Origen

First published Mon Mar 10, 2014

Origen (c. 185–c. 253) was a Christian exegete and theologian, who made copious use of the allegorical method in his commentaries, and (though later considered a heretic) laid the foundations of philosophical theology for the church. He was taught by a certain Ammonius, whom the majority of scholars identify as Ammonius Saccas, the teacher of Plotinus; many believe, however, that the external evidence will not allow us to identify him with the Origen whom Plotinus knew as a colleague. He was certainly well-instructed in philosophy and made use of it as an ancillary to the exposition and harmonization of scripture. This was the task that he undertook in most of his extant writings, and the more systematic theology is founded on the ecclesiastical doctrines of the Trinity, the incarnation, salvation after death and the inerrancy of scripture.

Origen was the first Christian to speak of three hypostases in the Trinity and to use the term homoousios (though only by analogy) of the relation between the second of these hypostases and the first. The Father, or first person, is nevertheless the only one who is autotheos, God in the fullest sense, whereas the Son is his dunamis or power and the Spirit a dependent being, operative only in the elect. All three are eternal and incorporeal, the Son being known as Wisdom in relation to the Father and Logos (reason, word) in relation to the world. In this capacity he is the shepherd of rational beings the logikoi, who, according to his later critics, were said in his lost writings to have been in origin incorporeal beings coeval with the world if not eternal, and currently imprisoned in material bodies only because of a cooling in their love. It is not so easy to demonstrate from his extant works that he held the material world in such contempt, though he certainly holds it to be created out of nothing and suspects that the concept of matter is philosophically redundant. Souls, in his view, are sent down into bodies (perhaps never more than once, though again some critics impute to him a doctrine of transmigration or chronic falling away from bliss). The soul remains indefeasibly free in its choices, and the misuse of this freedom is the cause of its captivity to the devil.

The deliverance of the soul is effected by the incarnation of the Logos, or second person of the Trinity, who assumes real body but remains fully God. His death on the Cross is a ransom to the devil, and his resurrection prefigures that of the saints, though he seems to imagine the body after death, in Platonic terms, as a tenuous vehicle of the soul. Scholars differ as to whether he envisages a final absorption of the body into incorporeal spirit. It is clear that he expects the vast majority of souls to endure a fiery purification after death, and that no soul will be excluded by God's will from this purgatory. While he thinks it possible that some may be too debauched by their sins to repent, he also opines that the devil himself will at last make peace with God, though he cannot attain beatitude. In the present life, an anticipation of bliss in the presence of Christ can be enjoyed by the exegete who has fully mastered the spiritual meaning of the scriptures. These are the word of God to us because Christ the word is ubiquitously present in them, investing them with a threefold sense as he himself assumed body, soul and spirit for our sake in his sojourn on earth.

1. Origen's life and work

The Greek name Origenes signifies “born of Horus,” an Egyptian falcon-headed deity. The Christian scholar of this name was a native of Alexandria (Eusebius, Church History 6.1), though it is only his detractor Epiphanius who says that he was also by race a Copt (Panarion 1.1). Eusebius records the jibe of the Neoplatonist Porphyry that Origen, though a Greek by education, became a Christian, whereas his philosophy teacher Ammonius, having once been a Christian, converted to a more lawful way of life (Church History 6.19.7). Although most scholars assume that this is Ammonius Saccas, the teacher of Plotinus, there was another philosopher of the same name, who is credited with “unequalled polymathy” by the philosopher Longinus at Porphyry, Life of Plotinus 20.49–50. (For further information see Edwards 1993: 179.) Eusebius, moreover, asserts that that both Origen and his teacher were Christians throughout their lives (6.19.10); as evidence of the latter's Christianity in his youth, he records that his father Leontius died as a martyr in 202, and that Origen himself, then 17, not only exhorted Leontius to persevere but thirsted for the same death (6.2.7). His mother could curb his enthusiasm only by hiding his clothes so that he was ashamed to leave the house (6.2.6). Eusebius also tells us that his sexual diffidence or his ascetic temper induced Origen to make himself literally a eunuch for the kingdom of heaven (6.8.2); the act is not unparalleled (Markschies 2007: 15–34), but Epiphanius was unable to verify the story (Panarion 64.2).

After his father's death, Origen devoted himself to scholarship and became a notable teacher, perhaps succeeding Clement as head of the catechetical school in Alexandria (Eusebius, Church History 6.3.1 and 6.7–8.1; but cf. Osborn 2008: 19–21). He appears to have studied Hebrew with a converted Jew (First Principles 1.3.4 etc.), and one of his letters alludes to his studies in philosophy with an unnamed teacher (Eusebius, Church History 6.19.13). Among the works Eusebius says that he composed at this time, dictating to “more than seven stenographers” (6.23.2), were the first five books of his Commentary on John, eight books of a Commentary on Genesis, two books On the Resurrection and his major surviving work, a synthesis of scriptural teaching under the name First Principles (6.24). Of these the last survives entire, but only in the Latin of Rufinus. A few books of the Commentary on John survive in Greek, while portions of the work on the resurrection were preserved in a rejoinder by Methodius of Olympia, which itself survives only in the excerpts and epitomes of later authors (see Dechow 1977). It was also in Alexandria, in imitation of the Homeric scholars of the Hellenistic era, that Origen addressed himself to the preparation of his great Hexapla, in which a corrected edition of the Septuagint, the original, allegedly inspired translation of the Hebrew scriptures (3rd c. BC?), stood in parallel to the Hebrew and the renderings of other Greek translators (Eusebius, Church History 6.16. See further Neuschäfer 1987; Dorival 2013).

