Friedrich Nietzsche (1844–1900) was a German philosopher of the late 19th century who challenged the foundations of Christianity and traditional morality. He was interested in the enhancement of individual and cultural health, and believed in life, creativity, power, and the realities of the world we live in, rather than those situated in a world beyond. Central to his philosophy is the idea of “life-affirmation,” which involves an honest questioning of all doctrines that drain life's expansive energies, however socially prevalent those views might be. Often referred to as one of the first existentialist philosophers along with Søren Kierkegaard (1813–1855), Nietzsche's revitalizing philosophy has inspired leading figures in all walks of cultural life, including dancers, poets, novelists, painters, psychologists, philosophers, sociologists and social revolutionaries.
- 1. Life: 1844–1900
- 2. Early Writings: 1872–1876
- 3. Middle-Period Writings: 1878-1882
- 4. Later-Period Writings: 1883-1887
- 5. Final Writings of 1888
- 6. Nietzsche's Unpublished Notebooks
- 7. Nietzsche's Influence Upon 20th Century Thought
- Academic Tools
- Other Internet Resources
- Related Entries
In the small German village of Röcken bei Lützen, located in a rural farmland area southwest of Leipzig, Friedrich Wilhelm Nietzsche was born at approximately 10:00 a.m. on October 15, 1844. The date coincided with the 49th birthday of the Prussian King, Friedrich Wilhelm IV, after whom Nietzsche was named, and who had been responsible for Nietzsche's father's appointment as Röcken's town minister.
Nietzsche's uncle and grandfathers were also Lutheran ministers, and his paternal grandfather, Friedrich August Ludwig Nietzsche (1756–1826), was further distinguished as a Protestant scholar, one of whose books (1796) affirmed the “everlasting survival of Christianity.” Nietzsche's grandparents on both sides were from the Province of Saxony, with his paternal grandfather, paternal grandmother (Erdmuthe Dorothea Krause, 1778–1856), maternal grandfather (David Ernst Ohler, 1787–1859) and maternal grandmother (Johanna Elisabeth Wilhelmine Hahn, 1794–1876) having been born respectively in the small towns of Bibra (just south of Jena), Reichenbach (southeast of Jena), Zeitz (between Jena and Leipzig), and Wehlitz (just northwest of Leipzig).
When Nietzsche was nearly 5 years old, his father, Karl Ludwig Nietzsche (1813–1849) died from a brain ailment (July 30, 1849) and the death of Nietzsche's two-year-old brother, Ludwig Joseph, traumatically followed six months later (January 4, 1850). Having been living only yards away from Röcken's church in the house reserved for the pastor and his family, the Nietzsche family left their home soon after Karl Ludwig's death. They moved to nearby Naumburg an der Saale, where Nietzsche (called “Fritz” by his family) lived with his mother, Franziska (1826–1897), his grandmother, Erdmuthe, his father's two sisters, Auguste and Rosalie (d. 1855 and 1867, respectively), and his younger sister, Therese Elisabeth Alexandra (1846–1935).
From the ages of 14 to 19 (1858–1864), Nietzsche attended a first-rate boarding school, Schulpforta, located about 4km from his home in Naumburg, where he prepared for university studies. The school's rigid educational atmosphere was reflected in its long history as a former Cistercian monastery (1137–1540), with buildings that included a 12th century Romanesque chapel and a 13th century Gothic church. At Schulpforta — a school whose alumnae included the German Idealist philosopher, Johann Gottlieb Fichte (1762–1814) — Nietzsche met his lifelong acquaintance, Paul Deussen (1845–1919), who was confirmed at Nietzsche's side in 1861, and who was to become an Orientalist, historian of philosophy, and in 1911, the founder of the Schopenhauer Society. During his summers in Naumburg, Nietzsche led a small music and literature club named “Germania,” and became acquainted with Richard Wagner's music through the club's subscription to the Zeitschrift für Musik. The teenage Nietzsche also read the German romantic writings of Friedrich Hölderlin and Jean-Paul Richter, along with David Strauss's controversial and demythologizing Life of Jesus Critically Examined (Das Leben Jesu kritisch bearbeitet, 1848).
After graduating from Schulpforta, Nietzsche entered the University of Bonn in 1864 as a theology and philology student, and his interests soon gravitated more exclusively towards philology — a discipline which then centered upon the interpretation of classical and biblical texts. As a student of philology, Nietzsche attended lectures by Otto Jahn (1813–1869) and Friedrich Wilhelm Ritschl (1806–1876). Jahn was a biographer of Mozart who had studied at the University of Berlin under Karl Lachmann (1793–1851) — a philologist known both for his studies of the Roman philosopher, Lucretius (ca. 99–55 BCE), and for having developed the genealogical, or stemmatic, method in textual recension; Ritschl was a classics scholar whose work centered on the Roman comic poet, Plautus (254–184 BCE).
Inspired by Ritschl, and following him to the University of Leipzig in 1865 — an institution located closer to Nietzsche's hometown of Naumburg — Nietzsche quickly established his own academic reputation through his published essays on two 6th century BCE poets, Theognis and Simonides, as well as on Aristotle. In Leipzig, he developed a close friendship with Erwin Rohde (1845–1898), a fellow philology student and future philologist, with whom he would correspond extensively in later years. Momentous for Nietzsche in 1865 was his accidental discovery of Arthur Schopenhauer's The World as Will and Representation (1818) in a local bookstore. He was then 21. Schopenhauer's atheistic and turbulent vision of the world, in conjunction with his highest praise of music as an art form, captured Nietzsche's imagination, and the extent to which the “cadaverous perfume” of Schopenhauer's world-view continued to permeate Nietzsche's mature thought remains a matter of scholarly debate. After discovering Schopenhauer, Nietzsche read F.A. Lange's newly-published History of Materialism and Critique of its Present Significance (1866) — a work that criticizes materialist theories from the standpoint of Kant's critique of metaphysics, and that attracted Nietzsche's interest in its view that metaphysical speculation is an expression of poetic illusion.
