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Hugo Grotius (1583–1645) [Hugo, Huigh or Hugeianus de Groot] was a towering figure in philosophy, political theory, law and associated fields during the seventeenth century and for hundreds of years afterwards. His work ranged over a wide array of topics, though he is best known to philosophers today for his contributions to the natural law theories of normativity which emerged in the later medieval and early modern periods. This article will attempt to explain his views on the law of nature and related issues while simultaneously providing some broader assessment of his place in the history of ideas.
- 1. Life and works
- 2. Method
- 3. Natural Law
- 4. Political Philosophy
- 5. Just war doctrine
- 6. Originality and influence
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Prison escapee, high-stakes politician, shipwreck survivor, Grotius was a remarkable man who led a remarkable life. Born on April 10, 1583 in Delft, Holland—Easter Sunday, as his biographers invariably note—his family was moderately prosperous, well-educated and ambitious. From these nourishing if not particularly distinguished origins, Grotius soon proved himself exceptional. When he was eight, he began writing skilful elegies in Latin; by eleven, he was a student in the Faculty of Letters at the University of Leiden. In 1598, at the tender age of fifteen, he accompanied the leading Dutch politician of the day, Johan van Oldenbarnevelt, on an embassy to the royal court of France. There King Henry IV, impressed by his extraordinary learnedness, hailed him as “the miracle of Holland.” And three years later, when the United Provinces decided to reinforce their autonomy from Spain by retaining an official Latin historiographer to chronicle their history, they chose Grotius over Dominicus Baudius, a full professor of rhetoric at Leiden, for the position.
In the small world of Dutch high society, Grotius had clearly been identified as a young man going places. While in France, he had earned (or possibly just bought) a law degree from the University of Orléans. After returning to The Hague, he established a law practice and within a short time, his clientele included Oldenbarnevelt, the Dutch East India Company (V.O.C.) and Prince Maurice of Nassau. Apparently he impressed Maurice, for when the position of Attorney General of Holland, Zeeland and West Friesland became available in 1607, the Prince chose him over two other older and more experienced candidates. Grotius didn't particularly enjoy the practice of law—in letters he voiced complaints familiar to today's lawyers, bemoaning the tedium of the work and obstreperous clients—so he closed his firm upon being made Attorney General. Perhaps capitalizing on his new position and the healthy salary it paid, he soon married the redoubtable Maria van Reigersbergen, with whom he would eventually have three daughters and four sons.
After several years as Attorney General, Grotius was appointed Pensionary (roughly equivalent to Governor of an American state) of Rotterdam in 1613. That same year, he was called to put theory into practice when a dispute arose between the English and the Dutch over the freedom of the seas. The details are interesting but complicated: in essence, on the basis of the claim that two Dutch vessels were trespassing on seas owned by England near Greenland, a small British fleet seized the contents of the Dutch ships. Grotius led a delegation to England in protest of the English actions. While history may have favoured Grotius—his view that the seas are open to all would eventually come to be international law—real politick made victory impossible for him at the time. The English were more powerful than the Dutch, and they neither returned the cargo nor conceded the legal point.
1613 may have carried some excitement but the end of the decade was one of the true zeniths (or nadirs, depending on one's perspective) of Grotius' life. A dispute between orthodox Calvinists and reformers over arcane theological matters which no longer seem important to us quickly assumed enormous political significance. Grotius, Oldenbarnevelt and other supporters of religious tolerance were aligned on the side with the reformers or “Remonstrants”; Maurice, the Calvinist establishment and other so-called “Contra-Remonstrants” were on the other. On August 29, 1618, Maurice and his allies staged a coup, overthrowing the States General (of which Grotius was a member by virtue of his position as Pensionary of Rotterdam) and imprisoning him along with Oldenbarnevelt and Rombout Hoogerbeets, the Pensionary of Leiden. Consolidating his grip on power, Maurice soon moved to eliminate the Remonstrants and their supporters in government; as part of this putsch, Oldenbarnevelt was executed and Grotius and Hoogerbeets were sentenced to life imprisonment. It would be overly dramatic to say Grotius languished there: he was allowed to correspond with outsiders; moreover, he had books and writing materials, and indeed he composed much important work during this time. But the cold and damp cell was far from pleasant and there was the looming danger that the authorities would revisit his case and impose an even harsher punishment. So in March 1621, Grotius and his wife Maria decided enough was enough. Placing himself in a large trunk that Maria had shipped to him, Grotius escaped prison by having the trunk carried out on the pretence that it contained a number of books. He fled to Antwerp and thence to Paris, where his family eventually joined him.
Now began a more stable and productive period. The French authorities welcomed Grotius by awarding him an annual pension which, while not always paid, at least gave the promise of security. He began composition of De iure belli ac pacis (On the law of war and peace), which was published by a Parisian press in 1625. It quickly made Grotius famous: for example, in a letter to Grotius, Vossius says that Descartes told him that he had recently met the Dutchman (in reply, Grotius wrote that he didn't remember meeting Descartes, an indication of their relative stature at the time). Perhaps encouraged by the reception of his work, Grotius tried returning to the Netherlands in 1631. Initially, he may have had reason to be optimistic: after practicing law for a little while in Amsterdam, he was offered the Governor Generalship of the V.O.C. in Asia. Soon enough, however, the authorities moved against him, placing a large price on his head and forcing him in April 1632 to flee his home country. Grotius would never set foot there again.
This time, he went to Hamburg, Germany. Nearby Sweden (one of the superpowers of the day) had numerous connections to the city, which made it quite natural for Swedish authorities to notice the presence and availability for hire of such a luminary. Moving to take advantage of the situation, they made him their Ambassador to France in 1634. Grotius began his diplomatic duties in Paris the following year. It is hard to gauge his success as ambassador: while he did help to negotiate a treaty which led to the end of the Thirty Years' War, he could also be outmanoeuvred in the diplomatic game—at one point, his bumbling forced the Swedish Chancellor Axel Oxenstierna to come to Paris and sort things out. Still, such stories notwithstanding, it is true that he lasted ten years in one of the highest and most demanding diplomatic postings of his day (Sweden being of the superpowers of mid-seventeenth century Europe).
During this time, Grotius returned to the theological issues which had earlier caused him such grief. The project of Christian unity—harmonizing both the various Protestant factions and the Protestants with the Catholics—became increasingly important to him. Both intellectually and practically, it was a task which suited him and his place in life: intellectually, because Christian unity raised many conceptual puzzles which challenged his mind; practically, because as ambassador for one of the great European powers, he could use his position to press the cause. Of course, the cause was doomed to failure—certainly, it was well beyond Grotius' abilities. Yet, it did lead him to write some extremely interesting and influential works, many of which were collected in his Opera Omnia Theologica.