According to Eusebius, his talents excited the jealousy of Demetrius, the Bishop of Alexandria, who cited his self-castration as a reason for refusing to ordain him as a presbyter (Eusebius, Church History 6.8.4–5). Nevertheless, when Origen left Alexandria in 216 to escape the ferocity of the Emperor Caracalla, Demetrius recalled him from Caesarea, where he had already begun to increase his reputation (6.19.16–19). On a subsequent visit to Caesarea he was ordained a presbyter, and took up residence in the city (6.8.5; 6.23.4). Having commenced a commentary on the Song of Songs in the course of a sojourn in Athens (6.32.2), he completed this in Caesarea, together with his Commentary on Matthew and his refutation of the True Logos, a pagan satire on Christianity written around 170 by an otherwise unknown Celsus (6.36.2). Never rising above the rank of presbyter, he was often employed, according to the custom of the times, as a mouthpiece of orthodoxy in trials of heretics before an episcopal synod. Eusebius commends his refutation of Beryllus of Bostra (6.33), adding that he was summoned to play a similar role in Arabia (6.37), and that in his books he tore the mask from heresies old and new. To this period of his life we should also date the Dialogue with Heraclides, discovered at Tura in 1951 (Chadwick 1959). Yet even at the height of his career, his orthodoxy was impugned. Jerome knows of a letter in which he rebuts the accusation that he had prophesied the salvation of the devil (Crouzel 1973); the same letter indicates, according to Jerome, that his teachings had given offence to Heraclas, his former student who had now succeeded Demetrius as bishop of Alexandria. It is clear at least that no censure was extended to Dionysius, the successor of Heraclas and another of Origen's pupils. In Caesarea the ageing theologian suffered tortures under Decius in 251 (Eusebius, Church History 6.39.5) and, according to Eusebius, died as Gallus came to the throne in 253 (7.1.1). His assertion that Origen was then in his seventieth year is inconsistent with the date implied for his birth (185). Most scholars have elected to postpone the death of Origen to 254 or 255, without explaining why they think the biographer more likely to have erred with regard to the year of his subject's birth than that of his death.

His library in Caesarea was inherited by his admirer Pamphilus, then by Eusebius as a disciple of Pamphilus and bishop of that city. It also fell to Eusebius to finish the Apology which Pamphilus had begun to write against Origen's first detractors. From this work and the philippics of such enemies of Origen as Jerome, Theophilus of Alexandria, Epiphanius of Salamis, and the Emperor Justinian, we can cull fragments of writings that have otherwise perished (see further Clark 1992). We also possess an anthology of choice excerpts from his writings the Philokalia (McLynn 2004), and two short texts On Prayer and To the Martyrs. Much had already been lost by attrition in the time of Eusebius (died c.339); more may have perished after Origen was anathematized in or around the year 553. Many of Origen's Commentaries and Homilies, like the First Principles, survive only in the Latin of Rufinus, who translated him in the fourth century with reverence but not always with fidelity (see further Pace 1990). The following synopsis of Origen's thought is based primarily on the extant corpus in Greek and Latin, making use of polemical matter only with the caution that is now enjoined by the most learned scholars.

2. The intellectual milieu

Scholars are apt to speak casually of Origen's Platonism, more technically of his middle Platonism, most commonly, and not often with conscious paradox, of his Christian Platonism. The Lutheran theologian Anders Nygren (1953), who protested that a Christian Platonist is not a Christian, differed only in his judgment of the facts, not in his reading of them, from his critics J.M. Rist (1964) and Catherine Osborne (1994), who maintained that Platonism in Origen's hands was not so much an adulteration as a salutary refinement of the gospel. Nevertheless, whatever the merits of Nygren's theology, Origen would have agreed with him in the matter of nomenclature. The majority of his explicit references to Plato are to be found in the work Against Celsus, a reply to a dead polemicist who is nowadays characterized as a middle Platonist, though Origen hints that he may have been an Epicurean (Against Celsus 1.8; see further Bergjan 2001). Origen undertakes to show that the simplest disciple of God's word knows him better than the philosophers who seek him by their own methods (Against Celsus 7.42), that Plato misrepresents the fall and diminishes the Creator, that if his myths are deep, the biblical allegories are deeper and less perverse, and that Numenius, the foremost Platonist of recent times, has spoken of both Moses and Jesus with esteem (Against Celsus 4.15 etc.).

The Bible (consisting for Origen only of the New Testament and the Septuagint) is the matrix of every argument in this as in all his writings; while it would be naive, and a contradiction of his own practice, to deny that that his exegesis was conditioned by philosophical assumptions; the propaedeutic to biblical study in his school at Caesarea was not Platonism but a professedly unprejudiced survey of all the Greek schools. We learn this from his pupil Gregory Thaumaturgus (Panegyric 13.151–152), to whom he also wrote a letter assigning to Greek thought an ancillary role in the elucidation of the scriptures; while he was less inclined than his predecessors to accuse the Greeks of plagiarizing their philosophical views from the books of Moses, he held that, since every exercise of reason is inspired by Christ the Logos, a Christian has as much right to the tools of pagan philosophy as the Israelites had to reimburse their labour from the “spoils of the Egyptians” (Philokalia 13; see further Martens 2012: 29–33). Theologians have at last begun to take Origen at his word as an interpreter of the scriptures; this is not to say that all other influences are ignored, but that he is thought to deserve the same courtesy that Classicists show to Plotinus when they acknowledge that even doctrines which he consciously shares with the Stoics or Aristotle can be derived without subterfuge from the text of Plato.

The epithet “Platonist” will of course be warranted if Origen the Christian is identified with the Origen whom Porphyry represents as one of the privileged disciples of Ammonius Saccas, the Alexandrian teacher of Plotinus. According to Porphyry (Life of Plotinus, 3.20–38) this Origen swore an oath with Plotinus and a third disciple, Herennius, not to reveal the esoteric doctrines of Ammonius after the latter's death in 243 A.D. This story implies both personal intimacy and geographical proximity, yet Origen the Christian was at this time almost sixty (twenty years senior to Plotinus), had left Alexandria for Caesarea some years before, and already had a multitude of books to his name as a Christian teacher. Porphyry does not allude to these lucubrations in his Life of Plotinus, but says that the Origen he refers to breached the pact by issuing first a treatise On Daemons, then another, with the title That the King is the Only Maker, in the reign of Gallienus (253–268). He includes in the Life a letter, written in 262 or 263 by his former tutor Longinus, which ascribes to Origen only the work On Daemons (Porphyry, Life of Plotinus, 20.36–45). All scholars agree that Origen the Christian could not have written anything in the last years of Gallienus; if we can trust Eusebius, he did not live to see this reign at all, but died in that of Gallienus' predecessor Gallus (251–253). So, if this Origen is our author, Porphyry must at least have misstated the period at which he violated the agreement. Those who contend that there was only one Origen reply that that it is the chronology of Eusebius that must be flawed because, although his account of Origen's youth implies that he was born in 185, he asserts that his death occurred in his seventieth year, and hence not earlier than 254, the first year of Gallienus. The same apologists argue that Porphyry fails to mention his Christian writings either because he despised them or (more cogently) because the publication of them did not violate the oath (cf. Ramelli 2009). If this argument is to prevail, a reason must also be furnished for the silence of Longinus on this part of Origen's work, the Christian works of Origen must be regarded as aids (in some degree) to the reconstruction of the teaching of Ammonius, and something must be said to explain the failure of Origen's Christian detractors in late antiquity to cite the two works—still extant, according to Proclus—which he added to the Neoplatonic canon. For these reasons, while theologians have often maintained, or simply assumed, the identity of the two Origens, the Oxford Classical Dictionary asserts that the contrary position is nowadays the more widely held (Smith 2012; see further Edwards 1993).

