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Mill's Moral and Political Philosophy
John Stuart Mill (1806-1873) was the most famous and influential British moral philosopher of the nineteenth century. He was one of the last systematic philosophers, making significant contributions in logic, metaphysics, epistemology, ethics, political philosophy, and social theory. He was also an important public figure, articulating the liberal platform, pressing for various liberal reforms, and serving in Parliament. Mill's greatest philosophical influence was in moral and political philosophy, especially his articulation and defense of utilitarian moral theory and liberal political philosophy. This entry will examine Mill's moral and political philosophy selectively, reconstructing the central elements of his contributions to the utilitarian and liberal traditions. We will concentrate on his two most popular and best known works — Utilitarianism (1861) and On Liberty (1859) — though we will draw on other texts when this sheds light on our interpretation of his utilitarian and liberal principles. We will conclude by looking at how Mill applies these principles to issues of political and sexual equality in Considerations on Representative Government (1859), Principles of Political Economy (1848), and The Subjection of Women (1869).
- 1. Mill's Intellectual Background
- 2. Mill's Utilitarianism
- 2.1 The Philosophical Radicals
- 2.2 Psychological Egoism and Hedonism
- 2.3 Happiness and Higher Pleasures
- 2.4 Perfectionist Elements
- 2.5 Conceptions of Duty
- 2.6 Utilitarianism as a Standard of Conduct
- 2.7 Act Utilitarianism
- 2.8 Rule Utilitarianism?
- 2.9 Sanction Utilitarianism
- 2.10 Act vs. Sanction Utilitarianism
- 2.11 The Proof of Utility
- 2.12 The Sanctions of Utility
- 3. Mill's Liberalism
- 3.1 Liberal Principles and the Categorical Approach
- 3.2 Categories, Rights, and Utility
- 3.3 Freedom of Expression
- 3.4 A Perfectionist Defense of Basic Liberties
- 3.5 Limits on Liberty
- 3.6 The Harm Principle
- 3.7 Paternalism
- 3.8 Censorship
- 3.9 Offense
- 3.10 Moralism
- 3.11 The Categorical Approach Revisited
- 3.12 Liberalism and Utilitarianism
- 4. Democratic Equality
- 5. Sexual Equality
- 6. Concluding Remarks
- Other Internet Resources
- Related Entries
One cannot properly appreciate the development of Mill's moral and political philosophy without some understanding of his intellectual background. Mill was raised in the tradition of Philosophical Radicalism, made famous by Jeremy Bentham (1748-1832), John Austin (1790-1859), and his father James Mill (1773-1836), which applied utilitarian principles in a self-conscious and systematic way to issues of institutional design and social reform. Utilitarianism assesses actions and institutions in terms of their effects on human happiness and enjoins us to perform actions and design institutions so that they promote — in one formulation, maximize — human happiness. Utilitarianism was a progressive doctrine historically, principally because of its universal scope — its insistence that everyone's happiness matters — and its egalitarian conception of impartiality — its insistence that everyone's happiness matters equally. Because of these general characteristics of utilitarianism, the Radicals' application of utilitarian principles to social institutions tended to challenge traditional institutions of class and privilege.
As documented in his Autobiography (1873), Mill was groomed from birth by his father to become the ultimate Victorian intellectual and utilitarian reformer. As part of this apprenticeship, Mill was exposed to an extremely demanding education, shaped by utilitarian principles. He began Greek at the age of three. He had read considerable Greek and Latin history, poetry, and philosophy by the age eight. At the age of eleven he helped edit his father's History of India. At the age of thirteen he began a systematic study of political economy. While Mill followed the strict intellectual regimen laid down by his father for many years, the intellectual and emotional stress that he was asked to shoulder eventually proved too much. He suffered a profound intellectual and emotional crisis in the period 1826-1830. Mill discusses this emotional crisis in his Autobiography. In contrast with contemporary memoirs, Mill does not rush to blame his father for all of his troubles. However, he does think that his training was too strictly intellectual and ignored his emotional needs and development. Mill's recovery was assisted by friendships he formed with Thomas Carlyle and Samuel Coleridge, who introduced him to ideas and texts from the Romantic and Conservative traditions. As Mill emerged from his depression, he became more concerned with the development of well-rounded individuals and with the role of feeling, culture, and creativity in the happiness of individuals.
Though Mill never renounced the liberal and utilitarian tradition and mission that he inherited from his father, his mental crisis and recovery greatly influenced his interpretation of this tradition. He became critical of the moral psychology of Bentham and his father and of some of the social theory underlying their plans for reform. It is arguable that Mill tends to downplay the significance of his innovations and to underestimate the intellectual discontinuities between himself and his father. One measure of the extent of Mill's departure from the views of Bentham and James Mill is that Mill's contributions to the utilitarian tradition led his father to view him as a defector from the utilitarian cause (Auto ch. V, para. 24/CW I 189). We need to try to understand the extent of the transformation Mill brings to the utilitarian and liberal principles of the Radicals.
Utilitarianism, in its most general form, claims that one should assess persons, actions, and institutions by how well they promote human (or perhaps sentient) happiness. This claim Mill shares with his forbears. But he modified their assumptions about human motivation, the nature of happiness, the relationship between happiness and duty, and the justification of utilitarianism.
Some of Mill's most significant innovations to the utilitarian tradition concern his claims about the nature of happiness and the role of happiness in human motivation. Bentham and James Mill understand happiness hedonistically, as consisting in pleasure, and they believe that the ultimate aim of each person is predominantly, if not exclusively, the promotion of the agent's own happiness (pleasure). Mill rejects their psychological egoism (hedonism) and significantly modifies their assumptions about happiness when he introduces his doctrine of higher pleasures. To appreciate Mill's innovations here, we need to understand some aspects of the Radical legacy he inherits.
Bentham begins his Introduction to the Principles of Morals and Legislation (1789) with this hedonistic assumption about human motivation.
Nature has placed mankind under the governance of two sovereign masters, pain and pleasure [ch. I, section 1].
Bentham allows that we may be moved by the pleasures and pains of others. But he appears to think that these other-regarding pleasures can move us only insofar as we take pleasure in the pleasure of others (V 32). This suggests that Bentham endorses a version of the principle of psychological egoism, which claims that the agent's own happiness is and can be the only ultimate object of his desires. In his unfinished Constitutional Code (1822-32), Bentham makes this commitment to psychological egoism clear.
On the occasion of every act he exercises, every human being is led to pursue that line of conduct which, according to his view of the case, taken by him at the moment, will be in the highest degree contributory to his own greatest happiness [Introduction, §2].
Bentham is a hedonist about utility or happiness, treating happiness as consisting in pleasure (Principles I 3). So the version of psychological egoism to which he is attracted is psychological hedonism. Bentham does not say why he believes that one's own pleasure is the only ultimate object of desire. He may see it as a reasonable generalization from his observations about the motives underlying human behavior.
James Mill also treats psychological hedonism as axiomatic in his Essay on Government (1824). For instance, he claims
The desire, therefore, of that power which is necessary to render the persons and properties of human beings subservient to our pleasures, is the grand governing law of human nature [Essay IV; cf. Essay V].
In these pronouncements about human motivation, the Radicals are psychological egoists and hedonists. Sometimes, Bentham appears to allow for a more diverse set of ultimate motives or interests, including other-regarding motives (Principles X 25, 36-38; XI 31; Table of the Springs of Action II 2). But these concessions to psychological pluralism are exceptional. Even in contexts where Bentham recognizes motivation that is not ultimately self-interested, he appears to treat it as weaker and less dependable than self-interested motivation (Book of Fallacies 392-93).
Bentham claims that utility not only describes human motivation but sets the standard of right and wrong (I 1).
By the principle of utility is meant that principle which approves or disapproves of every action whatsoever, according to the tendency which it appears to have to augment or diminish the happiness of the party whose interest is in question … [I 2].
It remains to be determined whose happiness matters. One might imagine that it is the utility of the agent. This would be the ethical counterpart to psychological egoism. However, Bentham's answer, and the answer characteristic of utilitarianism, is the happiness of the community or the happiness of all (I 4-10). Bentham says that our account of right action, obligation, and duty ought to be governed by the principle of utility (I 9-10). This seems to imply that an action is right or obligatory just insofar as it promotes utility. But then the right or obligatory act would seem to be the one that promotes utility the most or maximizes utility. For these reasons, it is common to understand Bentham as combining psychological hedonism and hedonistic utilitarianism.
But, if this is Bentham's view, he faces a problem, for he combines the ethical claim that each of us ought to aim at the general happiness (pleasure) with the psychological claim that each of us can only aim (ultimately) at his own happiness (pleasure). Here we seem to have a special case of the conflict between psychological egoism and morality's other-regarding or altruistic demands. It is hard to see how to reconcile psychological egoism and a universalist moral theory.
Bentham is not unaware of this tension. He addresses part of the problem in the political context in other writings, notably his Plan for Parliamentary Reform (1817). In the political context, the problem is how we can get self-interested rulers to rule in the interest of the governed, as utilitarianism implies that they should. Bentham's answer invokes his commitment to representative democracy. We can reconcile self-interested motivation and promotion of the common good if we make rulers democratically accountable to (all) those whom they govern, for this tends to make the interest of the governed and the interest of the governors coincide. Bentham's argument, elaborated by James Mill in his Essay on Government, is something like this.
- Each person acts only to promote his own interests.
- The proper object of government is the interest of the governed.
- Hence, rulers will pursue the proper object of government if and only if their interests coincide with those of the governed.
- A ruler's interest will coincide with those of the governed if and only if he is politically accountable to the governed.
- Hence, rulers must be democratically accountable.
It was this reasoning that led Bentham and Mill to advocate democratic reforms that included extending the franchise to workers and peasant farmers.
This attempt to harness self-interest for the promotion of the common good is ingenious and has been an incredibly influential idea in theories of institutional design. Whether it is an adequate response to the tension between utilitarianism and psychological egoism is another matter. Even in the political context it only reduces the conflict between egoistic motivation and impartial utilitarian demands. Until such time as political leaders are made fully accountable, the political demands of utilitarianism must remain irrelevant. Also notice that the coincidence Bentham seeks between the interest of the governed and the interest of the governors is artificial. Political accountability will not effectively curb political egoism if rulers are sufficiently good at deceiving the public. Finally, notice that Bentham's solution to the tension has no obvious counterpart in the case of private, rather than public or political, conduct. Perhaps we can make political leaders accountable to citizens. But can we effectively make one citizen accountable to others?
In Principles Chapter IV Bentham sets out his conception of pleasure and utility in more detail, distinguishing between intrinsic and relational dimensions of pleasures. For our purposes, some dimensions matter more than others. Hedonism says that pleasure is the one and only intrinsic good and that pain is the one and only intrinsic evil. All other things have only extrinsic or instrumental value depending on whether and, if so, how much pleasure or pain they produce. Because the utilitarian asks us to maximize value, he has to be able to make sense of quantities or magnitudes of value associated with different options, where he assigns value to pleasure and disvalue to pain. Intensity, duration, and extent would appear to be the most relevant variables here. Each option is associated with various pleasures and pains both within a single life and across lives. For any given option we must find out how many pleasures and pains it produces, whether those occur in a single life or in different lives. For every distinct pleasure and pain, we must calculate its intensity and its duration. That would give us the total amount of (net) pleasure (or pain) associated with each option. Then we must do that option with greatest total. If there are two (or more) options with the greatest total, we are free to select any of these.
Bentham does not assume that our estimates of what will maximize utility will always be reliable. Nor does he assume that we should always try to maximize utility (I 13; IV 6). Doing so is costly, and we may sometimes promote utility best by not trying to promote it directly. Nonetheless, utility, he thinks, is the standard of right conduct.
What was Mill's attitude toward this strand of psychological egoism and hedonism in the thinking of his Radical forbears? Henry Sidgwick (1838-1900), for one, read Mill as a psychological egoist (Methods 42-44). This is not just guilt by association. For it may appear that Mill endorses psychological egoism in his so-called “proof” of the principle of utility in Chapter IV of Utilitarianism. There, Mill aims to show that happiness is the one and only thing desirable in itself (IV 2). To do this, he argues that happiness is desirable in itself (IV 3), and a central premise in this argument is that everyone desires his own happiness (IV 3). Mill later argues that only happiness is desirable (IV 4).
But the proof does not reveal Mill to be a psychological egoist, much less a psychological hedonist. First, notice that in the proof he is primarily concerned with happiness, not pleasure, as an object of desire (IV 2-6). That doesn't require him to distinguish the two, but it does mean that support for psychological egoism wouldn't obviously be support for psychological hedonism. More importantly, Mill does not endorse psychological egoism. To see this, consider the structure of his proof.
Mill claims that the utilitarian must claim that happiness is the one and only thing desirable in itself (IV 2). He claims that the only proof of desirability is desire and proceeds to argue that happiness is the one and only thing desired. He argues that a person does desire his own happiness for its own sake and that, therefore, happiness as such is desired by and desirable for its own sake for humanity as a whole (IV 3). He then turns to defend the claim that happiness is the only thing desirable in itself, by arguing that apparent counterexamples (e.g. desires for virtue for its own sake) are not inconsistent with his claim (IV 4-6).
Later, we will look at the proof in more detail and discuss various worries about its cogency. The important point, for present purposes, is that Mill does not endorse psychological egoism here. He does say that each person has an ultimate desire for her own happiness, but he does not say that this is each person's only ultimate desire. Indeed, in the second half of the proof he allows that some agents have a disinterested concern for virtue and that they care about virtue for its own sake (IV 4-5). And what is true of virtue is no less true of less grand objects of desire, such as money or power (IV 6). These too it is possible to desire for their own sakes.
In fact, Mill offers an associationist story about the evolution of such intrinsic or ultimate desires. Like everyone else, the miser initially desires money only instrumentally, for the sake of the things that it allows him to buy. But, over time, the miser's desire transfers from the ends to the means such that he develops a concern for money for its own sake, independently of its instrumental value. Whether all of our desires originated in self-interested or specifically hedonistic desire Mill does not say. But he is clear that our own happiness and certainly our own pleasure are not the only intrinsic aims we have. If psychological egoism claims that one's own happiness is the only thing that is desired for its own sake, then this shows that Mill is not a psychological egoist.
Of course, he does say that these things are desired as parts of happiness, and this might seem to be compatible with a sophisticated version of psychological egoism. But there is room for doubt that Mill is endorsing even a sophisticated psychological egoism. First, he does say that people can develop a purely “disinterested” desire for virtue itself, “without looking to any end beyond it” (IV 5). So it is not clear that he thinks one need desire virtue as a part of happiness. Moreover, if the concern with virtue is disinterested, it is hard to see how this involves pursuing one's own interest. Indeed, it is not clear that Mill is here talking about desiring virtue for its constitutive contribution to (a) the agent's own happiness or (b) the general happiness. Only (a) could possibly provide some comfort to psychological egoism. But presumably Mill's proof requires (b); it requires that it be the general happiness that is the one and only thing desirable for its own sake. But if Mill has (b) in mind, then he's given up on psychological egoism.
Difficulties with the proof itself make it hard to know just what Mill is assuming about human motivation. Perhaps all we can say for sure is that the proof does not provide good reason to read Mill as a psychological egoist. If we look outside of Utilitarianism we can find even clearer evidence of Mill's doubts about psychological egoism and hedonism. In a note to his edition of James Mill's Analysis of the Phenomena of the Human Mind (1869) John Stuart Mill diagnoses a possible equivocation in his father's doctrine.
That the pleasures or pains of another person can only be pleasurable or painful to us through the association of our own pleasures and pains with them, is true in one sense, which is probably that intended by the author, but not true in another, against which he has not sufficiently guarded his mode of expression. It is evident, that the only pleasures or pains of which we have direct experience … [are] those felt by ourselves … [and] that the pleasure or pain with which we contemplate the pleasure or pain felt by someone else, is itself a pleasure or pain of our own. But if it be meant that in such cases the pleasure or pain is consciously referred to self, I take this to be a mistake [II 217-18].
In his “Remarks on Bentham's Philosophy” (1833) Mill urges a similar caution in understanding Bentham.
In laying down as a philosophical axiom that men's actions are always obedient to their interests, Mr. Bentham did no more than dress up the very trivial proposition that all people do what they feel themselves most disposed to do ….. He by no means intended by this assertion to impute universal selfishness to mankind, for he reckoned the motive of sympathy as an interest [para. 26/CW X 13-14].
In both passages Mill makes what is now a familiar diagnosis of the troubles with psychological egoism. He thinks that psychological egoism is ambiguous between a true but trivial thesis about the ownership of desire — an agent necessarily acts on his own desires — and a substantive but wildly implausible thesis about the content of desires — an agent's ultimate desire is always and necessarily to promote his own interests or pleasure. If so, there is no thesis that is both substantive and plausible. The substantive thesis may seem speciously attractive if we tacitly confuse it with the trivially true thesis. But it seems clear from Bentham's and James Mill's worries about the conflict between ruler's interests and the interest of the ruled that they intend something like the substantive psychological thesis. But if they do so because they conflate it with the trivial but true thesis, then they commit the fallacy of equivocation.
In A System of Logic (1843) Mill again provides a critique of psychological hedonism that relies on an associationist account of the development of plural ends that are psychologically autonomous (VI.ii.4/CW VIII 842). Something one desires originally only as an instrumental means to pleasure comes, by a process of association, to be desired for itself. In the process, Mill claims, the desire acquires psychological autonomy such that it can conflict with the prudential or hedonist concerns from which it originated. For instance, this is true of the miser. He starts off, like others, desiring money only as a means, for the pleasures that it can buy him. But he comes, over time, by a process of association or habituation, to care about money itself. In this way, the miser's concern for money can acquire psychological autonomy. Freed of its instrumental origin, the miser's desire for money can conflict with and override the prudential concern from which it originated. Here Mill denies the psychological hedonist view that pleasure is the sole ultimate object of our desires. Likewise, he denies the more general psychological egoist thesis that one's own happiness is the sole ultimate object of desire.
So it seems clear that Mill rejects the traditional substantive doctrines of psychological egoism and hedonism that Bentham and his father sometimes defended or suggested. This is really part of a larger criticism of the conception of psychology and human nature underlying Benthamite utilitarianism, which Mill elaborates in his essays “On Bentham” (1838) and “Remarks on Bentham's Philosophy”. Mill links Bentham's faults to the narrowness of his philosophy and personality.
Bentham's contempt, then, for all other schools of thinkers; his determination to create a philosophy wholly out of the materials furnished by his own mind, and by minds like his own; was his first disqualification as a philosopher. His second, was the incompleteness of his own mind as a representative of universal human nature. In many of the most natural and strongest feelings of human nature he had no sympathy; from many of its graver experiences he was altogether cut off; and the faculty by which one mind understands a mind different from itself, and throws itself into the feelings of that other mind, was denied him by his deficiency of Imagination [“Bentham” para. 23/CW X 91; cf. para. 26/CW X93].
Mill's desire to distance himself from Benthamite assumptions about human nature and psychology are also reflected in Mill's conception of happiness and his doctrine of higher pleasures.
Whatever his differences with Benthamite utilitarianism, Mill never abandons the utilitarian tradition of the Radicals. Mill explains his commitment to utilitarianism early in Chapter II of Utilitarianism.
The creed which accepts as the foundations of morals “utility” or the “greatest happiness principle” holds that actions are right in proportion as they tend to promote happiness; wrong as they tend to produce the reverse of happiness. By happiness is intended pleasure and the absence of pain; by unhappiness, pain and the privation of pleasure [II 2; cf.II 1].
This famous passage is sometimes called the Proportionality Doctrine. It sounds like Bentham. The first sentence appears to endorse utilitarianism, while the second sentence appears to endorse a hedonistic conception of utilitarianism.
Mill immediately goes on to introduce his doctrine of higher pleasures, which he contrasts with Benthamite utilitarianism. Hedonism implies that the mental state of pleasure is the only thing having intrinsic value (and the mental state of pain is the only intrinsic evil). All other things have only extrinsic value; they have value just insofar as they bring about, mediately or directly, intrinsic value (or disvalue). It follows that actions, activities, etc.can have only extrinsic value, and it would seem that their value should depend entirely upon the quantity of pleasure that they produce, where quantity is a function of the number of pleasures, their intensity, and their duration. This would mean that one kind of activity or pursuit is intrinsically no better than another. If we correctly value one more than another, it must be because the first produces more numerous, intense, or durable pleasures than the other.
Mill worries that some will reject hedonism as a theory of value or happiness fit only for swine (II 3). In particular, he worries that opponents will assume that utilitarianism favors sensual or voluptuary pursuits (e.g. push-pin) over higher or nobler pursuits (e.g. poetry). Mill attempts to reassure readers that the utilitarian can and will defend the superiority of higher pleasures.
He begins by noting, with fairly obvious reference to Bentham, that the hedonist can defend higher pursuits as extrinsically superior on the ground that they produce more intense, durable, and fecund pleasures (II 4). Presumably, the Benthamite should claim that neither poetry nor push-pin is intrinsically good. A fortiori neither is intrinsically superior to the other. We can only compare their extrinsic value based on the quantity of pleasure they produce, and this must be an empirical issue. As Mill remarks in the essay “On Bentham”
He [Bentham] says somewhere in his works, that, “quantity of pleasure being equal, push-pin is as good as poetry” [para. 64/CW X 113].
