The Paradox of Suspense

First published Mon Jul 6, 2009

The ultimate success of Hollywood blockbusters is dependent upon repeat viewings. Fans return to theaters to see films multiple times and buy DVDs so they can watch movies yet again. Although it is something of a received dogma in philosophy and psychology that suspense requires uncertainty, many of the biggest box office successes are action movies that fans claim to find suspenseful on repeated viewings. The conflict between the theory of suspense and the accounts of viewers generates a problem known as the paradox of suspense, which we can boil down to a simple question: If suspense requires uncertainty, how can a viewer who knows the outcome still feel suspense?

There is a related problem concerning “musical suspense”: How can one can feel suspense in response to sonic movements with which one is intimately acquainted? Unlike paradigmatic suspense, musical suspense is typically unaccompanied by fear. Accordingly, it is better described as mere tension. Given the controversy over the nature of the response to music, this entry will deal solely with the paradox of suspense in regard to narrative artworks.

I will consider four different solutions to the paradox of suspense: (1) the thought theory of entertained uncertainty, (2) the desire-frustration theory of suspense, (3) the moment-by-moment forgetting theory, and (4) the emotional misidentification view. The thought theory of entertained uncertainty explains the paradox by denying that actual uncertainty is necessary for suspense; instead, all that is required is for viewers to engage the fiction as they normally would—entertaining thoughts of the story as if they were undecided. The desire-frustration theory holds that uncertainty, entertained or actual, is not necessary for suspense. To create suspense, one merely needs to frustrate a desire to affect the outcome of an imminent event. The moment-by-moment forgetting view is the position that while viewers are immersed in a fictional scenario, they effectively cannot remember the outcome. The emotional misidentification view holds that it is impossible for viewers who know the outcome to feel suspense, and the best explanation of the claims of audiences to the contrary is that viewers must be confusing their actual fear and anxiety with what they take to be suspense.

Rather than provide an exhaustive survey of the literature on suspense, in what follows I discuss representatives of the four types of solutions to the paradox. I begin with a description of the paradox of suspense and then explain which claims the various solutions reject.

1. The Paradox of Suspense

Cognitive psychologists Ortony, Clore, and Collins put forth a useful theory of suspense that we might call the standard account. They argue that suspense is composed of fear, hope, and the “cognitive state of uncertainty” (131). They define fear as a feeling of displeasure about the prospect of an undesirable event; and hope as a feeling of pleasure about the prospect of a desirable event. On the standard account, people feel suspense when they fear a bad outcome, hope for a good outcome, and are uncertain about which outcome will come to pass. In real life, we might feel suspense when walking through an unfamiliar, reputedly dangerous neighborhood at night. We fear that we might be mugged, hope that we will be safe, and are uncertain which will occur.

Ortony, Clore, and Collins argue that as “prospect emotions,” fear and hope depend on the desirability and likelihood of a prospective outcome—the yet to be determined outcome of an event. For example, fear is amplified as the degree of danger, the undesirability and/or likelihood of an outcome, increases. If I am fearful of being attacked, I am more fearful if the prospective attack is more undesirable: Given equal likelihood, I would be more fearful of being stabbed in the gut with a knife or a beaten about the torso with a pillowcase full of oranges than merely punched repeatedly. Similarly, the more likely I believe an undesirable outcome to be, the more fearful I may be of that outcome. The converse is true concerning hope: The more desirable and likely an outcome seems the more hopeful we may feel.

The intensity of our feelings of suspense seems to rely on two features of an event's outcome: (1) its uncertainty and (2) the significance of what is at stake. Although the standard view does not claim a direct relationship between uncertainty, what is at stake, and suspense, it does suggest that the greatest suspense is felt in cases where the outcome is very uncertain and the stakes are very high. The standard view also tells us that you can have suspense with low stakes if there is great uncertainty, or with low uncertainty if there are high stakes. However, on the standard view, if there is no uncertainty, there can be no suspense. Similarly, if nothing is at stake, there can be no desirable or undesirable outcome, hence no fear or hope, and consequently no suspense.

The preceding analysis of suspense generates a particularly troublesome paradox. If uncertainty is required in order for one to feel suspense, then how is it that some narrative artworks can still seem suspenseful on repeated encounters? For example, if we have already seen a movie, and we remember it well, then we are certain how it will end. Although we may not feel suspense as intensely as we did upon first viewing, it is undeniable that we can feel some suspense upon repeated viewings. But if suspense requires uncertainty, it should be impossible to feel suspense during subsequent viewings. This problem is known as the paradox of suspense. It can be stated more formally as follows:

  1. Suspense requires uncertainty.
  2. Knowledge of a story's outcome precludes uncertainty.
  3. People feel suspense in response to some stories when they have knowledge of the outcome.

