No aspect of our mental life is more important to the quality and meaning of our existence than emotions. They are what make life worth living, or sometimes ending. So it is not surprising that most of the great classical philosophers—Plato, Aristotle, Spinoza, Descartes, Hobbes, Hume—had recognizable theories of emotion, conceived as responses to certain sorts of events of concern to a subject, triggering bodily changes and typically motivating characteristic behavior. What is surprising is that in much of the twentieth-century philosophers of mind and psychologists tended to neglect them—perhaps because the sheer variety of phenomena covered by the word “emotion” and its closest neighbors tends to discourage tidy theory. In recent years, however, emotions have once again become the focus of vigorous interest in philosophy, as well as in other branches of cognitive science. In view of the proliferation of increasingly fruitful exchanges between researchers of different stripes, it is no longer useful to speak of the philosophy of emotion in isolation from the approaches of other disciplines, particularly psychology, neurology, evolutionary biology, and even economics. While it is quite impossible to do justice to those approaches here, some sidelong glances in their direction will aim to suggest their philosophical importance.
I begin by outlining some of the ways that philosophers have conceived of the place of emotions in the topography of the mind, particularly in their relation to bodily states, to motivation, and to beliefs and desires, as well as some of the ways in which they have envisaged the relation between different emotions. Most emotions have an intentional structure: we shall need to say something about what that means. Psychology and more recently evolutionary biology have offered a number of theories of emotions, stressing their function in the conduct of life. Philosophers have been especially partial to cognitivist theories, emphasizing analogies either with propositional judgments or with perception. But different theories implicitly posit different ontologies of emotion, and there has been some dispute about what emotions really are, and indeed whether they are any kind of thing at all. Emotions also raise normative questions: about the extent to which they can be said to be rational, or can contribute to rationality. In that regard the question of our knowledge of our own emotions is especially problematic, as it seems they are both the object of our most immediate awareness and the most powerful source of our capacity for self-deception. This results in a particularly ambivalent relation between emotions and morality. I will conclude with a brief survey of some recent trends, particularly as they affect and are influenced by the neighboring disciplines in which the study of emotions has become increasingly prominent.
- 1. Emotions and the Topography of the Mind
- 2. Emotions as Feelings
- 3. Emotions and Intentional Objects
- 4. Psychological and Evolutionary Approaches
- 5. Cognitivist Theories
- 6. Perceptual Theories
- 7. The Ontology of Emotions
- 8. Rationality and Emotions
- 9. Emotions and Self-knowledge
- 10. Morality and Emotions
- 11. Summary of Recent Trends and Ramifications into neighboring disciplines
- 12. Conclusion: Adequacy Conditions on Theories of Emotion
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How do emotions fit into different conceptions of the mind? One model, advocated by Descartes as well as by many contemporary psychologists, posits a few basic emotions out of which all others are compounded. An alternative model views every emotion as consisting in, or at least including, some irreducibly specific component not compounded of anything simpler. Again, emotions might form an indefinitely broad continuum comprising a small number of finite dimensions (e.g. level of arousal, intensity, pleasure or aversion, self- or other-directedness, etc.). In much the way that color arises from the visual system's comparison of retinal cones, whose limited sensitivity ranges correspond roughly to primary hues, we might then hope to find relatively simple biological explanations for the rich variety of emotions. Rigid boundaries between them would be arbitrary. Alternative models, based in physiology or evolutionary psychology, have posited modular subsystems or agents the function of which is to coordinate the fulfilment of basic needs, such as mating, affiliation, defense and the avoidance of predators. (Panksepp 1998, Cosmides and Tooby 2000).
To date cognitive science does not seem to have provided any crucial tests to decide between competing models of the mind. An eclectic approach therefore seems warranted. What does seem well established in the light of cross-cultural research is that a small number of emotions have inter-translatable names and universally recognizable expressions. According to Ekman and Friesen (1989) these are happiness, sadness, fear, anger, surprise, and disgust (the last two of which, however, some researchers consider too simple to be called emotions) (Panksepp 1998). Other emotions are not so easily recognizable cross-culturally, and some expressions are almost as local as dialects. But then this is an issue on which cognitive science alone should not, perhaps, be accorded the last word: what to a neurologist might be classed as two tokens of the same emotion type might seem to have little in common under the magnifying lens of a Marcel Proust.
Other models propose mutually conflicting ways of locating emotion within the general economy of the mind. Some treat emotion as one of many separate faculties. For Plato in the Republic, there seems to have been three basic components of the human mind: the reasoning, the desiring, and the emotive parts. For Aristotle, the emotions are not represented as constituting a separate agency or module, but they had even greater importance, particularly in the moral life, our capacity for which Aristotle regarded as largely a result of learning to feel the right emotions in the right circumstances. Hume's notorious dictum that reason is and ought to be the slave of the passions also placed the emotions at the very center of character and agency. For Spinoza, emotions are not lodged in a separate body in conflict with the soul, since soul and body are aspects of a single reality; but emotions, as affections of the soul, make the difference between the best and the worst lives, as they either increase the soul's power to act, or diminish that power. In other models, emotions as a category are apt to be sucked into either of two other faculties of mind. They are then treated as mere composites or offshoots of those other faculties: a peculiar kind of belief, or a vague kind of desire or will. The Stoics made emotions into judgments about the value of things incidental to an agent's virtue, to which we should therefore remain perfectly indifferent. Hobbes assimilated “passions” to specific appetites or aversions. Kant too saw emotions as essentially conative phenomena, but grouped them with inclinations enticing the will to act on motives other than that of duty.
The revival of philosophical interest in emotions from the middle of the twentieth century can be traced to an article by Erroll Bedford (1957), and a book by Anthony Kenny (1963) which argued against the assumption that emotions are feelings, impervious to either will or reason. Bedford stressed both the intentionality and the importance of contextual factors on the nature, arousal and expression of emotions. Kenny, reviving some medieval theories of intentionality, urged that emotions should be viewed as intentional states. He defined a notion of a formal object of an intentional state as that characteristic that must belong to something if it is to be possible for the state to relate to it. This implies an excessively strong logical link between the state and its object's actual possession of the characteristic in question. Nevertheless it points to an important condition on the appropriateness of an emotion to a given object (see Section 3 below). These papers gave impetus to what became the cognitivist mainstream in philosophy of emotion, some fairly wide variations going from C.D. Broad (1971 )‘s “affect-laden judgments” to the “strong desires” theory advocated by Joel Marks (1982). Among other philosophers responsible for the revival of interest in emotions, Irving Thalberg (1977) took as given the cognitive dimension of emotion, and explored some of the subtleties of the different relations of emotions to their objects. The Wittgensteinian flavor of Bedford's second point, about the contextual dependency of emotions, was elaborated into a “social constructionist” view both by some psychologists and some philosophers (Harré 1986). On this view, favored later by some feminist philosophers such as Naomi Scheman (1983) and Sue Campbell (1998), emotions are not primarily viewed as individual characteristics of the persons to whom they are attributed, but emerge out of the dynamics of social interaction. The influence of Wittgenstein, stemming from his remarks on “seeing-as” (Wittgenstein 1953), was also felt in Robert Roberts’ (2003) view of emotions as “concern-based construals”.
Twentieth-century Anglo-American philosophy and psychology tended to incorporate emotions into other, better understood mental categories. Under the influence of a “tough-minded” ideology committed to behaviorism, it seemed easier to look for adequate theories of action or will, as well as theories of belief or knowledge, than to construct adequate theories of emotion. Economic models of rational decision and agency inspired by Bayesian theory are essentially assimilative models, viewing emotion either as a species of belief, or as a species of desire.
That enviably resilient Bayesian model has been cracked, in the eyes of many philosophers, by such refractory phenomena as akrasia or “weakness of will.” In cases of akrasia, traditional descriptive rationality seems to be violated, insofar as the “strongest” desire does not win, even when paired with the appropriate belief (Davidson 1980). Emotion is ready to pick up the slack. Recent work, often drawing support from the burgeoning study of the emotional brain, has recognised that while emotions typically involve both cognitive and conative states, they are distinct from both, if only in being significantly more complex.