After Queen Christina ascended to the throne in 1644, she systematically began to undermine her rival Oxenstierna and—as part of this infighting—recalled Grotius from his ambassadorship. She didn't fire him; instead, she instructed him to come to Stockholm and assume a different position. At first, Grotius didn't want to go, but bowing to the force of royal prerogative (not to mention economic necessity), he set sail for Stockholm in March 1645. It was a fateful decision: travelling conditions on the Baltic in late winters can be harsh; his ship wrecked and Grotius barely escaped with his life. After spending a few months in Sweden, he decided to return to Germany and so undertook another voyage. Again, conditions were poor; it took eight long days to cross the relatively narrow stretch of water. This time, it was too much: weakened by recent events, Grotius died on August 28, 1645, in Rostock, Germany. While they are probably apocryphal, his supposed last words—“By attempting many things, I have accomplished nothing”—do evoke the span of his life's work and his personal assessment of the results.
Given that he led such an active public life while also raising a large family, the sheer quantity of Grotius' works is nothing short of astonishing. Typical, for him, was the time of his embassy to France. The same year as the embassy, he published Pontifex Romanus, a collection of six essays on recent political events. While working on this, he produced what are in essence critical editions of two works: the Phaenomena, an astrononomical work of the 3rd century BCE by Aratus of Soli, and Martianus Capella's handbook of the seven liberal arts. He also began research on a history of the Netherlands, research would which much later would result in the Annales et Historiae de Rebus Belgicis. And he did all this while still in his late teens. Over the full course of his life, Grotius would write or edit some five-dozen book-length works and innumerable smaller pieces.
To philosophers and the philosophically-minded, two of these stand out: De iure praedae commentarius (Commentary on the law of prize and booty, henceforth referred to as “DIP”) and De iure belli ac pacis (“DIB”). The former was almost lost. Placed in a trunk sometime during or after his life, the sole manuscript copy was uncovered when some of his descendents sold a collection of his papers in 1864 (for an account of these events, see Knight (1925), Chap. 5). It was apparently commissioned by the V.O.C. around 1603. In it, Grotius was to defend the capture of a large Portuguese merchant ship by a V.O.C. fleet in the area around modern-day Singapore. The key legal and conceptual question was whether any private agent (such as the V.O.C.) could legitimately employ force against another private agent which was impeding its actions (see Tuck (1993), 170). But it also had an important propagandistic objective, which was to defame the Portuguese (and Spanish) while extolling the V.O.C. and Dutch (for more on the general historical context of the DIP, see van Ittersum (2002)). Modern philosophical readers will find the “Prolegomena” of Chapter Two especially interesting, since that is where Grotius lays out his views on the nature and bases of rights. While Grotius chose not to publish this or most of the manuscript, he did see Chapter Twelve into press. Given the title Mare Liberum (On the freedom of the seas), it was both influential and controversial: among others, the Englishman John Selden published a critical reply.
Whatever the merits of the DIP, it is on the DIB that the bulk of Grotius' reputation rests. It consists of an introduction and three books, totalling more than 900 pages in translation. As with DIP, the introduction or “Prolegomena” holds the greatest interest for philosophers, for it is here that Grotius articulates and defends the philosophical foundations of the DIB. While philosophers are naturally attracted to the “Prolegomena,” the body of the DIB is also redolent with themes of philosophical interest. Book One defines the concept of war, argues for the legitimacy of war, and identifies who may legitimately wage war. Book Two deals with the causes of war, the origins of property, the transfer of rights and more, while Book Three is dedicated primarily to the rightful conduct of belligerents in war. After the initial publication in 1625, Grotius ushered several more editions to press during his life, each time adding more references without substantially changing the arguments. (A word of explanation about citations to the DIB: they commonly take the form of book, chapter, section and—where applicable—paragraph; so, “I.1.10.1” means “Book One, Chapter One, Section Ten, Paragraph One”.)
The first reaction of many readers is to the very style of Grotius' prose. So before getting to his ideas and arguments, a few words should be said his method, both in the DIP and the DIB (differences between the two—and there are differences—can be ignored for our purposes). There are several distinct sets of issues. First and most obviously, there is the question of what we should make of the voluminous references to ancient, medieval and early modern works which can be found in the margins of both books. Some have taken a rather dim view of them; in a scornful passage of Emile, Rousseau wrote:
True political theory [le droit politique] is yet to appear, and it is to be presumed that it never will. Grotius, the master of all the savants in this subject, is but a child; and, what is worse, a dishonest child [enfant de mauvaise foi]. When I hear Grotius praised to the skies and Hobbes covered with execration I see how far sensible men read or understand these two authors. The truth is that their principles are exactly the same: they only differ in their expression. They also differ in their method. Hobbes relies on sophisms, and Grotius on the poets; all the rest is the same. (Rousseau (1915), vol. II, 147)
It would be absurd to deny that Grotius does rely “on the poets”—after all, he said in the “Prolegomena” to the DIB that “the testimony of philosophers, historians, poets, finally also of orators” will be used to “prove the existence of this law of nature” (§40). Arguments from authority carried great weight for him: the more illuminati one could cite, the better for one's argument. Philosophers today are not going to be impressed by such arguments, though they can be instructive to historians of philosophy. By studying Grotius' use of texts, one can learn how they were interpreted in the early modern period—and this can unlock one of the many barriers to understanding that time.
But is there more to his citations of these texts than just an overly respectful attitude toward authority? Most scholars think there is, though they are divided on what it might be. One possibility is that they reflect Grotius' commitment to the idea of philosophia perennis. Like Leibniz a few decades later, Grotius thought there were elements of truth in virtually all great thinkers. He writes, “I quote them as witnesses whose conspiring testimony, proceeding from innumerable different times and places, must be referred to some universal cause” (DIB, Prol. §40). His job as heir to ideas of the great dead is to combine or synthesize them into a single unified theory. And doing that requires him to draw on them as frequently as possible.
Another suggestion sees Grotius as deeply concerned to refute scepticism about international law. Grotius was upset when the powerful French Cardinal Richelieu told him, “the weakest are always wrong in matters of state.” How is it that he can convince doubters such as Richelieu of the existence and force of a set of norms governing the conduct of governments both domestically and internationally? The argument will never be easily won but the burden may be lightened by sharing the load. If Grotius can show that so many people throughout history have accepted what the sceptic denies, then perhaps the force of numbers may change the sceptic's mind.