Although none of these claims seems objectionable in isolation, together, they are inconsistent. The four solutions to the paradox that I discuss in the next section each question one or another of the claims that make up the paradox. The entertained uncertainty and desire-frustration theories reject the first claim. The moment-by-moment forgetting theory rejects the second premise. And the emotional misidentification theory takes issue with the third.

2. Entertained Uncertainty

Noël Carroll qualifies the first claim of the paradox; he argues that suspense merely requires entertained uncertainty, not actual uncertainty (Carroll 2001). In “The Paradox of Suspense,” Carroll offers a persuasive account of how we might dissolve this paradox. He argues that even if we know that a film will end a certain way, we can still imagine while watching it, that it will not end that way. He argues that merely imagining that an event's outcome is uncertain is enough to create suspense, thereby qualifying the first premise of the paradox—only entertained uncertainty is necessary for suspense.

Narrative, according to Carroll, is something akin to guided imagination, a process he describes as entertaining thoughts or holding propositions non-assertively (Carroll 1990). People can work themselves into a variety of emotional states by merely imagining situations that they know are untrue, such as being passed over for a promotion, cheated on by one's spouse, or having one's child kidnapped. The thought theory of emotional response is the theory that fiction taps this power of the imagination for its energy to produce emotional reactions. This seems to solve the paradox of suspense, since we can know that the hero will not die, but still fear the outcome simply by imagining that he might. On this view, suspense does not require genuine uncertainty, only entertained uncertainty. Although we cannot be genuinely uncertain about the outcome of a familiar narrative, we can willfully entertain uncertainty. And we can entertain uncertainty on any number of encounters with the same story.

Although Carroll's thought theory seems to explain how it is possible to feel suspense in response to a familiar narrative, it does not give an explanation for the typical scenario of diminishing suspense. If all it takes is entertained uncertainty (in addition to the unnamed other contributing factors), why do some fictions loose their power for many viewers? A perfectly willing viewer may eagerly sit down to re-watch a suspenseful film without feeling nearly the same amount of suspense as on the first viewing. This scenario—that of diminishing returns (to the same narrative)—is not merely possible, it is common. This shows that entertained uncertainty is insufficient for recidivist suspense—suspense felt in response to a familiar narrative. Perhaps the defender of the entertained uncertainty theory could reply by simply supplementing the theory with an account of why it becomes more difficult or just less likely for audiences to entertain narrative outcomes as uncertain the more familiar they are with a story.

Regardless, the theory faces bigger problems, one of which is that there is reason to believe that entertained uncertainty is not necessary for suspense. There are numerous cases where knowledge of the outcome can make a narrative more, not less suspenseful. For instance, the first time one watches Hitchcock's Psycho (1960), one may feel mild fear for Marion Crane as she chats with Norman Bates in the hotel office. Filled with stuffed, menacing birds, the office creates an aura of danger, but viewers have no reason to suspect that in the next couple of minutes Norman will bury a carving knife in Marion's chest as she showers. However, on a second viewing, one feels a great deal more suspense during the office scene. Norman's disturbance seems obvious on repeated viewings. How could Marion fail to see it? One wants to scream “Get out of there!” The reason why the office scene in Psycho is more suspenseful on subsequent viewings cannot be that audiences are entertaining the idea that the outcome is as uncertain as it was on their first viewing, since the first viewing is not as suspenseful as the second.

This objection rests on the claim that normal people do indeed feel suspense on the second viewing of Psycho, but one might simply deny this claim. Perhaps audiences merely feel tension or anticipation, but not suspense. As we shall see, this is precisely what defenders of the emotional misidentification view say in response to all reports of recidivist suspense. If the defender of the entertained uncertainty view were to make a similar response to cases like that of Psycho—cases where one seemingly feels more suspense when the outcome is certain—she risks undermining the support for her central claim that recidivist suspense is common. The defender of entertained uncertainty would owe us a clear explanation for why we should trust the phenomenology in some cases and not in others.

However, if we trust the phenomenology, if we trust audience members' accounts of what they feel when they watch Psycho, then we have additional reason to reject the claim of the paradox—the claim that suspense requires uncertainty. But we lack an explanation for how this is possible. The next theory that we will consider attempts to provide an answer.