It is one thing, however, to recognize the need for a theory of mind that finds a place for the unique role of emotions, and quite another to construct one. Emotions vary so much in a number of dimensions—transparency, intensity, behavioral expression, object-directedness, and susceptibility to rational assessment—as to cast doubt on the assumption that they have anything in common. However, while this variation may have led philosophers to steer clear of emotions in the past, many philosophers are now rising to the challenge. The explanatory inadequacy of theories that shortchange emotion is becoming increasingly apparent, and, as Peter Goldie (2000) observes, it is no longer the case that emotion is treated as a poor relation in the philosophy of mind.
The simplest theory of emotions, and perhaps the theory most representative of common sense, is that emotions are simply a class of feelings, differentiated from sensation and proprioceptions by their experienced quality. William James proposed a variant of this view (commonly known as the “James-Lange” theory of emotion, after James and Carl G. Lange) according to which emotions are specifically feelings caused by changes in physiological conditions relating to the autonomic and motor functions. When we perceive that we are in danger, for example, this perception sets off a collection of bodily responses, and our awareness of these responses is what constitutes fear. James thus maintained that “we feel sorry because we cry, angry because we strike, afraid because we tremble, and [it is] not that we cry, strike, or tremble, because we are sorry, angry, or fearful, as the case may be” (James 1884, 190).
One problem with this theory is that it is unable to give an adequate account of the differences between emotions. This objection was first voiced by Walter Cannon (1929). According to James, what distinguishes emotions is the fact that each involves the perception of a unique set of bodily changes. Cannon claimed, however, that the visceral reactions characteristic of distinct emotions such as fear and anger are identical, and so these reactions cannot be what allow us to tell emotions apart. The same conclusion is usually drawn from an oft-cited experiment performed by Stanley Schacter and Jerome Singer (1962). Subjects in their study were injected with epinephrine, a stimulant of the sympathetic system. Schacter and Singer found that these subjects tended to interpret the arousal they experienced either as anger or as euphoria, depending on the type of situation they found themselves in. Some were placed in a room where an actor was behaving angrily; others were placed in a room where an actor was acting silly and euphoric. In both cases the subjects' mood tended to follow that of the actor. The conclusion most frequently drawn is that, although some forms of general arousal are easily labeled in terms of some emotional state, there is no hope of finding in physiological states any principle of distinction between specific emotions. The differentiae of specific emotions are not physiological, but cognitive or something else.
Subsequent research has shown that a limited number of emotions do, in fact, have significantly different bodily profiles (LeDoux 1996; Panksepp 1998). However, brain or bodily changes and the feelings accompanying these changes get us only part way towards an adequate taxonomy. To account for the differences between guilt, embarrassment, and shame, for example, a plausible theory will have to look beyond physiology and common-sense phenomenology.
Another problem with the assimilation of emotions to feeling is that it tempts one to treat emotions as brute facts, susceptible of biological or psychological explanation but not otherwise capable of being rationalized. Emotions, however, are capable of being not only explained, but also justified—they are closely related to the reasons that give rise to them. If someone angers me, I can cite my antagonist's deprecatory tone; if someone makes me jealous, I can point to his poaching on my emotional property. (Taylor 1975).
Both of these problems—that of differentiating individual emotions, and that of accounting for emotions' various ties to rationality—can be traced, at least in part, to a more fundamental oversight. Feeling theories, by assimilating emotions to sensations, fail to take account of the fact that emotions are typically directed at intentional objects. This defect is to some extent mitigated in what might be regarded as more sophisticated versions of “feeling theories”. Peter Goldie (2000) is among those who have recently advocated a return to the close identification of emotions with feelings, on the ground that the divorce between them was decreed on false premises: feelings, too, can actually have intentional objects in the world beyond the bounds of the body (these are what he calls “feelings towards”). Some emotional feelings are simply bodily feelings and thus, whilst intentional, do not have this kind of intentionality (Goldie 2009). Goldie resists both reductive theories which regard emotions as mere compounds of belief and desire, and “add-on theories” that view them as beliefs and desires plus something else — such as feelings, for example. Only if we understand the crucial component of feeling in emotion are we likely to understand the large nugget of truth in the traditional view of emotions as often irrational and disruptive. Furthermore, Goldie holds that certain primitive emotions, on the analogy of cognitively impenetrable perceptual illusions, influence action tendencies without the mediation of propositions or concepts (Goldie 2003).
What does a mood, such as free-floating depression or euphoria, have in common with an episode of indignation whose reasons can be precisely articulated? The first seems to have as its object nothing and everything, and often admits of no particular justification; the second has a long story to tell, typically involving other people and what they have done or said. Not only these people, but the relevant facts about the situations involved, as well as some of the special facts about those situations, aspects of those facts, the causal role played by these aspects, and even the typical aims of the actions motivated by the emotions can all in some context or other be labeled objects of emotion. The wide range of possible objects is suggested by the many different ways we fill in ascriptions of emotions. If someone is indignant, then there is some object o or proposition p such that the person is indignant at or with o, about p or that p, because of p, or in virtue of p.
This variety has led to a good deal of confusion. A long-standing debate, for example, concerns the extent to which the objects of emotions are to be identified with their causes. This identification seems plausible; yet it is easy to construct examples in which being the cause of an emotion is intuitively neither a necessary nor a sufficient condition for its being its object: if A gets annoyed at B for some entirely trivial matter, drunkenness may have caused A's annoyance, yet it is in no sense its object. Its object may be some innocent remark of B's, which occasioned the annoyance but which it would be misleading to regard as its cause. In fact the object of the annoyance may be a certain insulting quality in B's remark which is, as a matter of fact, entirely imaginary and therefore could not possibly be its true cause.
The right way to deal with these complexities is to embrace them. We need a taxonomy of the different sorts of possible emotional objects. We might then distinguish different types of emotions, not on the basis of their qualitative feel, but—at least in part—according to the different complex structures of their object relations. Many emotions, such as love, necessarily involve a target, or actual particular at which they are directed. Others, such as sadness, do not. On the other hand, although a number of aspects of the loved one may motivate attentional focus, efforts to find a propositional object for love have been unconvincing. (Kraut 1986; Rorty 1988). Sadness may or may not focus on a propositional object; regret, by contrast, cannot be described without specifying such an object. Depression or elation can lack all three kinds of object. Objectless emotions share many properties with other emotions, especially in their physiological and motivational aspects, but they might more properly be classified as moods rather than full-fledged emotions. Moods typically facilitate certain ranges of object-directed emotions, but they form a class apart.
Finally, while different emotions may or may not have these various sorts of objects, every emotion has a formal object if it has any object. A formal object is a property implicitly ascribed by the emotion to its target, focus or propositional object, in virtue of which the emotion can be seen as intelligible. My fear of a dog, for example, construes a number of the dog's features (its salivating maw, its ferocious bark) as being frightening, and it is my perception of the dog as frightening that makes my emotion fear, rather than some other emotion. The formal object associated with a given emotion is essential to the definition of that particular emotion. This explains the appearance of tautology in the specification any formal object (I am disgusted because it is disgusting); but it is also, in part, what allows us to speak of emotions being appropriate or inappropriate. If the dog obstructing my path is a shitzu, my fear is mistaken: the target of my fear fails to fit fear's formal object. As we shall see in section 10 below, appropriateness in this sense does not entail moral correctness; but it makes the emotion intelligible even when it is abhorrent. Thus racist disgust, while obviously morally inappropriate, is nevertheless intelligible in terms of its link to paradigm cases of disgust.