3. Doctrine of God

The opening chapter of Origen's First Principles is a paradigmatic instance of his application of philosophic reasoning to biblical exegesis. He assumes here what he asserts elsewhere, that the nature of God is known to us only by his own revelation in the sacred text. The scriptures tell us both that God is fire and that God is spirit, but Origen warns us not to deduce, from a literal construction of these terms, that he is a body (Princ. 1.1.1). It is possible but not certain, that he has in mind the Stoicizing theology of Tertullian: the Bible speaks more plainly on this matter than any Stoic, and few of Origen's contemporaries would have doubted the corporeality of fire or spirit. In urging the contrary position, that God is incorporeal. Origen speaks not only for the Platonists but for all the Greek apologists of the church: the prevalent thought of his time (and perhaps of ours) required that if God is to be invisible, immutable, eternal, omnipresent, and irresistible in power he must not be confined to one place or composed of labile matter. The philosophical sympathies of Origen become evident when he goes on to equate this bodiless god with nous or intellect. In Plato, nous had been an occasional synonym for the Demiurge, while Numenius of Apamea, half a century before Origen, had subordinated the Demiurge, as a second nous, to the “first nous”, which is Plato's form of the Good. Although the Good in Plato is superior to ousia or being, Numenius like the majority of Platonists before Origen, appears to have posited nothing higher than intellect; Origen too—in this respect a good Platonist—is less inclined to apophatic theology than Philo the Alexandrian Jew or his Christian predecessors in Egypt, Clement and Basilides. To explain the selective use of the definite article in John 1.1, he characterizes the Father (ho theos) as autotheos, very God, in contrast the Son who is merely theos (CommJohn 2.7.16–18); when he suggests, however, that the Father is higher than nous (Against Celsus 7.45), he does not develop a metaphysical theory, any more than he develops his hint in the same work that God may be the Aristotelian “thought of thoughts” (see further Whittaker 1969). Tobias Böhm's ingenious suggestion (2002) that for Origen the being of God is his nous, and his unity that which is higher than nous, assumes that he was acquainted with the first and second hypotheses of the Parmenides, a dialogue of which he evinces little knowledge in his extant works.

Whether he is noetic or supranoetic, Origen's God cannot be known to us in his essence, nor is it by his ousia, or essence, but by his dunamis, or power, that he acts upon other beings (On Prayer 25.3). His dunamis, which is infinite and mediated by the second person of the Trinity, is the source of every dunamis that is exercised by his creatures, even by those who have fallen into apostasy and rebellion (CommJohn 1.39.291). On the other hand nothing, not even the second person, proceeds directly from the immutable ousia of God (CommJohn 13.25.153 and 20.18.157: see below). Yet, while he asserts that God is by nature impassible—in the sense that he is the agent, not the patient, in every transaction and cannot be moved by any external force—Origen is one of the first theologians to assert that he can suffer, in a sense, as God, and not only by virtue of the incarnation (Homilies on Ezekiel 6.1; see Osborn 1994: 164–184). This suffering takes the form of commiseration for the plight of his sinful creatures, never of sorrow on his own account. Compassion supposes knowledge, and Origen appears to have been untroubled by the difficulties that arise from the ascription of contingent knowledge to an eternal being. That God transcends the temporal order is evident from his answer to those who ask what God was doing before he created the world: the question, he argues, presupposes a time before the beginning of the world, but reflection teaches us that time and the revolutions of the cosmos are coeval (Princ. 3.5.3). This is a Platonic doctrine, but it had now become common for Platonists to argue, in submission to Aristotle, that the temporal world has neither end nor beginning and is “generated” only in the sense that it is a theatre of vicissitude, in which all that exists has come into being and will pass away.

The agent whom we call the Second Person of the Trinity is “another god” at Dialogue with Heraclides 2 and a “second god” on two occasions in his work Against Celsus (5.39, 5.61). This appellation is not attested in earlier Christian prose, though it is anticipated in Philo and Numenius. It does not occur in works addressed by Origen to Christians of sound faith, not even in those which show no fear of subordinating the Son to the Father—an indication perhaps that it was avoided because it savoured of polytheism and not because it belied the equality of the divine persons (Edwards 2006). It seems that in Numenius it is the contemplation of the first intellect by the second that gives rise to the forms, or Platonic ideas; Origen, as a Christian, holds that the contemplation is mutual, since “no-one knows the Son but the Father and no-one knows the Father but the Son” (Matthew 11.27). Thus he maintains, on the one hand, that the Son, as truth (John 14.6), knows all that is in the mind of the Father; the infamous proviso that the Son does not see the Father signifies only that within the Godhead vision is not mediated by our physical organs (Princ. 1.1.8). On the other hand, when we read that the Son is the wisdom and power of the Father (1 Corinthians 1.24) and that the world was created through him (Hebrews 1.2), we are to understand that he is that divine helpmate who declares at Proverbs 8.22 that the Lord created her in the beginning of his ways, and at Wisdom7.26 that she is the mirror of his unspotted majesty. The verb “created” (which Origen prefers to the alternative reading “possessed”) does not imply that the Son has a temporal beginning, but that, having no other substrate than the Father's will, he expresses that will more perfectly than the things that are “made” from matter. It is inconceivable that the Father could ever have lacked wisdom, and equally inconceivable to Origen that this wisdom could ever have taken a different form from the one that it now possesses as the second person or hypostasis of the Trinity (Princ. 1.2.2). He is the first theologian to state unequivocally that the “three hypostases” which constitute the Trinity are eternal not only in nature, but in their hypostatic character; there was never a time when wisdom was the latent thought of the Father and had not yet come forth as speech.