In 1867, as he approached the age of 23, Nietzsche entered his required military service and was assigned to an equestrian field artillery regiment close to Naumburg, during which time he lived at home with his mother. While attempting to leap-mount into the saddle, he suffered a serious chest injury and was put on sick leave after his chest wound refused to heal. He returned shortly thereafter to the University of Leipzig, and in November of 1868, met the composer Richard Wagner (1813–1883) at the home of Hermann Brockhaus (1806–1877), an Orientalist who was married to Wagner's sister, Ottilie. Brockhaus was himself a specialist in Sanskrit and Persian whose publications included (1850) an edition of the Vendidad Sade — a text of the Zoroastrian religion, whose prophet was Zarathustra (Zoroaster).Wagner and Nietzsche shared an enthusiasm for Schopenhauer, and Nietzsche — who had been composing piano, choral and orchestral music since he was a teenager — admired Wagner for his musical genius, magnetic personality and cultural influence. Wagner was the same age Nietzsche's father would have been, and he had also attended the University of Leipzig many years before. The Nietzsche-Wagner relationship was quasi-familial and sometimes-stormy, and it affected Nietzsche deeply: writing in 1869 that his friendship with Wagner was the “greatest achievement” [die größte Errungenschaft] of his life, almost twenty years later, he would still be assessing Wagner's cultural significance. In the interim — a year before Wagner's death and a good seven years before his own breakdown — Nietzsche was already reminiscing wistfully in 1882 about how his days with Wagner had been the best of his life. During the months surrounding Nietzsche's initial meeting with Wagner, Ritschl recommended Nietzsche for a position on the classical philology faculty at the University of Basel. The Swiss university offered Nietzsche the professorial position, and he began teaching there in May, 1869, at the age of 24.
At Basel, Nietzsche's satisfaction with his life among his philology colleagues was limited, and he established closer intellectual ties to the historians Franz Overbeck (1837–1905) and Jacob Burkhardt (1818–1897), whose lectures he attended. Overbeck — who roomed for five years in the same house as Nietzsche — became Nietzsche's close and enduring friend, exchanging many letters with him over the years, and rushing to Nietzsche's assistance in Turin immediately after his devastating collapse in 1889. Nietzsche also cultivated his friendship with Richard Wagner and visited him often at his Swiss home in Tribschen, a small town near Lucerne. Never in outstanding health, further complications arose from Nietzsche's August-October 1870 service as a 25-year-old hospital attendant during the Franco-Prussian War (1870-71), where he participated in the siege of Metz. He witnessed the traumatic effects of battle, took close care of wounded soldiers, and contracted diphtheria and dysentery.
Nietzsche's enthusiasm for Schopenhauer, his studies in classical philology, his inspiration from Wagner, his reading of Lange, his interests in health, his professional need to prove himself as a young academic, and his frustration with the contemporary German culture, all coalesced in his first book — The Birth of Tragedy (1872) — which was published in January 1872 when Nietzsche was 27. Wagner showered the book with praise, but a vitriolic, painfully-memorable and yet authoritative critical reaction by Ulrich von Wilamowitz-Möllendorff (1848-1931) — a scholar who was to become one of Germany's leading philologists — immediately dampened the book's reception, not to mention Nietzsche's class enrolments in Basel.
Wilamowitz-Möllendorff himself came from an aristocratic family of distant Polish descent and was also a graduate of Schulpforta (1867). In his critique, he referred to Nietzsche as a disgrace to Schulpforta, and said that in light of the latter's prophetic, soothsaying, exaggerated and historically uninformed style of writing, Nietzsche should instead “gather tigers and panthers about his knees, but not the youth of Germany.” It is intriguing that in Thus Spoke Zarathustra, written thirteen years later, Nietzsche invokes the comparable imagery of a lion nuzzling warmly at the knees of Zarathustra in the book's concluding and inspirational scene, as if to acknowledge that his proper audience is, indeed, not a set of university professors.
As Nietzsche continued his residence in Switzerland between 1872 and 1879, he often visited Wagner at his new (1872) home in Bayreuth, Germany. In 1873, he met Paul Rée (1849–1901), who, while living in close company with Nietzsche in Sorrento during the autumn of 1876, would write On the Origin of Moral Feelings (1877). During this time, Nietzsche completed a series of four studies on contemporary German culture — the Unfashionable Observations (1873–76) — which focus respectively upon (1) the historian of religion and culture critic, David Strauss, (2) issues concerning the social value of historiography, (3) Arthur Schopenhauer and (4) Richard Wagner, both as heroic inspirations for new cultural standards.
Near the end of his university career, Nietzsche completed Human, All-Too-Human (1878) — a book that marks a turning point in his philosophical style and that, while reinforcing his friendship with Rée, also ends his friendship with the anti-Semitic Wagner, who comes under attack in a thinly-disguised characterization of “the artist.” Despite the damage done by the unflattering review of The Birth of Tragedy, Nietzsche remained respected in his professorial position in Basel, but his deteriorating health, which led to migraine headaches, eyesight problems and vomiting, necessitated his resignation from the university in June, 1879, at age 34. At this point, he had been a university professor for ten years, and had just less than another ten years of productive intellectual life remaining.
