custom, authoritative rule-making, and adjudication. Legal philosophy retraces and clarifies, critically, that elemental practical reasoning, somewhat as Hart did in Hart 1961, where he constructs a descriptive-explanatory account of law (i.e., refines his and our concept or understanding of law) by explaining how rules differ from habits, how powers have different functions and social value from obligations and so are not aptly reducible to obligations, and how “primary” rules for outlawing gross violence, theft and fraud need, by reason of their lack of certainty in content and application and their immobility, to be supplemented by “secondary” rules of recognition, adjudication and change, the remedial supplementation that shifts a society into the domain and rule of law and legal system. May not those elements in Hart's book be taken as an instance of natural law legal theory done in a primarily descriptive (rather than primarily justificatory) mode, and with incomplete scrutiny of the resources of practical reason, resources being drawn upon by the whole explanatory general description of law? Does not Hart's description, despite its incompleteness, work as well as it does precisely because it disinters some elementary justifications conceived and put to use by the people whose activities provide the material for the descriptions? Does he not share the deep methodology of Aristotle and the natural law tradition (Finnis 2003b) in making his identification of what law is (of “the concept of law”) depend upon his account of why law is a reasonable response to common human needs?

None of this is to say that a sound legal theory of the kind explained in this entry need be called “natural law theory.” Like all philosophy, it should be done by considering propositions, not labels.

6. Other elements of natural law theory

Intended to be part of a comprehensive theory of practical reasons that are fit to direct us to the common good of each of our communities and its members, any natural law theory of law brings to bear on law all the theses proposed and defended in natural law theory's moral and political parts and in a sound understanding of the human makeup and of the lasting characteristics of our circumstances. So, besides the questions listed by Green as quoted in section 5 above, issues such as the following three (see others in Finnis 2002) are treated by natural law theory as integral to legal science, theory or philosophy.

6.1 Intention in action and utterance

Rules of law are propositions of practical reason, apt for being taken as directive in the deliberations of law's individual subjects towards judgment, choice (decision), and action (including chosen forbearance). So a sound theory of law will have an integrated and critical understanding of the structure of chosen action, particularly of the relationships between the intending of ends, the adoption of means, the dual character of almost all ends as also means, and of almost all means as also ends, and the necessity and normal possibility of freely choosing between options which embody or promise benefits and disadvantages incommensurable (incompletely commensurable) (Finnis 1997) with the benefits and disadvantages of the alternative options. Such an understanding will clarify the often somewhat crude accounts given in criminal law dogmatics (case law and textbooks) of actus reus andmens rea, accounts which often fail to distinguish been action as a physically or conventionally demarcated chunk of behavior and action as the carrying out of the choice of an option, that is of a proposal shaped and thus given a privileged description in the deliberations of the acting subject. The difference between intended or chosen means (or ends) and foreseeable or even fully foreseen effects (“side-effects”), like the consequent difference between the moral and, presumptively, legal standards applicable respectively to intended and not-intended effects, is psychologically and morally real. But it is often distorted by a simplistic legal dogmatics too averse to the (very real) risk that defendants will prevaricate about what they had in mind. What counts, and can often be inferred despite prevarication, is the act-description under which the behavior chosen was attractive to the defendant in his or her actual deliberations (as distinct from rationalizing act-descriptions adopted to present that motivation in a better light).

The reality of intention in the distinct but related field of communication of meaning will also be explored and defended by a natural law theory of law. This does not involve an unqualified and simple originalism in constitutional interpretation, or a simple denial of the characteristic insistence of legal dogmatics that the intention of the parties to agreements or declarations is to be ascertained “objectively (not subjectively),” that is, by reference to what a reasonable observer would have taken the statement in issue to mean. For: such an observer (and thus the “objective” viewpoint) will presumptively have given primacy in this interpretation to what (as far as the observer can discern in the circumstances of the statement's making [= utterance]) the statement's author actually (“subjectively”) meant (= intended to express/state).