Quite apart from the questions posed by the marginalia, an entirely different aspect of Grotius' method concerns his refusal to divide ethics, politics and law into separate subjects. These days, compartmentalization is the norm; ordinarily, we study one of these subjects while paying scant attention to the others. Now, it is true that Grotius does often identify ways in which legal norms differ from moral or political ones (see, e.g., the discussion of laws at the beginning of DIB I.1). At the same time, he does not think that law, politics and ethics are entirely distinct domains. If one reads Grotius with the expectation that he will keep them apart, one will likely be befuddled by the way he ignores distinctions which are important to us. It may help to know that he does this because he is interested in picking out the fundamental principles which lie at the basis of all normativity, not just a portion thereof. He cannot talk just about ethics, say, because his views on ethics are informed by his views on politics and the law. A fundamental tenet of his thought is that moral, political and legal norms are all based on laws derived from or supplied by nature.
The issues here are complex and much discussed. For more, see Dufour (1980), Tanaka (1993), Vermeulen (1983) and Whewell (1853).
Natural law is multiply ambiguous. It can be descriptive, in that it is sometimes supposed to describe a certain set of facts which obtain because of some natural features. At the same time, it can also be prescriptive, in that it is sometimes supposed to prescribe certain forms of behaviour as acceptable and proscribe others as unacceptable. On another level, its scope or range of application is unfixed. Some natural law theories pertain to political entities (typically states and relations among states); others, to civil laws; yet others, to moral agents. On still another level, the ambiguities can be seen as stemming from the very notions of “natural” and “law.” “Natural” can refer to human nature, or to the nature of the universe in general, or both. One's sense of the validity and force of a natural law theory will vary enormously depending on which reference is employed. “Law” was similarly contested. One extreme interpreted it literally, so that a natural law is a rule implemented by some agent (typically God) which compels obedience on pain of some penalty. The other extreme took “law” completely metaphorically, picking out some standard or norm perceivable in natural phenomena which governs behaviour through entirely impersonal means.
Such variation should not be surprising, for the natural law tradition was long and robust. Though there were ties to the ancient world, it began in earnest with Aquinas, since he was the first to formulate a group of ideas systematic enough to be called a theory. The tradition continued through the middle ages and into the early modern era before (allegedly) meeting its demise in Kant. Given that natural law was the dominant paradigm in ethics, politics and law for hundreds of years—much longer than the period from Kant to us—it is entirely predictable that theorists would have pushed that paradigm in so many directions. It may be that there is some essence shared by all natural law theories; for example, one recent commentator has suggested that the “stable core in [the natural law tradition] is the idea that morals is primarily a matter of norms or prescriptions and only derivatively about virtues and values” (Haakonssen (1992), 884). But those who study natural law in the period of its flourishing will be impressed by the almost unlimited possibilities of interpretation.
Though this is not an article on the natural law, these points are necessary preliminaries for considering Grotius' natural law views. If Grotius is at all known to philosophers today, it is for being “the father of natural law” (as put by, e.g., Vreeland (1917)). At this juncture, we need not assess the validity of this claim (for more on Grotius' originality, see Section 6 below). Instead, we ought to understand Grotius' actual views on the laws of nature. To understand his views, four issues need to be examined: first, the source of the laws; second, their nature or content; third, their force or obligatory status; finally, their scope.
Why are there natural laws? Do they exist in virtue of the nature of things or for some other reason? These are the questions lurking behind the issue of source. Grotius changed his mind on how they should be answered. In the DIP he declares that “What God has shown to be His Will, that is law. This axiom points directly to the cause of law, and is rightly laid down as the primary principle” (Chap. II). Here Grotius announces a thesis about the relation between normativity and the divine being which is commonly known as “voluntarist”: by an act of volition, God determines the full and exact content of all normative categories—justice, goodness and so forth. Voluntarism was a well-established tradition of natural law theories; the DIP belongs firmly in that tradition. In later works, however, Grotius departs from it. For example, in the De summa potestatum, he declares that normativity of any kind “arises from the nature of the action itself, so that it is right per se to worship God and it is right per se not to lie” (Opera Omnia Theologica, vol. III, p. 187). A much more famous expression of non-voluntarism appears in the “Prolegomena” to the DIB. In the first few sections of the “Prolegomena,” Grotius lays the groundwork for his natural law theory. Then, in section eleven, he writes that “What we have been saying would have a degree of validity even if we should concede [etiamsi daremus] that which cannot be conceded without the utmost wickedness, that there is no God, or that the affairs of men are of no concern to him.” Instead of emerging from or being otherwise dependent on God, the fundamental principles of ethics, politics and law obtain in virtue of nature. As he says, “the mother of right—that is, of natural law—is human nature” (Prol. §16). Somewhat later, he clarifies why it is that human nature produces the natural law: “The law of nature is a dictate of right reason, which points out that an act, according as it is or is not in conformity with rational nature, has in it a quality of moral baseness or moral necessity; and that, in consequence, such an act is either forbidden or enjoined” (I.1.10.1). If an action agrees with the rational and social aspects of human nature, it is permissible; if it doesn't, it is impermissible (cf. I.1.12.1). That is to say, the source of the natural law is the (in)compatibility of actions with our essences as rational and social beings. For discussion of the etiamsi daremus passage, see St. Leger (1962) and Todescan (2003).
Suppose we have established where the laws come from. This will reveal nothing about the second of our four issues: viz., the content of the laws or what they actually say. Grotius' views on how we should learn about this were quite consistent: throughout his corpus, he continued to maintain that (as he put it in the DIP), “The Will of God is revealed, not only through oracles and portents, but above all in the very design of the Creator; for it is from this last source that the law of nature is derived” (Chap. II). As he put it in the DIB, the law of nature “proceeds from the essential traits implanted in man” (Prol. §12). Where some other natural law theories solved the problem of knowledge through recourse to the supernatural, Grotius did not. For him, a study of nature itself—and more specifically, a study of human nature—can suffice to teach us the essentials of ethics, politics and law.
And what, exactly, does such a study reveal about those fundamental normative principles? The reasoning in both the DIP and DIB may be reconstructed as follows. Human nature is constituted by two essential properties: the desire for self-preservation and the need for society (see DIP, Chap. 2, and DIB, Prol. §§6–7). These two properties temper and inform each other: the desire for self-preservation is limited by the social impulse, so that humans do not naturally seek to maintain and enhance their being at all costs; conversely, the need for the company of other humans is limited by the self-preservation drive, for individuals must naturally strive to secure the means for their well-being. Moreover, the self-preservation drive and the sociability impulse are both emotive and cognitive; they are both non-rational and rational, having the force of unreflective instinct as well as well-thought-out plans. Because we are essentially both social and self-preserving beings, it follows that two things are imperative for our successful existence. We ought to abstain from what belongs to other persons, and we ought to engage in the reasonable pursuit of what genuinely serves our interest. Accordingly, Grotius makes these the first two elements of natural law in the DIB (see Prol. §§8, 10); they form the core of the first four “laws” in the DIP (see Chap. II). While these principles enjoy lexical priority in the hierarchy of natural norms, they do not exhaust the list. A study of nature also teaches us that “Evil deeds must be corrected” and “Good deeds must be recompensed” (Laws V-VI of the DIP). In fact, Grotius derives a list of some 22 fundamental natural tenets in the DIP and a similarly large group (though not numbered in the same way) in the DIB. Any explanation of Grotius' natural law theory should begin by citing these first-order tenets or principles, for they are what constitute its substance.