In fact, Bentham appears to have thought not simply that push-pin could be as valuable as poetry but that in fact it was more valuable. In The Rationale of Reward Bentham writes
The utility of all these arts and sciences … is exactly in proportion to the pleasure they yield. Every other species of preeminence which may be attempted to be established among them is altogether fanciful. Prejudice apart, the game of push-pin is of equal value with the arts and sciences of music and poetry. If the game of push-pin furnish more pleasure, it is more valuable than either. Everybody can play at push-pin; poetry and music are relished only by a few. The game of push-pin is always innocent: it were well could the same always be asserted of poetry. Indeed, between poetry and truth there is a natural opposition: false morals and fictitious nature. … If poetry and music deserve to be preferred before a game of push-pin, it must be because they are calculated to gratify those individuals who are most difficult to be pleased. [III.i]
As Bentham suggests, the difficulty of pleasing high-brows must be a count against music and poetry, for it raises their opportunity costs. Moreover, the education that it takes to appreciate music and poetry is also more costly than that required to appreciate push-pin. So Bentham seems to be making out a case for the purity and extent of the pleasures of push-pin.
Presumably, Mill's claim is that Bentham's actual view of the comparative value of push-pin and poetry might be rejected. Indeed, this is one place where Mill thinks that Bentham wrongly projects from his own narrow experience and interests, specifically from his failure to understand and appreciate the value of the arts. Mill apparently thinks that the arts broaden one's sensibilities and imagination, so that even if the pleasures associated with the arts are sometimes impure or costly they nonetheless produce intense and durable pleasures directly and produce much more pleasure indirectly by cultivating our emotional sensibilities and imagination.
So Mill thinks that the Benthamite hedonist can defend the extrinsic superiority of higher pleasure. Nonetheless, he is not content with this defense of the superiority of higher pleasures. While agreeing with the strict hedonist that the higher pleasures produce a larger quantity of pleasure and so are extrinsically more valuable, he also insists that the greater value of intellectual pleasures can and should be put on a more secure footing (II 4). He explains these higher pleasures and links them with the preferences of a competent judge, in the following manner.
If I am asked what I mean by difference of quality in pleasures, or what makes one pleasure more valuable than another, merely as a pleasure, except its being greater in amount, there is but one possible answer. If one of the two is, by those who are competently acquainted with both, placed so far above the other that they prefer it, even though knowing it to be attended with a greater amount of discontent, and would not resign it for any quantity of the other pleasure which their nature is capable of, we are justified in ascribing to the preferred enjoyment a superiority in quality so far outweighing quantity as to render it, in comparison, of small account[II 5].
Indeed, Mill seems to claim here not just that higher pleasures are intrinsically more valuable than lower ones but that they are incomparably better (II 6).
This certainly goes beyond Bentham's quantitative hedonism. In fact, it is not even clear that Mill's higher pleasures doctrine is consistent with hedonism. Mill's position here is hard to pin down, in part because he uses the term ‘pleasure’ sometimes to refer to (a) a certain kind of mental state or sensation and at other times to refer to (b) non-mental items, such as actions, activities, and pursuits that do or can cause pleasurable mental states (cf. the way in which someone might refer to sexual activity as a bodily pleasure). We might call (a)-type pleasures subjective pleasures and (b)-type pleasures objective pleasures. What's unclear is whether Mill's higher pleasures are subjective pleasures or objective pleasures. His discussion concerns activities that employ our higher faculties. What's unclear is whether higher pleasures refer to mental states or sensations caused by higher activities or the activities themselves.
It might seem clear that we should interpret higher pleasures as subjective pleasures. After all, Mill has just told us that he is a hedonist about happiness. The Radicals may not have always been clear about the kind of mental state or sensation they take pleasure to be, but it seems clear that they conceive of it as some kind of mental state or sensation. This is certainly the way the hedonist tradition is usually understood. Some, like Bentham, appear to conceive of pleasure as a sensation with a distinctive kind of qualitative feel. Others, perhaps despairing of finding qualia common to all disparate kinds of pleasures, tend to understand pleasures functionally, as mental states or sensations the subject, whose states these are, wants to continue and is disposed to prolong. Pleasures, understood functionally, could have very different qualitative feels and yet still be pleasures. Insofar as Mill does discuss subjective pleasures, he is not clear which, if either, of these conceptions of pleasure he favors. Nonetheless, it may seem natural to assume that as a hedonist he conceives of pleasures as subjective pleasures. According to this interpretation, Mill is focusing on pleasurable sensations and then distinguishing higher and lower pleasures by references to their causes. Higher pleasures are pleasures caused by the exercise of our higher faculties, whereas lower pleasures are pleasures caused by the exercise of our lower capacities. But this interpretation of the higher pleasures doctrine has some costs.
One concern is that conceding this difference between higher and lower pleasures does not imply the qualitative superiority of the former. It is not obvious why a hedonist should think that higher pleasures, as such, should be more valuable than lower ones. The pleasures or sensations, as such, should be of equal value, though some activities that produce pleasure may produce more intense, more durable, or more numerous pleasures. But then there appears to be a problem reconciling this reading of the higher pleasures doctrine with hedonism.
Another problem for this reading of the higher pleasures doctrine is that various features of Mill's discussion suggest that he understands higher pleasures as objective pleasures. First, we have independent evidence that Mill sometimes uses the word “pleasure” to refer to objective pleasures. For instance, in the second part of the “proof” of the principle of utility in Chapter IV Mill counts music, virtue, and health as pleasures (IV 5). These seem to be objective pleasures. Elsewhere in his discussion of higher pleasures in Chapter II, Mill equates a person's pleasures with his “indulgences” (II 7) and with his “mode of existence” (II 8). Here too he seems to be discussing objective pleasures. When Mill introduces higher pleasures (II 4) he is clearly discussing, among other things, intellectual pursuits and activities. He claims to be arguing that what the quantitative hedonist finds extrinsically more valuable is also intrinsically more valuable (II 4, 7). But what the quantitative hedonist defends as extrinsically more valuable are complex activities and pursuits, such as writing or reading poetry, not mental states. Because Mill claims that these very same things are intrinsically, and not just extrinsically, more valuable, his higher pleasures would appear to be intellectual activities and pursuits, rather than mental states. Finally, in paragraphs4-8 Mill links the preferences of competent judges and the greater value of the objects of their preferences. But among the things Mill thinks competent judges would prefer are activities and pursuits. And, in particular, in commenting on the passage quoted above (II5), Mill writes
Now it is an unquestionable fact that those who are equally acquainted with and equally capable of appreciating and enjoying both do give a most marked preference to the manner of existence which employs their higher faculties [II 6; emphasis added].
Here Mill is identifying the higher pleasures with activities and pursuits that exercise our higher capacities. He also claims that happiness includes “many and various pleasures, with a decided predominance of the active over the passive …” (II 12). Whereas activities can be passive or active, it is hard to see how pleasures themselves would be.
Perhaps this is not absolutely conclusive evidence that Mill's higher pleasures are objective pleasures, but it has significant probative value. Insofar as Mill's higher pleasures doctrine concerns objective pleasures, it appears anti-hedonistic for two reasons. First, he claims that the intellectual pursuits have value out of proportion to the amount of contentment or pleasure (the mental state) that they produce. This would contradict the traditional hedonist claim that the extrinsic value of an activity is proportional to the quantity of pleasure associated with it. Second, Mill claims that these activities are intrinsically more valuable than the lower pursuits (II 7). But the traditional hedonist claims that the mental state of pleasure is the one and only intrinsic good; activities can have only extrinsic value, and no activity can be intrinsically more valuable than another.
Whichever way we read Mill's higher pleasures doctrine, it is hard to square that doctrine with hedonism, as traditionally formulated. This apparent inconsistency was been noted by many of Mill's subsequent critics, including Sidgwick (Methods 93n, 94, 121), F.H. Bradley (Ethical Studies 116-20), T.H. Green (Prolegomena to Ethics §§162-63), and G.E. Moore (Principia Ethica 71-72, 77-81). Green's discussion is especially instructive. After raising some of these questions about the compatibility of the higher pleasures doctrine with hedonism, Green focuses on Mill's explanation of the preferences of competent judges for modes of existence that employ their higher faculties. Higher pleasures are those things (e.g.activities) that a competent judge would prefer, even if they produced less pleasure in her than the lower “pleasures” would (II 5). But why should competent judges prefer activities that they often find less pleasurable unless they believe that these activities are more valuable? Mill explains the fact that competent judges prefer activities that exercise their rational capacities by appeal to their sense of dignity.
We may give what explanation we please of this unwillingness [on the part of a competent judge ever to sink into what he feels to be a lower grade of existence] …but its most appropriate appellation is a sense of dignity, which all human beings possess in one form or other, and in some, though by no means in exact, proportion to their higher faculties …[II 6].
Green thinks that the dignity passage undermines hedonism (Prolegomena §§164-66, 171). In claiming that it is the dignity of a life in which the higher capacities are exercised and the competent judge's sense of her own dignity that explains her preference for those activities, Mill implies that her preferences reflect judgments about the value that these activities have independently of their being the object of desire or the source of pleasure. We take pleasure in these activities because they are valuable; they are not valuable, because they are pleasurable. This means that the preferences of competent judges should be understood as evidence of the greater value of the object of their preferences, rather than as constituting the object of their preferences as more valuable.
To see Green's point, think of competent judges as demi-gods. In the dignity passage, Mill is making the same sort of point that Socrates does in discussing Euthyphro's definition of piety as what all the gods love (Euthyphro 9c-11b). Socrates thought the gods' attitudes would be principled, not arbitrary. But this meant that their love presupposed, rather than explained, piety and justice. Similarly, Mill thinks that the preferences of competent judges are not arbitrary, but principled, reflecting a sense of the value of the higher capacities. But this would make his doctrine of higher pleasures fundamentally anti-hedonistic, insofar it explains the superiority of higher activities, not in terms of the pleasure they produce, but rather in terms of the dignity or value of the kind of life characterized by the exercise of higher capacities. And it is sensitivity to the dignity of such a life that explains the categorical preference that competent judges supposedly have for higher activities.
If we read Mill's higher pleasures doctrine as Green suggests, then we can begin to see the possibility and the appeal of reading Mill as a kind of perfectionist about happiness, who claims that human happiness consists in the proper exercise of those capacities essential to our nature. For instance, Mill suggests this sort of perfectionist perspective on happiness when early in On Liberty he describes the utilitarian foundation of his defense of individual liberties.
It is proper to state that I forego any advantage which could be derived to my argument from the idea of abstract right as a thing independent of utility. I regard utility as the ultimate appeal on all ethical questions; but it must be utility in the largest sense, grounded on the permanent interests of man as a progressive being [I 11].
Mill apparently believes that the sense of dignity of a (properly self-conscious) progressive being would give rise to a categorical preference for activities that exercise his or her higher capacities. In claiming that “it is better to be a human being dissatisfied than a pig satisfied; better to be Socrates dissatisfied than a fool satisfied” (U: II 6), Mill recognizes capacities for self-examination and practical deliberation as among our higher capacities.
This concern with self-examination and practical deliberation is, of course, a central theme in On Liberty. There he articulates the interest that progressive beings have in reflective decision-making.
He who lets the world, or his own portion of it, choose his plan of life for him has no need of any other faculty than the ape-like one of imitation. He who chooses his plan for himself employs all his faculties. He must use observation to see, reasoning and judgment to foresee, activity to gather materials for decision, discrimination to decide, and when he has decided, firmness and self-control to hold his deliberate decision. And these qualities he requires and exercises exactly in proportion as the part of his conduct which he determines according to his own judgment and feelings is a large one. It is possible that he might be guided in some good path, and kept out of harm's way, without any of these things. But what will be his comparative worth as a human being [III 4]?
Even if we agree that these deliberative capacities are unique to humans or that humans possess them to a higher degree than other creatures, we might wonder in what way their possession marks us as progressive beings or their exercise is important to human happiness. Mill thinks an account of human happiness ought to reflect the kinds of beings we are or what is valuable about human nature. His discussion of responsibility in A System of Logic (“Of Liberty and Necessity”) suggests that he thinks that humans are responsible agents and that this is what marks us as progressive beings. There he claims that capacities for practical deliberation are necessary for responsibility. In particular, he claims that moral responsibility involves a kind of self-mastery or self-governance in which one can distinguish between the strength of one's desires and impulses and their suitability or authority and in which one's actions reflect one's deliberations about what is suitable or right to do (VI.ii.3/CW VIII 841). Non-responsible agents, such as brutes or small children, appear to act on their strongest desires or, if they deliberate, to deliberate only about the instrumental means to the satisfaction of their strongest desires. By contrast, responsible agents must be able to deliberate about the appropriateness of their desires and regulate their actions according to these deliberations. If this is right, then Mill can claim that possession and use of our deliberative capacities mark us as progressive beings, because they are what mark as moral agents who are responsible. If our happiness should reflect the sort of being we are, then Mill can argue that higher activities that exercise these deliberative capacities form the principal or most important ingredient in human happiness.
We have been focusing on Mill's conception of happiness. Though Mill appears to endorse Bentham's commitment to the utilitarian claim that it is our duty to promote happiness, he seems to have a very different conception of happiness. His higher pleasures doctrine seems to involve a significant departure from Bentham's hedonistic conception of happiness. Indeed, we have seen that there is a case to be made for reading Mill as a kind of perfectionist about happiness who stresses the intrinsic value of activities that exercise our higher capacities. Because Mill introduces these apparently anti-hedonistic claims about happiness with an apparent endorsement of hedonism (I 2), it is unclear if he has a consistent conception of happiness. The apparently hedonistic formulation at the beginning of ChapterII, Mill insists, is only a first approximation that needs further articulation.
To give a clear view of the moral standard set up by the theory, much more requires to be said; in particular, what things it includes in the ideas of pain and pleasure, and to what extent this is left an open question [II 2].
This should be a puzzling claim if we assume, as Bentham seems to have, that ‘pleasure‘ refers to a simple, qualitative mental state or sensation, for then, it is not clear what further analysis of pleasure should be necessary or even possible.
There is no puzzle if Mill is speaking here, as he does elsewhere, of objective pleasures. If he uses the word ‘pleasure‘ here to refer, not to any mental state, but to the activities that typically produce pleasurable mental states, then he can consistently say that happiness consists in pleasure — objective pleasure — and offer an objective or even perfectionist conception of happiness whose dominant component is the exercise of deliberative capacities. And this is just what he seems to do. His defense of higher pleasures in the paragraphs immediately following this initial statement of utilitarianism should be read as an important articulation of this initial statement that yields an anti-hedonistic conception of happiness.
There is no doubt that his initial formulation of his conception of happiness in terms of pleasure misleadingly leads us to expect greater continuity between his own brand of utilitarianism and Benthamite utilitarianism than we actually find. Mill's break with the hedonistic utilitarianism of Bentham and his father would have been clearer if he had avoided defining utilitarianism in terms of pleasure and pain and eschewed talk of “higher pleasures” and simply argued for a conception of happiness that recognizes the intrinsic superiority of the higher activities. However, this seems to be how we should understand the doctrine of higher pleasures. The fact that he uses the word ‘pleasure‘ to refer to objective pleasures allows us to recover a consistent and coherent doctrine from his somewhat misleading claims.
As Mill's Proportionality Doctrine makes clear, he endorses the utilitarian idea that duty or right action is to be defined in terms of the promotion of happiness. But exactly how Mill thinks duty is related to happiness is not entirely clear. To understand some of the different strands in his conception of utilitarianism, we need to make some distinctions. In particular, we need to distinguish between direct and indirect utilitarianism.
- Direct Utilitarianism: Any object of moral assessment (e.g. action, motive, policy, or institution) should be assessed by and in proportion to the value of its consequences for the general happiness.
- Indirect Utilitarianism: Any object of moral assessment should be assessed, not by the value of its consequences for the general happiness, but by its conformity to something else (e.g. norms or motives) that has (have) good or optimal acceptance value.
So formulated, direct and indirect utilitarianism are general theories that apply, at least in principle, to any object of moral assessment. But our focus here is on right action or duty. Act utilitarianism is the most familiar form of direct utilitarianism applied to action, whereas the most common indirect utilitarian theory of duty is rule utilitarianism.
- Act Utilitarianism: An act is right insofar as its consequences for the general happiness are at least as good as any alternative available to the agent.
- Rule Utilitarianism: An act is right insofar as it conforms to a rule whose acceptance value for the general happiness is at least as great as any alternative rule available to the agent.
This conception of act utilitarianism is both maximizing, because it identifies the right action with the best available action, and scalar, because it recognizes that rightness can come in degrees, depending on the action's proximity to the best. The right act is the optimal act, but some suboptimal acts can be more right and less wrong than others. Similarly, this conception of rule utilitarianism assesses rules in both maximizing and scalar fashion.
Act utilitarianism appears to say that we should adhere to familiar moral precepts about honesty, fidelity, and nonmaleficence only when doing so has the best consequences. It is a counter-intuitive doctrine to the extent that we regard some of these precepts as categorical moral rules or principles. Rule utilitarianism may seem less counter-intuitive, because it can explain why one ought to adhere to certain rules or precepts, even when doing so does not have the best consequences, provided doing so is generally optimal. Act utilitarianism must condemn following rules when doing so is suboptimal; rule utilitarianism need not. But not everyone agrees that this makes rule utilitarianism superior to act utilitarianism. Some think that we are wrong to embrace categorical moral rules and principles. Though these rules and principles might be good rules of thumb, they are not exceptionless generalizations. Moreover, rule utilitarianism may seem ad hoc. If utility is the appropriate test for rules, then why shouldn't we assess actions by the same criterion? Isn't rule utilitarianism a form of irrational rule worship? I raise these issues here, not to take a stand on them, but to indicate what might be at stake in the debate between direct and indirect forms of utilitarianism.
We might expect a utilitarian (act or rule) to apply the utilitarian principle in her deliberations. Consider act utilitarianism for a moment. We might expect such a utilitarian to be motivated by pure disinterested benevolence and to deliberate by calculating expected utility. But it is a practical question how to reason or be motivated, and act utilitarianism implies that this practical question, like all practical questions, is correctly answered by what would maximize utility. Utilitarian calculation is time-consuming and often unreliable or subject to bias and distortion. For such reasons, we may better approximate the utilitarian standard if we don't always try to approximate it. Mill says that to suppose that one must always consciously employ the utilitarian principle in making decisions
… is to mistake the very meaning of a standard of morals and confound the rule of action with the motive of it. It is the business of ethics to tell us what are our duties, or by what test we may know them; but no system of ethics requires that the sole motive of all we do shall be a feeling of duty; on the contrary, ninety-nine hundredths of all our actions are done from other motives, and rightly so done if the rule of duty does not condemn them [II 18].
Later utilitarians, such as Sidgwick, have made essentially the same point, insisting that utilitarianism provides a standard of right action, not necessarily as a decision procedure (Methods 413).
If utilitarianism is itself the standard of right conduct, not a decision procedure, then what sort of decision procedure should the utilitarian endorse, and what role should the principle of utility play in moral reasoning? As we will see, Mill thinks that much moral reasoning should be governed by secondary precepts or principles about such things as fidelity, fair play, and honesty that make no direct reference to utility but whose general observance does promote utility. These secondary principles should be set aside in favor of direct appeals to the utilitarian first principle in cases in which adherence to the secondary precept would have obviously inferior consequences or in which such secondary principles conflict (II 19, 24-25).
The question that concerns us here is what kind of utilitarian standard Mill endorses. Is he an act utilitarian, a rule utilitarian, or some other kind of indirect utilitarian?
Several of Mill's characterizations of utilitarianism imply or at least suggest a form of direct utilitarianism, specifically act utilitarianism. Chapter II, we saw, is where Mill purports to say what the doctrine of utilitarianism does and does not say. In the opening paragraph, he tells us that utilitarians are “those who stand up for utility as the test of right and wrong” (II 1). According to the Proportionality Doctrine, introduced in the next paragraph, utilitarianism holds “that actions are right in proportion as they tend to promote happiness; wrong as they tend to produce the reverse of happiness” (II 2). Later in that chapter, he says that it requires that “utility or happiness [be] considered as the directive rule of human conduct” (II 8). Still later in Chapter II, he describes utilitarianism as a “standard of what is right in conduct” (II 17). Even Chapter V, which will eventually introduce some indirect elements, begins with Mill asserting that utilitarianism is “the doctrine that utility or happiness is the criterion of right and wrong” (V 1). These passages all seem to endorse a form of direct utilitarianism, specifically act utilitarianism.
But not everyone agrees. J.O. Urmson famously defended a rule utilitarian reading of Mill (1953). One of Urmson's reasons for this rule utilitarian reading appeals to Mill's reliance on various rules and secondary principles in moral reasoning. We will examine that rationale shortly. But, perhaps surprisingly, Urmson also appeals to the Proportionality Doctrine as requiring a rule utilitarian interpretation of Mill.
A. Felicific Tendencies. Recall that the Proportionality Doctrine says, in part, that utilitarianism holds that actions are right in proportion as they tend to promote happiness; wrong as they tend to produce the reverse of happiness (II 2). Urmson claims that we can make sense of an action's tendency to produce good or bad consequences only as a claim about what is true of a class or type of actions. Token actions produce specifiable consequences; only types of actions have tendencies. On Urmson's interpretation, Mill is really saying that an action is right if it is a token of a type of act that tends to have good or optimal consequences. But then the Proportionality Doctrine would espouse a form of rule utilitarianism.