That emotions typically have formal objects highlights another important feature of emotional experience which feeling theories neglect, and which other psychological theories attempt to accommodate: emotions involve evaluations. If someone insults me and I become angry, his impertinence will be the aspect of his behavior that fits the formal object of anger: I only become angry once I construe the person's remark as a slight; the specific nature of my emotion's formal object is a function of my appraisal of the situation. Magna Arnold introduced the notion of appraisal into psychology, characterizing it as the process through which the significance of a situation for an individual is determined. Appraisal gives rise to attraction or aversion, and emotion is equated with this “felt tendency toward anything intuitively appraised as good (beneficial), or away from anything intuitively appraised as bad (harmful).” (Arnold 1960, 171). Subsequent appraisal theories accept the broad features of Arnold's account, and differ mainly in emphasis. Richard Lazarus (1991) makes the strong claim that appraisals are both necessary and sufficient for emotion, and sees the identity of particular emotions as being completely determined by the patterns of appraisal giving rise to them. Nico Frijda (1986) takes the patterns of action readiness following appraisals to be what characterize different emotions, but departs from Arnold in not characterizing these patterns solely in terms of attraction and aversion. Klaus Scherer and his Geneva school have elaborated appraisal theories into sophisticated models that anatomize different emotions in terms of some eighteen or more dimensions of appraisal. Emotions turn out to be reliably correlated, if not identified, with patterns of such complex appraisals. (Scherer et al., 2001). Appraisal theories can be described as taking a functional approach to emotion, insofar as appraisals lead to reactions whose function is to deal with specific situation types having some significance for an individual (Scherer 2006). This approach suggests that the space of emotions can be conceptualized as multidimensional. In practice, however, so-called dimensional theories simplify the problem of representation by reducing these to just two or three (Russell 2003). Typically these include ‘arousal’ and ‘valence’. This is handy, but tends to flatten out many distinct ways in which one might classify emotional valence as ‘positive’ or ‘negative’. Emotional valence, like value in general, can be assessed in several overlapping dimensions of appraisal: an emotional experience might be hedonically disagreeable, but positive as a health indicator; or it might be positive in a short-term perspective, but negative in the longer term, as attested by the motto “no pain, no gain.” I say more in section 11 below about recent explorations and rehabilitations of “negative” emotions.
Other theories consider the function of emotions more broadly, and ask, not why we should have particular emotions on specific occasions, but rather why we should have specific emotion types at all. This question is often given an evolutionary answer: emotions (or at least many of them) are adaptations whose purpose is to solve basic ecological problems facing organisms (Plutchik 1980; Frank 1988). Darwin (1998) himself was concerned not so much with the question of how our emotions might have evolved, but rather why they should have the forms of expression that they do. Emotional expressions, he thought, once served particular functions (e.g. baring teeth in anger to prepare for attack), but now accompany particular emotions because of their usefulness in communicating these emotions to others. Paul Ekman (1972), inspired by Darwin's approach, takes emotional expressions to be important parts of “affect programs”—complex responses found in all human populations, which are controlled by mechanisms operating below the level of consciousness. Much research has been done on this group of emotions (usually listed as happiness, sadness, fear, anger, surprise, and disgust) and scientifically-minded philosophers often restrict their discussions of emotion to the affect programs, since these are those best understood of all emotional phenomena (Griffiths 1997; DeLancey 2001; Prinz 2004). However, the affect program model leaves out a good deal. In particular, it ignores those emotions which involve higher cognitive processes, such as jealousy, envy, and Schadenfreude. It is these sorts of emotions which many philosophers have made the focus of their own theories of emotion. The research program of evolutionary psychology (Cosmides et al. 2000) goes some way to filling this lacuna, and emphasizes the modularity that is likely to result on the plausible speculation that different social and psychological emotional functions have been shaped relatively independently by natural selection. Whether emotions function as “mental modules”, however, remains a topic of debate (Faucher and Tappolet 2006). In any case, the mechanisms elaborated by natural selection in the context of competitive survival, dominance, mating and affiliation are not necessarily harmonious. Philosophers, for their part, have devoted a good deal of attention to the analysis of more subtle differences between “higher” emotions. (Ben-Ze'ev 2000). This has led many philosophers to stress cognitive aspects of emotions.
Most contemporary philosophical theories of emotion resemble psychological appraisal theories, characterizing emotions primarily in terms of their associated cognitions. But there are several different ways of understanding the cognitions involved. While appraisal theorists generally allow that the cognitive processes underlying emotion can be either conscious or unconscious, and can involve either propositional or non-propositional content, cognitivists typically claim that emotions involve propositional attitudes. Many emotions are specified in terms of propositions: one can't be angry with someone unless one believes that person guilty of some offense; one can't be envious unless one believes that someone else has something good in her possession. Some proponents of cognitivism universalize this feature, and maintain that any emotion must involve some sort of attitude directed at a proposition.
The most parsimonious type of cognitivist theory follows the Stoics in identifying emotions with judgments. Robert Solomon (1980), Jerome Neu (2000) and Martha Nussbaum (2001) take this approach. My anger at someone simply is the judgment that I have been wronged by that person. Other cognitivist theories introduce further elements into their analyses. Emotions have been described as sets of beliefs and desires (Marks 1982), affect-laden judgments (Broad 1971; Lyons 1980), and as complexes of beliefs, desires, and feelings (Oakley 1992).
Cognitivist theories have faced criticism along a number of fronts. Various confusions in the very concept of “cognition” have been alleged to blur most conceptions that invoke that term (Power and Dalgliesh 2008; Debes 2009). John Deigh (1994) has objected that the view of emotions as propositional attitudes has the effect of excluding animals and infants lacking language. Others have argued that if emotions always involve the standard propositional attitudes, namely belief and desire, then an account of the rationality of emotions will collapse into an account of what it is for those standard propositional attitudes to be rational: but emotional rationality is not reducible to the rationality of beliefs or desires (Lyons 1980; de Sousa 1987; Ben-Ze'ev 2000; Goldie 2000; Helm 2001; Elster 2003). Another criticism, stressed by Wollheim (1999) draws upon a difference between transient mental states and mental dispositions. Emotions, like beliefs and desires, can exist either as occurrent events (jealousy of a rival at a party) or as persisting modifications of the mind (a tendency to feel jealousy). However, dispositional beliefs have a straightforward connection with their occurrent manifestations: if I have a standing belief that the world is round, for example, then I will assent to this proposition on particular occasions. Sincere avowal of desires also counts as evidence for underlying dispositions, though the connection is not as tight. Dispositional emotions, on the other hand, do not have tailor-made forms of expression, but can be manifested in a whole diverse range of behavior. In some cases, what might be held to be dispositional emotions are not necessarily dispositions to undergo a specific occurrent emotion of the same name. Love, for example, while it can be manifested in amorous feelings, is sometimes expressed in any of a practically unlimited variety of occurrent emotions — including longing, grief, jealousy, rage, and other less than pleasant occurrent feelings.
A frequent objection made to cognitivist theories is the “fear of flying” objection: propositional attitudes are neither necessary nor sufficient for the existence of an emotion, since I may be well aware that flying is the safest means of transport and yet suffer fear of flying. (Stocker 1992). I may feel a twinge of suspicion towards my butler, and yet believe him to be utterly trustworthy; conversely, I may judge that he is up to no good, and yet feel nothing in the way of emotion. These examples suggest an analogy with perceptual illusions, which a correct belief sometimes quite fails to dispel. Such “recalcitrant emotions” seem to offer pretty conclusive evidence against the assimilation of at least some emotions either to judgement or to belief (D'Arms and Jacobson 2003; Brady 2009).
A cognitivist might reply that this objection merely establishes that the propositional content of emotion (like the propositional content of perception) differs from the propositional content of belief, not that emotions have no propositional content at all. It remains that even if perceptions necessarily have propositional content, they cannot be assimilated to belief: so it seems to be with emotion. Furthermore, it is not obvious that the content of perceptions or emotions are exhausted by their propositional content (Peacocke 2001). Similarly several theorists insist that experiences of emotion have content beyond any propositional content. (Goldie 2000; Wollheim 1999; Charland 2002; Tappolet 2003).