6.2 Responsibility and punishment

Criminal responsibility (guilt) is primarily for acts and consequences intended by the offender. Liability for negligence is relatively exceptional in modern criminal law, though the predominant form of liability in modern law of compensation (“civil law”). (The duties and standards of care used to attribute tortious/delictual/civil liability are in part straightforwardly moral and in part conventional—in neither part are they securely source-based in the sense of sources given unconditional primacy in legal positivism.)

The legal enunciation of rules of criminal law (mostly “prohibitions”) has as its primary goal the elimination or at least discouraging of the specified kinds of action (or omission). In this phase of the legal institution of criminal law and punishment, the goal can be called deterrence. The fact that this goal works partly by enforcement and application of the threatened sanction in the event of violation and conviction does not, however, entail that deterrence is the formative or even the primary end of punishment. Indeed, the institution of punishment has its primary sense and justification, not in deterrence, but in the restoration of that presumptively fair balance of burdens and advantages which offenders upset, precisely in choosing to prefer their own purposes and advantage to restraining their action so as to avoid violating the law. In preferring that self-preferential option, offenders help themselves to an advantage over all who do restrain themselves so as to respect the law. The offenders thereby upset the presumptively fair balance of advantages and burdens between themselves and the law-abiding. The primary purpose of punishment thus can reasonably be to restore that disturbed balance by depriving convicted offenders of their unfairly gained advantage—excess freedom of action—by imposing upon them measures, punishments, whose precise purpose is to restrict their freedom of action, whether by fines or imprisonment, proportionately to the degree to which they indulged their self-preference. Punishment in that way seeks to ensure that, over the span of time running from before the offence to the undergoing of the penalty, no one gains an advantage over fellow citizens by offending.

Thus, while compensation in civil law (tort, delict, etc.) rectifies the disturbed balance of advantages and burdens as between tortfeasors and their victims, punishment in criminal (penal) law rectifies the relationship between offenders and all the law-abiding members of the community. This retributive justification (general justifying aim) of punishment explains why mental competence and mens rea are standard legal pre-conditions of criminal guilt and liability to punishment. It is compatible with concurrent goals of deterrence, protection and reform, as bonus side-effects of the retributive sentence, and as organizing aims of specific measures and features e.g., of a prison regimen. It both presupposes and reinforces the reality that the political community in question stands to offenders and law-abiding alike as our community.

6.3 Each legal system is of and for a particular political community

Examination of (i) how one legal system becomes independent of another by lawful processes and (ii) how parts of a legal system (e.g., its constitution, or its rules for identifying office-holders) are replaced by the unlawful processes of coup d'état or revolution demonstrates (see Raz 1979, 100–109) that the identity of a subsisting legal system as one and the same system of legal norms cannot be explained (or even coherently described) by an account which refers only to the norms and their inter-relationships as validating norms and validated norms. The non-momentary identity of a legal system is a function of the subsisting identity of the community whose legal system it is. Legal theory is sub-alternated to the historical understanding (including self-understanding) of a community and its members as being this community—paradigmatically, this nation-state—rather than some accidental sequence or agglomeration of persons and events, and this understanding must be in some substantial measure non-dependent upon the legal norms that the community may succeed in constituting for itself and its members. Doubtless the shared purpose of living together under a rule of law, and the shared memory of a shared acknowledgment or recognition of such laws as our laws, are normally important components of such a shared understanding of political-communal and legal identity. But other shared purposes, memories and dispositions to act must be also be substantially present, if the phenomena of lawful independence and revolutionary constitutional change are to be as they are.

The not uncritical realism of natural law theory, evidenced in its approach to the realities of intention as distinct from foresight and inattention, and of self-preferential choice and the differing relationships between (i) offender and law-abiding and (ii) tortfeasor and victim, similarly enables it to undertake a critical reflection, within legal theory broadly understood, on the kinds of community capable of sustaining and being ordered in part by a legal system.

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