Paternalism

First published Wed Nov 6, 2002; substantive revision Tue Jun 1, 2010

Paternalism is the interference of a state or an individual with another person, against their will, and defended or motivated by a claim that the person interfered with will be better off or protected from harm. The issue of paternalism arises with respect to restrictions by the law such as anti-drug legislation, the compulsory wearing of seatbelts, and in medical contexts by the withholding of relevant information concerning a patient's condition by physicians. At the theoretical level it raises questions of how persons should be treated when they are less than fully rational.


1. Introduction

The government requires people to contribute to a pension system (Social Security). It requires motorcyclists to wear helmets. It forbids people from swimming at a public beach when lifeguards are not present. It forbids the sale of various drugs deemed to be ineffective. It forbids the sale of various drugs believed to be harmful. It does not allow consent to certain forms of assault to be a defense against prosecution for that assault.

The civil law does not allow the enforcement of certain kinds of contracts, e.g. for gambling debts. It requires minors to have blood transfusions even if their religious beliefs forbid it. Persons may be civilly committed if they are a danger to themselves.

Doctors do not tell their patients the truth about their medical condition. A physician may tell the wife of a man whose car went off a bridge into the water and drowned that he died instantly when in fact he died a rather ghastly death.

A husband may hide the sleeping pills from a depressed wife. A philosophy department may require a student to take logic courses.

A teacher may be less than honest about telling a student that he has little philosophical ability.

All of these rules, policies, and actions may be done for various reasons; may be justified by various considerations. When they are justified solely on the grounds that the person affected would be better off, or would be less harmed, as a result of the rule, policy, etc., and the person in question would prefer not to be treated this way, we have an instance of paternalism.

As the examples indicate the question of paternalism is one that arises in many different areas of our personal and public life. As such, it is an important realm of applied ethics. But it also raises certain theoretical issues. Perhaps the most important is: what powers it is legitimate for a state, operating both coercively and in terms of incentives, to possess. It also raises questions about the proper ways in which individuals, either in an institutional or purely personal setting, should relate to one another. How should we think about individual autonomy and its limits? What is it to respect the personhood of others? What is the trade-off, if any, between regard for the welfare of another and respect for their right to make their own decisions?

This entry examines some of the conceptual issues involved in analyzing paternalism, and then discusses the normative issues concerning the legitimacy of paternalism by the state and various civil institutions.

2. Conceptual Issues

The analysis of paternalism involves at least the following elements. It involves some kind of limitation on the freedom or autonomy of some agent and it does so for a particular class of reasons. As with many other concepts used in normative debate determining the exact boundaries of the concept is a contested issue.

And as often is the case the first question is whether the concept itself is normative or descriptive. Is application of the concept a matter for empirical determination, so that if two people disagree about the application to a particular case they are disagreeing about some matter of fact or of definition? Or does their disagreement reflect different views about the legitimacy of the application in question?

While it is clear that for some to characterize a policy as paternalistic is to condemn or criticize it, that does not establish that the term itself is an evaluative one. As a matter of methodology it is preferable to see if some concept can be defined in non-normative terms and only if that fails to capture the relevant phenomena to accept a normative definition.

I suggest the following conditions as an analysis of X acts paternalistically towards Y by doing (omitting) Z:

  1. Z (or its omission) interferes with the liberty or autonomy of Y.
  2. X does so without the consent of Y.
  3. X does so just because Z will improve the welfare of Y (where this includes preventing his welfare from diminishing), or in some way promote the interests, values, or good of Y.

Condition one is the trickiest to capture. Clear cases include threatening bodily compulsion, lying, withholding information that the person has a right to have, or imposing requirements or conditions. But what about the following case? A father, skeptical about the financial acumen of a child, instead of bequeathing the money directly, gives it to another child with instructions to use it in the best interests of the first child. The first child has no legal claim on the inheritance. There does not seem to be an interference with the child's liberty nor on most conceptions the child's autonomy.

Or consider the case of a wife who hides her sleeping pills so that her potentially suicidal husband cannot use them. Her act may satisfy the second and third conditions but what about the first? Does her action limit the liberty or autonomy of her husband?

The second condition is supposed to be read as distinct from acting against the consent of an agent. The agent may neither consent nor not consent. He may, for example, be unaware of what is being done to him. There is also the distinct issue of whether one acts not knowing about the consent of the person in question. Suppose the person in fact consents but this is not known to the paternaliser.

The third condition also can be complicated. There may be more than one reason for interfering with Y. In addition to concern for the welfare of Y there may be concern for how Y's actions may affect third-parties. Is the “just for” condition too strong? Or what about the case where a legislature passes a legal rule for paternalistic reasons but there are sufficient non-paternalistic reasons to justify passage of the rule?