A crucial mandate of cognitivist theories is to avert the charge that emotions are merely “subjective.” But propositional attitudes are not the only cognitive states. A more basic feature of cognition is that is has a “mind-to-world direction of fit.” The expression is meant to sum up the contrast between cognition and the conative orientation, in which success is defined in terms of the opposite, world-to-mind, direction of fit (Searle 1983). We will or desire what does not yet exist, and deem ourselves successful if the world is brought into line with the mind's plan.
A view ascribing to emotions a true mind-to-world direction of fit, inspired by the model of perception, would involve a criterion of success that depended on correctness with respect to some objective property. To take this approach is to give a particular answer to a question posed long ago in Plato's Euthyphro (the question, as originally put forward, concerned the nature of piety, but it extends to values in general): Do we love X—mutatis mutandis for the other emotions—because X is lovable, or do we declare X to be lovable merely because we love it? The first alternative is the objectivist one, encouraged by the analogy of perception. It requires that we define clearly the relevant sense of ‘objectivity’. Specifically it promises a valid analogy between some of the ways in which we can speak of perception as aspiring to objectivity and ways in which we can say the same of emotion.
Emotions are sometimes said to be subjective in this sense: that they merely reflect something that belongs exclusively and contingently to the mind of the subject of experience, and therefore do not co-vary with any property that could be independently identified. This charge presupposes a sense of “objective” that contrasts with “projective,” in something like the psychoanalytic sense. In terms of the analogy of perception, to say that emotions are universally subjective in this sense would be to claim that they resemble hallucinations more than veridical perceptions. The perceptual system is capable of the sort of functioning-in-a-vacuum that leads to perceptual mistakes. Similarly, emotions may mislead us into “hasty” or “emotional” judgments (Solomon 1984). On the other hand, the lack of perceptual capacities can be a crippling handicap in one's attempt to negotiate the world: similarly a lack of adequate emotional responses can hinder our attempts to view the world correctly and act correctly in it (Nussbaum 1990, Thomas 1989). This explains why we are so often tempted to take seriously ascription of reasonableness or unreasonableness, fittingness or inappropriateness, for common emotions. Unfortunately it is unclear how the alleged objective properties identified by emotions might be identified independently.
Closely related to the question of the cognitive aspect of emotions is the question of their passivity. Passivity has an ambiguous relation to subjectivity. In one vein, impressed by the bad reputation of the “passions” as taking over our consciousness against our will, philosophers have been tempted to take the passivity of emotions as evidence of their subjectivity. In another vein, however, it has been noted that the passivity of emotions is sometimes precisely analogous to the passivity of perception. How the world is, is not in our power. So it is only to be expected that our emotions, if they actually represent something genuinely and objectively in the world, should not be in our power either: we can no more arbitrarily choose to experience an emotion than we can adopt a belief at will. (Gordon 1987).
If the view that emotions are a kind of perception can be sustained, then the connection between emotion and cognition will have been secured. But there is yet another way of establishing this connection, compatible with the perceptual model. This is to draw attention to the role of emotions as providing the framework for cognitions of the more conventional kind. de Sousa (1987) and Amélie Rorty (1980) propose this sort of account, according to which emotions are not so much perceptions as they are ways of seeing—species of determinate patterns of salience among objects of attention, lines of inquiry, and inferential strategies (see also Roberts 2003). Emotions make certain features of situations or arguments more prominent, giving them a weight in our experience that they would have lacked in the absence of emotion. Consider how Iago proceeds to make Othello jealous. He directs Othello's attention, suggests questions to ask, and insinuates that there are inferences to be drawn without specifying them himself. Once Othello's attention turns to his wife's friendship with Cassio and the lost handkerchief, inferences which on the same evidence would not even have been thought of before are now experienced as compelling: “Farewell, the tranquil mind….”
This account does not identify emotions with judgments or desires, but it does explain why cognitivist theorists have been tempted to make this identification. Emotions set the agenda for beliefs and desires: one might say that they ask the questions that judgment answers with beliefs and evaluate the prospects that may or may not arouse desire. As every committee chairperson knows, questions have much to do with the determination of answers: the rest can be left up to the facts. In this way emotions could be said to be judgments, in the sense that they are what we see the world “in terms of.” But they need not consist in articulated propositions. Much the same reasons motivate their assimilation to desire. As long as we presuppose some basic or preexisting desires, the directive power of “motivation” belongs to what controls attention, salience, and inference strategies preferred.
Some philosophers suggest that the directive power which emotions exert over perception is partly a function of their essentially dramatic or narrative structure (Rorty 1988). A particularly subtle examination of the role of narrative in constituting our emotions over the long term is to be found in (Goldie 2012). It seems conceptually incoherent to suppose that one could have an emotion—say, an intense jealousy or a consuming rage—for only a fraction of a second (Wollheim 1999). One explanation of this feature of emotions is that a story plays itself out during the course of each emotional episode, and stories take place over stretches of time. de Sousa (1987) has suggested that the stories characteristic of different emotions are learned by association with “paradigm scenarios.” These are drawn first from our daily life as small children and later reinforced by the stories, art, and culture to which we are exposed. Later still, they are supplemented and refined by literature and other art forms capable of expanding the range of one's imagination of ways to live. Paradigm scenarios involve two aspects: first, a situation type providing the characteristic objects of the specific emotion-type (where objects can be of the various sorts mentioned above), and second, a set of characteristic or “normal” responses to the situation, where normality is determined by a complex and controversial mix of biological and cultural factors. Once our emotional repertoire is established, we interpret various situations we are faced with through the lens of different paradigm scenarios. When a particular scenario suggests itself as an interpretation, it arranges or rearranges our perceptual, cognitive, and inferential dispositions.
A problem with this idea is that each emotion is appropriate to its paradigm scenario by definition, since it is the paradigm scenario which in effect calibrates the emotional repertoire. It is not clear whether this places unreasonable limitations on the range of possible criticism to which emotions give rise. What is certain is that when a paradigm scenario is evoked by a novel situation, the resulting emotion may or may not be appropriate to the situation that triggers it. In that sense at least, then, emotions can be assessed for rationality.
This brings up normative issues about emotions, which will be addressed in sections 8–10 below. First, however, I consider what one might conclude about the nature or “ontology” of emotions.
What, in the end, are emotions? What do they ultimately consist in? A variety of possible answers to this “ontological” question suggest themselves in the light of the above account. They might be physiological processes, or perceptions of physiological processes, or neuro-psychological states, or adaptive dispositions, or evaluative judgments, or computational states, or even social facts or dynamical processes. In fact most philosophers would assent to most of these descriptions while regarding all as partial. In view of the acknowledged complexity of emotional functions, it seems wise to rephrase the question not in terms of ontology, but in terms of levels of explanation. The trichotomy first introduced by David Marr (1982) remains an excellent starting point. At the computational level (which most would now call the functional level), we need to identify the emotions' basic teleology: what they are for. This will be appropriate even if one believes, as some traditionally have, that emotions actually represent the breakdown of smoothly adaptive functions such as thought, perception, and rational planning. For in that case the emotions will be understood precisely in terms of their failure to promote the smooth working of the cognitive and conative functions. Such a failure will trigger a descent to a lower level of explanation, adverting to the counterproductive exercise of mechanisms at the algorithmic and implementational levels. The first—-more or less equivalent to the design level of (Dennett 1971)—refers to the sub-functions that natural selection has set up to perform the functions said to be disrupted by emotion. The second designates the actual neuro-physiological processes whereby, in animals built on a specific plan such as mammals or humans such as we, these sub-functions are normally carried out.