But why are they operative on us? Why do they enjoin or prohibit us from performing certain specific actions? Here we come to our third issue, concerning the laws' force or obligatory status. Traditionally, natural law theorists tended to invoke God for their solution to this very deep mystery. Aquinas, for example, argued that obligation is the result of an action of will by a superior on an inferior (see, e.g., Summa Theologica II.ii.q104). We are obliged to follow civil laws because our political superiors have forced us to do so through actions of their more powerful wills. And we are obliged to follow natural laws because God has forced us to do so through his infinitely more powerful will. Grotius was tempted by this view; he writes in DIB that morally necessary acts must be “understood as necessarily commanded or forbidden by God” (I.1.10.2).
As any parent knows, however, “because I said so” is not the most compelling reason for action. That is true even when the person speaking is God. Hence thinkers have long sought to articulate other grounds for obligation. In Grotius' time, for example, Suarez wrote, “to break the natural law without sinning involves an inconsistency… and therefore the existence of an obligation which is imposed by the natural law but which is not a matter of conscience also involves an inconsistency” (De legibus, II.IX.6). Here we find a very different account of the basis of obligation: we are obliged to perform or avoid certain actions which are incompatible with our consciences, because we will be guilty of inconsistency if we don't. To put it in slightly different terms, we are obliged to perform or avoid certain actions which are compatible or incompatible with our natures as rational beings, because we will be less than human if we don't. Grotius adopts this idea for himself, modifying it in keeping with his rich conception of human nature: for him, natural law obliges us to perform actions which conduce to our rationality, sociability and need for self-preservation. This thought underlies several of his specific laws of nature—such as, for instance, the law that evil deeds must be corrected. Grotius places this obligation under the heading of compensatory justice (DIP, Chap. Two). The “task of compensatory justice” is “restitution”: using the example of theft, Grotius explains that “such justice requires that the thing taken shall be returned” (ibid.). Evil deeds have disturbed the moral and legal equilibrium of society; they have unjustly benefited some while unjustly harming others. Since it is imperative to maintain healthy social relations, it is imperative that evil deeds be punished.
The problem of explaining why we should obey the laws of nature—or indeed, why we should obey any set of norms—is one of the most enduring in philosophy; it would be rash to suppose that a solution can be found in Grotius. One inadequacy of his account is inspired by Richelieu: while Grotius tries to separate and equalize our rational, social and self-interested motives for action, one may question whether they are in fact distinct and equal. If it can be shown that one is more fundamental than the others—that, say, self-interest is our first and most basic reason for action—then our reason for obeying the laws of nature and being moral will be very different from what Grotius argued. (For additional discussion, see Korsgaard (1996), 7, 21–22 and 28–30.)
Moving on, we come to the last of our four issues—i.e., scope. In Grotius' day, this issue was made urgent by European encounters with indigenous peoples in the Americas and elsewhere (for discussion, see Tierney (1997), Chapter XI). Some theorists tried to place epistemic or doxastic restrictions on the scope of the laws, arguing that they enjoined and protected only those who held certain beliefs. Since the beliefs which determined the applicability of the laws were usually religious in nature, it was commonly argued that natural laws were pertinent only to Christians and did not cover non-Christians. Given that natural laws form the basis for morality, then since they do not cover non-Christians, it follows that Christians were under no obligations to treat non-Christians morally. Like many others, Grotius strongly disagreed with such arguments. For him, natural laws apply to all rational and social beings as such. It doesn't matter what they think or believe; if they are rational and social, they are bound by the law of nature (see, e.g., DIB II.20.44).
As the previous section stressed, Grotius' natural law theory was about much more than politics; it offered an account of normativity of all kinds. At the same time as he was concerned to explicate normativity generally speaking, the evidence unambiguously suggests that he was especially interested in political issues. After all, he did lead a very political life and his two greatest works are eminently political. In this section, a few of his political ideas are discussed.
Let's start with one closely connected to the problem of obligation. Just now, it was said that the ground of obligation lay in our natures as rational, social, self-preserving beings. This is correct but it needs amplification. Grotius did not conceive of our essences as static; instead, they are dynamic, expressive of our abilities and activities. This is emphatically reflected in his conception of rights (ius, or iura in the plural). He distinguishes between several meanings of iura, the most important of which conceives of a ius as “a moral quality of a person, making it possible to have or to do something correctly” (DIB I.1.4). For Grotius, a ius or right is a capacity or power possessed by the agent; it is a “faculty” or an “aptitude” of the person (ibid.). To have a ius is to have the ability to engage in certain specified actions without moral or legal sanction. So, for example, when he endows humans with the right to self-preservation, he grants us the power to pursue our own interests without needing the permission or assistance of the state or any other authority. Because rights are centred on the individual subject, one will often read that Grotius propounded a theory of “subjective right” (see, e.g., Kingsbury and Roberts (1990), 31 and references there).
The import of Grotius' theory of rights can be clarified contrasting it with the dominant medieval conception of iura. This conception stems primarily from Aquinas, who held that “the word ius was first of all used to denote the just thing itself” (ST II.ii.q57.art1). In its original usage, ius was applied to things—actions, entities, situations—and not persons. As Aquinas and his followers conceived of it, things earn the appellation “right” when they align fully with the natural law. For two reasons, then, the medieval conception of rights can be thought of as “objective”: first, because the things which are right are objects (and not subjects); second, because things become worthy of the label “right” when they satisfy an objective, agent-independent set of necessity and sufficient conditions, viz., those conditions required for conformity to the natural law. Now, it is true that this medieval view had begun to be displaced by Grotius' time; for example, Suarez says that a “strict acceptation of ius” bestows it “upon a certain moral power which every man has, either over his own property or with respect to that which is due to him” (De legibus I.2.5). However, Grotius is usually given the credit for shifting the paradigm fundamentally (see, e.g., Haakonssen (1985), 240; for an opposing view, see Irwin (2008), 98). While it took time for his paradigm to become hegemonic, it did eventually prevail. When we say that so-and-so has the right to such-and-such, we usually mean that he has the means or power to do such-and-such: for example, the assertion that someone has the right to freedom of thought means that he has the ability to think as he pleases and no one or no thing can force him to do otherwise. This was Grotius' view; though subsequently mediated by many others, his contribution was essential.