From 1880 until his collapse in January 1889, Nietzsche led a wandering, gypsy-like existence as a stateless person (having given up his German citizenship, and not having acquired Swiss citizenship), circling almost annually between his mother's house in Naumburg and various French, Swiss, German and Italian cities. His travels took him through the Mediterranean seaside city of Nice (during the winters), the Swiss alpine village of Sils-Maria (during the summers, located near the present-day ski resort of St. Moritz), Leipzig (where he had attended university, and had been hoping to resume his teaching career in 1883), Turin, Genoa, Recoaro, Messina, Rapallo, Florence, Venice, and Rome, never residing in any place longer than several months at a time.
On a visit to Rome in 1882, Nietzsche, now at age thirty-seven, met Lou von Salomé (1861–1937), a 21 year old Russian woman who was studying philosophy and theology in Zurich. He quickly fell in love with her. Eventually declining to develop her relationship with Nietzsche on a romantic level, the future of Nietzsche's friendship with her and Paul Rée took a turn for the worse, as Salomé and Rée left Nietzsche and moved to Berlin. In the years to follow, Salomé would become an associate of Sigmund Freud, and would write with psychological insight of her association with Nietzsche.
These nomadic years were the occasion of Nietzsche's main works, among which are Daybreak (1881), The Gay Science (1882/1887), Thus Spoke Zarathustra (1883–85), Beyond Good and Evil (1886), and On the Genealogy of Morals (1887). Nietzsche's final active year, 1888, saw the completion of The Case of Wagner (May-August 1888), Twilight of the Idols (August-September 1888), The Antichrist (September 1888), Ecce Homo (October-November 1888) and Nietzsche Contra Wagner (December 1888).
On the morning of January 3, 1889, while in Turin, Nietzsche experienced a mental breakdown which left him an invalid for the rest of his life. Coincidentally, on virtually the same date, viz., January 4, his little brother, Joseph, had died many years before. Nietzsche, upon witnessing a horse being whipped by a coachman at the Piazza Carlo Alberto — although this episode with the horse could be anecdotal — threw his arms around the horse's neck and collapsed in the plaza, never to return to full sanity.
Some argue that Nietzsche was afflicted with a syphilitic infection (this was the original diagnosis of the doctors in Basel and Jena) contracted either while he was a student or while he was serving as a hospital attendant during the Franco-Prussian War; some claim that his use of chloral hydrate, a drug which he had been using as a sedative, undermined his already-weakened nervous system; some speculate that Nietzsche's collapse was due to a brain disease he inherited from his father; some maintain that a mental illness gradually drove him insane; some maintain that he suffered from a slow-growing, frontal cranial base tumor; some maintain that he suffered from CADASIL syndrome, a heriditary stroke disorder. The exact cause of Nietzsche's incapacitation remains unclear. That he had an extraordinarily sensitive nervous constitution and took an assortment of medications is well-documented as a more general fact. To complicate matters of interpretation, Nietzsche states in a letter from April 1888 that he never had any symptoms of a mental disorder. In contrast, we have Paul Rée writing in an 1897 letter that Nietzsche had always been unbalanced.
During his creative years, Nietzsche struggled to bring his writings into print and never doubted that his books would have a lasting cultural effect. He did not live long enough to experience his world-historical influence, but he had a brief glimpse of his growing intellectual importance in discovering that he was the subject of 1888 lectures given by Georg Brandes (Georg Morris Cohen) at the University of Copenhagen, to whom he directed the above April 1888 correspondence, and from whom he received a recommendation to read Kierkegaard's works. Nietzsche's collapse, however, followed soon thereafter.
After a brief hospitalization in Basel, he spent 1889 in a sanatorium in Jena at the Binswanger Clinic, and in March 1890 his mother took him back home to Naumburg, where he lived under her care for the next seven years in the house he knew as a youngster. After his mother's death in 1897, his sister Elisabeth — having returned home from Paraguay in 1893, where she had been working since 1886 with her husband Bernhard Förster to establish an Aryan, anti-Semitic German colony called “New Germany” (“Nueva Germania”) — assumed responsibility for Nietzsche's welfare. In an effort to promote her brother's philosophy, she rented the “Villa Silberblick,” a large house in Weimar, and moved both Nietzsche and his collected manuscripts to the residence. This became the new home of the Nietzsche Archives (which had been located at the family home for the three years preceding), where Elisabeth received visitors who wanted to observe the now-incapacitated philosopher.
On August 25, 1900, Nietzsche died in the villa as he approached his 56th year, apparently of pneumonia in combination with a stroke. His body was then transported to the family gravesite directly beside the church in Röcken bei Lützen, where his mother and sister now also rest. The Villa Silberblick was eventually turned into a museum, and since 1950, Nietzsche's manuscripts have been located in Weimar at the Goethe- und Schiller-Archiv
Nietzsche's first book was published in 1872 and was entitled The Birth of Tragedy, Out of the Spirit of Music (Die Geburt der Tragödie aus dem Geiste der Musik). In terms of its intellectual atmosphere, it sets forth an alternative to the late 18th/early 19th century understanding of Greek culture — an understanding largely inspired by Johann Winckelmann's History of Ancient Art (1764) — which, grounded on the aesthetics of classical sculpture, hailed ancient Greece as the epitome of noble simplicity, calm grandeur, clear blue skies, and rational serenity. In 1886, Nietzsche's book was reissued with a revised title, The Birth of Tragedy, Or: Hellenism and Pessimism (Die Geburt der Tragödie, Oder: Griechentum und Pessimismus), along with a lucid and revealing prefatory essay — “An Attempt at Self-Criticism” — which expresses Nietzsche's own critical reflections on the book, looking back fourteen years. Although he obviously remained proud of the work, Nietzsche also describes it as a questionable, strange and almost inaccessible book, filled with Kantian and Schopenhauerian formulas that were inherently at odds with the new valuations he was trying to express.