This trichotomy has been reinterpreted in various ways, but it still serves. It is generally agreed that the simpler emotions, those whose expression and recognition Ekman (1972, 1989) has shown to be universal, are driven by the basic needs of organisms such as mating, defense or avoidance of predators, and social affiliation. All complex mammals require swift, relatively stereotyped responses to these challenges. These are the “affect programs” favored by Ekman (1972, 1989), DeLancey (2001) and particularly Griffiths (1997), to be “what emotions really are.” Opinions divide as to whether the same sort of functional analysis can be applied to a wider range of what Griffiths has called the “cognitively penetrable” emotions. Placing severe constraints on what is to count as a “natural kind”, Griffiths argued that Ekman's six basic affect programs, and only they, form natural kinds: the others, he claimed, are for the moment beyond the reach of useful scientific investigation. Each affect program comprises a coordinated syndrome of responses (which we attribute to the algorithmic level) implemented at the physiological (hormonal and neurological), muscular-skeletal, and expressive levels in ways that owe their uniformity to homology, that is to say their common ancestral origin. Other emotions, however, bear only relations of analogy with these and don't count as natural kinds either singly or as a class.
Against this Charland (2002) has argued that a sufficient level of homology can be found to unite at least the basic emotions as a class, and that we should regard emoters, and hence their emotions, as a natural kind. Relying on Panksepp (1998, 2000), Charland argues that the integrated mechanism of seven basic emotions (Panksepp's list differs slightly from Ekman's) are implemented by distinct circuits forming natural kinds not only in the human but more widely in the mammalian brain. Emoters form a distinct kind in view of their ancestral organization in terms of certain basic functions, the specific algorithms that contribute to those functions, and their implementation in terms of physiological, expressive, hormonal, and motivational processes. This is sufficient not only to justify treating the specific emotions as natural kinds, but to treat emotion in general as a natural kind (Charland 1995, 1997). This view seems to require that we regard emotions as a set of processes distinguished at all three levels of explanation. Emotions in general should then be viewed as a genus of processes typically involving five different component aspects or components, comprising subjective feeling, cognition, motor expression, action tendencies or desire, and neurological processes (Scherer 2005). On this view, individual emotions would owe their specific identity to all five components: the subfunctions they are designed to serve; their perceptual or quasi judgmental component, their associated desires, their mode of expression, and their characteristic physiological implementation.
Another way of organizing the various approaches might appeal to the dominant theoretical models on which they rest. It has often been said that in the history of the philosophy of mind, every epoch has tended to redefine its subject matter in terms of the most fashionable technological metaphor. The notion of emotions as “springs of action” alludes to the once fashionable model of clockwork. The dominant metaphor in Freud's early work was hydraulic. (Freud 1895). What does this observation lead us to expect for emotions?
At the more remote level of explanation, we have seen that theories favored by cognitive science are likely to appeal to evolutionary ideas. But at more proximate levels, three dominant contemporary models might be expected to lay claims on emotion theory: physiology, computation, and dynamical systems.
Physiological processes are conceded by all philosophers to be involved in clearly prototypical cases of emotion. But no philosopher, for fear perhaps of defining themselves out of relevant competence, has been willing to concede that emotions just are physiological processes. Instead they are held to be complexes in which physiology plays a part at the level of implementation of some higher-level process. The higher-level process in which an emotion consists owes its overall structure to functional needs, and typically comprises, in addition to physiological aspects, behavioural, expressive, and phenomenological, components.
Computational theories of emotion seem to have been particularly attractive to psychiatrists and psychoanalysts. They were broached early by a couple of psychoanalysts turned hackers (Peterfreund 1971), (Shank and Colby 1973) and played an important role in the theoretical elaborations of John Bowlby's work on the mechanisms and psychological consequences of early separation and loss. (Bowlby 1969–1980). These works attempted to model Freudian concepts of the dynamics of conscious and unconscious mental life in computational terms. Colby even constructed a simulation of a paranoid patient, “Parry”, which famously fooled some psychiatrists. The key idea was to set up second-order parameters that acted on the first-order modules of perception, belief and desire, thus regulating or disrupting the operation of perceptual and action programs. From the sidelines, de Sousa (1987) suggested that connectionist systems or analog models stand a better chance of modeling emotion than those based on classical von Neuman-type digital computation, but that suggestion hasn't gone anywhere. From the point of view of computational theory, the prevailing wind, backed by both evolutionary speculation and neurological findings on control systems and relatively independent affect-programs, has tended to favour modular conceptions of emotion rather than holistic ones. (Charland 1995, Robinson 2005).
Still, some philosophers and computer scientists have continued to be interested in integrating computing theory with emotions. Aaron Sloman has elaborated the sort of ideas that were embryonic in Shank and Colby into a more sophisticated computational theory of the mind in which emotions are virtual machines, playing a crucial role in a complex hierarchic architecture in which they control, monitor, schedule and sometimes disrupt other control modules. (Wright, Sloman and Beaudoin 1996). The notion of architecture here adverts to the complex hierarchy of control of component modular mechanisms. In line with the three-level schema I have cited from Marr (cf. also (Dennett 1971)), we should understand the approach elaborated in this work as pertaining both to the functional and to the algorithmic level. It explicitly eschews hypotheses about implementation. Joining the growing consensus that emotion phenomena reflect distinct, successively evolved behavioral control systems, Sloman distinguishes between a primitive or primary stream rooted in relatively fixed neuro-physiological response syndromes, a more elaborate control system bringing in cortical control, as well as a third level, probably exclusive to humans, which most closely corresponds to the layer of emotions that we are most concerned with when we think of the emotional charge of art and literature or of the complexity of social intercourse. Rosalind Picard (1997) lays out the evidence for the view that computers will need emotions to be truly intelligent, and in particular to interact intelligently with humans. She also adverts to the role of emotions in evaluation and the pruning of search spaces. But she is as much concerned to provide an emotional theory of computation as to elaborate a computational theory of emotions. Marvin Minsky (2006) explores the many-faceted nature of mental life, including emotions, from a computer modeling point of view. Paul Thagard (2005; 2006) has elaborated computer models in which emotional valence interacts with evidential strength to determine a mode of emotional coherence. There has recently been progress in both detection and increasingly realistic simulations of emotional behaviour by robots, and psychological models have been refined to the point that component models of emotions can give rise to dynamic computational models, which also function as a testing ground for hypotheses about the constituents of emotion, particularly in the framework of “appraisal theories” (Scherer, Bänziger, Tanja and Roesch, 2010). This inquiry has been pursued with special vigor by the Swiss Centre for Affective Sciences (SCAS) in Geneva.
Dynamical systems theories have been relatively slow to emerge, despite their increasingly fashionable status in more central areas of cognitive science. One remarkable attempt to integrate the perspective of dynamical systems into understanding of emotional life is that of (Magai and Haviland-Jones 2002), who draw on dynamical systems theory to model the elusive combination of unpredictability and patterned coherence found in the life-long evolution of individuality. Like predecessors such as Bowlby (1969–1980), they are motivated by a goal of understanding at the level of conscious experience as well as of underlying mechanisms: dynamical systems theory is only one of their tools. It is therefore particularly pertinent to the preoccupations of those who are interested in the normative dimensions of emotions: their rationality and their irrationality, their capacity for enhancing or inhibiting self-knowledge, and their moral implications. I address these questions in the next three sections.
The clearest notions associated with rationality are coherence and consistency in the sphere of belief, and optimization of outcomes in the sphere of action. But these notions are mainly critical ones. By themselves, they would be not suffice to guide an organism towards any particular course of action. For the number of goals that it is logically possible to posit at any particular time is virtually infinite, and the number of possible strategies that might be employed in pursuit of them is orders of magnitude larger. Moreover, in considering possible strategies, the number of consequences of any one strategy is again infinite, so that unless some drastic pre-selection can be effected among the alternatives their evaluation could never be completed. This gives rise to what is known among cognitive scientists as the “Frame Problem”: in deciding among any range of possible actions, most of the consequences of each must be eliminated a priori, i.e. without wasting any time on verifying that they are indeed irrelevant.