In addition to its intrinsic interest, Grotius' innovative conception of rights had numerous important consequences. Two examples may serve as illustrations. First, whereas medieval theorists tended to speak of “the right,” Grotius and his successors stressed the powers and entitlements of the person who has rights. By associating rights with the powers of a person, moderns were able to distinguish sharply between rights on the one hand versus duties on the other (cf. Finnis (1980), 209). Second, because Grotius made rights into powers or faculties which humans possessed, he played a crucial part in the commoditization of rights. Once rights became possessions, they can be traded away just like all other possessions. The means of transfer might not be identical to other exchanges of goods but the essential idea of giving away something in one's possession for something which isn't is there. As commentators have argued, the commoditization of rights was one of the most important political developments of the seventeenth century (for more, see especially Macpherson (1962), 3f).
Grotius exploited the latter idea in some of the more notorious parts of his corpus. Take the following:
At this point first of all the opinion of those must be rejected who hold that everywhere and without exception sovereignty resides in the people, so that it is permissible for the people to restrain and punish kings whenever they make a bad use of their power… We refute it by means of the following arguments.
To every man it is permitted to enslave himself to any one he pleases for private ownership, as is evident both from the Hebraic and from the Roman Law. Why, then, would it there not be as lawful for a People who are at their own disposal to deliver up themselves to some one person, or to several persons, and transfer the right of governing them upon him or them, retaining no vestige of that right for themselves? (DIB I.3.8.1).
Grotius extends the case elsewhere, insisting that a people may give their rights to a ruler, receiving a peaceful and stable society in return (DIB I.4.2.1). But what are the limits placed on the ruler who has taken possession of these rights? To some readers, Grotius' willingness to allow agents to transfer their rights leaves him open to charges of befriending despots. Provided that the initial transfer of rights was legitimate, then once the ruler is in possession of rights, those living under him or her have no right to complain that certain forms of behaviour are unjust, for they have no relevant rights at all. As Rousseau put it, Grotius “spares no pains to rob the people of all their rights and invest kings with them” (Social Contract, Book II, Chapter Two). To be sure, other readers denied that Grotius' theory allowed agents a total transfer of their rights; in particular, they contended that agents will always retain their fundamental rights, such as the right of self-defence (see Locke as interpreted by Tuck (1979), 172–3). Nevertheless, whatever the theory itself actually implies, it remains that Grotius himself seems to have believed that agents may surrender all liberties in certain circumstances (for more, see DIB I.3.9–16).
On a more positive note, Grotius' recognition of the transferability of rights led him to a novel solution for one of the great problems of political philosophy. What is the source of the state's right or power? Two traditional answers were (1) God—he set up the state and it derives its authority from his sanction—and (2) might—because the state is powerful, it has the authority to govern, for might makes right. While Grotius flirts with both of these, he finally settled for something else. He writes in the DIP, “just as every right [ius] of the magistrate comes to him from the state, so has the same right come to the state from private individuals; and similarly, the power of the state is the result of collective agreement” (Chap. Eight). Through innumerable, separate, sequential decisions occurring over a protracted period of time, individuals gradually agreed to form institutions for governing society by imbuing them with some of power which they naturally possess. Eventually, these institutions gelled into a single coherent entity which is the state. The state's power, then, is the product neither of God nor of sheer force but instead of the wilful transference of individuals' powers or rights to it. It may be a mistake to interpret this idea as a nascent contractualism (see Tuck (1993), 178–9) but likewise, it would be a mistake to deny the appeal it would have to later contractualists such as Hobbes.
All of this underscores Grotius' real but uneven contributions to the doctrines of political liberalism which were being formulated in his time. To the emerging theory of liberalism, he gave the idea that individuals—both individual persons and individual groups of persons—are bearers of rights. Also, he advanced the compelling second-order account of the nature of those rights described above. And he argued strongly in support of the attribution of several specific first-order rights: for example, besides those which have already been mentioned (such as self-defence), he vigorously defended rights to property. However, as important as these and other contributions to liberalism are, they must be balanced against some of Grotius' other views. For instance, while it is true that he thought individuals had rights, it is also true that he thought there were a number of circumstances in which those rights might be surrendered or even just overridden. So the rights that we are supposed to have in Grotius' theory are not completely assured. More sinister are his views on slavery, which is or at least can be an entirely just institution. In the DIP he writes that Aristotle is not “mistaken when he says that certain persons are by nature slaves” (Chap. Six, Quest. V, Art. One). While Grotius may have repudiated this thought in the DIB (see III.7.1—but see also I.3.8.4), a simple argument continued to convince him that slavery is compatible with a just society. If individuals may sell their labour, Grotius reasons, then they should also be able to sell their liberty. If they sell all of their liberty, then they are of course slaves (I.3.8.1). A final weight to be placed on the balance of Grotius' liberalism is his view on the status of rulers or sovereigns. Because sovereignty is “that power… whose actions are not subject to the legal control of another” (DIB I.3.7.1), it follows as a necessary truth that those who hold sovereignty are necessarily superior to all others. Because they are necessarily superior to the rest, Grotius considers rebarbative the suggestion that sovereigns are answerable to their subjects. They may wish to take the needs of her or his subjects into account (III.15) but this is only “praiseworthy” and not imperative. In sum, then, Grotius' contributions to political liberalism are comparable to Hobbes, Spinoza, Locke and other seventeenth century luminaries. They are genuine and significant while mixed with decidedly non-liberal themes.
As the title of his magnum opus implies, the normative status of war was of paramount concern to Grotius. The common distinction between ius ad bellum and ius in bello—the distinction between the rightful causes of war versus the rightful conduct of war—is useful for understanding his views. Regarding ius ad bellum, Grotius devotes DIP Chap. Three and DIB I.2 to the question of whether it is ever lawful to wage war. He argues that war is not only compatible with but sometimes compelled by all three major kinds of law—the law of nature, the law of nations or international law, and divine law. In support of his answer, he adduces a number of conceptual, historical and theological arguments. It would be tendentious to recount all of his arguments, so take just one influential example of the first sort:
He who wills the attainment of a given end, wills also the things that are necessary to that end. God wills that we should protect ourselves, retain our hold on the necessities of life, obtain that which is our due, punish transgressors, and at the same time defend the state… But these divine objectives sometimes constitute causes for undertaking and carrying on war… Thus it is God's Will that certain wars should be waged… Yet no one will deny that whatsoever God will, is just. Therefore, some wars are just. (DIP Chap. Three)
Far from believing that war is a condition outside the realm of morality and law, Grotius took it to be an instrument of right (cf. Dumbauld (1969), 73). As he wrote, “where judicial settlement fails, war begins” (DIB II.1.2.1). Wars may be justly undertaken in response either to “wrongs not yet committed, or to wrongs already done” (ibid.). The list of wrongs which justify war is long, including the inflicting of punishment (ibid.), self-defence (II.1.3), the defence of chastity (II.1.7), etc. At the same time as he countenances war, Grotius does set limits, some of them controversial. For example, he argues that one doesn't have the right to defend oneself against an assailant who is “useful to many” (II.1.9.1). This principle applies to both individuals and states. So it follows that both individuals and states may be obliged to acquiesce when attacked by someone important to society—whether the society of a single nation or the society of nations. Overall, it has been argued, what sets Grotius' analysis of ius ad bellum apart from his predecessors is “in his detailed and systematic elaboration of the ‘just causes' of war’” (Draper (1992), 194).