Though Origen rejects it, this was in fact the prevailing thesis of most Christian writing in the second century when it undertook to explain the Fourth Evangelist's assertion that the one who became incarnate was the Logos who had been with the Father as theos (god) if not ho theos (God) from the beginning (John 1.1). Since it was this speech or word that created the world, it was argued, there would have been no reason for it to exist before the creation as a distinct hypostasis. If he existed at all, it was as the logos endiathetos, the word within, which had not yet emerged from the mind as logos prophorikos, or verbal utterance. In this latent phase he could be identified (as Philo had already argued) with the paradigm, or world of forms, which supplies the Platonic demiurge with his pattern for the creation. Clement of Alexandria accepts this equation, albeit perhaps without denying the hypostatic eternity of the Logos (Edwards 2000). Origen, however, resists the interpretation of Logos as “speech” because there are some who take this to imply that the second person is merely a function or epiphenomenon of the first (CommJohn 1.24.151; Orbe 1991). Logos, in his view, is one of the numerous designations (epinoiai) which are conferred on the second person to define his relation, not to the Father (as “Son” and “Wisdom” do) but to his creatures (CommJohn 2.9.66 etc.): he is Logos as the paradigm and parent of all the logikai, or rational beings, who exercise reason only by participation in him. He cannot be identified with the world of forms, or Platonic ideas, because to Origen these ideas are imaginary entities which the Greeks absurdly suppose to be independent of the Creator (Princ. 2.3.6). It appears then that he endorsed the older and more literal reading of the Timaeus, according to which the Demiurge, the forms and matter are three autonomous principles of being. Before him Philo, Alcinous, and Clement of Alexandria had construed the forms as thoughts in the mind of the Demiurge, while Alexander of Aphrodisias held that they gave content to God's eternal contemplation of himself (Armstrong 1960). Origen himself opines that all genera, all species and even the archetypes of all particular things are eternally present in the mind of God (Princ. 1.4.5), but he holds this as a Christian antidote to difficulties which arise from the temporality of the world.

4. The created order

These difficulties, as Origen perceived, had not been fully resolved by the argument that since the world is coeval with time we need not ask what God was doing before he created it (see further Tzamalikos 2006: 179–271). From Genesis 1.1 we learn that God created the world in the beginning, and from John 1.1 that the Logos was with him in the beginning; but as we are also told that God created all things in wisdom, Origen takes this beginning to be not a temporal origin but the eternal desideratum of existence who is also the second person of the Trinity (CommJohn 1.39.289). It follows, however, that if this temporal world is the only one, an infinite cause has exhausted itself in a finite effect. Perhaps it was in the hope of evading this paradox that Origen interpreted Solomon's dictum, “there is nothing new under the sun” (Ecclesiastes 1.10) to mean that worlds have existed before the present one (Princ. 3.1.6). This manoeuvre, however, will bring no escape unless one posits an infinite succession of worlds before and after the present one, and even Origen's enemies do not say that he went so far. An endless series, after all, would be sempiternal rather than eternal, and the Stoics might have replied that their belief in the perpetual reduplication of the same cosmos—a belief disowned by Origen (Cels. 4. 68)—comes closer to matching timeless activity with a timeless product. A better solution than either of these, in Origen's view, was to posit a noetic realm, created but eternal, populated by logika, or rational entities, under the hegemony of the logos, and preceding ours in the ontological hierarchy rather than in the temporal continuum (Princ. 2.9.4). Evidence for this conceit could be found in the creation of a heaven and earth at Genesis 1.1 before the creation of the visible firmament (Genesis Homilies 1.5). To the modern mind this is forced exegesis, representing the triumph of philosophy over philology; the philosophy, however, is not that of any Greek school, but of a Christian who has set himself a conundrum by his fidelity to Moses. It is a striking observation, however we explain it, that the forms of particular things which coexist in the mind of Origen's God with the genera and species are not attested in any pagan Platonist before Plotinus, his younger contemporary and (as most believe) a fellow-pupil of Ammonius Saccas (cf. Plotinus, Enneads 5.7).

As the absolute and transcendent dunamis of the Father (Cels. 1.66; CommJohn 1.18.107 etc.), the second person is properly the lord of every dunamis in heaven and earth (Cels. 5.45). At the same time, it can be said that he is the food of the celestial dunameis who have remained true to the Creator, while Satan is the food of those who have fallen (On Prayer 27.12). It is the angelic dunameis who keep watch over his cradle at the time of his nativity (Cels. 1.61), and who sometimes form a retinue at the scenes where he performs those works of power which we call miracles (CommJohn 2.4.40). This polysemic usage of the term, which mirrors that of the New Testament, presents no difficulty so long as every other dunamis is conceived as a lower or local manifestation of the undivided power which appertains to him as Logos. As we have seen, this term defines his hegemonic relation to the created order; Wisdom is another of his biblical appellations, yet this Wisdom is the beginning in which the Logos was with God (CommJohn 1.39.289; see further Tzamalikos 2006: 119–178). However one accounts for these obscurities, it seems unlikely that Origen could have signed the Nicene Creed of 325, in which the Son is declared to be from the ousia of the Father, and therefore homoousios (of one essence, substance or nature) with him (cf. CommJohn 20.18.157). A community of nature between the two is asserted, however, at CommJohn 2.10.76); and in his Commentary on Hebrews, he deduces from Wisdom 7.26, where Wisdom is styled an aporroia or emanation of the Father, that the relation between the two persons of the Trinity is analogous to that which holds between an ointment and the exhalation which is homoousios with it (Pamphilus, Apology 99–104; see Edwards 1998). Thus he can make oblique use of a term which he cannot predicate directly of incorporeals; Plotinus, who could have done so, could not have said that nous was homoousios with the One because the latter is superior to ousia.which can be posited only at the level of nous.