3. The Desire-Frustration Theory of Suspense

Aaron Smuts defends the desire-frustration theory of suspense, which holds that the frustration of a desire to affect the outcome of an immanent event is both necessary and sufficient to create suspense. Whereas Carroll revises the first claim, Smuts simply denies that uncertainty is necessary for suspense (Smuts 2008). Smuts appeals to examples such as Psycho—which are more suspenseful on repeated to encounters—and historical re-enactments such as Touching the Void (2004)—where the audience knows the outcome before the first viewing—to support the claim that uncertainty is unnecessary for suspense.

Smuts argues that in all suspenseful narratives and in all suspenseful situations in real life we find factors that partially frustrate one's ability to satisfy a desire, factors that suspend one's efficacy. He argues that even when the stakes are high, if one is actively working towards the realization of a desired outcome, there can be no suspense. Smuts' explanation of why fictions are extremely effective at creating suspense and how suspense in response to fictions is possible when we know the outcome is this: In contrast with our engagement with real situations, where we can actively work towards the satisfaction of a desire, in engaging with fictions we are completely powerless.

Smuts notes that our inability to affect fictions is something we are often aware of, and something the masters of suspense frequently make prominent. For instance, one of the most suspenseful episodes in Hitchcock's Rear Window (1954) is that in which Lisa (Grace Kelly) is looking for evidence of murder in the apartment across the way. Through binoculars, Jeff (James Stewart) sees Thorwald enter his apartment as Lisa is hunting around in the bedroom. Jeff's position mirrors that of the audience: We are unable to warn Lisa of the danger, utterly incapable of using our knowledge to affect the outcome. Similarly, Smuts and Frome argue that the most suspenseful videogames are those where the player is temporarily taken out of control, having to wait to see how a jump turns out or whether his or her character will be discovered by sniffing guard dogs. Smuts' explanation is that the partial frustration of our ability to satisfy our desires is necessary to the creation of suspense.

There are at least two important questions unanswered by the desire-frustration theory. First, why do suspenseful events need to be imminent? This element of the theory is under-developed, raising doubts about its claims to sufficiency. The defender of the desire-frustration theory might be able to reply that this is merely a function of the way we desire—near events provoke much stronger responses than those that are distant. But, as it stands, the account is incomplete.

Second, one can feel suspense in response to situations where one might not readily consent to having a desire. If so, the frustration of a desire would not be necessary for suspense. For instance, in Michael Clayton (2008) the two thugs hired to kill the protagonist try to install a tracking device in his car radio. Before they can finish, Michael starts walking back to his car. The scene is incredibly suspenseful, but what desire is frustrated? I cannot recall desiring to warn Michael. Is it the desire to see the thugs get away unnoticed? That would be odd. It is not clear why audiences would desire to see the installation complete, since our sympathies certainly lie with Michael and not his pursuers. But neither does it seem that we want to do something to stop the installation of the tracking device.

4. Moment By Moment Forgetting

Richard Gerrig argues for what we can call the moment-by-moment forgetting theory. Unlike the previous two explanations, Gerrig thinks that suspense requires uncertainty. His solution to the paradox is to deny the second premise—that knowing the outcome of a narrative precludes uncertainty. Despite appearances, Gerrig claims that one can both know how a story turns out and be uncertain about the result while the story unfolds.

By appeal to some putative features of our cognitive architecture, Gerrig claims that people are unable to effectively make use of their knowledge of the outcome of a story in such a way that would preclude suspense. Gerrig offers an evolutionary psychological explanation of how this could be possible. He argues that evolution has not equipped humans with the ability to look up known outcomes to repeated events. Since there are no exactly repeated events in nature, there was simply no selective pressure to develop such an ability. As such, repeaters can feel suspense, because while they are caught in the grips of a story they are unaware of the outcome. In this way, Gerrig argues, fictional scenarios can be effectively uncertain for viewers even if they know the outcome.