But Urmson's interpretation of the Proportionality Doctrine is problematic. First, it was common among the Philosophical Radicals to formulate utilitarianism, as the Proportionality Doctrine does, in terms of the felicific tendencies of actions. For instance, Bentham does this early in his Introduction to the Principles of Morals and Legislation.
By the principle of utility is meant that principle which approves or disapproves of every action whatsoever, according to the tendency which it appears to have to augment or diminish the happiness of the party whose interest is in question: or, what is the same thing in other words, to promote or oppose that happiness. I say of every action whatsoever; and therefore not only every action of a private individual, but of every measure of government [I 2; cf. I 3, 6].
Here Bentham clearly ascribes the felicific tendency to action tokens, and he equates an action's felicific tendency with the extent to which it promotes utility. Later, Bentham repeats this extensional understanding of tendencies.
The general tendency of an act is more or less pernicious, according to the sum total of its consequences: that is, according to the differences between the sum of such as are good, and the sum of such as are evil [VII 2; cf. IV 5].
If we interpret Mill's Proportionality Doctrine against the background of similar claims made by Bentham, then we have strong evidence against Urmson's reading and in favor of an act utilitarian reading of the Proportionality Doctrine (cf. Berger 1984: 73-78).
Second, we might note another act utilitarian understanding of the Proportionality Doctrine. Particular actions have many consequences that are distributed both across persons and across times. The felicific or hedonic valence of these various consequences can be mixed. A given act may have consequences that are good for A and B but bad for C or bad for A and B in the short-run but better for them in the long-run. We could speak of an action's tendency to promote happiness either as a way of picking out its beneficial consequences or perhaps as a way of signaling that its beneficial consequences outweigh or predominate over its harmful consequences. Sometimes, Bentham does just this (Principles IV 5). But then the Proportionality Doctrine would be asserting that an action is right insofar as it has beneficial consequences or insofar as its beneficial consequences predominate. But these are act utilitarian claims.
B. Secondary Principles. But Urmson does not appeal only to the Proportionality Doctrine to support his rule utilitarian interpretation. He also defends this interpretation as a reading of Mill's claims about the importance of secondary principles and rules in our moral reasoning. He recognizes that an act utilitarian might appeal to rules or principles as rules of thumb in doing utilitarian calculations but insists that Mill's secondary principles are not mere rules of thumb.
We can see the need for rules and principles that do not refer to utility by remembering Mill's distinction between a moral standard and a decision procedure (II 19). In his Autobiography Mill notes the case for pursuing our own happiness indirectly (V 7/CW I 145). The need for indirection in the pursuit of one's own happiness is sometimes called the paradox of egoism. It requires that one pursue things other than one's own happiness for their own sakes in order to be happy. Mill treats these plural ends as secondary principles. He holds similar views about the need for secondary principles in the promotion of universal happiness. For instance, in Utilitarianism he defends the utilitarian's appeal to various moral precepts as secondary principles (II 24-25). But it is not entirely clear how these secondary principles are related to the utilitarian first principle. Mill's discussion of the indirect pursuit of one's own happiness suggests one possibility.
- Secondary principles are false targets for the successful pursuit of one's primary objective, as when one shouldn't think too hard about how to make a free throw if one wants to increase one's chances of making it or when one aims to the left of the green in golf in order to compensate for a slice in one's swing.
However, the immediate context of discussion in Chapter II of Utilitarianism suggests a different relationship.
- Secondary principles are generally but imperfectly reliable guides to doing what will maximize happiness.
Secondary principles, so understood, might sound like mere rules of thumb. But Mill seems to regard them as more than heuristics in a utility calculation. He seems to believe that secondary principles often satisfy two conditions.
- Following the principle generally but imperfectly leads to optimal results.
- The suboptimal results that adherence to the principle produces cannot be identified reliably and efficiently in advance.
When these two conditions are met, Mill believes, agents should follow these principles automatically and uncritically most of the time. They should periodically step back and review, as best they can, whether the principle continues to satisfy conditions (1) and (2). Also, they should set aside these secondary principles and make direct appeal to the principle of utility in unusual cases in which it is especially clear that the effects of adhering to the principle would be substantially suboptimal and in cases in which secondary principles, each of which has a utilitarian justification, conflict (II 19, 24-25). But, otherwise, they should regulate their conduct according to these secondary principles without recourse to the utilitarian first principle. Regulating one's behavior in this way by secondary principles is what will best promote happiness. Mill summarizes this picture in A System of Logic.
I do not mean to assert that the promotion of happiness should be itself the end of all actions, or even all rules of action. It is the justification, and ought to be the controller, of all ends, but it is not itself the sole end. There are many virtuous actions, and even virtuous modes of action (though the cases are, I think, less frequent than is often supposed) by which happiness in the particular instance is sacrificed, more pain being produced than pleasure. But conduct of which this can be truly asserted, admits of justification only because it can be shown that on the whole more happiness will exist in the world, if feelings are cultivated which will make people, in certain cases, regardless of happiness [VI.xii.7/CW VIII 952].
He makes similar claims in his essay “On Bentham” (para. 61/W X 110-11).
Mill's claims about the nature and importance of secondary principles and precepts that are and ought to be regulated by utilitarian first principles form an important part of his views about moral reasoning. His utilitarian justification of discrete secondary principles is intended as a contrast with the intuitionism of William Whewell and others. As he makes clear in his essay “Whewell on Moral Philosophy” (1852), Mill thinks that the intuitionist wrongly treats familiar moral precepts as ultimate moral factors whose justification is supposed to be self-evident to reason. By contrast, Mill's account of secondary principles recognizes their importance in moral reasoning but insists that they are neither innate nor infallible; they are precepts that have been adopted and internalized because of their acceptance value, and their continued use should be suitably regulated by their ongoing comparative acceptance value. Far from undermining utilitarian first principles, Mill thinks, appeal to the importance of such moral principles actually provides support for utilitarianism.
It seems clear that Mill is assigning to secondary principles or rules a role that goes beyond rules of thumb in a utilitarian calculation. In the passage from A System of Logic above he claims that utility justifies which principles or rules we follow. Does this commit Mill to rule utilitarianism? Urmson thinks it does.
But Mill's claims about secondary principles are not inconsistent with act utilitarianism. For one thing, though Mill does not treat secondary principles as mere rules of thumb in utilitarian calculation, he does not think that they should be followed uncritically or independently of their consequences. He thinks that they should be set aside in favor of direct appeal to the principle of utility when following them would be clearly suboptimal or when there is a conflict among secondary principles.
Moreover, act utilitarianism permits one to act on discrete moral precepts or principles that make no direct reference to utility if this results in one performing the optimal action. Indeed, the act utilitarian can allow the agent to follow principles or rules even when this sometimes results in suboptimal acts being performed. Recall that act utilitarianism is a species of direct utilitarianism, which assesses things by their (actual) consequences. But the direct utilitarian assesses things other than actions, including motives, principles, and rules. Now it might be true that for a particular agent the rules with the optimal acceptance value direct him to perform actions some of which are suboptimal. If he cannot reliably identify in advance those cases where adherence to the rule would be suboptimal or if he is not sufficiently fine-grained psychologically to deviate from the rule here where doing so is optimal without deviating from the rule in other cases where it is not, then he will do more good by following the rules uncritically even though he knows that by doing so he will perform some suboptimal actions. In such a situation, a direct utilitarian should want the agent to follow the optimal rules, rather than always perform the optimal action. This would be rule utilitarianism (not direct utilitarianism) only if we made the further claim that the right action is to follow the optimal rules. But the direct utilitarian will refuse this further move. She will say that the right action is the optimal action, but that for some agents it can in principle sometimes be best to act from optimal motives, rather than perform right actions. The suboptimal actions the agent thus performs will be wrong, but they can be cases of blameless wrongdoing, perhaps even praiseworthy wrongdoing.
Important as it is to understanding some aspects of Mill's utilitarianism, this account of secondary principles does not force a choice between direct, act utilitarianism and indirect, rule utilitarianism. A fortiori, it does not provide reason to reject the act utilitarian strand in Mill's formulation of the utilitarian doctrine.
So far, the picture we get is that Mill endorses act utilitarianism as a standard of right conduct or duty, even if he does not require it to be a decision procedure or to supply a set of motives. Though he believes in the importance of secondary rules that can and should regulate much moral reasoning, this does not require any departure from direct utilitarianism. However, Chapter V of Utilitarianism introduces claims about duty, justice, and rights that are hard to square with direct or act utilitarianism.
For the truth is, that the idea of penal sanction, which is the essence of law, enters not only into the conception of injustice, but into that of any kind of wrong. We do not call anything wrong unless we mean to imply that a person ought to be punished in some way or other for doing it — if not by law, by the opinion of his fellow creatures; if not by opinion, by the reproaches of his own conscience. This seems the real turning point of the distinction between morality and simple expediency [V 14].
Here Mill defines wrongness and, by implication, duty, not directly in terms of the nature of the action or its consequences but indirectly in terms of appropriate responses to it. He appears to believe that one is under an obligation or duty to do something just in case failure to do it is wrong and that an action is wrong just in case some kind of external or internal sanction — punishment, social censure, or self-reproach — ought to be applied to its performance. This test distinguishes duty from expediency (V 14, 15). Not all suboptimal or inexpedient acts are wrong, only those to which one ought to apply some sort of sanction (at least, self-reproach).
Justice is a proper part of duty. Justice involves duties that are perfect duties — that is, duties that are correlated with rights (V 15). An act is just if and only if it is not unjust, and it is unjust just in case it is wrong and violates someone's rights (V 23). Someone has a right just in case she has a claim that society ought to protect by force of law or public opinion (V 24).
Notice that these relationships among duty, justice, and rights do not yet introduce any utilitarian elements. But Mill does think that whether sanctions ought to be applied to an action — and hence whether it is wrong — and whether society ought to enforce an individual's claim — and hence whether she has a right — both depend upon the utility or expediency of doing so (V 25). However, he does not say precisely what standard of expediency he has in mind. In particular, he does not say whether the relevant test for whether something is wrong requires that sanctions be optimal or merely beneficial overall. The class of wrong acts is narrower if we require that sanctions be optimal than if we require that they be merely beneficial. Unless otherwise noted, I will ignore this interesting question about the proper utilitarian standard for applying sanctions.
Because this account of duty defines the rightness and wrongness of an act, not in terms of its utility, as act utilitarianism does, but in terms of the utility of applying sanctions to the conduct, it is an indirect form of utilitarianism. Because justice is a species of duty, it inherits the indirect character of sanction utilitarianism. In “Mill's Theory of Morality” (1976) and other essays (1994), David Lyons has drawn attention to this indirect aspect of Mill's utilitarianism. Lyons does not have a name for this form of indirect utilitarianism. Because it makes the rightness and wrongness of conduct depend upon the utility of sanctioning that conduct in some way, we might call it sanction utilitarianism. Because sanction utilitarianism is a species of indirect utilitarianism, it is inconsistent with act utilitarianism. The introduction of indirect utilitarian ideas in Chapter V of Utilitarianism into an account of utilitarianism that otherwise looks act utilitarian reveals a fundamental tension in Mill's thought about duty.
Given Mill's ambivalence between direct and indirect utilitarianism, it is natural to inquire whether one view is more plausible than the other. Some of Mill's claims in Chapter V suggest a possible advantage that sanction utilitarianism might have. In articulating sanction utilitarianism, Mill claims that it allows him to distinguish duty and expediency and claim that not all inexpedient acts are wrong; inexpedient acts are only wrong when it is good or optimal to sanction them. This suggests that sanction utilitarianism may be preferable to act utilitarianism, because it has a more plausible account of the relation among different deontic categories.
Consider some of the implications of act utilitarianism. Act utilitarianism implies that I do wrong every time I fail to do the very best action, even when the suboptimal act that I perform is very good indeed. That may seem harsh and overly demanding. Commonsense moral thinking recognizes a familiar fourfold deontic distinction.
- wrong or forbidden
The act utilitarian seems unable to account for this fourfold distinction. Because it makes the optimal obligatory and the suboptimal wrong, it appears to expand the domain of the forbidden, collapse the distinction between the permissible and the obligatory, and make no room for the supererogatory. If the optimal is already one's duty, there appears to be no room for the supererogatory. By contrast, sanction utilitarianism does not appear to have these problems. It offers a distinct account of each category.
- Wrong or forbidden acts are those whose performance it is good/optimal to blame.
- Permissible acts are those whose performance it is not good/optimal to blame.
- Obligatory acts are those whose omission it is good/optimal to blame.
- Supererogatory acts are permissible acts that are especially expedient.
In this way, sanction utilitarianism appears to respect this common fourfold distinction and, in particular, to make room for the supererogatory.
However, the direct utilitarian can and should distinguish between the moral assessment of an act and the moral assessment of the act of praising or blaming that act. Each should be assessed, the direct utilitarian claims, by the utility of doing so. But then it is possible for there to be wrongdoing (a suboptimal act) that is blameless or even praiseworthy. But then the direct utilitarian can appeal to the same distinctions among praiseworthiness and blameworthiness that the sanction utilitarian appeals to, while denying that her own deontic distinctions track blame and praise. If so, it is unclear that sanction utilitarianism enjoys any real advantage here over act utilitarianism.
Moreover, sanction utilitarianism appears to have disadvantages that act utilitarianism does not. One such problem derives from its hybrid structure. Sanction utilitarianism is impurely indirect. For while it provides an indirect utilitarian theory of duty, the account it provides of when sanctions should be applied to conduct is direct — it depends upon the consequences of applying sanctions. Indeed, this isn't just the worry that sanction utilitarianism is a mixed theory — combining direct and indirect elements in an unmotivated or ad hoc way. There is a deeper worry afoot. Sanction utilitarianism provides an indirect utilitarian account of the conditions under which an action — any action — is right or wrong. This general criterion is that any action is wrong to which one ought to attach sanctions. But it goes on to explain when one ought to attach sanctions in direct utilitarian terms of whether doing so would be optimal (or, perhaps, beneficial). But imposing sanctions is a kind of action, and we can ask whether the imposition of a particular sanction would be right or wrong. The general criterion implies that we should answer this question about the rightness of applying sanctions in sanction-utilitarians terms, namely, by asking whether it would be right to sanction the failure to apply sanctions. This introduces a second-order sanction, whose rightness we can now ask about. We seem to be off on an infinite regress of sanctions. This is already cause for concern, inasmuch as this infinite regress looks vicious, because there appears to be no determinate fact to ground an answer to the original question about whether it is right to apply the first-order sanction. But matters are worse for sanction utilitarianism inasmuch as it implies a direct utilitarian answer to the question of whether it is right to apply sanctions that is inconsistent with the general criterion. This appears to render sanction utilitarianism internally inconsistent.
In the face of worries about sanction utilitarianism, it may be tempting to try to square sanction utilitarianism with act utilitarianism by noticing that in the crucial passage introducing sanction utilitarianism Mill says that “we do not call anything wrong unless we mean to imply that a person ought to be punished in some way or other for doing it — if not by law, by the opinion of his fellow creatures; if not by opinion, by the reproaches of his own conscience” (V 14, emphasis added). One might argue that Mill is giving an account of when we call something wrong, not when it is wrong. Whereas being wrong is, as the act utilitarian claims, a matter of being suboptimal, we only bother to call something wrong if it rises to the level that it would be good or optimal to sanction. Considered in itself, this act utilitarian reading of the significance of sanction utilitarianism is reasonably plausible. The problem is that the surrounding text makes it difficult to sustain this reading without strain. For in the previous sentence Mill says that “the idea of penal sanction … enters … into any kind of wrong,” and in the sentence immediately following the statement of sanction utilitarianism he says “that this seems to be the real turning point of the distinction between morality and simple expediency”. Here, he seems to be speaking in his own voice and insisting on distinguishing one's duty from what is or would be optimal.
The different strands in Mill's utilitarian conception of duty require disentangling. In his central exposition of the utilitarian standard in Chapter II, Mill commits himself to act utilitarianism in multiple passages. In that same chapter, he focuses on the felicific tendencies of actions and assigns a significant role to rules within moral reasoning, both of which have been taken to commit him to a rule utilitarian doctrine. However, these claims are reconcilable with direct utilitarianism and so provide no good reason to depart from a traditional act utilitarian reading of that chapter. But in Chapter V Mill does introduce indirect utilitarian ideas in the doctrine of sanction utilitarianism. It is hard to reconcile these direct and indirect elements in Mill's conception of duty.
We have focused so far on understanding Mill's version of utilitarianism, especially his conceptions of happiness and duty. Now we should consider his justification of utilitarianism, which he offers in his discussion of the “proof” of the principle of utility in Chapter IV. Mill claims that the utilitarian must claim that happiness is the one and only thing desirable in itself (IV 2). He claims that the only proof of desirability is desire and proceeds to argue that happiness is the one and only thing desired. He argues that a person does desire his own happiness for its own sake and that, therefore, happiness as such is desired by and desirable for its own sake for humanity as a whole (“The aggregate of all persons”) (IV 3). He then turns to defend the claim that happiness is the only thing desirable in itself, by arguing that apparent counterexamples (e.g. desires for virtue for its own sake) are not inconsistent with his claim (IV 5-8).
Mill's proof is widely regarded as flawed in multiple ways. To appreciate the objections we need to reconstruct the steps in this argument more carefully. One traditional reconstruction might look something like this.
- Utilitarianism is true iff happiness is the one and only thing desirable for its own sake (and not for the sake of something else).
- The only proof of desirability is desire.
- Each person desires his own happiness for its own sake (and not for the sake of something else).
- Hence, happiness, as such, is desired for its own sake (and not for the sake of something else) from the point of view of humanity (= the aggregate of persons).
- Hence, happiness, as such, is desirable for its own sake (and not for the sake of something else).
- Happiness is the only thing desired for its own sake (and not for the sake of something else). Other things — such as virtue, health, music, money, and power — can come to be desired for their own sakes, but then they are desired as parts of happiness.
- Hence, happiness is the only thing desirable for its own sake (and not for the sake of something else).
- Hence, utilitarianism is true.
The “proof” has, at least in some quarters, threatened Mill's reputation as a careful philosopher. It is commonly thought to be riddled with major mistakes — mistakes of inference and implausible assumptions. Here is a partial list of concerns about Mill's argument, as traditionally conceived.
(i) (1) is plausible only if “desirable” means worthy of being desired, not if it means capable of being desired. But (2) is most plausible if “desirable” means capable of being desired (see (iii) below). But then there is a real worry that the argument trades on a tacit equivocation between these two different senses of “desirable” and that the argument is, as a result, invalid.
(ii) Even so, (1) is false. Even if happiness were the one and only think desirable for its own sake, this would establish only a claim about the good or “ends”. It is not a claim about duty or right action. Utilitarianism not only claims that the good is human happiness but goes on to define the right in terms of promoting the good. The second claim does not follow from the first. Mill appears to recognize this insofar as he at least tacitly distinguishes the two claims (IV 9; cf. IV 2). However, he goes on to infer the second claim from the first without any independent argument.
[I]f human nature is so constituted as to desire nothing that is not either a part of happiness or a means of happiness, we can have no other proof, and we require no other, that these are the only things desirable. If so, happiness is the sole end of human action, and the promotion of it the test by which to judge all human conduct; from whence it necessarily follows that it must be the criterion of morality, since a part is included in the whole. [IV 9]
(iii) For the argument to be valid, “desirability” in premise (2) must mean worthy of being desired (as it does in premise (1)). But then (2) is false. Desire is not proof of desirability. People can and do have mistaken desires about what is good. Indeed, if Mill is either a hedonist or a perfectionist he must think that people can and do have desires that fail to track the good.
(iv) It is not clear that (3) is true. It seems as if masochists or selfless altruists might fail to desire their own happiness for its own sake.
(v) (4) may be incoherent and certainly does not follow from (3). It is not clear that aggregates of persons have desires. Perhaps under special circumstances groups of people might form a corporate agent or person. But aggregates of persons, as such, are not persons and do not have desires. Even if they did, it is doubtful that one could infer what the aggregate desires from facts about what its members desire. That would involve a compositional fallacy.
(vi) (5) is presumably equivalent to the claim that happiness is good. But is it good simpliciter or good for the aggregate? The analogy between individuals and groups would suggest that happiness should be a good for the aggregate. But presumably the intended conclusion requires that happiness be good simpliciter.
(vii) It is not clear how to understand (6). One would think that the aim is to make claims that parallel (4) and (5). But then (6) needs to be understood as making another claim about aggregate psychology. And this raises some of the old questions about aggregate psychology. However, much of the discussion in IV 5-8 seems to be about individual psychology. Mill seems to be saying that insofar as individuals do have intrinsic desires for things other than their own happiness the objects of intrinsic desire are desired as parts of their own happiness. Perhaps this is Mill's initial claim from which he then hopes to infer, as he did from (3)-(4), that the general happiness is the only thing desired by the aggregate for its own sake (and not for the sake of something else). This inference would, of course, give rise to the same sort of worries we raised about the inference from (3)-(4). In particular, we might doubt that aggregates of persons have any aims, much less ultimate aims. And even if we conceded that they did, it is not clear that we could infer facts about the desires of aggregates from facts about the desires of its members. That, we said, would seem to involve a compositional fallacy.