Although the Son is not “from the ousia” of the Father, he is said in the Latin translation of Origen's Commentary on Hebrews to be ex substantia patris, from the hypostasis of the Father. That hypostasis, not ousia, was the original noun in Greek can be deduced from the text of Hebrews 1.3, where the Son is described as an impression of his [the Father's] hypostasis. Here hypostasis appears to signify the reality disclosed by a phenomenon; the formula ex substantia patris was already axiomatic for Origen's African contemporary Tertullian (Against Praxeas 7.9). In Latin of this period substantia was used indifferently to represent both hypostasis and ousia; these Greek terms are not explicitly distinguished in Origen's writings, though he refrains from attributing either one ousia or three to the Godhead. Some difference in concreteness is implied by his strictures on those who fail to qualify the ousia of the Son and thus deny him a hypostasis altogether (CommJoh 1.24.152): it seems, then that the hypostasis is a specific determination of the more generic ousia. Origen stipulates in his treatise On Prayer (15.1) that the Son should not receive the prayer of adoration which is offered to the Father because he differs from the Father in ousia and in substrate (hupokeimenon); the latter word is best understood with reference to the body that he assumed in the incarnation, and we cannot therefore be sure whether the ousia of which Origen speaks is that of the exalted Christ in his eternal or his human character. It is generally true that he takes fewer pains than later Christian authors to winnow what is said of the Son as second person of the Trinity from what is said of him as Jesus of Nazareth. When he compares the Father to a statue of infinite magnitude and the Son to a smaller statue accommodated to our perceptions, he begins as though the visible were a metaphor for the invisible, but ends by quoting Philippians 2.7 on the manifestation of Christ in the form of a slave (Princ. 1.2.6).

Origen strongly affirms the ontological dependence of the Spirit, or third hypostasis of the Trinity, on the second. To say otherwise would be to deny that he was brought into being, since the author of all that was brought into being, according to John 1.3, is the Son or Logos. It would be truer, however, to say that the Spirit did not come into being without the Son than that he came into being through him (CommJohn 2.12.17–19). The Spirit, as hypostasis, is not only eternal but incorporeal in the strictest sense: this follows from First Principles 1.6.4, where Origen finds it impossible to imagine that any being apart from the members of the Trinity can subsist without a body. If these persons were incorporeal only in the looser sense that Origen recognises in First Principles, proem 10, he could not have drawn such an antithesis between the Godhead and the angelic creation. The powers and operations of the Spirit are not so clearly delineated in his writings, as those of the other two persons; the same could be said of almost any writer before Nicaea, and the cause, no doubt, is the absence of unanimity in the scriptures. It is the Spirit who moves (or broods) on the face of the waters before creation at Genesis 1.2; at John 1.3 the Logos supplants the Spirit, which is now said at John 7.39 to have been given only when Jesus was glorified at the end of his ministry. Origen follows John when he writes that the Father is at work in the entire creation, the Son in those beings who possess logos or reason, and the Spirit in the elect (Justinian, To Menas; cf. Princ. 1.3.5). It may be that this restriction of the Son's office implies a Greek rather than a biblical understanding of the term logos, but Greek thought knows of no supernal being who acts in the realm assigned by Origen to the Spirit (pace Dillon 1982). This Trinitarian hierarchy has been compared with that of the noetic principles being, life and mind in the system of Proclus, for whom being encompasses all that exists, life the more limited sphere of living creatures and mind the still more limited sphere of the rational. The correspondence, however, is far from exact, and, as Proclus wrote two centuries after Origen and under later influences, more compelling arguments will be required before we assign to a Platonic source the doctrine that Origen draws so effortlessly from the scriptures. No evidence has been produced to show that the Spirit functions in Origen as the soul of the world; he surmises on one occasion that the Logos is the soul of God (Princ. 2.8.5), but only because he needs to account for an anthropomorphic metaphor at Psalm 84.6. .

That the Godhead is incorporeal—and therefore, in Origen's lexicon, immaterial—is, as we have seen, an unassailable premiss of his theology. If the second person has any substrate—any matter, as we might say—it is the will of God the Father. The significance of this doctrine becomes apparent when we recall that Christ is wisdom and that in the myth attributed to the Gnostic Ptolemaeus, the error of wisdom lies in her acting without the assent of her consort Thelema, or Will (Irenaeus, Against Heresies 1.1-4). The Father's will, on the other hand, is not the substrate but the cause of the material universe, which Origen held, with every orthodox Christian of his day, to have been created out of nothing. For most Christians this did not entail that God creates without matter, but that the matter from which he shaped the world was the first of his creations. Matter had seldom been defined in Christian prose before Origen, but for him, as for Aristotle, as he has often been interpreted, it is the unqualified receptacle of all qualities, a mere potentiality for existence in contradistinction to essence, of which nothing can be predicated until it is actualised as determinate being. But then follows Bishop Berkeley's question: if matter is not something, why not conclude that it is nothing? Origen is perhaps the first extant writer who informs us that this question had been posed in his time, though in his accustomed manner he neither affirms it at First Principles 4.4.7 nor names its proponents. We must say “perhaps”, because the Philokalia, a florilegium of his writings, contains a short dialogue in which the redundancy of matter is established by Socratic interrogation (Philokalia 24). In view of his diffidence in First Principles, it seems more likely that this text is the work of Maximus, a second-century author to whom it is also attributed in our manuscripts.