Nietzsche, having by this time absorbed the German romanticist, and specifically Schopenhauerian, view that non-rational forces reside at the foundation of all creativity and of reality itself, identifies a strongly instinctual, wild, amoral, “Dionysian” energy within pre-Socratic Greek culture as an essentially creative and healthy force. Surveying the history of Western culture since the time of the Greeks, Nietzsche laments over how this Dionysian, creative energy had been submerged and weakened as it became overshadowed by the “Apollonian” forces of logical order and stiff sobriety. He concludes that European culture since the time of Socrates has remained one-sidedly Apollonian, bottled-up, and relatively unhealthy.
As a means towards cultural rebirth, he advocates the resurrection and fuller release of Dionysian artistic energies — those which he associates with primordial creativity, joy in existence and ultimate truth. The seeds of this liberating rebirth Nietzsche perceives in the contemporary German music of his time (viz., Bach, Beethoven and especially Wagner), and the concluding part of The Birth of Tragedy, in effect, adulates the emerging German artistic, tragic spirit as the potential savior of European culture. As one of his early books, The Birth of Tragedy has a strong Schopenhauerian, eternalistic flavor, and scholars disagree about the extent to which Nietzsche departs from that eternalistic dimension in this work and in later works.
Some regard Nietzsche's 1873 unpublished essay, “On Truth and Lies in a Nonmoral Sense” (“Über Wahrheit und Lüge im außermoralischen Sinn”) as a keystone in his thought; some believe that it is a peripheral, conflicted and non-representative fragment in his writings. In this essay, Nietzsche rejects the idea of universal constants, and claims, presumably as a truth, that what we call “truth” is only “a mobile army of metaphors, metonyms, and anthropomorphisms.” His view at this time is that arbitrariness prevails within human experience: concepts originate via the transformation of nerve stimuli into images, and “truth” is nothing more than the invention of fixed conventions for practical purposes, especially those of repose, security and consistency. Viewing human existence from a vast and sobering distance, Nietzsche further notes that there was an eternity before human beings came into existence, and believes that after humanity dies out, nothing significant will have changed in the great scheme of things.
Between 1873 and 1876, Nietzsche wrote the Unfashionable Observations (Unzeitgemässe Betrachtungen). These are four (of a projected, but never completed, thirteen) studies concerned with the quality of European, and especially German, culture during Nietzsche's time. They are unfashionable and nonconformist (or “untimely,” or “unmodern”) insofar as Nietzsche regarded his standpoint as culture-critic to be in tension with the self-congratulatory spirit of the times. The four studies were: David Strauss, the Confessor and the Writer (David Strauss, der Bekenner und der Schriftsteller, 1873); On the Uses and Disadvantages of History for Life (Vom Nutzen und Nachteil der Historie für das Leben, 1874); Schopenhauer as Educator (Schopenhauer als Erzieher, 1874); Richard Wagner in Bayreuth (1876).
The first of these attacks David Strauss, whose popular six-edition book, The Old and the New Faith: A Confession (1871) encapsulated for Nietzsche the general cultural atmosphere in Germany. Responding to Strauss's advocacy of a “new faith” grounded upon a scientifically-determined universal mechanism — one, however, lubricated by the optimistic, “soothing oil” of historical progress — Nietzsche criticizes Strauss's view as a vulgar and dismal sign of cultural degeneracy. Nietzsche's friend, Overbeck, in his contemporaneous writings, also adopted a critical attitude towards Strauss. The second “untimely meditation” surveys alternative ways to write history, and discusses how these ways could contribute to a society's health. Here Nietzsche claims that the principle of “life” is a more pressing and higher concern than that of “knowledge,” and that the quest for knowledge should serve the interests of life. This parallels how, in The Birth of Tragedy, Nietzsche looked at art through the perspective of life. The third and fourth studies — on Schopenhauer and Wagner, respectively — address how these two thinkers, as paradigms of philosophic and artistic genius, hold the potential to inspire a stronger, healthier and livelier German culture. These celebratory studies on Schopenhauer and Wagner reveal how, as a recurring feature of Nietzsche's thought, he presents us with some higher type of character — he offers different models of heroic characters as the years go by — as an ideal towards which he would have his best readers aspire.