(viii) Even if we accepted this defense of (5) and (7), this would only establish that happiness as such was the only thing desirable or good for the aggregate. It looks like we could have parallel claims about the agent's own happiness being the only thing desirable or good for the individual. But this might seem to imply that while the aggregate should pursue or promote the general happiness individuals should pursue or promote their own happiness. That would not be a defense of utilitarianism.
These are all serious worries about Mill's proof, as traditionally conceived. These objections seem so serious and so obvious that they should make us loathe to interpret Mill as advancing this conception of the proof. Can we do any better by Mill in our interpretation of his proof? At the beginning of Chapter IV Mill repeats his admonition that ultimate ends do not admit of proof in the ordinary sense of that term (IV 1). Here, he alludes to his introductory remarks in Chapter I that provide caution about the kind of proof available for first principles.
… I shall … attempt to contribute something toward the understanding and appreciation of the “utilitarian” or “happiness” theory, and toward such proof as it is susceptible of. It is evident that this cannot be proof in the ordinary and popular meaning of the term. Questions of ultimate ends are not amenable of direct proof. … We are not, however, to infer that its acceptance or rejection must depend upon blind impulse or arbitrary choice. There is a larger meaning of the word “proof,” in which this question is as amenable to it as any other of the disputed questions of philosophy. The subject is within the cognizance of the rational faculty; and neither does that faculty deal with it solely in the way of intuition [I 5].
So it seems that Mill is looking for arguments that may be rationally persuasive without providing incontrovertible proof. How might this help us better understand the proof?
For one thing, Mill need not confuse desire and desirability. He recognizes that they are distinct, but says that desire is our only proof of desirability (IV 3). In saying this, he need not presuppose that desiring something confers value on (obtaining) it. He can be a perfectionist, as we interpreted him, in the higher pleasures doctrine. As he recognizes there (especially the dignity passage), our desires often reflect value judgments we make, explicitly or implicitly. If so, our desires will be evidence of what we regard as valuable, and our reflectively acceptable desires may provide our best defeasible test of what things are objectively valuable.
Mill first applies this test to what each of us desires for her own sake. His answer is that what each of us desires for his or her own sake is happiness (IV 3). We needn't interpret Mill as endorsing psychological egoism at this point. Mill is not saying that each of us can focus only on her own happiness. Rather, he can be read as saying when each of us does focus on her own ends or sake, we find that each cares about her own happiness. Another way to put Mill's point is that prudential concern focuses on the agent's happiness.
Mill goes on to say that just as each person's own happiness is a good to that person, so too happiness, as such, is a good to the aggregate of persons. But we need not suppose that Mill is attributing a psychology, much less an egoist psychology, to humanity as a group. Instead, we can read Mill as claiming that just as the agent's own happiness is the object of prudential concern, so too happiness as such is the proper object of disinterested or impartial concern.
On this reading, Mill is not trying to derive utilitarianism from egoism. Rather, he is assuming that the moral point of view is impartial in a way that prudence is not. Just as prudence aims at the agent's own happiness, so too, Mill thinks, morality, which is impartial, aims at happiness as such. On this reading, the structure of Mill's proof looks something like this.
- Prudence is partial.
- Because prudence is partial, it aims at the agent's own happiness.
- Morality, by contrast, is impartial.
- Because morality is impartial, it aims at happiness as such.
- If the moral point of view aims at happiness as such, then it is the moral duty of each to promote happiness.
- Hence, utilitarianism is true.
If this is the right way to understand Mill's proof, then his justification or defense of utilitarianism consists in assuming that the moral point of view is impartial and claiming that utilitarianism is the right way to understand impartiality. Morality is impartial, and impartiality requires taking everyone's interests into account — and not just those of some select few — and weighing them equally — and not with a thumb in the scales for some select few. Indeed, later, in Chapter V, Mill identifies impartiality and its progressive demands with both justice and utility.
It [impartiality] is involved in the very meaning of Utility, or the Greatest-Happiness Principle. That principle is a mere form of words without rational signification, unless one person's happiness, supposed equal in degree (with the proper allowance made for kind), is counted for exactly as much as another's. Those conditions being supplied, Bentham's dictum ‘everybody to count for one, nobody for more than one,’ might be written under the principle of utility as an explanatory commentary. The equal claim of everybody to happiness in the estimation of the moralist and the legislator involves an equal claim to all the means of happiness …. And hence all social inequalities which have ceased to be considered expedient, assume the character not of simple inexpediency, but of injustice. The entire history of social improvement has been a series of transitions, by which one custom or institution after another, from being supposed a primary necessity of social existence, has passed into the rank of universally stigmatized injustice and tyranny. So it has been with the distinctions of slaves and freemen, nobles and serfs, patricians and plebeians; and so it will be, and in part already is, with the aristocracies of colour, race, and sex [V 36].
Here we see Mill identifying utilitarian impartiality with the demands of justice and morality itself (cf. Crisp 1997: 79-80). In doing so, he sees himself as echoing Bentham's conception of utilitarianism.
One might wonder if utilitarianism is the only or the best way to understand impartiality. Indeed, this is one way of understanding now familiar worries about the implications of utilitarianism for issues of distributive justice and individual rights. But this reading of the proof has the virtue of identifying Mill's defense of utilitarianism with the feature of it that made it a progressive influence historically.
In what is probably the most understudied chapter of Utilitarianism (ch. III), Mill addresses the question of the ultimate sanction of the principle of utility. He understands this alternately as a question about “the motives to obey it” and the “source of its obligation … [or] binding force” (III 1). Nor does Mill think that this issue about the sanction of the principle of utility is an idle one. There is a potential worry about the sanctions of utilitarianism that apparently has its source in prudence or self-interest.
He says to himself, I feel that I am bound not to rob or murder, betray or deceive; but why am I bound to promote the general happiness? If my own happiness lies in something else, why may I not give that the preference [III 1]?
But we can imagine this person unmoved by the moral demands in question and not just by a utilitarian reconstruction of these demands. And Mill is very clear that he thinks this issue about the sanction of utilitarianism arises for any moral theory and so poses no special problem for utilitarianism (III 1, 2, 3, 6).
Mill is not entirely clear how he understands the sanctions worry. Is it just a problem about motivation — the extent to which people are motivated to comply with utilitarianism or other moral conceptions and the extent to which and manner in which they might be brought to comply more fully or more easily? Or is it more a problem of authority — the extent to which people have reason to comply with utilitarianism or other moral conceptions? The sort of self-interested challenge that Mill identifies at the beginning (III 1) is usually part of an amoralist challenge to the authority of other-regarding morality. But much of Mill's actual discussion seems more addressed to the motivational issue.
Mill thinks that an account of the sanctions of utilitarianism or any other moral conception should distinguish between external and internal sanctions. The external sanctions are those penalties that can be visited on noncompliers by another, whether the others are mortals, individually or collectively, or God (III 3). Penalties might include official acts of the state (legal punishment) or community (official ostracism or public humiliation) or God (punishment meted out on Judgment Day). They might also include more informal and/or diffuse sanctions, such as those incurred when my bad acts have bad reputational effects that harm my social and/or economic prospects or opportunities. Of course, mortals are neither omniscient nor omnipotent. So there's no guarantee that noncompliers will be visited with external sanctions, at least in this world. If noncompliers can conceal their noncompliance, they will suffer no external sanctions. And existing external sanctions may be insufficient to deter noncompliance even if the noncompliance cannot be concealed. For instance, I may not be deterred from violating our agreement for mutually beneficial exchange of services by the bad reputational effects of noncompliance if you have already performed your part of the contract and the benefits of “taking the money and running” for me dwarf the costs of being excluded from future cooperation with you and other members of my community. Of course, we can collectively try to ratchet up the costs for detected noncompliance by criminalizing noncompliance, adopting draconian punishments for noncompliance, and pursuing extradition treaties with other communities. In this sense, the provision of adequate external sanctions is not entirely outside our control and could be treated as a political or social goal and achievement.
Mill spends somewhat more time discussing internal sanctions for noncompliance (iii 4-11). The internal sanction for noncompliance is Conscience (III 4). The issue that interests Mill most about Conscience seems to be whether it is innate (III 6-11). Mill represents the intuitionists (transcendentalists) as claiming that it is innate (II 6). He seems to equate Conscience being innate with its not being analyzable into other desires, passions, or emotions. Conscience might involve a desire to please God (III 4); it might involve the desire to be liked by others (III 4); it might involve the desire to form a union with others (III 10); or it might involve sympathy and empathy (III 7). Mill endorses the claim that Conscience is not innate (III 8-11). He thinks that Conscience involves these other emotions, passions, and desires and is built up out of them. Some of these capacities are themselves innate, but their proper development and exercise is a historical accomplishment that is not yet complete and that is fragile. So it is within our power individually — but more importantly collectively — to change social conditions so as to make Conscience and the internal sanctions of duty more robust.
In these claims Mill seems clearly to be focused on the motivational dimension of the internal sanctions of duty. But we might wonder what he has to say about the authority of these sanctions. The capacities underlying Conscience may not be distributed equally, and these capacities can wither or flower. Why should we care about Conscience? Is there anything wrong with me — in particular, any failure of practical reason — if I do not have a Conscience or it is weak? Is there any good reason I should cultivate a Conscience if I don't have one (assuming that's possible) or that I should invest resources in maintaining my Conscience if I do have one? Mill seems not to address these questions.
Is Mill right to claim that the worry about sanctions is really a general worry about the sanctions for noncompliance with other-regarding morality of any sort and so poses no special problem for utilitarianism? One might wonder whether utilitarianism makes greater demands on agents than other moral theories. For instance, contemporary writers have argued that utilitarianism seems to be potentially very demanding, much more so than commonsense morality. For instance, reformist utilitarians, such as Peter Singer (1972), have argued that utilitarianism entails extensive duties of mutual aid that would call for enormous changes in the lifestyles of all those who are even moderately well off. And critics of utilitarianism have treated the demandingness of utilitarianism as one of its principal flaws. Rawls (1971) has argued that the sort of interpersonal sacrifice that utilitarianism requires violates the strains of commitment in a well-ordered society. And Bernard Williams (1973) has argued that the demandingness of utilitarianism threatens the sort of personal projects and partial relationships that help give our lives meaning. The common complaint here is that utilitarianism's demands threaten to offend against a requirement of psychological realism, according to which the demands of an acceptable moral theory must be ones that can be incorporated into a reasonable and satisfying life plan.
This worry about the demands of utilitarianism is not easy to assess. One might wonder how to interpret and whether to accept the psychological realist constraint. If the constraint is relative to people's actual psychologies, then it represents a potentially conservative constraint on moral theorizing that one might well reject. If the constraint is relative to possible or ideal psychology, then it is not clear that even a highly revisionary moral theory need flout the constraint. Then there is a question about how demanding or revisionary utilitarianism actually is. Mill and Sidgwick thought that our knowledge of others and our causal powers to do good were limited to those near and dear and other associates with whom we have regular contact, with the result that — as individuals — we do better overall by focusing our energies and actions on associates of one kind or another, rather than the world at large (Utilitarianism II 19; Methods 361-69). On this view, utilitarianism can accommodate the sort of special obligations and personal concerns to which the critics of utilitarianism appeal. But it is arguable that even if this sort of utilitarian accommodation was tenable in nineteenth century Britain, technological development and globalization have rendered utilitarian demands more revisionary. Our information about others and our causal reach are not limited as they once were. Given the high benefit-to-cost ratio of many modern relief agencies, it is hard to resist something like Singer's conclusions about the reformist demands of utilitarianism. So even if Mill was right to think that the motivational demands of utilitarianism were not so different from those of other moral theories at the time he wrote, that claim might need to be reassessed today.
Mill's On Liberty is the most influential statement of his liberal principles. He begins by distinguishing old and new threats to liberty. The old threat to liberty is found in traditional societies in which there is rule by one (a monarchy) or a few (an aristocracy). Though one could be worried about restrictions on liberty by benevolent monarchs or aristocrats, the traditional worry is that when rulers are politically unaccountable to the governed they will rule in their own interests, rather than the interests of the governed. In particular, they will restrict the liberties of their subjects in ways that benefit the rulers, rather than the ruled. It was these traditional threats to liberty that the democratic reforms of the Philosophical Radicals were meant to address. But Mill thinks that these traditional threats to liberty are not the only ones to worry about. He makes clear that democracies contain their own threats to liberty — this is the tyranny, not of the one or the few, but of the majority (I 1-5). Mill sets out to articulate the principles that should regulate how governments and societies, whether democratic or not, can restrict individual liberties (I 6).
In an early and famous passage Mill offers one formulation of his basic principles concerning liberties.
The object of this essay is to assert one very simple principle, as entitled to govern absolutely the dealings of society with the individual in the way of compulsion and control, whether the means used be physical force in the form of legal penalties or the moral coercion of public opinion. That principle is that the sole end for which mankind are warranted, individually or collectively, in interfering with the liberty of action of any of their number is self-protection. That the only purpose for which power can be rightfully exercised over any member of a civilized community, against his will, is to prevent harm to others. His own good, either physical or moral, is not a sufficient warrant. He cannot rightfully be compelled to do or forbear because it will be better for him to do so, because it will make him happier, because, in the opinions of others, to do so would be wise or even right. These are good reasons for remonstrating with him, or reasoning with him, or persuading him, or entreating him, but not for compelling him or visiting him with any evil in case he do otherwise. To justify that, the conduct from which it is desired to deter him must be calculated to produce evil to someone else. The only part of the conduct of anyone for which he is amenable to society is that which concerns others. In the part which merely concerns himself, his independence, is, of right, absolute. Over himself, over his own body and mind, the individual is sovereign [I 9].
Notice that Mill is concerned with articulating principles to apply to restrictions on liberty in various contexts. He is perhaps most interested in cases where the state uses civil or criminal law to forbid conduct and applies sanctions for noncompliance. But he is also interested in other sorts of case — including those in which social groups use the threat of condemnation and ostracism to limit liberty and ensure conformity and those in which one individual restricts the liberty of another. Having noted these complexities, let us focus, for the time being, on the central case of legal prohibition by the state.
In this passage, Mill distinguishes paternalistic and moralistic restrictions of liberty from restrictions of liberty based upon the harm principle.
- A's restriction of B's liberty is paternalistic if it is done for B's own benefit.
- A's restriction of B's liberty is moralistic if it is done to ensure that B acts morally or not immorally.
- A's restriction of B's liberty is an application of the harm principle if A restrict B's liberty in order to prevent harm to someone other than B.
Here, Mill seems to say that a restriction on someone's liberty is legitimate if and only if it satisfies the harm principle (cf. IV 1-4, 6; V 2). Later, he distinguishes between genuine harm and mere offense. In order to satisfy the harm principle, an action must actually violate or threaten imminent violation of those important interests of others in which they have a right (I 12; III 1; IV 3, 10, 12; V 5). So he seems to be saying that the harm principle is always a good reason for restricting liberty, but that mere appeals to morality, paternalism, or offense are never good reasons for restricting liberty.
As this account of Mill's principles suggests, his defense of individual liberties appears to be part of what might be called a categorical approach. To decide whether an individual's liberty ought to be protected, we must ascertain to which category the potential restriction of liberty belongs. The main categories for potential restrictions are as follows.
- Offense (mere offense)
- Moralism (mere moralism)
- Paternalism (mere paternalism)
- Harm Principle
It is not just that Mill sorts restrictions on liberty by category. He also seems to permit or forbid restrictions on liberty by category, for he appears to say that a potential restriction is permissible if and only if it is an application of the harm principle.
Sometimes Mill suggests that the harm principle is equivalent to letting society restrict other-regarding conduct (I 11; IV 2). On this view, conduct can be divided into self-regarding and other-regarding conduct. Regulation of the former is paternalistic, and regulation of the latter is an application of the harm principle. So on this view it is never permissible to regulate purely self-regarding conduct and always permissible to regulate other-regarding conflict. But this is over-simple. Some other-regarding conduct causes mere offense, not genuine harm (IV 3, 12). So Mill cannot equate harmful behavior and other-regarding behavior and cannot think that all other-regarding behavior may be regulated.
It is generally thought that by applying this categorical approach to liberty and its permissible restrictions Mill is led to offer a fairly extensive defense of individual liberties against interference by the state and society. In particular, it is sometimes thought that Mill recognizes a large sphere of conduct which it is impermissible for the state to regulate. We might characterize this sphere of protected liberties as Mill's conception of liberal rights. On this reading, Mill is deriving his conception of liberal rights from a prior commitment to the categorical approach and, in particular, to the harm principle.
There is an apparent tension between Mill's commitment to a categorical approach to basic liberties and his defense of utilitarianism. Utilitarianism treats the good as prior to and independent of the right or duty — defining duty as the promotion of good consequences. Perhaps certain kinds of actions tend to be good or bad, but, according to direct utilitarianism, the moral quality of a particular action depends on its own consequences. By contrast, the deontological and natural rights traditions treat duty or the right as prior to and independent of the good. In particular, deontologists believe that it is not always one's duty to promote good consequences. Sometimes one has a duty to do an act that is suboptimal, and sometimes it is wrong to do the optimal act. Deontologists recognize moral constraints on pursuing the good. These constraints usually take the form of categorical rules to perform or refrain from certain sorts of actions (e.g. to keep promises or to refrain from lying), regardless of the consequences. A special case of this perceived conflict between categorical rules and utility is the perceived tension between utility and rights. For, on a common view, individual rights just are a special case of categorical rules. Individual rights, such as rights to liberties or to freedom from harm, are interpreted as side constraints on the pursuit of good consequences.
The apparent conflict between utility and rights, especially rights to liberties, poses an interesting test for Mill, because he not only endorses utilitarianism but wants to defend liberal rights. Moreover Mill insists that his arguments have utilitarian foundations.
It is proper to state that I forego any advantage which could be derived to my argument from the idea of abstract right as a thing independent of utility. I regard utility as the ultimate appeal on all ethical questions; but it must be utility in the largest sense, grounded on the permanent interests of man as a progressive being [OL: I 11].
Is Mill able to reconcile his defense of utility and liberty without compromising either his utilitarianism or his defense of a right to liberties? There seem to be four possible resolutions of this tension.
- The tension between utility and rights is inescapable, and Mill is simply inconsistent, endorsing both utilitarianism and rights to liberties.
- The tension between utility and rights is inescapable, and Mill's utilitarianism prevents him from defending genuine rights.
- The tension between utility and rights is inescapable, and Mill defends genuine rights, but only by abandoning his utilitarianism.
- The tension between utility and rights is not inescapable; Mill succeeds in reconciling a form of utilitarianism with a defense of individual rights to liberties.
It is worth bearing these possibilities in mind as we consider and evaluate Mill's defense of basic liberties. We will revisit this tension after we have examined Mill's main arguments and claims about basic liberties (see §3.13 below).
Mill begins his defense of basic liberties with a discussion of freedom of expression. He thinks that there is general agreement on the importance of free speech and that, once the grounds for free speech are understood, this agreement can be exploited to support a more general defense of individual liberties (I 16; III 1). So his defense of expressive liberties is important not only in its own right but also insofar as it lays the foundation of his liberal principles.
Mill's discussion of censorship in Chapter II focuses on censorship whose aim is to suppress false or immoral opinion (II 1-2). Here too, Mill is apparently concerned with censorship whether practiced by individuals, groups, or states. However, here, as elsewhere, he focuses on restrictions on liberty imposed by the state. He mentions four reasons for maintaining free speech and opposing censorship.
- A censored opinion might be true (II 1-20, 41).
- Even if literally false, a censored opinion might contain part of the truth (II 34-39, 42).
- Even if wholly false, a censored opinion would prevent true opinions from becoming dogma (II 1-2, 6, 7, 22-23, 43).
- As a dogma, an unchallenged opinion will lose its meaning (II 26, 43).
It is natural to group these four considerations into two main kinds: the first two invoke a truth-tracking defense of expressive liberties, while the second two appeal to a distinctive kind of value that free discussion is supposed to have.
A. The Truth-Tracking Rationale. The first two claims represent freedom of expression as instrumentally valuable; it is valuable, not in itself, but as the most reliable means of producing something else that Mill assumes is valuable (either extrinsically or intrinsically), namely, true belief. Though Mill seems to assume that true belief is valuable, it is not hard to see how true beliefs would possess at least instrumental value, if only because our actions, plans, and reasoning are likely to be more successful when based on true beliefs. Of course, the most reliable means of promoting true belief would be to believe everything. But that would bring a great deal of false belief along too. A more plausible goal to promote would be something like the ratio of true belief to false belief. Freedom of expression might then be defended as a more reliable policy for promoting the ratio of true belief to false belief than a policy of censorship. This rationale for freedom of expression is echoed by Justice Oliver Wendell Holmes, in his famous dissent in Abrams v. United States when he claims that the best test of truth is free trade in the marketplace of ideas.
Notice that this instrumental defense of freedom of expression does not require the mistaken assumption, which Mill sometimes makes, that the censor must assume his own infallibility (II 3). The censor need not assume that he is infallible. He can recognize that he might be mistaken, but insist that he must act on the best available evidence about what is true. Mill's better reply is that proper recognition of one's own fallibility should generally lead one to keep discussion open and not foreclose discussion of possibilities that seem improbable.