5. Theodicy and sin

It is clear at least that Origen's God creates the world from nothing and without toil or opposition (Princ.2.1.5). Because he asserts that such a world will inevitably be finite, as God himself cannot comprehend the infinite, Origen was later accused of slighting the omnipotence of the Creator. His meaning, however, is not that there are limits to the power of God, but that any particular exercise of it must logically have some limit. The infinite is by nature incomprehensible; hence it is no shortcoming in God that he cannot comprehend it, and he remains omnipotent in the sense that there is no finite enterprise that lies beyond his power. In contrast to the Gnostics, therefore, who held that our world is the residue of a rupture or fall within the Godhead, Origen maintains that a singe God is the creator of both the intellectual and the material cosmos. He also purports to demonstrate the priority of the intellectual Adam to the material Adam, first by giving an allegorical sense to the firmament which divides the waters at Genesis 1.7, then by a literal reading of Genesis 1.26–2.22. In this text the creation of humanity as male and female in the image of God, as the crown of his handiwork, is succeeded by a narrative of quite a different tenor, in which God fashions the body of the first man from the soil and then, after populating the garden with beasts and plants and infusing the spirit into his nostrils, derives the body of the first woman from his rib (Genesis 2.1–7; 2.21–25). It is not clear whether a temporal, as well as an ontological, priority is accorded to the inner man, or whether the protoplasts owe their creation to his fall.

That the denizens of the present world have sinned, and will sin again, is a ubiquitous premiss of Origen's theodicy. Misadventures which the world ascribes to fortune, fate or the malice of our superhuman guardians will always in fact be trials of virtue, chastisements for sin (perhaps forgotten) or correctives to hidden injustice. If the ways of providence remain elusive—if we cannot divine why God loved Jacob and hated Esau—the explanation must lie in causes prior to the birth of Jacob or the entry of his brother into the womb. These are the most positive intimations in Origen's extant works of a doctrine freely ascribed to him by his ancient critics, according to which all rational beings were once pure intellects in the presence of God, and would have remained so for ever had they not fallen away through koros or satiety. Each of the delinquents, we are told, received a body corresponding to the gravity of the original sin: those who fell least became angels, those who fell most became demons, and human souls constitute order in keeping with the mediocrity of their transgressions (Antipater of Bostra at Patrologia Graeca 96.504–505). This account of Origen's teaching was already known to Augustine, who perceived its incoherence, since it implies that the bodies of demons, who inhabit the air above us, are grosser than ours. In the form that is now canonical, it is a bricolage of Platonic myths recounting the fall of the soul from the “supercelestial place”, the peculiarly Christian and anti-Platonic concept of the demons as fallen angels, and Philo's opinion that koros is the cause of the soul's estrangement from its maker (Heir of Divine Things 240). If Origen held such a theory, it was not on the Platonic ground that soul, as the cause of motion, cannot be brought into being and hence must be immortal; his object, typically Christian, is to vindicate biblical teaching and at the same time to show that it cannot be used to support any Gnostic or pagan animadversion on divine justice. Accordingly (though some of his ancient critics pretended otherwise), his writings are unequivocal in their rejection of Plato's theory of transmigration, whether from human to human or from human to beast; although these theories (hesitantly accepted even by Platonists in the third century), gain some colour from Jewish traditions about Elijah and from punishments meted out to animals under the Levitical law, Origen bows to the wisdom of the church, which declares them inadmissible (CommJohn 1.11.66; Princ. 1.8.5).

Certainly at First Principles 1.4.1 he writes that satiety is the commonest cause of falling, but the soul of which he speaks may be an embodied one, as it is when it repents a few lines later (Princ. 1.4.1). At First Principles 3.5.6, and again in his fragmentary commentary on Ephesians, he interprets the noun katabolê at Ephesians 1.4 as an allusion to the soul's descent to a body from the hand of God; but this descent, which is not a fall, is not said to coincide with the creation. We read that the soul of Christ adhered to the word with indissoluble love ab initio creationis, but these words could signify either “from the beginning of the creation” or “from the beginning of its creation” (Princ. 2.6.3–4). At First Principles 1.7.1 we are said to be properly identical with our rational element; but Gregory of Nyssa and Augustine said the same without being understood to mean that we have ever existed as disembodied souls. When Origen surmises that Esau was expiating the sins of his former life, we cannot assume that he was ignorant of rabbinic speculations on the sins that Esau committed in the womb; when he refers elsewhere to causes preceding Esau's entry into the womb, these causes may not include any act on the part of Esau's soul (Princ. 3.1.22). That merit can be ascribed to a human being in the foetal state is evident from the leaping of John the Baptist in Elizabeth's womb when he recognises the child in the womb of Mary (Princ. 1.7.4). In his exegesis of John 1.31, Origen suggests that the Baptist deplores his failure to recognise Jesus at the River Jordan because he has already known him in a previous life; since, however, he was prepared to entertain the theory that the Baptist was an angel embodied for our sake, we cannot deduce that Origen credited all souls with a sentient existence before their entry into this world (CommJohn 2.31.186). That the elements are ensouled can be inferred from Isaiah 1.2, where God calls heaven and earth to witness; and Job's exclamation, “the stars are not clean in his sight” is applied by Origen to the sun and moon, who have been made “subject to vanity” for the sake of those who inhabit the physical cosmos (Princ. 1.7.2). Here it may be true that he borrows a tenet from the Platonists, but not without biblical warrant, and the uncleanness of the sun and moon is a consequence of their voluntary enthralment, not its cause (see further Scott 1994).

In Origen's extant writings, then, the doctrine of the soul's fall through satiety, after centuries of beatitude as a “pure intellect”, is never so clearly stated as in later indictments of his heterodoxy. Many hold none the less that the charges are true, and that Origen's advocacy of these doctrines is concealed from us by the loss or mutilation of the incriminating texts. Others, relying chiefly on the texts that have been preserved, maintain that for Origen the fall of souls was a tentative and occasional speculation or a myth, in Plato's sense, that was later mistaken for a dogma (Harl 1987). It has also been argued that his preserved words testify only to Origen's belief in the fall of angels (Princ. 1.5.3) and to the creation of the soul before its descent into the body; on this view, readers who came to his work with formulaic expectations mingled his own opinions with the Platonic tenets to which they bore a calculated but incomplete resemblance. No hypothesis has yet accounted for all that is said in the surviving corpus of Origen's works. If the soul falls from a discarnate state, for example, what is to be made of the sin of Adam and Eve, who are certainly embodied, though their fall is represented as an occlusion of the intellect by the senses (Cels. 7.39)? If, as Origen seems to hold (Princ. 3.6.1), the likeness of God was not yet conferred on the intellectual man who was created in the image of God, should we infer that Adam's body was given to him as a means of acquiring the likeness, just as the Neoplatonist Porphyry, fifty years later, taught that souls are implanted in bodies in order to cultivate virtue through the struggle against temptation? If embodiment is either the primordial state or a state imposed on the soul for its edification, only limited credence can be given to the report of Epiphanius that Origen identified the coats of skins at Genesis 3.21 with the body that God created for Adam as a consequence of the fall (Panarion 64.4.11; cf. Heidl 2003: 138–150). On the other hand, if we grant that our initial state was not unlike the present one, we may find it hard to interpret Origen's dictum that the end, or consummation (apokatastasis), is “the same as the beginning” (Princ. 1.6.2). The provenance of the noun apokatastasis is more easily established than its meaning, for even in the New Testament it may signify not so much the restoration of that which was once the case as the realisation of that which ought to be (see further Tzamalikos 2007: 237–356; Ramelli 2013: 129–221).