Even supposing that a war has been undertaken rightly, it must also be fought rightly for it to be just. And here we come to ius in bello, a topic treated in DIB III. Grotius begins by setting three rules governing the conduct of war (DIB III.1.2–4), the first and most basic of which is that “In war things which are necessary to attain the end in view are permissible” (III.1.2). This obviously places wide limits on permissible conduct, though it isn't as chilling as a first reading might suggest, for the necessity requirement can be hard to meet. After advancing these rules, Grotius considers the permissibility of a large number of actions. The variety and amount of detail in this discussion is fascinating. Typical is his analysis of ruses, deceit and falsehood. Not only does he distinguish between those three ways of conveying false impressions but also he distinguishes variations within each of them (see III.1.6–20). For example, if deceit is a genus, then deceit in a negative action is one species (III.1.7) and deceit in a positive action is another (III.1.8). And deceit in a positive action can in turn be divided into two sub-species (ibid.). The practical aims of DIB come through plainly here and throughout Book III, where the priority seems to be clarifying what exactly is and is not permissible in war by considering a large number of actions which could belligerents could undertake and determining their moral and legal standing. In general, Grotius held that war is justifiable when, and only when, it serves right. Since the conditions for service to right are numerous and non-obvious, he must expend considerable effort identifying and explicating them (for more, see Draper (1992), 191–207).
Coming at last to a broader assessment of Grotius' contributions to the history of ideas, we should start by distinguishing the question of his originality from that of his influence. For our purposes, it will suffice to define originality as involving the formation of novel and important new concepts and/or methods while taking influence to consist in having major effects on others. Let us handle originality first before coming to the easier question of Grotius' influence.
Given that his work ranged across so many different fields—ethics, political theory, politics, religion—it is impossible to make a blanket statement that Grotius was or was not an original thinker. Instead, the only responsible approach is to deal with his alleged contributions on a case-by-case basis. Because it would be tedious to go through all the cases here, let us just take the two which are likely to be of greatest interest to philosophers: ethics and political theory.
There is scholarly dispute about the originality of Grotius' ethics. Irwin (2008) has recently argued that because he merely extracts the major elements of his theory of morality from other authors, especially Aquinas and Suarez, “Grotius is no pioneer” in the history of ethics (98). By contrast, Schneewind (1993) thinks that Grotius deserves credit for introducing agonism into ethics—the notion that “conflict is ineradicable, and could not be removed, even in principle, by the completest possible metaphysical knowledge of how the world is constituted” (58). Others who have weighed in include Kilcullen (1995) and Darwall (forthcoming). A clear and balanced assessment is given by Tierney (1997), Chapter XIII.
Turning to political theory, Sections 4–5 above identified various concrete contributions of Grotius' to politics. For many scholars, however, Grotius is important not so much for his new ideas as for his new way of thinking about political problems. So, Kingsbury and Roberts (1990) say, “the greatest direct contribution of” the DIB is “the systematic reassembling of practice and authorities on the traditional but fundamental subject of the jus belli, organized for the first time around a body of principles rooted in the law of nature” (3–4).
There is a different gauge of Grotius' originality in the domain of politics. Through his writings, he gave rise to a theory of statehood and the relations among states which has come to be known as, simply, “Grotian” (the labels are used by Wight (1991), among others). This theory is an account of the origins and identity conditions of states. It conceives of states as existing not in a pre- or anti-social condition but rather in an international society governed by a system of norms. Those norms hold apart from a positive action by a legislature or legislator. At the same time as it insists on the existence and relevance of these norms (which are, of course, the laws of nature), it is also cognizant of the force of real politick. Individual states will engage in the pursuit of their own perceived interests, regardless of whether such pursuits place them in conflict with the natural law. By doing all of this, the Grotian school is supposed to negotiate a middle way between bare-knuckled “Machiavellianism” and excessively idealistic “Kantianism” (for more, see Wight together with the criticisms in Bull (1976)). Depending on the fortunes of these schools at any particular moment in history, Grotius' influence on international relations will be waxing or waning.
That mention of the influence brings us to the second broad topic of this concluding section. Scholars may argue about whether and how Grotius was original but no one can doubt his influence. For example, the Swedish King Gustav Adolph is supposed to have kept a copy of the DIB under his pillow, next to the Bible. And King James I reacted strongly (and negatively) to Grotius' presentations during a diplomatic mission to England.
So Grotius' influence was felt on some of the major actors of his day. Naturally, though, his main impact was on other scholars. Bayle called him “one of the greatest men in Europe.” Leibniz hailed “the incomparable Hugo Grotius.” Thomas Reid spoke of “the immortal Hugo Grotius,” Hutcheson drew on him extensively, and Hume approvingly cited an argument of his about the origins of property in the third appendix of his second Enquiry. To be sure, not all were so impressed. Rousseau's opinion has already been cited; the natural law theorist Samuel Pufendorf was also sceptical. And Voltaire found Grotius to be simply boring. Still, whether for good or for ill, Grotius was at the centre of letters for an enviably long time. For a brief synopsis of Grotius' influence, focusing on the DIB , see Tuck (2005), pp. ix-xii.
Primary Texts and Translations
N.B.: This is but a small selection of Grotius' more important works. For a more complete catalogue, see ter Meulen and Diermanse (1950).
- Mare liberum (Leiden: Elzevier, 1609). Reprinted and translated many times since. The translation and edition by Ralph van Deman Magoffin (Oxford: Oxford University Press, 1916) contains a facsimile of the 1633 edition. See also the recently published The Free Sea; trans. by Richard Hakluyt with William Welwod's critique and Grotius's reply, edited and with an introduction by David Armitage (Indianapolis: Liberty Fund, 2004).