This instrumental rationale may justify freedom of expression in preference to a policy of censorship whenever the censor finds the beliefs in question implausible or offensive. But it does not justify freedom of expression in preference to more conservative forms of censorship. If the question is what policies are likely to increase the ratio of true to false belief, we would seem to be well justified in censoring opinions for whose falsity there is especially clear, compelling, and consistent or stable evidence. We would be on good ground in censoring flat-earthers (both literal and figurative).
Another way to see the weakness of the truth-tracking justification of freedom of expression is to notice that this instrumental defense of freedom of expression cannot explain what is wrong with censorship that is successful in truth-tracking terms. Suppose we lived in a society of the sort Plato imagines in the Republic in which cognitive capacities are distributed unequally between rulers and citizens and in which maximally knowledgeable and reliable censors — call them “philosopher kings” — censor all and only false beliefs. The truth-tracking argument would provide no argument against censorship in such circumstances. This shows that the truth-tracking argument condemns only unsuccessful or incompetent censorship. For some, this may be the biggest worry about censorship. But many would have residual worries about successful or competent censorship. They would object to censorship, even by philosopher-kings. Answering this worry requires a more robust defense of expressive liberties.
B. The Deliberative Rationale. The resources for a more robust defense of freedom of expression can be found in Mill's claim that it is needed to keep true beliefs from becoming dogmatic, because this reason for valuing freedom is intended to rebut the case for censorship even on the assumption that all and only false beliefs would be censored (II 2, 21). Mill's argument here is that freedoms of thought and discussion are necessary for fulfilling our natures as progressive beings (II 20). We can and should read Mill as appealing to his perfectionist assumptions about happiness to defend expressive liberties.
Recall that Mill claims that his defense of liberty relies on claims about the happiness of people as progressive beings (I 11). We have seen that Mill thinks that it is our deliberative capacities, especially our capacities for practical deliberation, that mark us as progressive creatures and that, as a result, the principal ingredient of our happiness or well-being must exercise these deliberative capacities. At its most general, practical deliberation involves reflective decision-making. In On Liberty Mill thinks of practical deliberation in terms of capacities to form, assess, choose, and implement projects and goals (III 4). We saw that Mill makes similar claims about the role of deliberative capacities in the happiness of progressive beings in his discussion of higher pleasures in Chapter II of Utilitarianism, where he contrasts the examined life Socrates led and the life of a contented swine and accords the former incomparably greater value (II 6). These deliberative capacities form the principal or most important ingredient in human happiness, because they are the capacities that mark us as responsible and, hence, progressive beings.
Mill's claim that the value of freedom of expression lies in keeping true beliefs from becoming dogmatic reflects his view that freedoms of thought and discussion are necessary for fulfilling our natures as progressive beings (II 20). For instance, we can see Mill appealing to a familiar distinction between true belief, on the one hand, and knowledge, understood as something like justified true belief, on the other hand (cf. Scanlon 1972; Ten 1980: 126-28). Progressive beings seek knowledge or justified true belief, and not simply true belief. Whereas the mere possession of true beliefs need not exercise one's deliberative capacities, because they might be the product of indoctrination, their justification would. One exercises deliberative capacities in the justification of one's beliefs and actions that is required for theoretical and practical knowledge. This is because justification involves comparison of, and deliberation among, alternatives (II 6, 7, 8, 22-23, 43). Freedoms of thought and discussion are essential to the justification of one's beliefs and actions, because individuals are not cognitively self-sufficient (II 38, 39; III 1). Sharing thought and discussion with others, especially about important matters, improves one's deliberations. It enlarges the menu of options, by identifying new options worth consideration, and helps one better assess the merits of these options, by forcing on one's attention new considerations and arguments about the comparative merits of the options. In these ways, open and vigorous discussion with diverse interlocutors improves the quality of one's deliberations. If so, censorship, even of false belief, can rob both those whose speech is suppressed and their audience of resources that they need to justify their beliefs and actions (II 1).
We should be careful not to overstate the significance of this argument against censorship. Deliberative values may not always speak in favor of expanding one's option set. Cognitively limited agents cannot consider all logically possible options, and careful consideration of many options — especially irrelevant options and options known to have failed — is likely to retard, rather than advance, their deliberations. More options are not always better than fewer. Nonetheless, it is important to note that this perfectionist appeal to deliberative values can explain why it is often wrong to censor even false beliefs. In this way, Mill's defense of expressive liberties that relies on his perfectionist appeal to deliberative values is a more robust defense than the one provided by his truth-tracking arguments alone.
Though important in its own right, Mill's defense of freedom of thought and discussion provides the resources for an argument for various basic liberties. The deliberative rationale for freedoms of thought and discussion is a special case of a more general defense of basic liberties of thought and action that Mill offers in the balance of On Liberty. A good human life is one that exercises one's higher capacities (I 11;20; III 1-10); a person's higher capacities include her deliberative capacities, in particular, capacities to form, revise, assess, select, and implement her own plan of life. This kind of self-government requires both positive and negative conditions. Among the positive conditions it requires is an education that develops deliberative competence by providing understanding of different historical periods and social possibilities, developing cultural and aesthetic sensibilities, developing skills essential for critical reasoning and assessment, and cultivating habits of intellectual curiosity, modesty, and open-mindedness (V 12-15). Among the negative conditions that self-government requires are various liberties of thought and action. If the choice and pursuit of projects and plans is to be deliberate, it must be informed as to the alternatives and their grounds, and this requires intellectual freedoms of speech, association, and press that expand the menu of deliberative options and allow for the vivid representation of the comparative merits of options on that menu. If there is to be choice and implementation of choices, there must be liberties of action such as freedom of association, freedom of worship, and freedom to choose one's occupation.
Indeed, liberties of thought and action are importantly related. This is apparent in the pre-eminent value Mill assigns to diversity and experimentation in life-style. Indeed, in his Autobiography Mill describes this as the central truth of On Liberty:
The importance, to man and society, of a large variety in types of character, and of giving full freedom to human nature to expand itself in innumerable and conflicting directions [VII/259].
Diversity and experimentation in life-style are important not only insofar as they are expressions of self-government but also insofar as they enhance self-government. For experimentation and diversity of life-style expand the deliberative menu and bring out more clearly the nature and merits of options on the menu (II 23, 38; III 1). So experiments in living not only express the autonomy of the agent at the time of action, but they provide materials for the agent and others in future deliberations. But diversity and experimentation presuppose liberties of action, and in this way liberties of action, as well as thought and discussion, are essential to the full exercise of deliberative capacities.
Despite this robust rationale for liberties of thought and action, it is also important to see that Mill is not treating liberty as an intrinsic good or endorsing an unqualified right to liberty.
First, insofar as Mill defends individual liberties by appeal to deliberative values, he can distinguish the importance of different liberties in terms of their role in practical deliberation. A central part of practical deliberation is forming ideals and regulating one's actions and plans in accordance with these ideals. But some liberties seem more central than others to the selection of personal ideals. For instance, it seems plausible that liberties of speech, association, worship, and choice of profession are more important than liberties to drive in either direction on streets designated as one-way, liberties not to wear seat belts, or liberties to dispose of one's gross income as one pleases, because restrictions on the former seem to interfere more than restrictions on the latter with deliberations about what sort of person to be. If so, Millian principles arguably defend rights to certain basic liberties, rather than a right to liberty per se. If so, Mill's liberalism should not be confused with traditional libertarianism, which does recognize a right to liberty per se.
Second, even the exercise of basic liberties is limited by the harm principle, which justifies restricting liberty to engage in actions that cause harm or threaten imminent harm to others. As we will see (§3.6), there are interesting questions about the correct interpretation of the harm principle, such as how we draw the line between harm and offense. But his commitment to some version of the harm principle as a ground for restricting liberty is hard to dispute.
Third, it is important to be clear about how Mill values basic liberties. To account for the robust character of his perfectionist argument, it is tempting to suppose that Mill thinks these basic liberties are themselves important intrinsic goods (cf. Berger 1984: 41, 50, 199, 231-32; Bogen and Farrell 1978). But limitations in the scope of Mill's argument show that this cannot be his view.
It is, perhaps, hardly necessary to say that this doctrine is meant to apply only to human beings in the maturity of their faculties. … Liberty, as a principle, has no application to any state of things anterior to the time when mankind have become capable of being improved by free and equal discussion [I 10].
So, for instance, the scope of Mill's prohibition on paternalism does not include paternalistic restrictions on the choices of the very young. Presumably, Mill is also willing to permit some forms of censorship for the young that he would reject for mature adults. Such restrictions on the scope of Mill's principles make no sense if basic liberties are dominant intrinsic goods, for then it should always be valuable to accord people liberties — a claim that Mill here denies. These restrictions make perfect sense if the liberties in question, though not intrinsically valuable, are necessary conditions to realizing dominant goods, for then there will be, or need be, no value to liberty where, as in these circumstances, other necessary conditions for the realization of these higher values — in particular, sufficient rational development or normative competence — are absent.
With a better understanding of the rationale and limits of Mill's liberal principles, we can take a closer look at the details of his categorical approach.
We should begin our scrutiny of the harm principle by rehearsing some facts about it. First, Mill distinguishes between harm and mere offense; to constitute a harm an action must be injurious or setback important interests of particular people, interests in which they have rights (I 12; III 1; IV 3, 10, 12; V 5). Whereas Mill appears to reject the regulation of mere offense, the harm principle appears to be the one justification he recognizes for restricting liberty. Second, to satisfy the harm principle, an action need not cause harm; it is enough if it poses a substantial risk of imminent harm (IV 10). Third, it should be noted that Mill wants to extend the scope of the harm principle. He insists that the harm principle is not just for social settings; its application should include the family, in particular, relationships between husbands and wives and parents and children (V 12). Here, he prefigures some claims he will develop in The Subjection of Women. Also, notice that he here seems to extend his analysis of liberal principles not just to the relations between governments or societies and individuals but to the relations among individuals, in particular, family members.
Does Mill really treat the harm principle as the sole legitimate basis for restricting the liberties of individuals? He is often interpreted as claiming that causing harm to others is both necessary and sufficient for justifying restrictions of liberty. Is that right?
Is harm sufficient to justify regulation? In general, Mill writes as if the prevention of harm is a sufficient justification for restricting liberty. However, at one point, he claims that causing harm to others creates a prima facie case for restricting liberty (I11). The suggestion seems to be that causing harm is always pro tanto reason to regulate the action, but that regulation may not always be on balance best. Perhaps effective restriction of the harmful behavior is very costly or has other bad side-effects. If the regulation is more harmful than the behavior in question, it may be best not to regulate. This suggests that we might distinguish stronger and weaker versions of the idea that harm is sufficient to justify regulation.
- Weak principle: harm is always a prima facie justification of regulation.
- Strong principle: harm is always a conclusive justification of regulation.
In another passage, Mill claims that actions that cause losses/harms in (fair) competition should not be regulated (V 3). If I beat you out in a fair competition for a job, you arguably suffer a loss or harm, but Mill thinks that it would be wrong to restrict my liberty. Insofar as this case threatens sufficiency, it is not entirely clear if it threatens weak, as well as strong, sufficiency. Also, we might wonder if it is a genuine counterexample to either form of sufficiency. Does my getting the job harm you? Mill links harms with rights (I 12; III 1; IV 3, 10, 12; V 5). Do you have a right to the job or just to a fair opportunity at the job? What about non-economic losses and harms? Suppose you promised to marry me but leave me standing at the altar. Here you may well harm me. But presumably we do not think, and Mill does not claim, that you can be legally prevented from doing so.
Is harm necessary to justify regulation? Though some of Mill's pronouncements suggest that causing harm is a necessary condition of restricting liberty, closer inspection suggests that Mill's considered answer must be No. It seems abundantly clear from various claims Mill makes both within On Liberty and elsewhere, that he is willing to countenance restrictions on individual liberty that do not appear designed to prevent harm to others. Here is a partial list of such commitments.
- Some actions for the benefit of others may be compelled on the ground that their omission causes harm. These include (a) giving evidence in court, (b) contributing one's fair share to common defense and other public goods, and (c) certain kinds of mutual aid (e.g. Good Samaritanism) (I 11).
- Each may be required to bear his fair share of the costs of securing public goods (IV 3).
- Government may regulate trade (e.g. fixing prices or regulating manufacture), because such conduct is not purely private (IV 4).
- The state should make education compulsory (V 12-14). (a) This is a form of paternalism that is consistent with Mill's scope worry (I 10), but also (b) a restriction on the liberty of parents that seems not to conform to the harm principle.
- Mill accepts many forms of social welfare legislation. He thinks that local and central government are empowered to enact various kinds of legislation pursuant to the community's interest (PPEV.i.2; CRGXV/CW XIX 538, 541). He explicitly includes the following items on the governmental agenda: (a) the redistribution of wealth (through taxes on earned and unearned income and inheritance) so as to ensure a decent minimum standard of living, (b) Poor Laws that provide work for the able-bodied indigent (PPE II.xii.2, V.xi.13), (c) labor regulation (e.g.regulation of the hours of factory-laborers) (PPE:V.xi.12), (d) provision for a common defense (OLI 11; PPEV.viii.1), (e) development of a system of public education (OL:V 12‑13; PPEII.xiii.3, V.xi.8; CRG VIII/467-70; AutoV/128), (f) maintenance of community infrastructure (e.g. roads, sanitation, police, and correctional facilities) (PPEV.viii.1; CRGXV/538, 541), and (c) state support for the arts (PPEV.xi.15). Some of these regulations restrict liberty directly; others do so indirectly inasmuch as the implementation of the legislation can only be supported by compulsory taxation.
In all of these cases, liberty is restricted not, it would seem, to prevent harm to others but rather to provide benefits to others. (1) alone explicitly tries to convert the failure to supply benefits into harms. But we might try to generalize this strategy to the other cases as well. How well does it work? There are two sorts of worries about this strategy.
There is a general worry about whether the failure to provide benefits always counts as a harm. In many cases it seems not to. You would benefit me by transferring all your savings to my bank account (let us assume); it doesn't follow that your failure to do so harms me. Why not? Presumably, because we assess harms counterfactually: if x harms me, it makes me significantly worse off than I would have been otherwise. This makes clear that harms are assessed relative to some baseline. It is an interesting question how to set the baseline. What seems clear is that the baseline cannot be set by the restriction on liberty itself; that would convert all failures to benefit into harms. The baseline must have some independent rationale. Take Mill's example of Good Samaritan laws. Suppose I fail to rescue the drowning child when I can do so at little or no cost to myself. We may agree that my failure to rescue is wrong and perhaps that the law ought to compel aid in such cases. But it is not clear that my failure to rescue harms the child. Have I made the child worse-off than he would otherwise have been? Well, relative to what baseline? Of course, I have made him worse-off relative to the baseline situation in which Good Samaritanism is compulsory. But why select that baseline? I haven't made him worse-off relative to the situation he would have been in had I not been there.
If so, it is not clear that I harm the person whom I fail to rescue. Nonetheless, the person whom I fail to rescue does seem to be harmed, not by me, but by his falling into the pond and drowning. After all, he would have been better off had he not fallen into the pond and drowned. This suggests a possible way for Mill to square Good Samaritan laws with the harm principle. It requires distinguishing two different readings of the harm principle (cf. Lyons 1979).
- HP1: A can restrict B's liberty in order to prevent B from harming others.
- HP2: A can restrict B's liberty in order to prevent harm to others.
Whereas HP1 justifies intervention only when the target herself would be the cause of harm to others, HP2 would justify intervention to prevent harm to others, whether that harm would be caused by the target or in some other way. Clearly, HP2 will justify more intervention than HP1. It is hard to justify Good Samaritan laws if HP is the sole basis for restricting liberty as long as we understand HP as HP1. If we understand HP as HP1, then we must either reject Good Samaritan laws or the claim that HP is the sole basis for restricting liberty. However, for all we have said so far, we could square Good Samaritan laws with HP if we interpret HP as HP2. That's some reason to interpret HP that way. But notice that if we interpret HP as HP2, then it is likely to allow a good many more restrictions on liberty than we might have thought. The sphere of liberal rights that follow from the harm principle would be considerably smaller according to HP2 than according to HP1.
A different worry about the necessity of harm concerns those cases in which the benefits secured by individual restrictions are small. The problem arises primarily for laws that compel contribution of one's fair share of public goods, as in (1b), (2), (5d), and (5f). For it is part of the structure of public goods that the effect of individual contributions on provision of the public good is quite small. The negative impact of an individual's failure to contribute is both small and is spread widely over the population. But that means that even if failure to confer such benefits would otherwise count as harmful, the cost of individual failures does not seem to meet Mill's criteria for harmful conduct — the costs are not sufficiently great and they are spread too widely and, as a result, are not borne by assignable individuals. This is a worry for both HP1 and HP2.
Finally, as we will see shortly, Mill does not in fact accept a blanket prohibition on paternalism. He allows paternalistic restrictions that have a certain structure — roughly, autonomy-enhancing forms of paternalism (V 11). If so, this shows that Mill does not think that the only acceptable restrictions on liberty are those that prevent harm to others.
These claims show that Mill is no libertarian. By itself, that is no problem. But it is hard to see how he can reconcile these claims about the way in which the state can and should interfere with individual liberty with his frequent claims that liberty may be restricted only in accordance with the harm principle. Mill's simple statement of his basic principle is vastly over-simple.
Presumably, Mill's concern with paternalism is general and includes paternalism practiced by individuals or groups, as well as by states. But, as we have already noticed, his focus is on paternalism practiced by the state. Why the blanket prohibition on paternalism? He offers two explicit reasons.
First, state power is liable to abuse. Politicians are self-interested and corruptible and will use a paternalistic license to limit the freedom of citizens in ways that promote their own interests and not those of the citizens whose liberty they restrict (V 20-3).
Second, even well intentioned rulers will misidentify the good of citizens. Because an agent is a more reliable judge of his own good, even well intentioned rulers will promote the good of the citizens less well than would the citizens themselves (IV 4, 12).
These are reasonably strong consequentialist arguments against giving the state a broad discretionary power to engage in paternalistic legislation whenever it sees fit. However, they do not support a categorical ban on paternalism. In particular, these arguments provide no principled objection to paternalism — no objection to successful paternalistic restrictions on B's liberty that do in fact benefit B. This weakness in Mill's explicit argument against paternalism is like the weakness in his truth-tracking defense of freedom of expression. Just as that argument provided no objection to successful censorship (censorship of all and only false belief), so too this argument provides no objection to successful paternalism (A's restrictions on B's liberty that do benefit B). Perhaps some who object to paternalism are only concerned with unsuccessful paternalism. They would have no objection to successful paternalism. But, for many, doubts about paternalism run deeper. They would be inclined to think that much, if not all, paternalism would be impermissible even if it was successful. For it is common to think that individuals have a right to make choices in their own personal affairs and that this includes a right to make choices that are imprudent.
However, Mill's perfectionist defense of basic liberties provides a more robust rationale against paternalistic interference. For if a person's happiness depends on her exercise of the capacities that make her a responsible agent, then a principal ingredient of her own good must include opportunities for responsible choice and reflective decision-making. But then it becomes clear how autonomy is an important part of a person's good and how paternalism undercuts her good in important and predictable ways. Mill may still not have an argument against successful paternalism, but his perfectionist defense of basic liberties does give him an argument that successful paternalism is much harder to achieve than one might have thought, because it is very hard to benefit an autonomous agent in paternalistic ways.
Despite Mill's many blanket prohibitions on paternalism, he does not (consistently) reject paternalism per se. For instance, he is forced to qualify his blanket prohibition on paternalism in order to maintain his claim that no one should be free to sell himself into slavery.
The ground for thus limiting his power of voluntarily disposing of his own lot is apparent, and is very clearly seen in this extreme case. … [B]y selling himself for a slave, he abdicates his liberty; he foregoes any future use of it beyond that single act. He, therefore, defeats in his own case, the very purpose which is the justification of allowing him to dispose of himself [V 11].
Because it is the importance of exercising one's deliberative capacities that explains the importance of certain liberties, the usual reason for recognizing liberties provides an argument against extending liberties to do things that will permanently undermine one's future exercise of those same capacities. In this case, an exception to the usual prohibition on paternalism is motivated by appeal to the very same deliberative values that explain the usual prohibition. So this seems to be a principled exception to the usual prohibition on paternalism. We might call these autonomy-enhancing forms of paternalism.
Notice that Mill claims that the reasons for allowing paternalism in “this extreme case” are “evidently of far wider application” (V 11). That raises the question of what other forms of paternalism might be justified as principled exceptions to the usual prohibition on paternalism. Unfortunately, Mill does not directly address this question.
In Chapter II Mill seems to assert that censorship is never permissible and that freedom of expression is absolute. Were we to combine this free speech absolutism with the assumption that liberty can be restricted iff it causes harm, we would have to conclude that Mill believes that speech can never be harmful — “sticks and stone can break my bones, but words can never hurt me”. However, Mill does recognize that speech can be harmful, and he applies the harm principle to speech, as well as other action, when he claims that the regulation of incendiary speech is permissible.