That this is not as much of a problem for people as it is for machines may well be due to our capacity for emotions. As noted earlier, emotions constitute one of the chief mechanisms whereby attention is constrained and directed. (Matthews and Wells 1994). This allows them to frame our decisions in two important ways. First, they define the parameters taken into account in any particular deliberation. Second, in the process of rational deliberation itself, they render salient only a tiny proportion of the available alternatives and of the conceivably relevant facts. Thus they winnow down to manageable size the number of considerations relevant to deliberation, and help to provide, in any particular situation, the indispensable framework without which the question of rationality could not even be considered. This suggestion, relabeled the “Search hypothesis of emotion”, has been elaborated and criticized by Evans (2004), who argues convincingly that it needs to be buttressed by a positive theory of precisely what emotional mechanisms are capable of effecting this task.
In a more pervasive and less easily definable way, the capacity to experience emotion seems to be indispensable to the conduct of a rational life over time. Antonio Damasio (1994) has amassed an impressive body of neurological evidence suggesting that emotions do, indeed, have this sort of function in everyday reasoning. Subjects in his studies who, because of injuries sustained to the prefrontal and somatosensory cortices of the brain, had a diminished capacity to experience emotion, were severely hindered in their ability to make intelligent practical decisions. In these ways, then, emotions would be all important to rationality even if they could not themselves be deemed rational or irrational.
Nevertheless we should not infer that emotions act consistently as aids to rational thought and action. Emotions do play an important role both in determining and in undermining rational thought and action, particularly in a social context (Greenspan 1988; 2000). Yet researchers in recent decades have identified a large number of cases where emotions are indeed guilty of the lapses in rationality imputed by traditional prejudices of philosophers. Some examples: present emotional attitudes to future emotions are systematically distorted by discounting schemes that invert preference orders (Ainslie 1992); we fail in other ways to estimate correctly what our future emotions and preferences will be (Gilbert 2006); our assessment of the past, too, is systematically partial, in that we ignore all but the “peaks” of unpleasantness or pleasure, and the temporally last segments of time (Kahneman 2000); subjects misinterpret their own experience of fear as sexual excitement (Dutton and Aron 1974); and conversely, a mild stimulus to sexual interest causes men—but not women—to accept severely disadvantageous rates of discounting (Daly and Wilson 2004). The picture is further complicated by the fact that some apparent irrationalities may serve group cohesion. Thus in the much studied “ultimatum game”, subjects are generally willing to incur considerable costs to punish unfair behavior (Oosterbeek, Sloof and van de Kuilen 2004).
But can emotions be assessed for rationality in themselves, rather than as components of practical strategies? There is a common prejudice that “feelings,” a word now sometimes commonly used interchangeably with “emotions,” neither owe nor can give any rational account of themselves. Yet we equally commonly blame others or ourselves for feeling “not wisely, but too well,” or for targeting inappropriate objects. The norms appropriate to both these types of judgment are inseparable from social norms, whether or not these are endorsed. Ultimately they are inseparable from conceptions of normality and human nature. Judgments of reasonableness therefore tend to be endorsed or rejected in accordance with one's ideological commitments to this or that conception of human nature. It follows that whether these judgments can be viewed as objective or not will depend on whether there are objective facts to be sought about human nature. On this question there is fortunately no need to pronounce. It is enough to note that there is no logical reason why judgments of reasonableness or irrationality in relation to emotions need be regarded as any more subjective than any other judgments of rationality in human affairs.
Exactly how one conceives of the nature of emotional rationality will depend on one's theory of what the emotions are. Cognitivist and appraisal theories will say that a reasonable emotion is one whose constituent propositional attitudes or appraisals are reasonable. Theories which take emotions to be perceptions of objective values will claim that the target of an appropriate emotion should possess the value which the emotion presents it as having. Narrative theories will consider an emotion appropriate if its dramatic structure adequately resembles that of its eliciting situation.
Of course, these answers to the question of what it is for an emotion to be reasonable suppose that the relevant notion of rationality is an epistemic one, and that what appropriate emotions succeed in achieving is some sort of representational adequacy. This assumes that emotions are states that we passively undergo. However, the relation of the emotions to the will is not as clear as the word “passion” might suggest. Certain philosophers have argued that emotions are more like actions, for which we must bear responsibility (Sartre 1948; Solomon 1980). If this is true, and emotions are to some extent under our voluntary control, then emotions will also be assessable for their strategic rationality.
Close to the issue of emotional rationality lies the question of whether emotions should be appraised in a dimension of “authenticity”: once we give up the naive assumption that emotions are simply “natural” biological states, how should we assess the enhancement of emotions through chemical means? The ubiquity of prescription drugs purporting to promote equanimity, relieve depression, and enhance cognitive powers demands that we take a stance on the broader question of the desirability of promoting chemical enhancements of our emotional capacities. Should we welcome such enhancements, whether with the technological assistance of “big pharma” or by the more artisanal means of “recreational” drugs? Or should we, in the name of emotional “authenticity”, insist that emotions are authentic only when their chemical infrastructure is entirely endogenic? The debate has barely begun (Kraemer 2011). Whether or not enhancing our emotional capability is possible or desirable, however, the results may be no more predictable than when one attempts to call up an emotion at will: the emotion that is actually triggered may not be the one that was summoned. If a person is not aware that a substitution has taken place, then she will be self-deceived about her emotions—an all too frequent occurrence, worthy of a brief discussion in its own right.
We often make the “Cartesian” assumption that if anyone can know our emotions it is ourselves. Descartes said it thus: “it is impossible for the soul to feel a passion without that passion being truly as one feels it.” Barely a page later, however, he noted that “those that are most agitated by their passions are not those who know them best” (Descartes 1984 , 338, 339). In fact, few kinds of self-knowledge could matter more than knowing one's own repertoire of emotional responses. At the same time, emotions are both the cause and the subject of many failures of self-knowledge. Their complexity entails much potential to mislead or be misled. Insofar as most emotions involve belief, they inherit the susceptibility of the latter to self-deception. Recent literature on self-deception has striven to dissolve the air of paradox to which this once gave rise (Fingarette 1969, Mele 1987). Furthermore, brain scientists have noted the pervasive nature of self-deception and of different species of “confabulation”, and they have begun to make progress in unmasking the underlying neurological processes (Hirstein 2005). But there remain three distinct sources of self-deception that stem from features of emotions already alluded to.
The first arises from the connection of emotion with bodily changes. There was something right in James's claim that the emotion follows on, rather than causing the voluntary and involuntary bodily changes which are held to express it. Because some of these changes are either directly or indirectly subject to our choices, we are able to pretend or dissimulate emotion. That implies that we can sometimes be caught in our own pretense. Sometimes we identify our emotions by what we feel: and if what we feel has been distorted by a project of deception, then we will misidentify our own emotions.
A second source of self-deception arises from the role of emotions in determining salience among potential objects of attention or concern. Poets have always known that the main effect of love is to redirect attention: when I love, I notice nothing but my beloved, and nothing of his faults. When my love turns to anger I still focus on him, but now attend to a very different set of properties. This suggests one way of controlling or dominating my emotion: think about something else, or think differently about this object (Greenspan 2000). But this carries a risk. It is easier to think of something than to avoid thinking about it; and to many cases of emotional distress only the latter could bring adequate relief. Besides, one is not always able to predict, and therefore to control, the effect that redirected attention might produce. This familiar observation alerts us to the role of the unconscious: if among the associations that are evoked by a given scene are some that I can react to without being aware of them, then I will not always be able to predict my own reactions, even if I have mastered the not altogether trivial task of attending to whatever I choose. Where the unconscious is, self-deception necessarily threatens.
This brings us to the third source of emotional self-deception: the involvement of social norms in the determination of our emotions. This possibility arises in two stages from the admission that there are unconscious motivations for emotions. First, if I am experiencing an emotion that seems altogether inappropriate to its occasion, I will naturally confabulate an explanation for it. A neurotic who is unreasonably angry with his wife because he unconsciously identifies her with his mother will not rest content with having no reason for his anger. Instead, he will make one up. Second, the reason he makes up will typically be one that is socially approved (Averill 1982).