However the soul's detention in the present world is accounted for, its freedom to choose its own goods, and its own god, is an indefeasible premiss of Origen's philosophy. Astrologers who pretend to read our fates from the stars can be answered with a quip from Epicurus: if all that comes to pass is predestined, so is the belief in predestination, and we therefore have no reason to think it true (Philokalia 25.4). Even if they vouchsafe some premonitions of the future to the saints, we are not to suppose that they are the causes of what they signify, or that God, who inscribes his own knowledge in the stars, is the author of everything that he foresees. Because he is exempt from time, our future lies open to him as the past and present lie open; he knows, in the words of Paul, whether each of his creatures is to be a vessel of honour or a vessel of dishonour. It is we, however, who make his knowledge true by our own choice of good or evil; the Gnostics misconstrue the apostle's statement that God “makes” us vessels of honour or dishonour when they argue that the damned and the elect are of different natures. None of us is born virtuous but each of us (as Aristotle says and common experience goes on telling us) has the power to advance in virtue by performing virtuous acts (Princ. 3.1).

6. The Work of Christ

Nevertheless, since the fall has darkened our minds and subjected our bodies to corruption, we cannot effect our own salvation without the assistance of God's word made flesh. For Origen the virgin birth is a datable event, an appropriation by the Word of full humanity in body, soul and spirit. The union can be described as an anakrasis or mixture (Cels. 3.41), a voluntary cleaving of the flesh or soul to the Word, and (in defiance of chemical facts) as the sublimation of the humanity by the divinity, as iron loses its form when held in an incandescent flame (Princ. 2.6.4) The humanity, for all that, is not annihilated, and Christ can speak at times as man and at others with God without being guilty of dissimulation (CommJohn 19.2.6). His own words “my soul is sorrowful unto death” reveals his possession of a soul, which mediates between the flesh and the divinity which would otherwise destroy it. While the soul (for Christ as for us) is invariably the seat of passion, some of his passions originate in his spirit, which, though human, is divinely irradiated by the Word. By virtue of this irradiation, he foresees his own death, and his prescience gives rise not to a commotion of the spirit but to a commotion in the spirit, which is experienced as a passion of the soul (CommJohn 32.18.221–224). The body which clothes him before the crucifixion is as palpable as ours, and equally vulnerable to physical affections. After his resurrection, he does not show himself to Caiaphas and Pilate because he is visible only to the eye of faith (Cels. 2.60–65). This means not, however, that his body is no real body, but that it no longer suffers the consequences of the fall.

The blood of Christ, first in his circumcision and then on the Cross, is a ransom paid to Satan (Commentary on Romans 2.13.29; cf. 1Corinthians 6.23), whose prisoners we become, willingly if unwittingly, when we allow his image to oust that of god in our souls (Genesis Homilies 1.13). Yet Satan is never master of our wills: if he enters the soul of a Judas Iscariot, it is because the thought that he plants there has received assent and ripened into a sinful disposition (CommJohn 32.281–285; see further Layton 2004: 129–131.) We are taught to suppress such thoughts and to refrain from sin, by the teaching of Christ, the chief of his bounties during his earthly sojourn, which we now receive in even greater measure through the scriptures. As the primordial Word of God, he is present in every word from God that the church has canonised under the direction of the Spirit; the many words of scripture, in fact, are one (Philokalia 5.4). When we are instructed to eat the flesh and drink the blood of the Son of Man, it is clear that the words cannot be taken literally; while Origen does not deny the allusion to the eucharist, he argues that the higher sense—but also the quotidian sense—of the saying is that believers must draw nourishment from the scriptures in which Christ “as it were, takes flesh and speaks with a literal voice” in order to draw us on to the invisible mysteries (Cels. 4.15; On Prayer 27.10–14). The scriptures, then, are the daily bread for which Christians are taught to pray; to accept eating as a metaphor for reading is to acknowledge that whenever the scriptures speak of tasting, hearing or seeing God, they are not only imparting what we might call a spiritual sense to these words, but appealing to our own spiritual senses (Princ. 1.1.9), the loftier faculties which were freely exercised by Adam and Eve before the fall (Cels. 7.39; see further Rahner 1979).

To distinguish only two senses of scripture is to forget that Christ, the true Word, became incarnate in a threefold human nature. At First Principles 4.2.4, Origen asserts that the body, the soul and the spirit in the human reader find their respective analogues in the text of scripture. The body is the plain text, whether narrative or didactic, construed according to common grammatical or semantic norms. The spirit, which must generally be sought beneath the surface, acquaints us with the work of Christ and the mysteries of faith, and thus corresponds to the typological sense in mediaeval and modern exegesis. The soul of scripture is illustrated by Paul's translation of the Mosaic precept, “thou shalt not muzzle the ox which treadeth the corn”, to ministers of the church (Princ. 4.2.6). For this reason, and because the church is the bride of Christ in Origen's psychic reading of the Song of Songs, the term “ecclesiastical” has been applied to this intermediate plane of reference. In works which survive in Latin certain passages are said to be amenable to a literal, a moral and a spiritual exposition, but we cannot say whether Origen would have commended this translation. It is possible that he offers us a further clue to the content of the psychic sense in the prologue to his Commentary on the Song of Songs (ed. Baehrens 1925: 75), where he argues that each of the three books ascribed to Solomon in the Hebrew canon corresponds to a branch of Greek philosophy, and also to one stage in the believer's progress from the foothills to the summit of understanding. Ethics is represented in this itinerary by Proverbs, physics by Ecclesiastics, the science of contemplation (theorics, epoptics or enoptics) by the Song). The first of these texts is phrased and may be understood somatically; the third, in which Solomon forgoes his own name and becomes the bridegroom, lifts the veil between the enlightened soul and her Redeemer (see further King 2005: 222–263). If we pursue this seductive analogy, the second book of Solomon, which reveals our place in the cosmos, is a mine of cosmological or sapiential teaching which may be said to represent the soul of scripture.