[E]ven opinions lose their immunity when the circumstances in which they are expressed are such as to constitute their expression a positive instigation to some mischievous act. An opinion that corn dealers are starvers of the poor, or that private property is robbery, ought to be unmolested when simply circulated through the press, but may justifiably incur punishment when delivered orally to an excited mob assembled before the house of a corn dealer, or when handed about among the same mob in the form of a placard [III 1].
One question that the corn dealer passage raises is how much censorship would be justified by applying the harm principle. Mill would presumably agree with Holmes's formulation of the “clear and present danger” test in his majority opinion in Schenck v. United States.
The most stringent protection of free speech would not protect a man in falsely shouting fire in a crowded theater, and causing a panic. … The question in every case is whether the words used are used in such circumstances and are of such a nature as to create a clear and present danger ….
There are other ways in which First Amendment jurisprudence is not absolutist, which are worth considering. For instance, First Amendment jurisprudence distinguishes between low-value and high-value speech and subjects legislation restricting high-value speech to closer judicial scrutiny than it does legislation affecting low-value speech. The Supreme Court formulated the distinction between low-value and high-value speech in Chaplinsky v. New Hampshire. 
There are certain well-defined and narrowly limited classes of speech, the prevention and punishment of which have never been thought to raise any Constitutional problem. These include the lewd and the obscene, the profane, the libelous, and the insulting or “fighting” words — those which by their very utterance inflict injury or tend to incite an immediate breach of the peace. It has been well observed that such utterances are no essential part of any exposition of ideas, and are of such slight social value as a step to truth that any benefit that may be derived from them is clearly outweighed by the social interest in order and morality.
Here the Court associates central First Amendment liberties with what is an essential part of the exposition of ideas and what is of value as a step toward truth. Like Mill, the Court justifies freedom of expression as a way of promoting true belief. However, if the Court values freedom of expression only as a means of promoting true belief, then it becomes difficult to extend protection to false beliefs, as the Court has. But we need not interpret the Court as valuing freedom of expression only as a means of acquiring true beliefs. The Court appeals to what is an essential part of the exposition of ideas and what is of value as a step toward truth. We can see this rationale as invoking, as Mill also does, deliberative values about the value of free inquiry to the promotion of knowledge, and not just true belief. If we interpret the Court's rationale this way, we can provide a more wide-ranging conception of high-value speech that includes the advocacy of some false beliefs.
What would Mill think about low-value speech and the permissibility of regulating it? He might well think that some examples of low-value speech violate the harm principle. For instance, it is not hard to see how libelous speech — roughly, false and defamatory speech in which the speaker knew that her statement is false and defamatory or acted in reckless disregard of these matters — might be harmful. And some kinds of fighting words might also be harmful. Certainly, fighting words that incite pugilistic responses can be harmful, as Mill recognizes in the corn dealer case. In other situations, fighting words may cause genuine psychic harm that is serious in its consequences and goes beyond mere offense. It is less clear what Mill would think about the permissibility of anti-discriminatory regulations of speech of the sort embodied in employment discrimination law, hate speech regulations, and policies regulating certain kinds of pornography. Mill's commitments here would depend, in part, on whether the regulations in question targeted mere offense or genuine harm. Insofar as such regulations target genuine harm, and not mere offense, some of them may be defensible according to Millian principles.
As we have seen, Mill distinguishes between merely offensive and genuinely harmful behavior. Whereas genuinely harmful behavior can be regulated, merely offensive behavior cannot (I 12; III 1; IV 3, 10, 12; V 5). However, in his discussion of drunkenness, he does at one point allow that offenses against others may be prohibited, at least when they involve acts of public indecency.
Again, there are many acts which, being directly injurious only to the agents themselves, ought not to be legally interdicted, but which, if done publicly, are a violation of good manners and, coming thus within the category of offenses against others, may be rightly prohibited. Of this kind are offenses against decency; on which it is unnecessary to dwell, the rather as they are only connected indirectly with our subject, the objection to publicity being equally strong in the case of many actions not in themselves condemnable, nor supposed to be so [V 7].
The immediate context is otherwise paternalistic restrictions with drink. But when drinking that is otherwise purely self-regarding is done in public, it becomes offensive and, Mill here claims, regulable. It seems impossible to square this with Mill's blanket prohibition on offense regulation. However, it might be claimed that this is best viewed as a qualification, rather than a rejection, of his opposition to offense regulation. Though still opposed to offense legislation per se, he indicates here that he is not opposed to the regulation of public offenses. Not everything that is permissible to do in private is permissible to do in public. Even if this is a coherent position, we might wonder if it is attractive. If behavior is impermissible to regulate in private, why is it okay to regulate in public? Mill's answer is that when done in public, the conduct comes “thus within the category of offense against others”. But if publicity is relevant because it makes the conduct offensive, then Mill's real appeal is to offense. But then this exception threatens to swallow the rule.
Mill may not have a consistent view about offense. Except for this one potentially wide-ranging endorsement of offense regulation, Mill's is otherwise clear in his opposition to offense regulation. How attractive is this sort of libertarian position on offense regulation?
It is instructive in this context to consider briefly the views of Joel Feinberg, who sees himself articulating a Millian position in his important four-volume work Moral Limits of the Criminal Law (1984-88). Feinberg understands his own defense of Millian principles as involving a modified Millian categorical approach. His main modification of Millian principles, as he sees it, is to permit some forms of offense regulation. In volume 2, Offense to Others (1985), Feinberg begins by focusing on nuisance. Many offensive things are nuisances; they cause passing disagreeable mental states or sensations. But even if many nuisances are just the price one has to pay to live in a free society, it is common for the criminal law to regulate nuisance. Feinberg thinks that some nuisances — especially public nuisances — can justify regulation. To determine when offense (nuisance) regulation is permissible and when it is not, Feinberg employs a balancing test in which we must weigh the seriousness of the offense (e.g. its magnitude and avoidability) against the importance of the agent's interests being regulated (e.g. their magnitude and the existence of alternative avenues of expression).
The details of Feinberg's balancing test are complex and potentially controversial. But it does seem safe to say that most liberal societies do in fact allow for some nuisance regulation and that if one is going to consider modifying Mill's categorical approach so as to allow the prevention of profound nuisance, then one must restrict potential regulation to offense that is not unreasonable, and one must allow restriction only when the expressive interests of the offenders are modest and where offenders have ample alternative avenues of expression. Since Mill's own position on offense regulation is not fully consistent, it is hard to say how big a modification this would make in his liberal principles.
Mill, we saw, appears to reject legal moralism categorically (e.g. I 9). Other Millian liberals, such as Feinberg, treat the rejection of legal moralism as a constitutive commitment of liberalism. One might well wonder whether there are cases of legal moralism that aren't cases of the harm principle because one might wonder if there are forms of immorality that don't cause harm. We might fail to see a gap between harm and immorality for one of two reasons.
- One might think that the only real immorality is the sort that causes harm, as in murder, rape, assault, extortion, etc.
- One might think that any immorality causes harm because it harms the agent's soul.
However, neither reason should be an obstacle to us taking legal moralism seriously.
Consider (2). Even if immorality necessarily harmed one's soul, this would still not collapse moralism into the harm principle. For one thing, the harm would be to the agent's own soul, so restrictions on liberty designed to prevent this harm would paternalistic, not applications of the harm principle. And even if Mill is committed to allowing some kinds of paternalism, such as autonomy-enhancing forms of paternalism, there is no reason to think that he would approve of paternalism whose sole rationale is protection of the agent's soul. Moreover, it seems clear that Mill intends the harm principle to apply to conduct that causes harm independently of its immorality.
Consider (1). Though paradigm forms of immorality, such as murder, rape, and (unprovoked) assault, cause harm (independently), it is not at all clear that all forms of immorality involve such harm. Traditional debates about legal moralism, of the sort famously waged between Lord Devlin and H.L.A. Hart, concerned the legislative enforcement of sexual morality, in particular, the regulation of homosexuality and pornography. For the most part, both sides conceded that these activities were harmless but then debated whether it could be permissible to regulate them as a matter of enforcing sexual morality. Moreover, as we will see, there are other sorts of conduct that appear not to cause harm but nonetheless to be wrong, including, but not limited to, such things as criminal attempts, crimes that don't harm, desecration of the dead, and bestiality.
To understand and assess the Millian position on legal moralism, it is useful to bear in mind the debate between Devlin and his Millian critics. Though Mill would presumably oppose moral legislation that prevents no harm, Lord Devlin (1965) defends its permissibility. Millian liberals, such as Hart (1963), Dworkin (1966), and Feinberg (1988), have rejected Devlin's arguments, his defense of the moral legislation of sexual morality, and, more generally, his defense of moral legislation.
At one point, Devlin appeals to public censure as a reason to regard the behavior as immoral and subject to regulation. Here, he seems to argue as follows.
- Society has reason to prohibit behavior that is immoral, whether or not it causes harm.
- Hence, society has reason to prohibit behavior that it has good reason to believe is immoral.
- Public censure of behavior provides good reason to think that the behavior is immoral.
- There is public censure of homosexuality and pornography.
- Hence, society has a right to prohibit homosexuality and pornography.
Some critics, such as Dworkin, have focused on (3), claiming that public censure is not very good reason to think that the object of censure is immoral. Censure might register disgust (Icky!) or alienation (That's weird!) rather than a moral judgment. Even when censure reflects moral beliefs, censure itself provides no good reason to think that the censured conduct is immoral. People have all sorts of moral beliefs that are ill-informed, dogmatic, superstitious, and the product of prejudice. One has to be able to tell some secularly plausible story about why the censored conduct is wrong before one should treat censure as a reliable indicator of immorality. Not only should we reject (3) as such; but also we should reject the specific suggestion that public censure of homosexuality and pornography provide good evidence of their immorality.
Mill and anyone else who categorically rejects legal moralism will think that the plausibility of (3) is neither here nor there. The real problem with the argument, they claim, is (1). Much immoral conduct is harmful and that is why it is immoral. This is true of central provisions of the criminal law, such as the prohibitions on murder, rape, assault, and theft. This sort of moral legislation is fine. But moral legislation as such, in particular, moral legislation that does not aim to prevent harm is impermissible. Criminal legislation deprives people of liberty and, as such, imposes quite significant harm. The only good reason for imposing such harm is the prevention of harm.
Perhaps there is no very good reason to think that homosexuality and pornography are, as such, immoral. But consider a more plausible case of harmless immorality, say, a case of promise-breaking or deception that actually fails to result in harm. Junior takes the car out without parental permission but nothing untoward happens. Here is a case of harmless wrongdoing. Consider this argument
- Society has reason to prohibit behavior that is immoral, whether or not it causes harm.
- Junior's taking the car without parental permission is a case of harmless wrongdoing.
- Hence, society has a right to prohibit Junior's behavior.
Presumably, liberals think this is a case in which the law should not intervene. Here, it might seem that we need to agree with Mill in order to avoid the illiberal conclusion. Indeed, many people tend to think that to avoid illiberal conclusions about moral legislation one must reject legal moralism as such.
But this line of reasoning assumes that Devlin's argument is valid. But it is not. The conclusion of his argument — (5) — and the conclusion of this last argument — (3) — are all-things-considered conclusions. But they rest on the legal moralist principle (1), which asserts only pro tanto or prima facie reason to regulate. But a pro tanto reason to regulate does not entail an all-thing-considered reason to regulate. In particular, even if there is some reason to regulate conduct, there may be countervailing reasons not to regulate it. Perhaps the costs of regulation — administrative and otherwise — exceed the benefit of regulation. But this shows that the legal moralist need not regulate all harmless wrongdoing, and this shows that it is not necessary to reject legal moralism as such in order to defend liberal conclusions. This does not entail that Mill's rejection of legal moralism is wrong, only that it is not necessary to deliver most of his liberal conclusions.
But we do force a choice between the Millian rejection of legal moralism and the more liberal form of legal moralism if there are cases of harmless wrongdoing where legal regulation is appropriate. Consider the following list of candidates for harmless immorality that it is nonetheless appropriate to regulate.
- Criminal attempts, such as attempted murder, that aim to harm but do not succeed
- Crimes that don't harm, because their consequences don't make anyone worse off than they would otherwise be, such as the murder of someone whose life is not worth living or nonharmful fraud
- Desecration of the dead
All of these seem to be cases of wrongdoing that does not cause harm. Yet many would think some or all of them are properly regulated by the criminal or civil law. If any of these involve harmless immorality that it is permissible to regulate, then we must reject the Millian categorical ban on legal moralism.
So, Mill's “one very simple principle” — that liberty may be restricted always and only to prevent harm to another — is over-simple. So too is the related categorical approach to liberty that approves all applications of the harm principle and rejects all cases of paternalism, censorship, offense regulation, and legal moralism. The harm principle itself is complex. It is not clear whether harm to another creates a pro tanto or all-things-considered reason for restricting liberty, and it is not clear if the harm principle justifies restricting liberty to prevent others from being harmed or only justifies restricting liberty to prevent those whose liberty is being restricted from causing harm to another. However these questions are resolved, it is unclear that the harm principle is necessary to justify restrictions on liberty. Liberty may be restricted to pursue the public good in certain ways. Moreover, Mill softens his anti-paternalistic position by recognizing the permissibility of restrictions on selling oneself into slavery and other autonomy-enhancing forms of paternalism. He recognizes legitimate forms of censorship designed to prevent harm to others. Despite his general hostility to offense regulation, at one point Mill recognizes the permissibility of restrictions on public indecency on the ground that such conduct is offensive to others. Though Mill does seem more consistent in his opposition to legal moralism, it is not necessary to reject legal moralism as such in order to recognize the liberal conclusion that many forms of legal moralism do not do enough good in order to justify the harms they cause. Moreover, there are some forms of legal moralism that do seem to justify enforcing moral norms, even though the behavior in question does not cause harm.
These count as important qualifications to the harm principle provided that we understand a harm as something like the setback of an important interest. We might try to square some of these complications with Mill's advocacy of the harm principle by accepting a moralized conception of harm according to which something counts as a harm just in case it is an unjustified interference with someone's interests and violates her rights (cf. Jacobsen 2000). For then at least some apparent exceptions to the harm principle, such as restrictions on liberty designed to promote the common good or produce public goods, could be reconciled with the harm principle on the ground that they aim to prevent unjustified interference with the interests of others. But it is unclear how the moralization of harm would allow us to reconcile autonomy-enhancing paternalism with the harm principle. For the prohibition on selling oneself into slavery, though it might count as a justified interference with someone's interests is interference with one's own interests, not those of another. Moreover, the moralized interpretation of the harm principle prevents us from citing the harm that an action would cause, as Mill evidently does, as the reason for thinking that it is unjustified interference with another or that it would violate someone's rights. If so, it seems better to maintain an independent grip on the concept of harm and recognize that Mill endorses a complex, rather than a simple, categorical approach.
Now that we have examined Mill's categorical approach to basic liberties we can return to the apparent tension between a categorical approach to individual liberties and rights and utilitarianism. For even if Mill employs complex, rather than simple, categories, there appears to be a tension between categorical protections of basic liberties and the sort of case-by-case consequentialist analysis that utilitarianism would seem to require. Insofar as rights correspond to categorical rules protecting individual interests or liberties, this is also an issue about whether Mill can defend rights to basic liberties compatibly with his utilitarian commitments.
While complex categories are not, as such, any less categorical than simple ones, some of the complexity in Mill's considered categories seems to reduce the tension with utilitarianism. For, as we noted, he does allow several restrictions on individual liberty that are designed to promote the common good, for instance, by securing public goods. Moreover, he does allow paternalistic restrictions on liberty when the consequences are autonomy-enhancing. And, at least sometimes, he is prepared to accept the regulation of public indecency on the ground of preventing offense to others. If this exception is not to swallow his rule against offense regulation, then he must condition the permissibility of offense regulation on something like Feinberg's balancing test, which weighs the seriousness of the expressive interests of the agent against the seriousness of the complaints by the agent's audience. In all these cases, Mill is prepared to sacrifice liberties for the sake of some greater good. Insofar as Mill's exceptions to the one very simple principle have this consequentialist character, his position may not look anti-utilitarian after all.
But this may be too simple a reconciliation of Mill's liberalism and his utilitarianism. Where Mill does recognize good consequences as a sufficient justification for infringing individual liberties, it is arguable that he does or can treat the liberty as non-fundamental. The liberty to be free from taxation necessary to secure the provision of public goods is not central to choice and pursuit of personal ideals. The liberty to sell oneself into slavery is not a fundamental liberty precisely because it undermines the agent's own autonomy. Where audience interests outweigh the agent's expressive interests in a defensible balancing test for offense regulation, there will almost always be alternative avenues for individual expression, but then it is arguable that the particular liberty of expression in question is not a fundamental liberty. So consequentialist reasoning might be sufficient to justify restricting non-basic liberties. But this allows Mill to claim that basic liberties are not hostage to case-by-case consequentialist accounting. This leaves Mill with a reasonably plausible claim to recognize individual rights to basic liberties. Can this commitment be squared with utilitarianism? Consider three different reconciliation strategies.
A. Rights as Secondary Principles. One response is for Mill to treat rights as secondary principles whose observance is justified on utilitarian grounds. Recall that he denies that his arguments appeal to “the idea of abstract right as a thing independent of utility” (OL I 11). On one interpretation, rights are protected by rules that insulate an individual's interest or liberty from certain kinds of interference and that make no direct reference to the good consequences of insulation. We should observe such rules more or less uncritically, and set them aside only when adherence to them is clearly suboptimal or in cases of conflicts among such rules (rights). In such exceptional cases, we should make direct appeal to the principle of utility. But, otherwise, not. Why should we regulate our conduct by such rules? Because doing so is generally but imperfectly optimal, and we are unable to discriminate for cases in which deviation form the rules is suboptimal without deviating from them in other cases in which it is not.
Recall that we said that Mill's claims about the role of secondary principles in moral reasoning were compatible with act utilitarianism (§2.8). It is generally but imperfectly optimal to honor rights. In cases in which it is not optimal, it may nonetheless be best to act on a policy that honors them. These would be cases of blameless wrongdoing.
B. Rights as Incomparable Goods. Why should we believe that there are interests or liberties that it is generally but imperfectly optimal to protect? Mill's answer is that some interests and liberties play a more fundamental role in human happiness than others. On this reading, rights protect incomparable or dominant goods. Recall that Mill links the idea of justice and rights insofar as all injustices are not only wrong but violate rights.
While I dispute the pretensions of any theory which sets up an imaginary standard of justice not grounded on utility, I account the justice which is grounded on utility to be the chief part, and incomparably the most sacred and binding part, of all morality. Justice is a name for certain classes of moral rules which concern the essentials of human well-being more nearly, and are therefore of more absolute obligation, than any other rules for the guidance of life; and the notion which we have found to be of the essence of the idea of justice — that of a right residing in an individual — implies and testifies to this more binding obligation [U V 32; cf. V 33, 37-38].
Indeed, if the goods protected by rights are so important, we can understand why Mill might think that society ought to enforce them by law or opinion (V 24).
On the incomparable goods conception of rights, it is in fact always optimal to honor rights, except in cases of conflicts of rights. This account of rights could be fit within a direct conception of utilitarianism and would be compatible with act utilitarianism. It would explain why one person's right trumps ordinary appeals to collective advantage. But it would not support the idea that rights are absolute protections. Rights should not be honored when doing so would be clearly suboptimal. Of course, if rights protect interests and liberties that are higher in the scale of value than other considerations, then there may be few, if any cases, in which interfering with a right to promote other collective goods would be optimal. Indeed, if Mill treats such interests and liberties as he treats higher pleasure — as being incomparably better than other goods — then it could never be better overall to sacrifice a right in the smallest way to achieve any amount of lesser goods. Of course, even if the goods that rights protect are incomparably better than other goods, they won't be incomparably better than each other. So we can imagine that honoring a right might be purchased at the price of honoring other, comparable rights. There should be no presumption in such conflicts that it is always optimal to honor an individual's rights. But that would be to recognize a conflict of rights, and Mill's conception of secondary principles implies that such conflicts should be resolved by direct appeal to the principle of utility. Presumably, Mill would be committed to the desirability of maximizing the observance of rights or minimizing their violation.
C. Mill's Indirect Theory of Rights. The secondary principle and incomparable goods conceptions of rights have a lot in common. They both justify honoring rights, except in cases of conflicts of rights in a way that is compatible with act utilitarianism. The incomparable goods conception implies that it is never optimal to violate a right, except in cases of conflicts of rights. The secondary principle conception implies that we should honor rights, except in cases of conflicts of rights, either because this is optimal or, if not, because it is a case of blameless wrongdoing.
Notice that these direct utilitarian interpretations of Mill's conception of rights explain why Mill might believe that rights are considerations that are sufficiently important that they ought to be not only honored but socially protected by force of law or opinion as well (U V 24). Consider the incomparable goods conception. It treats the social enforceability of rights as consequence of their importance. It does not treat social enforceability as the defining feature of rights, as Mill seems at one point to suggest. He says that the idea of a rights violation has two elements — the idea of injury to the right holder and the idea of warranted punishment. He expands on this second element.
When we call anything a person's right, we mean that he has a valid claim on society to protect him in the possession of it, either by the force of law, or by that of education and opinion. If he has what we consider a sufficient claim, on whatever account, to have something guaranteed to him by society, we say that he has a right to it [V 24].