If we are self-deceived in our emotional responses, or if some emotional state induces self-deception, this may not be merely a failure of self-knowledge. Many have thought that having certain emotions is an important part of what it is to be a virtuous moral agent. If this is true, then being systematically self-deceived about one's emotions will be a kind of moral failure as well.
The complexity of emotions and their role in mental life is reflected in the unsettled place they have held in the history of ethics. Often they have been regarded as a dangerous threat to morality and rationality; in the romantic tradition, on the contrary, passions have been placed at the center both of human individuality and of the moral life. This ambivalence is reflected in the close connections between the vocabulary of emotions and that of vices and virtues: envy, spite, jealousy, wrath, and pride are some names of emotions that also refer to common vices. Not coincidentally, some key virtues—love, compassion, benevolence, and sympathy—are also names of emotions. On the other hand, prudence, fortitude and temperance consist largely in the capacity to resist the motivational power of emotions (Williams 1973).
The view that emotions are irrational was eloquently defended by the Epicureans and Stoics. For this reason, these Hellenistic schools pose a particularly interesting challenge for the rest of the Western tradition. The Stoics adapted and made their own the Socratic hypothesis that virtue is nothing else than knowledge, adding the idea that emotions are essentially irrational beliefs. All vice and all suffering is then irrational, and the good life requires the rooting out of all desires and attachments. (As for the third of the major Hellenistic schools, the Skeptics, their view was that it is beliefs as such that were responsible for pain. Hence they recommend the repudiation of opinions of any sort.) All three schools stressed the overarching value of “ataraxia”, the absence of disturbance in the soul. Philosophy can then be viewed as therapy, the function of which is to purge emotions from the soul (Nussbaum 1994). In support of this, the Stoics advanced the plausible claim that it is psychologically impossible to keep only nice emotions and give up the nasty ones. For all attachment and all desire, however worthy their objects might seem, entail the capacity for wrenching and destructive negative emotions. Erotic love can bring with it the murderous jealousy of a Medea, and even a commitment to the idea of justice may foster a capacity for destructive anger which is nothing but “furor brevis”— temporary insanity, in Seneca's arresting phrase. Moreover, the usual objects of our attachment are clearly unworthy of a free human being, since they diminish rather than enhance the autonomy of those that endure them.
The Hellenistic philosophers' observations about nasty emotions are not wholly compelling. Surely it is possible to see at least some emotions as having a positive contribution to make to our moral lives, and indeed we have seen that the verdict of cognitive science is that a capacity for normal emotion appears to be a sine qua non for the rational and moral conduct of life. Outside of this intimate but still somewhat mysterious link between the neurological capacity for emotion and rationality, the exact significance of emotions to the moral life will again depend on one's theory of the emotions. Inasmuch as emotions are partly constituted by desires, as some cognitivist theorists maintain, they will, as David Hume contended, help to motivate decent behavior and cement social life. If emotions are perceptions, and can be more or less epistemically adequate to their objects, then emotions may have a further contribution to make to the moral life, depending on what sort of adequacy and what sort of objects are involved. Max Scheler (1954) was the first to suggest that emotions are in effect perceptions of “tertiary qualities” that supervene in the (human) world on facts about social relations, pleasure and pain, and natural psychological facts, a suggestion recently elaborated by Tappolet (2000).
An important amendment to that view, voiced by D'Arms and Jacobson (2000a) is that emotions may have intrinsic criteria of appropriateness that diverge from, and indeed may conflict with, ethical norms. Appropriate emotions are not necessarily moral. Despite that, some emotions, specifically guilt, resentment, shame and anger, may have a special role in the establishment of a range of “response-dependent” values and norms that lie at the heart of the moral life (McDowell 1985; Gibbard 1990; D'Arms and Jacobson 1993). Kevin Mulligan (1998) advances a related view: though not direct perceptions of value, emotions can be said to justify axiological judgments. Emotions themselves are justified by perceptions and beliefs, and are said to be appropriate if and only if the axiological judgments they support are correct. If any of those variant views is right, then emotions have a crucial role to play in ethics in revealing to us something like moral facts. A consequence of this view is that art and literature, in educating our emotions, will have a substantial role in our moral development (Nussbaum 2001). On the other hand, there remains something “natural” about the emotions concerned, so that moral emotions are sometimes precisely those that resist the principles inculcated by so-called moral education. Hence the view that emotions apprehend real moral properties can explain our approval of those, like Huckleberry Finn when he ignored his “duty” to turn in Jim the slave, whose emotions drive them to act against their own “rational” conscience (Bennett 1974; McIntyre 1990; Arpaly 2002).
These suggestions about the relevance of emotion to ethics must be sharply distinguished from “Emotivism”—the claim that emotions can be used to elucidate the concept of evaluation itself. Such elucidation would only be plausible if we understood the explicans more clearly than the explicandum. But the variety and complexity of emotions makes them poor candidates for the role of explicans. The view in question must also be distinguished from the sociobiological hypothesis—which had early precursors in Mencius and Hume—that certain motives of benevolence are part of the genetic equipment which makes ethical behavior possible. That plausible view has attracted surprisingly energetic opposition in recent years. One objection against it is one directed against all forms of ethical naturalism: namely that the biological origins of a sentiment have no obvious bearing on its ethical value. Nevertheless, studies of social interaction among other primates strongly support the hypothesis that our moral intuitions have been shaped by evolution. And although analogies between primate behaviour and human morality are still resisted with desperate energy, it seems hard to deny that we can recognize a surprising range of familiar “moral emotions” in our nearest non-human cousins (de Waal 2006). Such naturalistic studies do promise to explain, at least, both the existence of some of our more benevolent emotions and attitudes, and the way in which their scope often seems so dangerously limited to the members of some restricted in-group.
The range of emotions to which the sociobiological hypothesis can be applied, however, is relatively narrow. That many complex emotions are to a certain extent socially constructed, is attested by the fact that what is considered normal emotion varies between epochs and cultures. Feminists have pointed out, in particular, that gender-specific norms on emotional experience and expression have been a standard means of maintaining inequality among the sexes in many cultures (de Beauvoir 1952). Viewed in this light, the emotions in general lack that property of universalizability which many philosophers have regarded as a sine qua non of the ethical (Blum 1980). On the other hand, the extent and significance of cultural differences are still a matter of considerable controversy (Pinker 2002). Any conclusions about the place of emotions in the moral life must therefore remain highly tentative.
In the past two decades, the philosophy of emotions has become enriched with a number of perspectives that have both embraced and inspired inter-disciplinary studies. In this section, not all references are to works by professional philosophers: some references are to philosophically significant work in psychology, sociology, or neuroscience. Most significantly, the study of emotions has had a considerable impact on ideas about the intersection of morality, politics, psychiatry and law.
Over a century after Nietzsche opened up the question of the “genealogy” of morals, philosophers have finally begun to take seriously the emotional roots of morality (Prinz 2007; Haidt 2012). Emotions are seen by several philosophers as the psychological roots of moral feelings, so that different domains of morality can be traced to groups of emotions of which the prototypes are observed in our primate cousins (de Waal 2006; Joyce 2006). Less radically, other philosophers have explored the function of emotion — particularly guilt and shame — in motivating moral behavior (Taylor 1985; Gibbard 1990; Baier, 1995; Greenspan 1995).