Nietzsche completed Human, All-Too-Human in 1878, supplementing this with a second part in 1879, Mixed Opinions and Maxims (Vermischte Meinungen und Sprüche), and a third part in 1880, The Wanderer and his Shadow (Der Wanderer und sein Schatten). The three parts were published together in 1886 as Human All-Too-Human, A Book for Free Spirits (Menschliches, Allzumenschliches, Ein Buch für freie Geister). Reluctant to construct a philosophical “system,” and sensitive to the importance of style in philosophic writing, Nietzsche composed these works as a series of several hundred aphorisms whose typical length ranges from a line or two to a page or two. Here, he often reflects upon cultural and psychological phenomena in reference to individuals' organic and physiological constitutions. The idea of power (for which he would later become known) sporadically appears as an explanatory principle, but Nietzsche tends at this time to invoke hedonistic considerations of pleasure and pain in his explanations of cultural and psychological phenomena. Given Nietzsche's harsh criticisms of hedonism and utilitarianism in later works (e.g., Thus Spoke Zarathustra, re: “the Last Man”), Human All-Too-Human appears to many readers as an uncharacteristic work, more science- than art-inspired in its approach to health, where Nietzsche was struggling to break free of Wagner's spell, and which does not fully embody the pain-and-power-centered approach that he later developed.
In Daybreak: Reflections on Moral Prejudices (Morgenröte. Gedanken über die moralischen Vorurteile, 1881), Nietzsche continues writing in his aphoristic style, but he marks a new beginning by accentuating as opposed to pleasure, the importance of the “feeling of power” in his understanding of human, and especially of so-called “moral” behavior. Always having been interested in the nature of health, his emerging references to power stem from his earlier efforts to discover the secret of the ancient Greeks' outstanding health, which he had regarded as the effects of how “agon” (i.e., competition, one-upmanship, or contest, as conceived in his 1872 essay, “Homer's Contest”) permeated their cultural attitudes. In this respect, Daybreak contains the seeds of Nietzsche's doctrine of the “will to power” — a doctrine that appears explicitly for the first time two years later in Thus Spoke Zarathustra (1883–85). Daybreak is also one of Nietzsche's clearest, intellectually calmest, and most intimate, volumes, providing many social-psychological insights in conjunction with some of his first sustained critical reflections on the cultural relativity at the basis of Christian moral evaluations. In this book — as he remarks retrospectively in Ecce Homo (1888) — Nietzsche begins his “crusade against morality.”
In a more well-known aphoristic work, The Gay Science (Die fröhliche Wissenschaft, 1882) — whose title was inspired by the troubadour songs of southern-French Provence (1100–1300) — Nietzsche sets forth some of the existential ideas for which he became famous, namely, the proclamation that “God is dead” and the doctrine of eternal recurrence — a doctrine that attends to how people of different levels of health are likely to react to the prospect of being reborn, over and over again, to replay life's experience exactly as before in every pleasurable and painful sequence of detail. Nietzsche's atheism — his account of “God's murder” (section 125) — is a reaction to the conception of a single, ultimate, judgmental authority who is privy to everyone's hidden and personally embarrassing secrets. His atheism also aims to redirect people's attention to their inherent freedom, the presently-existing world, and away from escapist, pain-relieving, heavenly otherworlds.
To a similar end, Nietzsche's doctrine of eternal recurrence (sections 285 and 341) serves to draw attention away from all worlds other than the one in which we presently live, since eternal recurrence precludes the possibility of any final escape from the present world. The doctrine also functions as a measure for judging someone's overall psychological strength and mental health, since Nietzsche believed that the doctrine of eternal recurrence was the hardest world-view to affirm. There are some differences of scholarly opinion concerning whether Nietzsche primarily intends this doctrine to describe a serious metaphysical theory, or whether he is offering merely one way to interpret the world among many others, which if adopted therapeutically as a psychologically healthy myth, can help us become stronger.
In 1887, The Gay Science was reissued with an important preface, an additional fifth Book, and an appendix of songs, reminiscent of the troubadours.
Thus Spoke Zarathustra, A Book for All and None (Also Sprach Zarathustra, Ein Buch für Alle und Keinen, 1883–85), is one of Nietzsche's most famous works, and Nietzsche regarded it as among his most significant. It is a manifesto of personal self-overcoming, and a guidebook for others towards the same revitalizing end. Thirty years after its initial publication, 150,000 copies of the work were printed by the German government and issued as inspirational reading, along with the Bible, to the young soldiers during WWI. Though Thus Spoke Zarathustra is antagonistic to the Judeo-Christian world-view, its poetic and prophetic style relies upon many, often inverted, Old and New Testament allusions. Nietzsche also filled the work with nature metaphors, almost in the spirit of pre-Socratic naturalist philosophy, which invoke animals, earth, air, fire, water, celestial bodies, plants, all in the service of describing the spiritual development of Zarathustra, a solitary, reflective, exceedingly strong-willed, sage-like, laughing and dancing voice of heroic self-mastery who, accompanied by a proud, sharp-eyed eagle and a wise snake, envisions a mode of psychologically healthier being beyond the common human condition. Nietzsche refers to this higher mode of being as “superhuman” (übermenschlich), and associates the doctrine of eternal recurrence — a doctrine for only the healthiest who can love life in its entirety — with this spiritual standpoint, in relation to which all-too-often downhearted, all-too-commonly-human attitudes stand as a mere bridge to be crossed and overcome.
Within Nietzsche's corpus, Thus Spoke Zarathustra has a controversial place, owing mainly to its thoroughly literary style. Nietzsche speaks in parables and short narratives populated by fictional characters — “the hunchback,” “the ugliest man,” “the soothsayer,” “the saint,” “the tightrope walker,” “the jester,” and “the Last Man,” to name a few — leaving his inherent messages open to a variety of interpretations. One of Nietzsche's most well-known and morally troubling figures — the superhuman — also appears substantially only in this work, rendering it questionable to some interpreters whether this ideal for the earth's future meaning is indeed central to Nietzsche's thought as a whole. There is also some interpretive uncertainty about whether the work, which was written across the span of three years, properly ends triumphantly at the conclusion of the Third Part, thus situating the psychologically complex Fourth Part as a question-raising supplement, or whether the book's narrative moves smoothly and progressively across the entire four parts.