If, in order to decide on any of the above issues, one must decide a normative issue, e.g. does someone have a right to some information, then the concept is not purely descriptive. Ultimately the question of how to refine the conditions, and what conditions to use, is a matter for philosophical judgment. The term “paternalism” as used in ordinary contexts may be too amorphous for thinking about particular normative issues. One should decide upon an analysis based on a hypothesis of what will be most useful for thinking about a particular range of problems. One might adopt one analysis in the context of doctors and patients and another in the context of whether the state should ban unhealthy foods.

Given some particular analysis of paternalism there will be various normative views about when paternalism is justified. The following terminology is useful.

Hard vs. soft paternalism

Soft paternalism is the view that the only conditions under which state paternalism is justified is when it is necessary to determine whether the person being interfered with is acting voluntarily and knowledgeably. To use Mill's famous example of the person about to walk across a damaged bridge, if we could not communicate the danger (he speaks only Japanese) a soft paternalist would justify forcibly preventing him from crossing the bridge in order to determine whether he knows about its condition. If he knows, and wants to, say, commit suicide he must be allowed to proceed. A hard paternalist says that, at least sometimes, it may be permissible to prevent him from crossing the bridge even if he knows of its condition. We are entitled to prevent voluntary suicide.

Broad vs. narrow paternalism

A narrow paternalist is only concerned with the question of state coercion, i.e. the use of legal coercion. A broad paternalist is concerned with any paternalistic action: state, institutional (hospital policy), or individual.

Weak vs. strong paternalism

A weak paternalist believes that it is legitimate to interfere with the means that agents choose to achieve their ends, if those means are likely to defeat those ends. So if a person really prefers safety to convenience then it is legitimate to force them to wear seatbelts. A strong paternalist believes that people may be mistaken or confused about their ends and it is legitimate to interfere to prevent them from achieving those ends. If a person really prefers the wind rustling through their hair to increased safety it is legitimate to make them wear helmets while motorcycling because their ends are irrational or mistaken. Another way of putting this: we may interfere with mistakes about the facts but not mistakes about values. So if a person tries to jump out of a window believing he will float gently to the ground we may restrain him. If he jumps because he believes that it is important to be spontaneous we may not.

Pure vs. impure paternalism

Suppose we prevent persons from manufacturing cigarettes because we believe they are harmful to consumers. The group we are trying to protect is the group of consumers not manufacturers (who may not be smokers at all). Our reason for interfering with the manufacturer is that he is causing harm to others. Nevertheless the basic justification is paternalist because the consumer consents (assuming the relevant information is available to him) to the harm. It is not like the case where we prevent manufacturers from polluting the air. In pure paternalism the class being protected is identical with the class being interfered with, e.g. preventing swimmers from swimming when lifeguards are not present. In the case of impure paternalism the class of persons interfered with is larger than the class being protected.

Moral vs. welfare paternalism

The usual justification for paternalism refers to the interests of the person being interfered with. These interests are defined in terms of the things that make a person's life go better; in particular their physical and psychological condition. It is things like death or misery or painful emotional states which are in question. Sometimes, however, advocates of state intervention seek to protect the moral welfare of the person. So, for example, it may be argued that prostitutes are better off being prevented from plying their trade even if they make a decent living and their health is protected against disease. They are better off because it is morally corrupting to sell one's sexual services. The interference is justified, therefore, to promote the moral well-being of the person. This then can be called moral paternalism. Still another distinction within moral paternalism is between interferences to improve a person's moral character, and hence her well-being, and interferences to make someone a better person—even if her life does not go better for her as a result.

Finally, it is important to distinguish paternalism, whether welfare or moral, from other ideas used to justify interference with persons; even cases where the interference is not justified in terms of protecting or promoting the interests of others. In particular moral paternalism should be distinguished from legal moralism, i.e. the idea that certain ways of acting are morally wrong or degrading and may be prohibited. So, for example, the barroom “sport” of dwarf tossing (where dwarfs who are paid, and are protected with helmets, etc. participate in contests to see who can throw them furthest) might be thought to be legitimately prohibited. Not because the dwarf is injured in any way, not because the dwarf corrupts himself by agreeing to participate in such activities, but simply because the activity is morally degrading and wrong.

To be sure it is not always easy to distinguish between legal moralism and moral paternalism. If one believes, as Plato does, that acting wrongly damages the soul of the agent, then it will be possible to invoke moral paternalism rather than legal moralism. What is important is that there are two distinct justifications that are possible; one appealing to the mere immorality of the conduct interfered with, the other to the harm done to the agent's character.

3. Normative Issues

Is there a burden of proof attached to paternalism? Does the paternalist or anti-paternalist have to give a reason for their action? As we have seen the analysis of paternalism seems to cut both ways. It is an interference with liberty which might be thought to place the burden of proof on the paternalist. It is an act intended to produce good for the agent which might be thought to place the burden of proof on those who object to paternalism. It might be thought, as Mill did, that the burden of proof is different depending on who is being treated paternalistically. If it is a child then the assumption is that, other things being equal, the burden of proof is on those who resist paternalism. If it is an adult of sound mind the presumption is reversed.