This may seem plausible in relation to cases in which suspenseful situations occur rapidly, but take a movie such as Speed (Jan de Bont, 1994) where a series of dangerous situations put the characters in jeopardy, and each situation unfolds over the course of several minutes. One finds it hard to imagine that recall could take so long. The ability to make decisions rapidly in stressful situations, such as how to escape a coming attacker or how to avoid being hit by a car, involves knowing how pursuers and drivers behave by recalling similar scenarios. This mechanism seems close to what is involved into forecasting the outcome of a fictional event. If we can forecast, then surely we can remember in the span of several minutes whether or not our forecast is correct based on our knowledge of the story. Given the prevalence of similar cognitive capacities and the gradual unfolding of suspense scenarios, Gerrig's portrait of the lazy mind of repeaters is prima facie unconvincing.

A related problem with Gerrig's account is that if viewers really do suffer from such mental handicaps as a matter of our evolutionary makeup, then he lacks an explanation of why suspense diminishes for many viewers. It would be strange to say that some of us have evolved a special cognitive ability to recall the outcomes of identically repeating events when there are no evolutionary pressures for such a trait. What seems to be the problem is that Gerrig has miscast the kind of skill that is involved. As stated previously, our ability to forecast the outcomes of familiar types of events can plausibly account for our ability to remember the outcomes of familiar fictional scenarios.

A further problem with Gerrig's theory is that it cannot account for a common phenomenon of repeated viewing, namely that with knowledge of the outcome of a story we are able to notice things that we might otherwise find unexceptional. Take Hitchcock's Shadow of a Doubt (1943) as an example. Early in the film, aspects of Uncle Charlie's behavior that might otherwise go unnoticed seem like obvious evidence of his murderous past on repeated viewings. This common experience requires the same kind of recall abilities that Gerrig thinks are necessarily retarded. If there were, as Gerrig suggests, “a systematic failure of memory processes to produce relevant knowledge as the narrative unfolds” then our ability when informed by knowledge of the narrative outcome to notice new clues upon a reviewing is utterly mysterious (Gerrig 1997, 172). Since the moment-by-moment forgetting theory implies that one cannot both feel suspense on a reviewing of Shadow of a Doubt and notice new clues during the same scenes, it appears to conflict with the evidence.

5. Emotional Misidentification

Robert Yanal offers a resolution to the paradox by denying the third premise, that repeaters feel genuine suspense on repeated encounters with familiar narratives. Yanal's emotional misidentification view holds that there are no true repeaters, only misidenitifiers. He argues that since suspense requires uncertainty, the best account for the any claim that the same movie was just as suspenseful on the 4th, 5th, or 6th viewing is that the recidivist is confused, mislabeling her emotional response. The recidivist is not feeling suspense, only anticipation. Uncertainty is necessary for suspense, but not for mere anticipation.

However, feeling suspense upon repeated viewings after a great span of time is an altogether different phenomenon. We often forget how a story unfolds and are genuinely uncertain about what happens. So, in a sense, the fiction is new for forgetters. On Yanal's account, one can be a confused recidivist, a forgetter, or a virgin viewer; but, one cannot be a true repeater. True repeaters are not possible, since they lack the cognitive uncertainty necessary for suspense.

Yanal's solution rests on the distinction between anticipation and suspense. But lacking a clear phenomenal distinction between the kind of anticipation that viewers putatively confuse with suspense and genuine suspense, we have cause to be suspicious. Since this kind of anticipation and suspense appear to feel the same, the principal difference, on Yanal's account, must be that the reaction cannot be suspense proper without the cognitive state of uncertainty. If so, Yanal has simply defined the problem under the rug. Why, we must ask, do viewers feel “anticipation” in response to narrative situations where they know the characters will survive unharmed?

Without much exposition, Yanal seizes upon the notion that suspense requires uncertainty. From there he constructs an a priori argument to the effect that it is impossible that suspense occur when the outcomes are known. On this definition alone, he concludes that either repeaters have forgotten the outcome, and they are not true repeaters, or they have misidentified the emotion they are experiencing.

On the same line of reasoning, audience members must be misidentifying a range of emotional responses, including fear. The generation of suspense in repeaters is no less mysterious than the generation of fear. We feel fear in response to familiar fictional events that we know will turn out well. But how could this be possible? How can we fear an event that we know will result in a desired outcome? The same question arises concerning both first-person fear (fear for one's self) and fear for others.

Yanal argues that “experiencing fear is neither itself suspenseful nor is it contingent upon ignorance. (I may know with certainty that my friend will be executed tomorrow, and yet feel fear for him, anxiety over his welfare, etc)” (Yanal 1999, 139). Without any hope that your friend will be executed, you would most likely feel dread, not fear. But this is beside the point, since the situation with most fictions is that you feel fear where you know with certainty, say if you have seen the movie before, that nothing bad will happen to the hero. Again, consider Speed: If you have seen the film or know the genre conventions, then you know that nothing bad will happen to the main characters, though it is possible to feel fear upon repeated viewings. At least, it appears to be possible if we have any faith at all in the phenomenological reports of audiences.