Beyond Good and Evil, Prelude to a Philosophy of the Future (Jenseits von Gut und Böse. Vorspiel einer Philosophie der Zukunft, 1886) is arguably a rethinking of Human, All-too-Human, since their respective tables of contents and sequence of themes loosely correspond to one another. In Beyond Good and Evil, Nietzsche identifies imagination, self-assertion, danger, originality and the “creation of values” as qualities of genuine philosophers, as opposed to incidental characters who engage in dusty scholarship. Nietzsche takes aim at some of the world's great philosophers, who ground their outlooks wholeheartedly upon concepts such as “self-consciousness,” “free will,” and “either/or” bipolar thinking.
Nietzsche alternatively philosophizes from the perspective of life located beyond good and evil, and challenges the entrenched moral idea that exploitation, domination, injury to the weak, destruction and appropriation are universally objectionable behaviors. Above all, he believes that living things aim to discharge their strength and express their “will to power” — a pouring-out of expansive energy as if one were like a perpetually-shining sun that, quite naturally, can entail danger, pain, lies, deception and masks. Here, “will” is not an inner emptiness, lack, feeling of deficiency, or constant drive for satisfaction, but is a fountain of constantly-swelling energy, or power.
As he views things from the perspective of life, Nietzsche further denies that there is a universal morality applicable indiscriminately to all human beings, and instead designates a series of moralities in an order of rank that ascends from the plebeian to the noble: some moralities are more suitable for subordinate roles; some are more appropriate for dominating and leading social roles. What counts as a preferable and legitimate action depends upon the kind of person one is. The deciding factor is whether one is weaker, sicker and on the decline, or whether one is healthier, more powerful and overflowing with life.
On the Genealogy of Morals, A Polemic (Zur Genealogie der Moral, Eine Streitschrift, 1887) is composed of three sustained essays that advance the critique of Christianity expressed in Beyond Good and Evil. The first essay continues the discussion of master morality versus servant morality, and maintains that the traditional ideals set forth as holy and morally good within Christian morality are products of self-deception, since they were forged in the bad air of revenge, resentment, hatred, impotence, and cowardice. In this essay, as well as the next, Nietzsche's controversial references to the “blond beast” in connection with master morality also appear. In the second essay, Nietzsche continues with an account of how feelings of guilt, or the “bad conscience,” arise merely as a consequence of an unhealthy Christian morality that turns an evil eye towards our natural inclinations. He also discusses how punishment, conceived as the infliction of pain upon someone in proportion to their offense, is likely to have been grounded in the contractual economic relationship between creditor and debtor, i.e., in business relationships. In the third essay, Nietzsche focusses upon the truth-oriented ascetic ideals that underlie and inform prevailing styles of art, religion and philosophy, and he offers a particularly scathing critique of the priesthood: the priests are allegedly a group of weak people who shepherd even weaker people as a way to experience power for themselves. The third essay also contains one of Nietzsche's clearest expressions of “perspectivism” (section 12) — the idea that there is no absolute, “God's eye” standpoint from which one can survey everything that is.
On the Genealogy of Morals is Nietzsche's “polemic,” i.e., attack, against the assumptions and methods (which, incidentally, are still popular) characteristic of works such as Paul Rée's The Origin of the Moral Sensations (1877). Inspired by utilitarianism and Darwinism, Rée offers a naturalistic account of our moral values, especially altruism, but by Nietzsche's lights, does not question the value of the moral values themselves. In the Genealogy, Nietzsche offers a competing account of the origin of moral values, aiming to reveal their life-negating foundations and functions.
Nietzsche ultimately advocates valuations that issue from a self-confident, self-reinforcing, self-governing, creative and commanding attitude, as opposed to those that issue from reactive attitudes that determine values more mechanically, subordinatingly, and opposingly to those who are inherently more powerful. For Nietzsche, those who prefer to think in terms of “good vs. bad” exemplify the former, leading and superior mentality, and those who think in terms of “good vs. evil,” exemplify the latter, inferior and subservient mentality.
The Case of Wagner, A Musician's Problem (Der Fall Wagner, Ein Musikanten-Problem, May-August 1888), contrasts sharply with Nietzsche's 1872 laudatory portrayal of Wagner in The Birth of Tragedy, and compares well with his 1873 meditation on David Strauss in its unbridled attack on a popular cultural figure. In The Case of Wagner, Nietzsche “declares war” upon Richard Wagner, whose music is characterized as the epitome of modern cultural achievement, but also crucially as sick and decadent. The work is a brilliant display of Nietzsche's talents as a music critic, and includes memorable mockings of Wagner's theatrical style, reflections on redemption via art, a “physiology of art,” and the virtues associated, respectively, with ascending and descending life energies. As the therapeutic inversion and antithesis of Wagner's debilitatingly serious music, Nietzsche refers us to Georges Bizet (1838–1875) whose music he finds cheerful, revitalizing, redeeming and light-hearted. Wagner himself had some years earlier (1850) condemned Felix Mendelssohn (1809–1847) for having confounded the public's taste in music. Nietzsche, writing almost thirty years later, here accuses Wagner of having done the same.