But this claim seems to introduce a form of indirect utilitarianism into Mill's conception of rights. For it implies that whether one possesses the moral trump of a right to particular interests or liberties in a particular case is not determined by the value of honoring or interfering with that interest of liberty but by the value of protecting and/or punishing interference.
How, if at all, does this indirect utilitarian aspect of Mill's theory of rights afford a response to the apparent tension between utility and rights? One point is that Mill can apparently say that it is always wrong to violate rights. Mill thinks that a right is something that society ought to protect me in the possession and exercise of, and he thinks that to protect me in this way is to punish (by force of law or opinion) those who interfere with my possession or exercise of that to which I have a right. But then rights violators ought to be punished by society. But then — according to Mill's indirect conception of duty — it follows that they act wrongly.
The different conceptions of rights that Mill's remarks support disagree over some interesting details, such as whether rights are absolute and whether it is always wrong to violate rights. But they all agree on the idea that individuals have basic interests and liberties the protection of which should not be subject to a case-by-case consequentialist calculation involving disparate kinds of goods. They all recognize rights to basic liberties that trump the pursuit of collective interests in comfort and convenience. These liberal essentials provide a kind of vindication of Mill's claim to give rights a utilitarian foundation. But Mill seems ambivalent as among these three different ways of grounding these liberal essentials.
We get a somewhat different perspective on Mill's utilitarian and liberal principles by seeing how he applies them to social and political issues. We might begin by focusing on Mill's conception of democratic equality, as reflected in his defense of a democratic form of liberalism in Considerations on Representative Government and Principles of Political Economy.
In Considerations on Representative Democracy Mill argues that a form of representative democracy is the best ideal form of government. It is not an invariant ideal, which holds regardless of historical or social circumstances. But he does think that it is the best form of government for societies with sufficient resources, security, and culture of self-reliance. In particular, Mill thinks that representative democracy is best, when it is best, because it best satisfies two criteria of all good government: (1) that government is good insofar as it promotes the common good, where this is conceived of as promoting the moral, intellectual, and active traits of its citizens, and (2) that government is good insofar as it makes effective use of institutions and the resources of its citizens to promote the common good (II/ CW XIX 390, 392). Insofar as (2) is really a component of (1), we might conclude that Mill's ultimate political criterion is that good government should promote the common good of its citizens. Mill does not explicitly invoke his version of utilitarianism. Perhaps he wants his defense of representative democracy to rest on more ecumenical premises. But he clearly understands this political criterion of the common good in broadly consequentialist or result-oriented terms. Moreover, though he may not mention the higher pleasures doctrine explicitly, it is also clear that Mill understands the good of each in broadly perfectionist terms that emphasize the importance of an active and autonomous form of life that exercises intellectual, deliberative, and creative capacities.
Mill thinks that there are two ways in which democracy is, under the right circumstances, best suited to promote the common good. First, he thinks that democracy plays an important epistemic role in identifying the common good. Proper deliberation about issues affecting the common good requires identifying how different policies would bear on the interests of affected parties and so requires the proper representation and articulation of the interests of citizens. But failure of imagination and the operation of personal bias present obstacles to the effective representation of the interests of others. Universal suffrage and political participation provide the best assurance that the interests of the governed will be properly appreciated by political decision-makers (III/404). In making this epistemic argument for democracy, Mill draws on some of his claims in On Liberty about the value of free inquiry and experimentation in lifestyle for developing our nature as progressive beings. But Mill thinks that democracy is also the best form of government because of the constitutive effects of political participation on the improvement of the moral capacities of citizens (II/404). To the extent that the governed can and do participate in public debate and elections they exercise those very deliberative capacities that it is the aim of government to develop.
So far, these would seem to be arguments for widespread — indeed, universal — direct democracy. In fact, unlike many writers interested in expanding the franchise, Mill defends the extension of the franchise to women too, rejecting any restriction on their franchise as baseless (VIII/479). But Mill qualifies this defense of direct democracy in various significant ways.
Mill defends representative, rather than direct, democracy. Direct democracy is impractical in anything but a small community (IV/412). But representative democracy has the further advantage of allowing the community to rely in its decision-making on the contributions of individuals with special qualifications of intelligence or character (V/424). In this way, representative democracy represents a more effective use of resources within the citizenry to advance the common good.
Moreover, Mill believes that representatives are charged with the task of voting, after free and open discussion, their own considered views about what would promote the common good, rather than the sectarian preferences of their constituents (X/490). This is part of what Mill has in mind when he insists that franchise be seen as a public trust, rather than a private right (X/488), and when he concludes that the ballot be fair and open, rather than secretive (X/490). Only in this way, can political participation become a school for developing the moral capacities of its citizens.
Mill does not think that representatives will always craft legislation themselves, especially not on technical topics of economics, health, or law. Rather, they will often delegate the work of drafting policy on such topics to expert civil servants. Representatives assume responsibility for such legislation by articulating the objectives of these policies and reviewing proposed policies prior to enacting them. Only in this way will representative democracy take advantage of special expertise and competence to promote the common good (V). Moreover, many needs are local in nature, and, even when the needs are general, their satisfaction may depend heavily on local conditions. For this reason, Mill advocates a federal system in which a central representative body has more limited functions and local or municipal representative bodies govern in matters involving local affairs or local detail, such as the creation and maintenance of local infrastructure (roads, courts, jails, and schools) (XV). However, one important function of a central government, Mill believes, is the need to protect local political minorities from being systematically disadvantaged by local political majorities (XV/544).
Mill also insists that a representative democracy, either local or federal, should employ proportional, rather than winner-take-all, representation (VII/449-62; cf. “Thoughts on Parliamentary Reform” CW XIX 328-29). We can see how proportional representation fits with the epistemic argument for democracy. Winner-take-all representation eliminates effective expression of minority points of view so essential for free and informed inquiry about the common good (VII/458).
Mill also introduces various limitations on the scope and weight of the franchise. As we will see, he argues that even in advanced societies the scope of the franchise should be less than universal. Moreover, he advocates a scheme of weighted voting that gives plural votes to citizens with special intellectual and moral qualifications. Before discussing Mill's rationale for these limitations in the scope and weight of the franchise, they need to be viewed in context. In his philosophical writings and in his service as a Liberal member of Parliament for Westminster from 1865 to 1868, Mill was a vigorous advocate for democratic reform. Though he may have recognized some limits in the scope of the franchise, he was a consistent, though not always successful, advocate for its extension beyond its then current scope. He supported extending the franchise to previously disenfranchised members of the working class, and he was a staunch advocate for female suffrage (VIII/479). To many, such views about the appropriate scope of the franchise seemed quite radical. Though Mill did support weighted voting, he saw this, at least in part, as a necessary concession to succeed in securing his primary objective of (near) universal suffrage (VIII/476). It is worth bearing this context in mind when evaluating Mill's proposals for the scope and weight of the franchise.
As we noted earlier, Mill does not defend representative democracy as ideal under all historical and social circumstances. There are some social circumstances, he thinks, in which democracy will not promote the common good. These are backward states of society in which most citizens are unfit to rule, because they lack necessary ingredients of the culture of autonomy to exercise decision-making authority responsibly. They lack discipline, or education, or an active and independent character. Different forms of government are appropriate for such backward states of advancement. In particular, Mill thinks that benevolent rule by an enlightened one or few, which aimed at the common good, would be better suited for such societies (CRG IV/415-18). Here, Mill is introducing a scope limitation on the defense of political rights that he recognized explicitly in his defense of basic liberties in On Liberty.
It is, perhaps, hardly necessary to say that this doctrine is meant to apply only to human beings in the maturity of their faculties. We are not speaking of children or of young persons below the age which the law may fix as that of manhood or womanhood. Those who are still in a state to require being taken care of by others must be protected against their own actions as well as against external injury. For the same reason we may leave out of consideration those backward states of society in which the race itself may be considered as in its nonage. … Despotism is a legitimate mode of government in dealing with barbarians, provided that the end be their improvement and the means justified by actually effecting that end. Liberty, as a principle, has no application to any state of things anterior to the time when mankind have become capable of being improved by free and equal discussion [I 10].
There are important practical questions, which Mill does not address clearly, about which societies cross this threshold of capacity for improvement by free inquiry and political rights. But he does make clear that political participation, like free inquiry, is important as a necessary condition for the exercise of our higher capacities.
But what is true of some societies in relation to others is also true of some individuals in relation to others within societies that cross this threshold of normative competence. This explains limitations on the scope of the franchise that Mill recognizes within such advanced civilizations. Mill confines the scope of the franchise to mature adults, excluding minors who would not have crossed the threshold of normative competence. He is also prepared to exclude those adults who are not literate (VIII/470-71). This is a failure of normative competence for which society is to blame (VIII/470). Mill also excludes from the franchise those adults who are on public assistance (VIII/472). Here he expresses the concern that voting gives one a say not only over one's own life but also over the lives of others and that without contributing to the production of an economic surplus one has no right to help determine how this surplus is distributed. But Mill is also committed to doubts about the normative competence of those on public assistance. Elsewhere, he insists that charities make beneficiaries dependent on benefactors in ways that compromise their autonomy and independence (PPE V.xi.13). Mill would agree with the familiar adage “Give a man a fish; you have fed him for today. Teach a man to fish; and you have fed him for a lifetime”. Insofar as this is true, it provides an additional rationale for excluding dependents from the franchise.
These are the only limitations on the scope of the franchise that Mill recognizes within advanced civilizations. This may be surprising inasmuch as there are many other differences in comparative normative competence within such communities. Nor is Mill unaware of these additional differences. But he thinks that the reasons for favoring democracy apply to all those above this normative threshold. Literate manual laborers have the same claim to the franchise, Mill thinks, as anyone else. They need to stand up for their own interests and make sure they are properly reckoned in political decision-making. Moreover, they stand to benefit from political participation, because of the way it develops their deliberative capacities.
However, Mill's account of representative democracy tracks these further differences in terms of the weight, rather than the scope, of the franchise. He seems to think that there is a fairly minimal threshold level of normative competence, above which all should enjoy voting rights. Nonetheless, differences of normative competence above this threshold should affect the comparative weight of one's vote. This scheme of weighted voting takes the form of a system of plural votes, which he adapts from proposals by Thomas Hare (CRG VIII; cf. “Parliamentary Reform” 322-28). Mill emphatically rejects property qualifications as suitable proxies for normative competence (CRG VIII/474; “Parliamentary Reform” 325) and insists on educational qualifications.
The most direct mode of effecting this, would be to establish the plurality of votes, in favour of those who could afford a reasonable presumption of superior knowledge and cultivation. … The perfection, then, of an electoral system would be, that every person should have one vote, but that every well-educated person in the community should have more than one, on a scale corresponding as far as practicable to their amount of education [“Parliamentary Reform” 324-25].
There is an upper limit on the system of plural votes such that the weighted votes of the educational elite will not give them a majority coalition that could advance its class interests at the expense of the uneducated (CRG VIII/476).
Mill recognizes that his commitment to plural voting will be controversial and may prove impractical (VIII/476). Moreover, he attaches more importance to his commitments to (near) universal suffrage and to proportional representation than to his proposal for weighted voting (VIII/477-78). But as long as there remain significant differences in normative competence, Mill seems to think that weighted voting should be part of ideal theory, even if it should prove impracticable. The differences depend, in significant part, on the backward state of the working classes.
The opinions and wishes of the poorest and rudest class of labourers may be very useful as one influence among others on the minds of the voters, as well as on those of the Legislature; and yet it may be highly mischievous to give them the preponderant influence, but admitting them, in their present state of morals and intelligence, to the full exercise of the suffrage [“Parliamentary Reform” 334].
Despite these doubts about the working classes, Mill regarded himself as a friend of the working classes, and with some reason (cf. Auto VII/CW I 274; cf. Ten 1998). Mill did not blame the working classes for their comparative inferiority, and he did not regard their inferiority as a natural or permanent condition. He thought that improved access to quality primary and secondary education and greater scope for civic participation would gradually improve normative competence in the working classes (PPE IV.vii.2). Insofar as this is true, the qualification to Mill's commitment to political equality, represented by his scheme of weighted voting, is temporary and transitional. In this sense, weighted voting is not part of ideal political theory in the way that (near) universal suffrage and proportional representation are.
It is sometimes claimed that Mill's doctrine of weighted voting is a paternalistic doctrine, especially in its application to the working classes, and that it is, therefore, inconsistent with his anti-paternalistic position in On Liberty (e.g. Arneson 1982). However, this verdict may be premature. Mill's scheme of weighted voting does not deny the working class a voice in forming policies that concern them. Mill is emphatic that the franchise be extended to include them, because this is necessary to properly articulate their interests to political decision-makers and because this introduces them to the public culture of reason-giving and develops their moral powers. Weighted voting gives additional influence to those with fuller capacities and expertise. It is not clear in what sense this scheme represents a restriction on the liberty of the working classes. But then it is not clear in what sense it represents a form of paternalism opposed in On Liberty. Moreover, even if it can be understood as a paternalistic limitation on the liberties of the working class, it is a temporary policy justified, Mill believes, by the real but corrigible condition of the working classes.
What of the substance of democratic government? We have seen that Mill thinks that government is good insofar as it promotes the common good, where this is conceived of as promoting the moral, intellectual, and active traits of its citizens. But what kinds of principles and policies does he think would satisfy this test?
Though Mill is an advocate of limited government in ways that one might expect given his defense of basic liberties in On Liberty, he is no libertarian. He emphatically rejects the idea that legitimate government is limited to the functions of affording protection against force and fraud (PPE V.i.2). Instead, he thinks that there are a variety of ways in which government can and should intervene in the lives of citizens — sometimes as coercer and other times as enabler or facilitator — in order to promote the common good. Mill's claims about happiness imply that the good of each consists in the exercise of her higher capacities. This, we have seen, requires an active life in which one's activities are regulated by one's deliberations and choices. As we have seen in Mill's critical discussions of paternalism, this places limits on how others can promote one's own good. I can't promote your good, understood in this way, in ways that bypass your agency anymore than I can win a race for you. But just as I can do things to help you win the race yourself (training with you, sharing nutritional tips, and helping you plan strategy), so too I can do things that help you lead an autonomous life. I can provide various sorts of necessary conditions for your leading such a life. If an individual's good consists in this sort of self-realization, then a government which aims at the common good should concern itself in significant part with the fair provision of opportunities for welfare.
Mill thinks that it is the duty of parents to provide their children with “such education, and such appliances and means, as will enable them to start with a fair chance of achieving by their own exertions a successful life” (PPE II.ii.3). But this duty is not confined to parents. Early in The Subjection of Women Mill contrasts systems of hereditary caste, such as feudalism and social systems based on slavery, with the distinctively modern and progressive commitment to equal opportunity for welfare.
For, what is the peculiar character of the modern world — the difference which chiefly distinguishes modern institutions, modern social ideas, modern life itself, from those of times long past? It is that human beings are no longer born into their place in life, and chained down by an inexorable bond to the place they are born to, but are free to employ their faculties, and such favorable chances as offer, to achieve the lot which may appear to them most desirable [I 13].
As with basic liberties, opportunities for welfare have value, not in themselves, but as necessary conditions for the sort of self-realization to which Mill assigns pre-eminent intrinsic value. But they are no less important for that reason. Indeed, many of the functions of government that he recognizes can be traced to providing opportunities for self-realization.
Though Mill generally opposes paternalism, censorship, offense regulation, and moralism, he does recognize various functions that government should perform in pursuing the common good. In part because the opportunities for each depend in part upon the position and resources of others, Mill thinks that provision of fair equality of opportunity constrains permissible socio-economic inequalities (PPE II.ii.1).
A just and wise legislation would abstain from holding out motives for dissipating rather than saving the earnings of honest exertion. Its impartiality between competitors would consist in endeavoring that they should all start fair …. Many, indeed, fail with greater efforts than those with which others succeed, not from difference of merits, but difference of opportunities; but if all were done which it would be in the power of a good government to do, by instruction and by legislation, to diminish this inequality of opportunities, the differences of fortune arising from people's own earnings could not justly give umbrage [V.ii.3].
As Mill makes clear in this passage, his concern is not with inequality as such. Though he envisions a society in which inequalities are reduced and in which a decent minimum standard of living is available to all (IV.vi.2), he does defend the profits of capitalists as a just recompense for their savings, risk, and economic supervision (II.xv.1; “Chapters on Socialism” CW V 734-35). Rather, Mill's concern in this passage is with inequalities derived from inequality of opportunity and those inequalities that perpetuate inequality of opportunity. To achieve equality of opportunity, Mill endorses various redistributive tax measures (cf. Berger 1984: 159-86). He defends a flat tax rate on earned income above a threshold necessary to secure a decent minimum standard of living, leaving earned income below this threshold untaxed (II.i.3, II.xii.2, II.xii.3, V.ii.1-3, V.iii.3-5). In addition, he endorses the use of higher tax rates on unearned income and on inheritance (II.ii.1, II.ii.3-4, II.xii.3, V.ii.3, V.ii.5, V.vi.2, V.ix.1). Within this framework established for equal opportunity, Mill defends additional governmental functions designed to promote the common good. A prime condition of normative competence is a decent education, and Mill thinks that it is one of the central roles of the state to provide a system of quality public education (OL V 12-13; PPE II.xii.3, V.xi.8; CRG XV/535). We have also seen that Mill thinks that charity breeds dependence, rather than autonomy. This is one reason that he defends the adoption of Poor Laws that provide work for the able-bodied indigent (II.xii.2). Mill also thinks that government should step in where market forces are unlikely to provide what people need or want (V.xi.8). In this way, he thinks that it is an important function for the state, whether central or local, to create and maintain various aspects of community infrastructure, including such things as a common defense, roads, sanitation, police, and correctional facilities (V.vii.1; CRG XV/541). He also thinks regulation of working conditions (hours, wages, and benefits) is permissible, because the provision of improved working conditions typically has the structure of a public good for workers, each of whom stands to gain a competitive advantage by conceding a little more to capital than his peers (V.xi.12). Mill thinks that there are other goods for which market provision will lead to underproduction, which is why he thinks that the state should subsidize scientific research and the arts (V.xi.15).
Mill's liberalism is committed to a largely secular state, democratic political institutions in which the franchise is widespread, private property rights, market economies, equal social and economic opportunity, and a variety of personal and civic liberties. To appreciate the significance of his brand of liberalism, it is helpful to focus on the substance of his conception of liberal essentials — the package of individual liberties and state responsibilities that he endorses — and the way he justifies his conception of liberal essentials. Millian liberalism is not laissez-faire liberalism, and it justifies liberal essentials as a way of promoting the common good. The distinctiveness of this brand of liberalism is perhaps best seen in contrast with two other conceptions of liberalism — a more libertarian conception of liberal essentials and their justification that dominated the British Liberal Party at mid-century and the sort of contemporary political liberalism, currently fashionable in Anglo-American philosophical circles, that justifies liberal essentials as required if the state is to be neutral among rival conceptions of the good life that its citizens might hold.
It may be useful to try to locate Millian liberalism within the debate between so-called Old and New Liberalism within the British Liberal Party in the second half of the nineteenth century. A good part of the agenda of the Liberal Party during much of the nineteenth century consisted in reforms that sought to undo limitations that the state placed on the liberties and opportunities of citizens, especially when these forms of state intervention tended to reinforce class privileges. This political culture was exemplified in the repeal of the Corn Laws, opposition to religious persecution, and several electoral reforms. The 1832 Reform Bill extended the franchise to the upper middle class; the 1867 Reform Act extended it to approximately one million urban workers; and the Reform Act of 1884 extended it still further to include another two million agricultural workers. But in the later part of the nineteenth century there emerged a new view about the role of such reforms within the Liberal agenda. Earlier Liberals, such as Herbert Spencer, thought that reform should be limited to the removal of state interference with individual liberty. Liberalism, on this conception, stood for individualism and laissez-faire. By contrast, the New Liberals thought that these reforms that extended economic, social, and political liberties had to be supplemented by social and economic reforms in areas of labor, education, and health designed to redress the effects of inequality. These new reforms gave the state positive, and not just negative, responsibilities that required interference with individual liberties. It was these constructive reforms that drove a wedge between the Old and the New Liberals (see, e.g., Clarke 1978, Collini 1979, and Nicholson 1990: ch. 5).
The New Liberalism is often associated with the work of British idealists and those influenced by them, such as T.H. Green, Bernard Bosanquet, D.G. Ritchie, and L.T. Hobhouse. It was not uncommon for British idealists, such as Bosanquet, to represent Mill as adhering to the laissez-faire doctrines of the Old Liberalism (1899: III-IV). But this interpretation represents a very poor understanding of Millian liberalism and greatly exaggerates the differences between Mill and idealists, such as Green (cf. Nicholson 1998: 483-88). As we have seen, Mill rejects laissez-faire liberalism. Like Green, Mill is generally opposed to paternalistic and moralistic attempts to infringe basic liberties and insists on the importance of freedom of expression. But he thinks that the state has an important role to play in securing equal opportunity, providing a good education that will nurture normative competence, and redressing various market failures and providing various public goods. Like Green, he justifies this mix of negative and positive responsibilities for state action by appeal to a perfectionist conception of the common good that stresses the role of autonomy in self-realization. There are differences between Mill and Green in their official attitudes toward hedonism and over the permissibility of temperance legislation, but their similarities far overshadow their differences (cf. Brink 2003: esp. XIII, XXIII, and XXIV). It makes sense to view Mill as laying much of the intellectual groundwork for the New Liberalism — both in its conception of liberal essentials and in its conception of the proper justification of liberal essentials.