If the relevant form of fear is best described as a prospect emotion, then the cognitive state of uncertainty would plausibly be necessary for fear. Are we to conclude that audience members must be confusing what they take to be fear with some other emotion? If so, what could it possibly be? Although we may not be infallible introspectors, we cannot help but assume that people can reliably identify when they feel fear. An a priori assumption that fear requires uncertainty is not sufficient to warrant the attribution of pervasive emotional misidentification. The same goes for suspense.

One reason why it may sound more plausible to hypothesize radically fallible introspective abilities regarding suspense but not fear, is that suspense seems to be a composite emotional state, lacking the corresponding kind of clear specifications. Rather than a pure emotional kind, suspense is better described as an emotional amalgam, comprised of fear and hope, where uncertainty, if it is required, is implied in the components: As such, suspense is a best thought of as a composite emotion.

6. Suspense and Surprise

Some explanation is in order for why Yanal and others think it unquestionable that uncertainty is required for suspense. Often suspenseful fictions include many surprises, and one can feel suspense if they think a surprise is up ahead. Picking up on this, many discussions of suspense, such as Kendall Walton's, lump together their treatments of suspense and surprise (Walton, 1990: 259-271). The tendency to think of suspense as intimately related to surprise, for which uncertainty appears to be required, may be one reason why many people think suspense requires the same. But this assumption is mistaken in two ways.

First, surprise does not require uncertainty, although it might first appear otherwise. If I think that something will happen and it does, then I will not feel surprise. For example, if I think that my friends have gathered at my apartment for my birthday, I will not feel surprise when I come home and find them in my living room. Based on failed surprise parties, one may conclude that surprise requires uncertainty. But this is too hasty. Surprise does not require that we be in a cognitive state of uncertainty. And it is fairly easy to see why. I may be certain that my beer sits on the table in front of me, but if it disappears when I reach for it, I will be surprised. Hence, I can feel surprise without uncertainty. To be mistaken is not the same as to be uncertain. Surprise results from the sudden subversion of an expectation, not the resolution of cognitive uncertainty.

Second, although suspense and surprise are often found in the same fictions, and the prospect of a surprise can be the source of some suspense, the connection stops there: Surprise is not involved in all or even most cases of suspense. Hence, whether suspense requires uncertainty is a matter independent of that concerning the conditions necessary for surprise.

7. Summary

We have critically evaluated four solutions to the paradox of suspense: the thought theory of entertained uncertainty, the desire-frustration theory, the moment-by-moment forgetting view, and the emotional misidentification view. The first two theories attempt to solve the paradox by explaining how it is that we feel suspense under conditions of certainty. The moment-by-moment forgetting theory effectively denies that we do have knowledge of the outcome of a story, even if we have read it before. And the emotional misidentification view denies that we do feel suspense on repeated encounters with a narrative, despite appearances.

The problems with the four theories are various, but it pays to note that a theory of suspense should be able to do more than simply provide a solution to the paradox of suspense; it should also be able to explain two additional facts. First, as noted above, suspense often diminishes after we have watched a movie, and continues to diminish on subsequent viewings. Second, although narrative fiction is extremely effective at creating intense suspense, we rarely feel suspense in our daily lives.

Bibliography

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  • –––, 1990, The Philosophy of Horror; or, Paradoxes of the Heart, New York: Routledge.
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  • –––, 1993, Experiencing Narrative Worlds, New Haven, CT: Yale University Press.
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  • Smuts, Aaron, 2008, “The Desire-Frustration Theory of Suspense” The Journal of Aesthetics and Art Criticism, 66 (3): 281-291.
  • Smuts, Aaron and Jonathan Frome, 2004, “Helpless Spectators: Generating Suspense in Videogames and Film”, Text Technology, 13.1: 13-34
  • Walton, Kendall, 1990, Mimesis as Make-Believe: On the Foundations of the Representational Arts, Cambridge, MA: Harvard University Press.
  • Yanal, Robert, 1999, Paradoxes of Emotion and Fiction, State College, PA: Penn State University Press.
  • –––, 1996, “The Paradox of Suspense”, British Journal of Aesthetics, 36: 146-158.

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