The title, Twilight of the Idols, or How One Philosophizes with a Hammer (Götzen-Dämmerung, oder Wie man mit dem Hammer philosophiert, August-September 1888), word-plays upon Wagner's opera, The Twilight of the Gods (Die Götterdämmerung). Nietzsche reiterates and elaborates some of the criticisms of Socrates, Plato, Kant and Christianity found in earlier works, criticizes the then-contemporary German culture as being unsophisticated and too-full of beer, and shoots some disapproving arrows at key French, British, and Italian cultural figures such as Rousseau, Hugo, Sand, Michelet, Zola, Renan, Carlyle, Mill, Eliot, Darwin, and Dante. In contrast to all these alleged representatives of cultural decadence, Nietzsche applauds Caesar, Napoleon, Goethe, Dostoevski, Thucydides and the Sophists as healthier and stronger types. The phrase “to philosophize with a hammer” primarily signifies a way to test idols by tapping on them lightly; one “sounds them out” to determine whether they are hollow, or intact, etc., as physician would use a percussion hammer upon the abdomen as a diagnostic instrument.
In The Antichrist, Curse on Christianity (Der Antichrist. Fluch auf das Christentum, September 1888 [published 1895]), Nietzsche expresses his disgust over the way noble values in Roman Society were corrupted by the rise of Christianity, and he discusses specific aspects and personages in Christian culture — the Gospels, Paul, the martyrs, priests, the crusades — with a view towards showing that Christianity is a religion for weak and unhealthy people, whose general historical effect has been to undermine the healthy qualities of the more noble cultures. The Antichrist was initially conceived of as the first part of a projected four-part work for which Nietzsche had in mind the title, Revaluation of All Values (the second part was to be entitled, “The Free Spirit”). As in most of his 1888 works, Nietzsche criticizes, either implicity or explicitly, the anti-Semitic writers of his day. In this particular study, one of his main targets is the French, anti-Semitic, Christian historian, Ernest Renan (1823-1892), who was known for works such as The Life of Jesus (1863) and History of the Origins of Christianity (1866–1881), the fourth book of which was entitled The Antichrist (1873). Some interpret Nietzsche's title for his book as meaning, “the Antichristian.” It should be noted that in an 1883 letter to his friend, Peter Gast [Johann Heinrich Köselitz], Nietzsche does describe himself self-entertainingly as “the Antichrist,” and also more seriously as “the most terrible opponent of Christianity.”
Nietzsche describes himself as “a follower of the philosopher Dionysus” in Ecce Homo, How One Becomes What One Is (Ecce Homo, Wie man wird, was man ist, October-November 1888) — a book in which he examines retrospectively his entire corpus, work by work, offering critical remarks, details of how the works were inspired, and explanatory observations regarding their philosophical contents. He begins this fateful intellectual autobiography — he was to lose his mind little more than a month later — with three eyebrow-raising sections entitled, “Why I Am So Wise,” “Why I Am So Clever,” and “Why I Write Such Good Books.” Nietzsche claims to be wise as a consequence of his acute aesthetic sensitivity to nuances of health and sickness in people's attitudes and characters; he claims to be clever because he knows how to choose the right nutrition, climate, residence and recreation for himself; he claims to write such good books because they allegedly adventurously open up, at least for a very select group of readers, a new series of noble and delicate experiences. After examining each of his published works, Nietzsche concludes Ecce Homo with the section, “Why I Am a Destiny.” He claims that he is a destiny because he regards his anti-moral truths as having the annihilating power of intellectual dynamite; he expects them to topple the morality born of sickness which he perceives to have been reigning within Western culture for the last two thousand years. In this way, he expresses his hope that Dionysus, the god of life's exuberance, would replace Jesus, the god of the heavenly otherworld, as the premier cultural standard for future millennia.
Although Ecce Homo stands historically as Nietzsche's final autobiographical statement, if we consider that — although the plans were in flux — Nietzsche was embarking on a new work, at one point to be entitled, Revaluation of All Values, his 1888 autobiographical excursion can be appreciated as a kind of house-cleaning and summing-up of where he had intellectually arrived at that point. Rather than being a final self-definition, it can be seen as yet another among Nietzsche's several efforts over the years to clear the way for a freer intellectual development or metamorphosis. In this respect, it compares to Thus Spoke Zarathustra, Book IV, which appears to be Nietzsche's squarely facing, almost as a kind of exorcism, the variety of inner characters that constituted his personality. Along the same lines, Ecce Homo recalls the interval between Human-All-too-Human and Daybreak, when Nietzsche plunged to a very low point in his health, coming close to death, and then dramatically recuperated.
Nietzsche Contra Wagner, Out of the Files of a Psychologist (Nietzsche contra Wagner, Aktenstücke eines Psychologen, December 1888) is a short, but classic, selection of passages Nietzsche extracted from his 1878–1887 published works. Many concern Wagner, but the excerpts serve mostly as a foil for Nietzsche to express his own views against Wagner's. In this self-portrait, completed only a month before his collapse, Nietzsche characterizes his own anti-Christian sentiments, and contemplates how even the greatest people usually undergo significant corruption. In Wagner's case, Nietzsche claims that the corrupting force was Christianity. One cannot help remembering here how, using the same kind of rationale, Wagner claimed that Felix Mendelssohn's corrupting force was Judaism. At the same time, Nietzsche describes how he truly admired some of Wagner's music for its profound expressions of loneliness and suffering — expressions which Nietzsche admitted were psychologically impossible for he himself to articulate.