- De iure belli ac pacis libri tres (Paris: Buon, 1625). Reprinted and translated many times since. Jean Barbeyrac's 1735 edition, with extensive notes and commentary, was the most important; it was translated into English and published in London by Innys et al. in 1738. It has been recently reprinted as The Rights of War and Peace, Books I-III, edited and with an introduction by Richard Tuck (Indianapolis: Liberty Fund, 2005). Another commonly used edition and translation is by Frank W. Kelsey et al. for the Classics of International Law series (Oxford: Oxford University Press, 1925). Kelsey's version is printed with a facsimile of the 1646 edition.
- Annales et Historiae de Rebus Belgicis (Amsterdam: Blaeu, 1657). Translated by T. Manley (London: Twyford and Paulet, 1665).
- Opera omnia theologica (London: Moses Pitt, 1679).
- De iure praedae commentarius, ed. by G. Hamaker (The Hague: Nijhoff, 1868). The most commonly used edition and translation is by G.L. Williams et al. for the Classics of International Law series (Oxford: Oxford University Press, 1950). Williams' version is printed along with a collotype of Grotius' manuscript.
- Briefwisseling van Hugo Grotius, ed. by P.C. Molhuysen et al. (The Hague: Nijhoff, 1928–2001).
- Grotius Reader: A Reader for Students of International Law and Legal History, ed. by L.E. van Holk and C.G. Roelofsen (The Hague: T.M.C. Asser Instituut, 1983).
- The Antiquity of the Batavian Republic (Assen, the Netherlands: Royal van Gorcum, 2000). Ed. and trans. by Jan Waszink et al.
Select Secondary Literature
N.B.: In addition to the following (which emphasizes English-language literature), interested readers should also consult the scholarly journal Grotiana (new series), which regularly publishes articles in several languages on all aspects of Grotius' thought and legacy.
- [anonymous]. (1984). (ed.) The World of Hugo Grotius (Amsterdam and Maarssen: APA—Holland University Press).
- Asser Instituut. (1985). (eds.) International Law and the Grotian Heritage (The Hague: T.M.C. Asser Instituut).
- Blom, Hans W. (2009). (ed.) Property, Piracy and Punishment: Hugo Grotius on War and Booty in De Iure Praedae—Concepts and Contexts (Leiden: Brill).
- Blom, Hans W., and Winkel, Laurens. (2004). (eds.) Grotius and the Stoa (Assen, the Netherlands: Royal Van Gorcum).
- Bull, Hedley, et al. (1990). (eds.) Hugo Grotius and International Relations (Oxford: Clarendon Press).
- Dunn, John, and Harris, Ian. (1997). (eds.) Grotius, vols. 1–2 (Cheltenham, UK: Edward Elgar Publishing). (N.B.: This large collection reprints a number of the articles cited individually below.)
- Onuma, Yasuaki. (1993). (ed.) A Normative Approach to War (Oxford: Clarendon Press).
- Eyffinger, A.C., et al. (1983). The Grotius Collection at the Peace Palace: A Concise Catalogue (The Hague: Peace Palace Library).
- Molhuysen, Philippus Christianus. (1943). “De Bibliotheek van Hugo de Groot in 1618,” Mededeelingen der Nederlandsche Akademie van Wetenschappen, Afdeeling Letterkunde, Nieuwe reeks, dl. 6, no. 3. (N.B.: This is a list of books in Grotius' possession in 1618.)
- ter Meulen, Jacob, and Diermanse, P.J.J. (1950). Bibliographie des écrits imprimés de Hugo Grotius (The Hague: Martinus Nijhoff).
- ––– (1961). Bibliographie des écrits sur Hugo Grotius imprimés au XVIIe sicle (The Hague: Martinus Nijhoff).
- Willems, J.C.M. (1980, 1981, ongoing). Grotiana (new series), vols. 1, 2, etc.
- Bayle, Pierre. (1720). “Grotius,” in Dictionaire historique et critique, 3rd ed. (Rotterdam: Michel Bohm).
- Brandt, Caspar, and Cattenburgh, Adriaan van. (1732). Historie van het leven des heeren Huig de Groot, 2nd ed. (Dordrecht and Amsterdam: Van Braam en onder der Linden).
- Dumbauld, Edward. (1969). The Life and Legal Writings of Hugo Grotius (Norman, Oklahoma: University of Oklahoma Press).
- Edwards, Charles. (1981). Hugo Grotius (Chicago: Nelson-Hall).
- Holk, L.E. van. (1983). “Hugo Grotius, 1583–1645, A Biographical Sketch,” in van Holk and Roelofsen (1983): 23–44.
- Knight, W.S.M. (1925). The Life and Works of Hugo Grotius (London: Sweet and Maxwell Publishers).
- Vreeland, Hamilton, Jr. (1917). Hugo Grotius: the Father of the Modern Science of International Law (New York: Oxford University Press).
Monographs and articles:
- Blom, Hans. (1995). Causality and Morality: the rise of naturalism in Dutch seventeenth-century political thought, Ph.D. thesis, Utrecht University.
- Brandt, Reinhard. (1974). Eigentumstheorien von Grotius bis Kant (Stuttgart-Bad Cannstatt: Frommann-Holzboog).
- Brett, Annabel. (2002). “Natural Right and Civil Community: The Civil Philosophy of Hugo Grotius,” The Historical Journal, vol. 45: 31–51.
- Bull, Hedley. (1976). “Martin Wight and the Theory of International Relations,” British Journal of International Studies, vol. 2: 101–116.
- Chroust, Anton-Hermann. (1943). “Hugo Grotius and the Scholastic Natural Law Tradition,” New Scholasticism, vol. 17: 101–133. Reprinted in Dunn and Harris (1997).
- Darwall, Stephen. (forthcoming). “Grotius at the Creation of Modern Moral Philosophy,” Archiv für Geschichte der Philosophie (forthcoming).
- Draper, G.I.A.D. (1990). “Grotius' Place in the Development of Legal Ideas about War,” in Bull et al. (1990): 177–207.
- Dufour, Alfred. (1980). “L'influence de la méthodologie des sciences physiques et mathématiques sur les fondateurs de l'école du droit naturel moderne (Grotius, Hobbes, Pufendorf),” Grotiana (New Series), vol. 1: 33–52. Reprinted in Dunn and Harris (1997).
- ––– (1984). “Grotius et le droit naturel du dix-septime sicle,” in [Anonymous] (1984): 15–41.
- Finnis, John. (1980). Natural Law and Natural Rights (Oxford: Clarendon Press).
- Gurvitch, G. (1927). “La philosophie du droit de Hugo Grotius et la théorie moderne du droit international,” Revue de Metaphysique et de Morale, vol. 34: 365–391.
- Haakonssen, Knud. (1985). “Hugo Grotius and the History of Political Thought,” Political Theory, vol. 13: 239–265. Reprinted in Dunn and Harris (1997).
- ––– (1992). “Natural Law,” in Lawrence C. Becker and Charlotte B. Becker, eds., The Encylopedia of Ethics (New York: Garland Publishers): 884–890.