This pattern would appear to have been suggested not by the usual division of philosophy into ethics, physics and logic, but by a passage in the Stromateis of Clement of Alexandria, where three edifying senses are accorded to the scriptures, the last of which is the epopteia, or discernment of the mysteries. Origen may also have been aware that certain teachers had sorted Plato's dialogues into different categories, each suited to a different level of aptitude in the pupil (Edwards 1997). In attributing this taxonomy to the Hebrew king, however, he is making a claim for the chronological primacy of the scriptures. No Platonist before him had undertaken a sustained allegorical reading of any text, as Porphyry confessed when he inaccurately charged him with forcing Stoic techniques of exegesis on a barbarous text (Eusebius, Church History 6.19). Commenting line by line on a sacred text was not, so far as our evidence goes, a typical enterprise for a Stoic. Among the Greeks the commentator who most resembles Origen is Alexander of Aphrodisias; his concern, however, is to smooth the surface of Aristotle, not to dig beneath it (see further Bendinelli 1997). Origen's true predecessor is Philo of Alexandria, who had teased moral and metaphysical profundities from the Torah, verse by verse, in order to demonstrate that nothing taught among the Greeks had been concealed from the Lawgiver of the Jews (see further Dawson 1992).

Philo is called a mystic because of passages which thirstily anticipate the mind's bacchanalian ecstasy in the presence of the ineffable. For Origen the term mystikos denotes the most arcane sense of the scriptures, and the encounter with the Bridegroom, “which no-one can understand who has not experienced it”, is described in his Homilies on the Song of Songs (I.7 [ed. Baehrens 1925: 39]). Whether it is a true ecstasy or a sense of hermeneutic illumination (Louth 2000: 69), this transient rapture foreshadows the culmination of the soul's journey after death, when God will at last be all in all. In answer to the jibes of Celsus, Origen asserts that, while the church teaches the resurrection of the body, the “spiritual body” of which Paul speaks will be of a rarer and hence more durable texture than the gross flesh which now ensheathes the soul (Cels. 5.18–5.23). In a dialogue which now survives only in excerpts, the soul is said to retain the eidos, or form, of the body, perhaps a counterpart to the tenuous vehicle which the soul carries into the afterlife in the eschatology of some Platonists (Methodius, On the Resurrection 22 [ed. Bonwetsch 1899: 93]; see further Schibli 1992). Most souls, having failed to purge their sins in this life, will be required to pass the flaming sword that bars the entrance to the earthly paradise (see further Crouzel 1972). Once its cleansing there is complete, the soul will pass through the seven planetary spheres, acquiring a more comprehensive knowledge of the cosmos and our place in it than is vouchsafed to us in this world (Princ. 1.11.6). Once again, kindred notions can be found in Platonic and Hermetic literature; the posthumous itinerary mirrors the transition from the ethical to the sapiential teachings of Solomon, and we see here in an inchoate form the purgative and illuminative ways of the western mystical tradition. A body of some kind is presupposed by this celestial topography; nevertheless, at the point where God becomes all in all, we hear nothing of a body, but only that soul will be entirely subsumed in spirit. Some scholars hold that a body must be either retained or imparted to us, since only the persons of the Trinity can subsist without one (e.g., Crouzel 1980); others, invoking the maxim that the end will be like the beginning, argue that we shall return to the incorporeal state in which we were first created (e.g., Scott 2012). In any case, this union with God appears to correspond to the last stage in the perusal of the Solomonic canon, and to the “unitive way” of the mystic in later Christian literature.

This purgatory after death is not confined to those who have died at peace with God; if any should fail to be saved, it is not because the opportunity to repent has been withdrawn, but because the soul has become so brutish that it is incapable of amendment (Princ. 1.5.5). This is the only truth that Origen thinks can be ascribed to Plato's doctrine of transmigration into beasts (Princ. 3.4.3), and it cannot be presumed that even the demons will remain obdurate for ever. Commenting on Paul's promise that “the last enemy, death” will be vanquished, Origen surmises that death will not be annihilated but will cease to molest the saints (Princ. 3.6.5). It is generally assumed that the proper subject of this passage is the devil, and the word diabolus does indeed occur in a ninth-century quotation (Eriugena, Periphyseon, Patrologia Latina 122, 930C). On the other hand, in a letter to his friends in Alexandria, Origen is said to have exclaimed that only a lunatic would prophesy the salvation of the devil (Crouzel 1973). Perhaps he means only that Satan is not destined for beatitude; this need not preclude his release from torment on the last after his peaceful acquiescence in the victory of God (see Edwards 2010).

7. Conclusion

By convention Origen is a “Christian Platonist of Alexandria”. In fact, his native city was only intermittently his place of residence; on the other hand, his intellectual home throughout his life was one in which Plato was never his compatriot but an honoured guest. There is no doubt that he knew the works of the great Athenian intimately, and credited him at times with more than a superficial grasp of the highest truths. Nevertheless, no Greek philosopher possessed for him the authority that he accorded to the scriptures; Plato was only the most prominent of the dead pagans who assisted him in the exegesis and harmonisation of this infallible text. The work in which Origen makes most frequent reference to Plato, his reply to Celsus, as noted above, is also the one in which he asserts that Christ takes flesh in the written word, disclosing mysteries that no human intellect has fathomed without revelation (Cels. 4.15), He was never troubled, as a mediaeval schoolman might be, by a conflict between ecclesiastical dogma and the best thought of the ancients, because the Word who taught the ancients from afar is, for him, the daily shepherd of the Church.

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