The writings of Nietzsche's final active year are peppered with some wild phrasings, but they remain lucid and philosophically penetrating on the whole. Given the utter loss of Nietzsche's intellectual capacities upon his collapse, this prior lucidity is puzzling. The abruptness of his breakdown in combination with the lucidity of his final writings has fed speculation that rather than suffering from a slowly progressive mental disease, Nietzsche had a physical condition (e.g., a brain tumor) whose silent growth eventually reached a critical mass that caused his mental composure to snap.
Nietzsche's unpublished writings often reveal his more tentative and speculative ideas. This material is surrounded by controversy, since some of it conflicts with views he expresses in his published works. Disagreement regarding Nietzsche's notebooks, also known as his Nachlass, centers around the degree of interpretive priority which ought to be given to the unpublished versus the published manuscripts. One popular approach in the tradition of classical scholarly interpretation is to maintain that Nietzsche's published works express his more considered and polished views, and that these should take precedence over the unpublished manuscripts when conflicts arise; a second attitude, given voice by Martin Heidegger (who lectured on Nietzsche in Nazi Germany, 1936–1940), and broadly consistent with a psychoanalytic approach as well, is to regard what Nietzsche published as representative of what he decided was publicly presentable, and what he kept privately to himself in unpublished form as containing his more authentic views; a third, more comprehensive, interpretive style tries to grasp all of Nietzsche's texts together in an effort to form the most coherent interpretation of Nietzsche's thought, judging the priority of published versus unpublished works on a thematic, or case-by-case basis; a fourth position influenced by the French deconstructionist perspective maintains that any rigid prioritizing between published and private works is impossible, since all of the texts embody a comparable multidimensionality of meaning.
In his unpublished manuscripts, Nietzsche sometimes elaborates the topics found in the published works, such as his early 1870's notebooks, where there is important material concerning his theory of knowledge. In the 1880's notebooks — those his sister collected together after his death under the title, The Will to Power: Attempt at a Revaluation of all Values — Nietzsche adopts a more metaphysical orientation towards the doctrines of Eternal Recurrence and the Will to Power, speculating upon their intellectual strength as interpretations of reality itself. Side-by-side with these speculations, and complicating efforts towards developing an interpretation which is both comprehensive and coherent, Nietzsche's 1880's notebooks also repeatedly state that “there are no facts, only interpretations.”
Nietzsche's thought extended a deep influence during the 20th century, especially in Continental Europe. In English-speaking countries, his positive reception has been less resonant. During the last decade of Nietzsche's life and the first decade of the 20th century, his thought was particularly attractive to avant-garde artists who saw themselves on the periphery of established social fashion and practice. Here, Nietzsche's advocacy of new, healthy beginnings, and of creative artistry in general stood forth. His tendency to seek explanations for commonly-accepted values and outlooks in the less-elevated realms of sheer animal instinct was also crucial to Sigmund Freud's development of psychoanalysis. Later, during the 1930's, aspects of Nietzsche's thought were espoused by the Nazis and Italian Fascists, partly due to the encouragement of Elisabeth Förster-Nietzsche through her associations with Adolf Hitler and Benito Mussolini. It was possible for the Nazi interpreters to assemble, quite selectively, various passages from Nietzsche's writings whose juxtaposition appeared to justify war, aggression and domination for the sake of nationalistic and racial self-glorification.
Until the 1960s in France, Nietzsche appealed mainly to writers and artists, since the academic philosophical climate was dominated by G.W.F. Hegel's, Edmund Husserl's and Martin Heidegger's thought, along with the structuralist movement of the 1950's. Nietzsche became especially influential in French philosophical circles during the 1960's-1980's, when his “God is dead” declaration, his perspectivism, and his emphasis upon power as the real motivator and explanation for people's actions revealed new ways to challenge established authority and launch effective social critique. In the English-speaking world, Nietzsche's unfortunate association with the Nazis kept him from serious philosophical consideration until the 1950's and 60's, when landmark works such as Walter Kaufmann's, Nietzsche: Philosopher, Psychologist, Antichrist (1950) and Arthur C. Danto's, Nietzsche as Philosopher (1965), paved the way for a more open-minded discussion.
Specific 20th century figures who were influenced, either quite substantially, or in a significant part, by Nietzsche include painters, dancers, musicians, playwrights, poets, novelists, psychologists, sociologists, literary theorists, historians, and philosophers: Alfred Adler, Georges Bataille, Martin Buber, Albert Camus, E.M. Cioran, Jacques Derrida, Gilles Deleuze, Isadora Duncan, Michel Foucault, Sigmund Freud, Stefan George, André Gide, Hermann Hesse, Carl Jung, Martin Heidegger, Gustav Mahler, André Malraux, Thomas Mann, H.L. Mencken, Rainer Maria Rilke, Jean-Paul Sartre, Max Scheler, Giovanni Segantini, George Bernard Shaw, Lev Shestov, Georg Simmel, Oswald Spengler, Richard Strauss, Paul Tillich, Ferdinand Tönnies, Mary Wigman, William Butler Yeats and Stefan Zweig.
That Nietzsche was able to write so prolifically and profoundly for years, while remaining in a condition of ill-health and often intense physical pain, is a testament to his spectacular mental capacities and willpower. Lesser people under the same physical pressures might not have had the inclination to pick up a pen, let alone think and record thoughts which — created in the midst of striving for healthy self-overcoming — would have the power to influence an entire century.
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