- ––– (1996). Natural Law and Moral Philosophy: from Grotius to the Scottish Enlightenment (Cambridge: Cambridge University Press).
- ––– (1998). “Divine/natural law theories in ethics,” in Daniel Garber and Michael Ayers, eds., The Cambridge History of Seventeenth-Century Philosophy, vols. 1–2 (Cambridge: Cambridge University Press): 1317–1357.
- Haggenmacher, Peter. (1983). Grotius et la doctrine de la guerre juste (Paris: Presses Universitaires de France). (N.B.: This monograph also has an extensive bibliography; see pp. 645–672.)
- Hart, A. C. 't. (1983). “Hugo Grotius and Giambattista Vico,” Netherlands International Law Review, vol. 30: 5–41. Reprinted in Dunn and Harris (1997).
- Hodges, Donald Clark. (1956/7). “Grotius on the law of war,” Modern Schoolman, vol. 34: 36–44.
- Hofmann, Hasso. (1977). “Hugo Grotius,” in Michael Stolleis, ed., Staatsdenker im 17 und 18 Jahrhundert: Reichspublizistik, Politik, Naturrecht (Frankfurt am Main: Metzner): 51–77.
- Irwin, Terence. (2008). The Development of Ethics, vol. II (Oxford: Oxford University Press).
- Kilcullen, John. (2001). “The Origin of Property: Ockham, Grotius, Pufendorf and Some Others,” in Kilcullen and Scott (2001), pp. 883–932.
- Kilcullen, John, and Scott, John. (2001). (trans.) William of Ockham, Work of Ninety, (Lewiston, NY: Edwin Mellon Press).
- Kingsbury, Benedict, and Roberts, Adam. (1990). “Introduction: Grotian Thought in International Relations,” in Bull et al. (1990): 1–64.
- Korsgaard, Christine M. (1996). The Sources of Normativity (Cambridge: Cambridge University Press).
- Lauterpacht, Hersch. (1946). “The Grotian Tradition in International Law,” The British Yearbook of International Law, vol. XXIII: 1–53. Reprinted in Dunn and Harris (1997).
- Macpherson, C.B. (1962). The Political Theory of Possessive Individualism (Oxford: Oxford University Press).
- Miller, Jon. (2003). “Stoics, Grotius and Spinoza on moral deliberation,” in Jon Miller and Brad Inwood, eds., Hellenistic and Early Modern Philosophy (Cambridge: Cambridge University Press): 116–140.
- Remec, Peter Paul. (1960). The Position of the Individual in International Law according to Grotius and Vattel (The Hague: Nijhoff).
- Rousseau, Jean-Jacques. (1915). Political Writings, vols. I–II, ed. and trans. by C. E. Vaughan (Cambridge: Cambridge University Press).
- St. Leger, James. (1962). The “Etiamsi Daremus” of Hugo Grotius: A Study in the Origins of International Law (Rome: Pontificium Athenaeum Internationale).
- Schneewind, J.B. (1993). “Kant and natural law ethics,” Ethics, vol. 104: 53–74.
- ––– (1998). The Invention of Autonomy (Cambridge: Cambridge University Press).
- Shaver, Robert. (1996). “Grotius on Scepticism and Self-Interest,” Archiv für Geschichte der Philosophie, vol. 78: 27–47.
- Simmonds, Kenneth R. (1957). “Some English Precursors of Hugo Grotius,” Transactions of the Grotius Society, vol. 43: 143–157.
- ––– (1957/8). “Hugo Grotius and Alberico Gentili,” Jahrbuch für Internationales Recht, Band 8: 85–100.
- Straumann, Benjamin. (2006). “'Ancient Caesarian Lawyers' in a State of Nature: Roman Tradition and Natural Rights in Hugo Grotius's De iure praedae,” Political Theory, vol. 34: 328–350.
- ––– (2007). Hugo Grotius und die Antike (Baden-Baden: NOMOS).
- Tanaka, Tadashi. (1993). “Grotius' method: with special reference to Prolegomena,” in Onuma (1993): 11–31.
- Tierney, Brian. (1983). “Tuck on rights: some medieval problems,” History of Political Thought, vol. 6: 429–441.
- ––– (1997). The Idea of Natural Rights (Atlanta: Scholars Press).
- Todescan, Franco (2003). Etiamsi Daremus: Studi Sinfonici sul Diritto Naturale (Padua: CEDAM).
- Tuck, Richard. (1979). Natural Rights Theories (Cambridge: Cambridge University Press).
- ––– (1983). “Grotius, Carneades and Hobbes,” Grotiana (new series), vol. 4: 43–62. Reprinted in Dunn and Harris (1997).
- ––– (1987). “The ‘modern’ theory of natural law,” in Anthony Pagden, ed., The Languages of Political Theory in Early-Modern Europe (Cambridge: Cambridge University Press): 99–119.
- ––– (1991). “Grotius and Selden,” in J.H. Burns and Mark Goldie, eds., The Cambridge History of Political Thought, 1450–1700 (Cambridge: Cambridge University Press): 499–529.
- ––– (1993). Philosophy and Government 1572–1651 (Cambridge: Cambridge University Press).
- ––– (1999). The Rights of War and Peace. Political Thought and the International Order from Grotius to Kant (Oxford: Oxford University Press).
- ––– (2005). “Introduction” to The Rights of War and Peace, Books I–III, by Hugo Grotius (reprinted Indianapolis: Liberty Fund).
- van Ittersum, Martine. (2002). Profit and Principle: Hugo Grotius, Natural Rights Theories and the Rise of Dutch Power in the East Indies, 1595–1615, Ph.D. thesis, Harvard University.
- Vermeulen, B. P. (1983). “Grotius' methodology and system of international law,” Netherlands International Law Review, vol. 30: 324–382.
- Vollenhoven, C. Van. (1932). The Framework of Grotius' Book De Iure Belli ac Pacis (1625) (Amsterdam: Noord-Hollandsche uitgeversmaatschappij).
- Whewell, William. (1853). “Editor's Preface,” in William Whewell, ed. and trans., Hugonis Grotii de iure belli ac pacis (Cambridge: Cambridge University Press): iii–xvi.
- Wight, Martin. (1991). International Theory: the Three Traditions, ed. by Gabriele Wight and Brian Porter (Leicester: Leicester University Press).
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- Hugo Grotius 1583–1645. A brief biography, with a timeline of his life and an image of him, maintained by William Uzgalis at Oregon State University.
- Briefwisseling van Hugo Grotius (in Dutch). A very useful website on Grotius' correspondence—including a searchable index of all the names in it, maintained at the Instituut voor Nederlandse Geschiedenis.