Suppose we start from the presumption that paternalism is wrong. The question becomes under what, if any, circumstances, can the presumption be overcome? The possible answers are “under no circumstances”, “under some circumstances”, and “under any circumstances”

The last seems very implausible. Essentially it is the view that the fact that an act is (intended to be) beneficial for a person, and does not affect or violate the interests of others, settles the question of whether it may be done. Only a view which ignores the means by which good is promoted, and the ethical status of such means, can hold this. Any sensible view has to distinguish between good done to agents at their request or with their consent, and good thrust upon them against their will.

So the normative options seem to be just two. Either we are never permitted to do good for others against their wishes, and in ways which limit their liberty, or we are permitted to do so.

Why might one think that at least the state may never do so? One might think so because of various beliefs about the impossibility of in fact doing good for people against their will or because one thinks that although possible to do good it is in fact inconsistent with some normative standard which ought to prevail.

With respect to the impossibility question one might believe either that it is not possible to do any good by acting paternalistically or that although it is possible to do some good the process will (almost) always produce bads which outweigh the good.

If one thought that almost)always more harm than good is done by the state when it acts paternalistically this raises the question of whether we can distinguish the conditions in which (rarely) more good than harm is done and build that into our guidelines. If this is possible,and so distinguishing does not create further harms which outweigh the good produced, and we think, the only issue is good promotion we should sometimes be paternalists. If it is impossible to distinguish the “good” from the “bad” cases then, at least if we are rule consequentialists, we ought not to have such a rule; and we ought not to try and make the distinctions on a case by case basis.

But one might believe that the question of whether more good than harm is produced is not simply an empirical one. It depends on our understanding of the good of persons. If the good simply included items such as longer life, greater health, more income, or less depression, then it makes it look like an empirical issue. But if we conceive of the good of individuals as including items such as being respected as an independent agent, having a right to make decisions for oneself, or having one's autonomy not infringed, then the issue of whether the agent is better off after being paternalised is partly a normative matter. One might believe that one cannot make people better off by infringing their autonomy in the same way that some people believe one cannot make a person better off by putting them in a Nozickian experience machine (one in which they are floating in a tank but seem to be having all kinds of wonderful experiences). Compare Mill's statement that “…a man's mode of laying out his own existence is best not because it is the best in itself, but because it is his own mode…” (1859, Chapter III).

Kantian views are frequently absolutistic in their objections to paternalism. On these views we must always respect the rational agency of other persons. To deny an adult the right to make their own decisions, however mistaken from some standpoint they are, is to treat them as simply means to their own good, rather than as ends in themselves. In a way anti-paternalism is already incorporated into Kantian theories by their prohibition against lying and force—the main instruments of paternalistic interference. Since these instrumentalities are already denied even to prevent individuals from harming others, they will certainly be forbidden to prevent them from harming themselves. Of course, one may object to the former absolutism while accepting the latter.

If one believes that sometimes paternalism is justifiable one may do so for various kinds of theoretical reasons. The broadest is simply consequentialist, i.e. more good than harm is produced. A narrower justification is that sometimes the individuals (long-run) autonomy is advanced by restricting his autonomy (short-run). So one might prevent people from taking mind-destroying drugs on the grounds that allowing them to do so destroys their autonomy and preventing them from doing so preserves it. This is essentially Mill's argument against allowing people to contract into slavery. Note that if the theory of the good associated with a particular consequentialism is broad enough, i.e., includes autonomy as one of the goods, it can be equivalent to the autonomy theory (assuming that the structure of the autonomy view is a maximizing one).

A different theoretical basis is (moral) contractualism. On this view if there are cases of justified paternalism they are justified on the basis that we (all of us) would agree to such interference, given suitable knowledge and suitable motivation. So, for instance, it might be argued that since we know we are subject to depression we all would agree, at least, to short-term anti-suicide interventions, to determine whether we are suffering from such a condition, and to attempt to cure it. More generally, we might accept what Feinberg called “soft paternalism.” This is the view that when we are not acting fully voluntarily it is permissible to intervene to provide information, or to point out defects in our rationality, but that if we then do make a voluntary choice it must be respected. Or we might agree to being forced to wear seat-belts knowing our disposition to discount future benefits for present ones. The justification here is neither consequentialist nor based simply on the preservation of autonomy. Rather either kind of consideration may be taken into account, as well as others, in determining what we would reasonably agree to.

Bibliography

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  • Sunstein, Cass and Richard Thaler, 2003, “Libertarian Paternalism is Not an Oxymoron,” The University of Chicago Law Review, 70: 1166–1187.
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autonomy: in moral and political philosophy | autonomy: personal | beneficence, principle of | liberty: positive and negative | limits of law | Mill, John Stuart: moral and political philosophy

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