In recent years, a notable development in philosophical treatment of emotions has been the attempt to incorporate interdisciplinary approaches and insights into philosophy. Paul Griffiths (1997), Jessie Prinz (2004), Craig DeLancey (2002), Tim Schroeder (2004) are among the most vigorous exponents of the view that philosophical work on the emotions must be re-oriented away from linguistic analysis and more richly rooted in science. Robert Solomon, who spurred both interest and opposition with his provocative thesis that emotions are judgments, also advocated an enrichment of emotion theory through cross-cultural perspectives and the integration of scientific perspectives (Solomon 1999). Under the impact of explosive progress in brain science, there has been renewed interest in the hypothesis that innate emotional temperament, as well as social environment, condition people's moral and political stance. Emotional dispositions, in turn, have been linked via neuro-transmitters to specific genes (Canli and Lesch 2007). At the same time, the influence of social environment and ideology has been studied in increasingly greater depth. The view that emotions are “socially constructed” and partly conditioned by ideology can now be supported by more solid empirical work: what is experienced as a quintessentially individual and psychological process, namely love, is conditioned by an ideology that depends on social and economic factors (Ben Ze'ev and Goussinsky 2008; Illouz 2012). More traditional perspectives continue to thrive, notably in the defense, by David Pugmire (2005) and others, of a broadly Aristotelian point of view on the moral importance of integrity in emotions. There has also been increasing attention paid to the central role of emotions in psychiatry (Blair, Mitchell, and Blair 2005; Charland 2010), in law and politics (Finkel and Parrott 2006; Deigh 2008), and in religion (Roberts 2007).
A notable development of the past quarter of a century has been the increasing interest in specific emotions. Many philosophers have abandoned their preoccupation with the question of whether or not emotions form a “natural kind” (Rorty 1988; 1998; 2003; Elster 1999; Ben Ze'ev 2000). Instead, some have been willing to look at less typical emotions, turning their attention to such “epistemic” emotions as interest, curiosity, conviction, and doubt (Silvia 2006; Brun, Doguoglu, and Kuenzle 2008), as well as to aesthetic emotions (Matravers 1998). Efforts have been expended, in particular, on the rehabilitation of some emotions commonly described as “negative”, such as guilt (Greenspan 1995), shame (Deonna et al. 2011), envy (D'Arms and Jacobson 2005), disgust (Rozin, Lowery, Haidt et al. 1999), and sentimentality (Solomon 2004; Howard 2012). The very idea that some emotions are “negative” has come under fire: philosophers have been critical of a simplistic notion of “valence” that is widely taken for granted in psychology (Krisjansson 2003).
The role of emotions in our experience of art and literature is an obviously promising area which has received much attention in recent decades. Robert Gordon (1987) was one of the first to suggest that the knowledge we have of the states of mind of others, and particularly of their emotional condition, is derived not from any psychological theory, but from an active simulation of that other's state. There is suggestive neurological evidence that this might be on the right track from the discovery of “mirror neurons” that are similarly activated both by a concrete action and by the sight of the same concrete action in another (Gallese and Goldman 1998). The idea has been developed by Keith Oatley (2012), as an approach to literature. Fiction, he argues on the basis of much empirical work, works as a simulation run on the wetware of the reader's mind, and has the power to change us. This view is also supported by Martha Nussbaum, who despite being firmly in the cognitive camp, has insisted that the kind of knowledge involved in moral appraisal is both affective and cognitive. For that reason, the full force of certain moral truths can best be grasped through the medium of literature rather than philosophical argument. (Nussbaum 1990; 1994; 2001; Baier 1995; Hogan 2011).
There has been a good deal of work on the role of emotions in music, although there is little consensus about how that works. (Budd 1985; Juslin and Sloboda 2001; Robinson 2005; Nussbaum 2007). Emotions in film have also come under scrutiny from philosophers (Plantinga 1999; French, Wettstein and Saint 2010.)
One area that has mushroomed since the last couple of decades of the twentieth Century is the philosophy of sex and love. At least one book has explored the prospects for love and sex with robots (Levy 2007). More usually, controversies have centered on the role of reason in generating love, as well as the kinds of reasons for action that love produces or can justify. As might be expected, contemporary contributions to the philosophy of love have on the whole been less sanguine about love, particularly erotic love, than the general run of self-help or popular books in praise of love. Surprisingly, however, the idea that we love for reasons continues to find defenders among philosophers. (Singer 2009; Frankfurt 2004; Jollimore 2011; Lamb 1997; Nussbaum 1997; Soble 1998; Solomon and Higgins 1991; Stewart 1995; Vannoy 1980; Blackburn 2004).
In debates about the nature of emotions, feminist voices have been important participants, particularly on issues concerning the role of emotions in morality (Gilligan 1982; Larrabee 1993) and the question of gender. On the latter question, (as in other aspects of mentality) research on gender differences in emotion has generally been dogged by publication bias: since absence of differences is not apt to seem newsworthy, journals have favored findings of emotional difference. Sometimes it has seemed to follow in some mysterious way from the dimorphism of human gametes that men and women must have significantly different experiences of emotions in general and of sex and love in particular. Nevertheless, a number of thinkers have resisted this trend. Nancy Eisenberg, for example, has concluded that “gender differences in empathy may be an artefact of measurement” (Eisenberg and Lennon 1983); much the same is argued about gender differences in emotional expression by Brody (1997), and specifically for jealousy by Hupka and Bank (1996) and Harris (2003).
Finally, though probably not exhaustively, emotion theorists have turned to collective or shared emotions, as a specific form of shared intentionality; a motivating topic in that area being the question of collective guilt feelings (Gilbert 2000; Tuomela 2007; Konzelmann Ziv 2009; Salmela 2012).
In short, interdisciplinary research has thrived in recent years. Vast projects have sprung up, notably the Centre for Interdisciplinary Study of Affective Sciences (CISAS) in Geneva, in which philosophers have collaborated with psychologists, neuroscientists, experimental economists, and students of literature to study emotions.
Despite the great diversity of views contending in the philosophy of emotions, one can discern a good deal of agreement. A broad consensus has emerged on what we might call adequacy conditions on any theory of emotion. An acceptable philosophical theory of emotions should be able to account at least for the following baker's dozen of characteristics. All the recent and current accounts of emotion discussed here have something to say about most of them, and some have had something to say about all.
- emotions are typically conscious phenomena; yet
- dispositions to manifest certain emotion types, such as irascibility, are often unconscious;
- emotions typically involve more pervasive bodily manifestations than other conscious states, but
- they cannot reliably be discriminated on physiological grounds alone;
- emotions vary along a number of dimensions: intensity, duration, valence, type and range of intentional objects, etc.;
- they are typically, but not always, manifested in desires;
- they are distinct from moods, but modified by them;
- they are reputed to be antagonists of rationality; but also
- they play an indispensable role in determining the quality of life;
- they contribute crucially to defining our ends and priorities;
- they play a crucial role in the regulation of social life;
- they protect us from an excessively slavish devotion to narrow conceptions of rationality;
- they have a central place in moral education and the moral life.
The exploration of questions raised by these characteristics is a thriving ongoing collaborative project in the theory of emotions, in which philosophy will continue both to inform and to draw on a wide range of philosophical expertise as well as the parallel explorations of other branches of cognitive science.
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Useful Collective Works and General Introductions to the Philosophy of Emotion
- Davidson, R., K. Scherer and H. Hill Goldsmith (eds.), 2001. Handbook of Affective Sciences, Oxford: Oxford University Press, 2003.
- Deonna, Julien A., and Fabrice Teroni, 2012. The Emotions: A Philosophical Introduction, London: Routledge.
- Evans, Dylan, and Peter Cruse, eds., 2004. Evolution, Rationality, and Emotion, Oxford: Oxford University Press.
- Goldie, Peter, 2000. The Emotions: A Philosophical Exploration, Oxford: Oxford University Press.
- Goldie, Peter, ed., 2010. The Oxford Handbook of Philosophy of Emotion, Oxford: Clarendon Press.
- Harré, Rom, 1986. The Social Construction of Emotions, Oxford: Blackwell.
- Hatsimoysis, Anthony, ed. 2003. Philosophy and the Emotions, Royal Institute of Philosophy Supplements, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.
- Leighton, Stephen, ed., 2003. Philosophy and the Emotions, Peterborough, Ontario: Broadview.
- Oatley, Keith, 1992. Best Laid Schemes: The Psychology of Emotions, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.
- Scherer, Klaus, and David Sander, eds., 2009. Oxford Companion to Emotion and the Affective Sciences, Oxford: Oxford University Press.
- Solomon, Robert C., ed., 2003. What is an Emotion? Classic and Contemporary Readings, Oxford; New York: Oxford University Press.
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