Mill's perfectionist justification of liberal essentials also provides a contrast with an influential strand in recent Anglo-American philosophical defenses of liberalism — of the sort found in John Rawls (1993), Ronald Dworkin (1978), Bruce Ackerman (1980), Charles Larmore (1987), and Will Kymlicka (1989) — that see liberal essentials as required if the state is to be neutral among rival conceptions of the good (cf. Ryan 1998). Liberal neutrality places limits on the justification of state action. Liberal governments, on this view, can and must enforce individual rights and any further demands of social justice, but they are not to undertake any action as a way of promoting a particular conception of the good life. Each individual citizen in a liberal regime should be free to form and pursue his own conception of the good, but the state should not be in the business of regulating what should be a matter of personal conscience. On matters of the good, a liberal state must be strictly neutral.
Liberal neutrality can be motivated in reaction to natural concerns about how a perfectionist politics appears liable to restrict political and personal liberties of thought and action in its attempt to promote a particular conception of the good. It is easy to suppose that an authoritarian political regime committed to extensive paternalistic and moralistic interference with the civic and personal liberties of citizens is the inevitable outcome of perfectionist politics. For those who see elite rule of the sort found in Plato's Republic as the logical expression of perfectionist politics, liberal essentials may seem to require neutrality about the good.
Despite this appeal, liberal neutrality is not unproblematic. For one thing, it is hard to see how a liberal state can be neutral among all conceptions of the good, inasmuch as it cannot tolerate individuals pursuing illiberal conceptions of the good, for instance, those that make the persecution of heretics a condition of personal salvation. Moreover, it is not clear why we shouldn't want the state to act in certain ways so as to help citizens lead better lives. The education of citizens, public health and sanitation, and a variety of public goods are things we expect a liberal state to provide, but it is hard to see how a state that is genuinely neutral about the good can justify such measures.
Moreover, Mill's perfectionist liberalism promises to deal with natural worries about perfectionist politics without the problematic commitment to neutrality. Mill's perfectionist liberalism is part of classical liberal tradition that grounds liberal essentials in a conception of the good that prizes the exercise of a person's rational capacities. In Mill's version, the good consists in forms of self-government that exercise the very deliberative capacities that make one a moral agent. He concludes that the state cannot foster this kind of good by regular use of paternalistic or moralistic intervention. Liberties of thought and action are central to the exercise of these deliberative powers. But equally essential are certain positive conditions, such as health, education, a decent minimum standard of living, and fair opportunities for self-realization. Even paternalistic intervention can sometimes be justified when, without it, people's deliberative powers will be severely compromised. If liberal essentials can be justified by the right sort of perfectionist account of the good, then the perfectionist need not be illiberal. And this sort of classical perfectionism explains ways in which many liberals do think that the state can and should help its citizens lead better lives. In these ways, Millian liberalism articulates a tradition of classical liberalism that has enduring significance.
Mill applies his liberal principles to issues of sexual equality primarily in The Subjection of Women. His discussion is interesting for at least two reasons. For one thing, it was at the time, and still is, the only extended defense, much less discussion, of sexual equality by a major male figure in the western tradition of moral and political philosophy. Secondly, it is one of Mill's latest and most mature works. Not only is it written after and with the benefit of The Principles of Political Economy, On Liberty, Utilitarianism, and Considerations on Representative Government, but also Mill tells us that this is a subject that has concerned him since he first started thinking about social and political issues (SW I 1).
Mill does not waste time; he denounces existing forms of sexual inequality in clear and unequivocal terms in his opening paragraph.
[T]he principle which regulates the existing social relations between the two sexes — the legal subordination of one sex to the other — is wrong in itself, and now one of the chief hindrances to human improvement; and … it ought to be replaced by a principle of perfect equality, admitting no power or privilege on the one side, nor disability on the other [I 1].
To modern ears, Mill's defense of sexual equality may seem obvious, and, to some contemporary feminists, Mill's criticism of sexual inequality may not be deep or consistent enough. But — viewed in historical context — Mill's defense of sexual equality was radical, courageous, and even eloquent. Indeed, it is sometimes claimed that Mill's contemporaries did not see anything especially controversial in the liberal principles endorsed in On Liberty until he came to apply them later to issues of sexual equality in The Subjection of Women (see Nicholson 1998: 471).
Mill's condemnation of sexual inequality is quite general. His focus tends to be on matters of general principle, with modest attention to particular reforms or policies. He rejects sexual inequality in both domestic and social contexts.
- Domestic Equality (II, esp. II 15)
- Equal rights over one's person (II 1)
- Equal rights over property (II 1, 15-16)
- Equal rights to control domestic decision-making (II 6-9)
- Equal rights over children (II 1)
- Equal rights to divorce/separation (II 1)
- Social Equality (III)
- Equal rights to education (III 19-20)
- Equal rights of professional opportunity (III 1, 3; cf. PPE IV.vii.3)
- Equal right to vote (III 2)
- Equal right to hold political office (III 3)
In addition to these rights, Mill presumably also endorses equal rights to freedom of expression, worship, and association. One assumes that he sees the main threats to these rights as occurring in the domestic realm and coming from husbands (and so perhaps falling under (1c)).
Mill spends time discussing particular inequalities that concern him and replying to potential objections to sexual equality or defenses of sexual inequality. His discussion of the principles requiring equality is fairly brief. There seem to be three main principles.
Equal Opportunity for Welfare. As we have seen, he contrasts systems of hereditary caste, such as feudalism and social systems based on slavery, with the distinctively modern and progressive commitment to equal opportunity for welfare (I 13). At several points, he likens the status of women inside and outside of marriage to slavery (II 1). Mill is not much impressed by those who would dispute the analogy on the ground that women are treated much better than slaves. Gilded cages are still cages that restrict freedom and opportunity. Also, Mill insists that husbands can be and often are just as violent and abusive as masters (II 1, 4). Indeed, with the demise of slavery in America, he views sexual inequality as the last vestige of slavery in the West.
The law of servitude in marriage is a monstrous contradiction to all the principles of the modern world, and to all the experience through which those principles have been slowly and painfully worked out. It is the sole case, now that negro slavery has been abolished, in which a human being in the plenitude of every faculty is delivered up to the tender mercies of another human being, in the hope forsooth that this other will use the power solely for the good of the person subjected to it. Marriage is the only actual bondage known to our law. There remain no legal slaves, except the mistress of every house [IV 2].
Mill often refers to the demand for equal opportunity for welfare as a demand of justice (IV 5).
Social Utility. Mill also condemns sexual inequalities of opportunity by appeal to the social utility lost.
The … benefit to be expected from giving to women the free use of their faculties, by leaving them the free choice of their employments, and opening to them the same field of occupation and the same prizes and encouragements as to other human beings, would be that of doubling the mass of mental faculties available for the higher service of humanity [IV 6; cf. IV 7-8].
Often, he seems to focus on instrumental value lost. At times, it sounds as if he is defending sexual equality for increasing GNP.
But Mill also focuses on the loss of intrinsic value associated with inequality and the intrinsic benefits that would come with sexual equality. For instance, he defends the value of marriage conceived as a form of friendship among equals, which is possible only when marriage is reformed so as to be a voluntary association among partners with equal legal rights to self-ownership, self-determination, property, and children (II 12; IV 16-18). Interestingly, he focuses as much on the expected benefits of marriage reforms for men, as for women. He clearly thinks that men stand to benefit from these and other egalitarian reforms, such as equal educational and professional opportunities, inasmuch as the fuller development of the higher faculties of one's spouse contributes to the fuller realization of one's own higher faculties (IV 6, 16, 18). Mill's defense of the value of friendships among equals can be strengthened by consideration of his perfectionist defense of liberties of thought and action in On Liberty. That argument appeals to the way in which intellectual exchange and discussion among diverse points of view contributes to the exercise of capacities for practical deliberation by expanding the menu of options available to interlocutors and better assessing the merits of options on the deliberative menu. Husbands whose wives are allowed and encouraged to develop their higher faculties have interlocutors that enable them to more fully realize their own deliberative capacities.
Because existing sexual inequalities, especially those within the family, are exceptions to the modern norm of equal opportunity at the heart of social justice, Mill thinks that these inequalities are also bad insofar as they weaken the culture of social justice (II 4, 12).
The example afforded, and the education given to the sentiments, by laying the foundation of domestic existence upon a relation contradictory to the first principles of social justice, must, from the very nature of man, have a perverting influence of such magnitude, that it is hardly possible [to conceive] so great a change for the better as would be made by its removal [IV 5; cf. II 4].
Mill also invokes the pernicious effects of boys being socialized to expectations in which power and entitlements are not conditional on and proportional to effort or merit (IV 4).
Basic Liberties. This focus on the way in which others — men especially — are harmed by sexual inequalities and stand to gain by egalitarian reforms is a little uncomfortable. It would be like defending the abolition of slavery by appealing to the real interests of the masters in abolition. One can see how such arguments might appeal to those who need argument most, namely, those not antecedently disposed to care about the status of slaves or women. But one does want to say that the most objectionable harms perpetrated by discrimination are those harms borne by the objects of discrimination themselves. Fortunately, Mill does finally turn his attention to this concern about sexual inequality. Here he focuses on the harms that discrimination causes to women by appeal to the pre-eminent importance of individual liberties.
Thus far, the benefits which it has appeared that the world would gain by ceasing to make sex a disqualification for privileges and a badge of subjection, are social rather than individual; consisting in an increase of the general fund of thinking and acting power, and an improvement in the general conditions of the association of men and women. But it would be a grievous understatement of the case to omit the most direct benefit of all, the unspeakable gain in private happiness to the liberated half of the species; the difference to them between a life of subjection to the will of others, and a life of rational freedom. After the primary necessities of food and raiment, freedom is the first and strongest want to human nature [IV 19].
Mill goes on to claim that personal independence is an “element of happiness” (IV 20). An equal regard for the happiness of each explains why sexual discrimination is impermissible. Here, one might expect Mill to invoke his liberal principles more explicitly. Sexual discrimination restricts the liberties and opportunities of women, yet it apparently cannot be justified by appeal to the harm principle. Indeed, sexual discrimination clearly harms women, so the restriction on liberty embodied in its elimination would apparently be an application of the harm principle.
The restrictions contained in then current marriage law that give the husband complete control over the person and property of their wives and do not allow for unilateral divorce or separation make marriage a form of sexual slavery. Slavery is an impermissible restriction of the liberty of another. Slavery would be impermissible even if the wife consented to marriage (cf. I 10). Mill might question whether the consent is meaningful given the social pressures to marry and to defer to their husbands, the limited options for those who do not marry, and the adverse consequences to women of expressing dissent within marriage (I 10). But the quality of consent should be in any case irrelevant, because we know that Mill thinks that it is impermissible to contract into slavery and that paternalistic laws that prevent such contracts are not only permissible but justified (OL V 11). Presumably, this is just the sort of case that Mill has in mind when he suggests that this exception to the usual prohibition on paternalism has “wider application” (V 11). Indeed, because Mill thinks that unreformed marriage is literally slavery (I 11), he must think, not just that consenting to marriage is relevantly like contracting into slavery, but that it is contracting into slavery.
Mill considers and replies to various actual and possible defenses of sexual discrimination, whether domestic or social. In almost all cases, the apologist for sexual inequality alleges that women are significantly naturally inferior in relation to men along some dimension that is alleged to be relevant to the proper management of personal and public affairs. The apologist claims that men possess some trait essential for normative competence that women lack — these might be represented as female deficits — or that women possess some trait that men lack that threatens normative competence — these might be represented as female disqualifiers. In either case, the apologist argues, it turns out that women are naturally inferior and so do not deserve equal treatment.
Mill actually considers a large list of potential natural differences, not restricted to deficits and disqualifiers, including claims that women are (1) more intuitive and practical, less principled and theoretical, than men (III 8), (2) more focused on particulars, less capable of abstraction or generalization, than men (III 9), (3) more nervous and excitable than men (III 11), (4) less single-minded than men (III 12), (5) less accomplished in philosophy, science, and art than men (III 16-18), (6) less original than men (III 18), (7) morally superior to men (III 25), (8) more susceptible to personal bias than men (III 26), (9) more pacific and less aggressive than men (IV 11), (10) more philanthropic than men (IV 11), and (11) more self-sacrificing and self-abnegating than men (II 10).
Sometimes, Mill questions whether the traits in question are unevenly distributed. But, for the most part, he seems to concede that the traits are unevenly distributed. However, he doesn't always agree that the female trait is a deficit or disqualifier. For instance, he thinks that being more intuitive, more practical, more focused on particulars, and less rigid allows women to compensate for deficits in the way that men typically approach decision-making. Women are less likely to follow principle for its own sake and are more likely to test principles by their real world consequences. They are better able to multi-task and intellectually more open-minded. Being morally superior and less aggressive are unqualified goods. However, he seems to concede that women are more excitable, less accomplished, and less original than men. He tries to explain these deficits in ways that do not presuppose women's natural inferiority.
Parts of this discussion are puzzling, especially the parts in which Mill defends the value of the alleged feminine trait. If these are valuable traits, but they are the product of sexual discrimination, does that provide support for the discrimination?
Fortunately, Mill has a more fundamental response to the apologists. Even if the trait is unevenly distributed and functions as a deficit or disqualifier, Mill wants to insist that there is no evidence of natural inferiority. There is no evidence of natural inferiority, because we cannot be sure that the incapacity is the product of nature, rather than nurture. In particular, because the history of sexual relations has been discriminatory, we cannot rule out the possibility that female incapacity is the product of past discriminatory treatment (I 17, 18; III 8, 15). Mill rightly insists that incapacity that is the product of discriminatory treatment cannot be appealed to justify that discrimination. That would be circular reasoning.
Mill can explain differential accomplishments in philosophy, science, and the arts by appeal to social barriers to women's participation in these fields (III 16-22) and to competing domestic demands that are placed on them (III 23). In this connection, it is worth noting that Mill can concede not only differential accomplishments of the sexes but differential capacity, in at least one sense. For Mill can and should distinguish between actual capacity and potential capacity. Actual capacities are a function of potential capacities and suitable training, opportunities, and responsibilities. If I have not been given a proper education and training with suitable deliberative opportunities and responsibilities at various points in my development, my potential competence may not be actual. Even if everyone had equal potential capacities, we should expect unequal actual capacities in systems where education and deliberative opportunities and responsibilities are distributed unequally. This is how Mill's case for sexual equality can concede not only that men are more accomplished than women but also that they have greater (actual) capacity. For their greater actual capacity is no evidence that they possess greater potential capacity.
But this Appeal to Nurture applies to all the differences between the sexes. In particular, it applies to feminine traits that seem like assets as well as to those that seem like deficits or disqualifiers. But then Mill cannot argue for women's rights on the ground that they bring distinctive natural talents to domestic or social contexts. He should claim that we just have very little evidence about what natural assets and liabilities women or men possess. Equal rights should prevail in the absence of any good evidence about the way in which natural assets and liabilities are distributed sexually.
It is worth discussing two traits associated with women, often thought to be virtues, which Mill treats as vices or at least insists on criticizing. These are philanthropy (IV 11) and self-sacrifice (II 10). Mill does not deny that women have these traits more than men, but he clearly thinks that this is the result of traditional divisions of social labor in which women are schooled to defer to their husbands and care for the family and in which women of means (whose husbands are wealthy) are encouraged to take up philanthropic causes. Moreover, he thinks that these artificial traits are morally problematic. Why?
In the case of philanthropy, we should distinguish between benevolence and charity. Mill has no problem with benevolent impulses to improve the lot of the poor. What he objects to are charitable schemes that provide food or money to the poor without making them self-reliant. Forms of beneficence that make the beneficiary dependent on the benefactor do the beneficiary no lasting good and actually harm them. This follows directly from Mill's perfectionist conception of happiness in which a chief ingredient of happiness is autonomous control of the shape and content of one's life. Real beneficence, though it might include temporary relief and support, must take the form of providing educational and vocational opportunities that will make the poor more self-reliant. Mill thinks that it is no surprise that female philanthropists should make this mistake, inasmuch as they treat the poor just as they are treated by men. In both cases, the beneficiary is made to rely on the benefactor's largess for his or her own well-being, rather than becoming properly equipped to supply for him or herself.
Self-sacrifice is not bad in itself. Indeed, Mill thinks that it would be much better if men tended to be more self-effacing and self-abnegating. The problem is that women have an exaggerated sense of self-sacrifice. They have too little concern for their own selves and too great a concern for and sense of responsibility for the welfare of others. Indeed, men's exaggerated sense of entitlement and inflated self-concern are just the corollaries of women's exaggerated sense of self-sacrifice and diminished self-concern. It is the one set of attitudes that make the other possible. Both extremes are wrong and require correction, which, of course, requires changes in cultural norms and the way men and women are educated. Mill anticipates later feminist claims in insisting that, so far from praising women's selflessness, we should be encouraging them to have a greater regard for themselves (e.g. Hampton 1997).
We have seen that in rebutting potential defenses of sexual inequality by appeal to various alleged dimensions of natural inferiority, Mill insists that we cannot determine whether traits commonly found in women are the product of nature or nurture without suitable social experimentation, including, the social experiment of sexual equality. In particular, there is the very real possibility that the traits alleged to justify sexual discrimination are the product of past discriminatory practice. It is arguable that Mill does not carry his Appeal to Nurture far enough.
At several points, Mill expresses the conviction that most women with a full menu of opportunities will accept a traditional sexual division of labor in which they perform domestic functions while their husbands pursue professions in civil society, and he approves of this traditional division of labor.
When the support of the family depends, not on property, but on earning, the common arrangement, by which the man earns the income and the wife superintends the domestic expenditure, seems to me in general the most suitable division of labor between the two persons. … In an otherwise just state of things, it is not, therefore, I think, a desirable custom, that the wife should contribute by her labour to the income of the family [II 16].
Of course, Mill is right that a wife shouldn't also have to earn a living outside the home if she is working full time within the home. But Mill gives no reason for thinking that women should have families or that, if they do, they, rather than their husbands, should be responsible for matters domestic. Indeed, Mill's view seems to be that for women extra-domestic vocations should be reserved primarily for those without children or whose children are already grown (IV 21). He seems here to assume that the traditional sexual division of labor is natural. But in making this assumption Mill appears to be ignoring his own Appeal to Nurture.
For Mill, women are, through no fault of their own, a backward class. This backwardness is correctable and temporary. In this respect, the situation of women is relevantly similar to the situation of the working classes. This raises the question of whether the right policy is to afford women full personal and political rights immediately or whether to treat them, as he does the working classes, in accordance with principles of transitional justice until such time as their backwardness has been corrected.
Recall that in On Liberty Mill limits the scope of his defense of basic liberties to those in the maturity of their faculties and leaves out of consideration “backward states of society”(I 10). He makes clear here that the argument for basic liberties applies only to those who meet some threshold level of normative competence. This, we saw, is because basic liberties are important as necessary conditions for exercising one's deliberative capacities, but have no value when other necessary conditions — such as basic normative competence — are not in place. Exactly where Mill sets this threshold is unclear. On the one hand, he clearly contemplates that some societies (actually “races”) might be too backward. On the other hand, he suggests that “all nations with whom we need concern ourselves” have met this threshold (though this could be a sorry comment on the limits of Mill's concerns).
We might notice two aspects of the issue that Mill is discussing to which he does not draw much attention. First, we might note that even though Mill seems to have in mind some threshold level of normative competence below which basic liberties are not important and above which they are important, the underlying phenomenon of normative competence is scalar and admits of degree. In principle, it seems, the argument for basic liberties in any particular case (with any particular agent) should track the degree of normative competence the agent possesses, whether above or below any particular threshold. If so, then selecting any one point on the scale of normative competence as setting a normative threshold above which basic liberties have full normative significance and below which they have none must be arbitrary and justified on pragmatic or administrative grounds.
Second, Mill does not directly address here whether the backwardness in question is correctable. Presumably, the backwardness of some is uncorrectable. This is currently true of those whose who are born with significant cognitive impairments. It is also true of those who were once competent but whose competence has now deteriorated as part of some irreversible degenerative process. But, for many, backwardness is a correctable condition. This is true of most children. They are incompetent, because they are immature; under normal circumstances, they will mature as they age and acquire more competence, eventually crossing the threshold of basic competence. Mill implies that the same is true of backward societies; with suitable changes in their economic, social, and political institutions, members of such societies can become competent. We might say that basic competence is a kind of actual capacity, but many people who lack this actual capacity have the potential capacity to acquire this actual capacity.
But in cases where backwardness is correctable, we are under special obligations to make the corrections. This raises questions about transitional justice. Even if we do not have the same obligations of justice toward the competent and the backward, we have obligations of justice toward those whose backwardness is correctable to help them acquire competence. Mill doesn't really deal with these questions of transitional justice in On Liberty, but he needs to. Consider the case of children. Presumably, transitional justice requires that we provide them with an education — in the broadest sense — that develops their normative competence. To do so, we need to recognize both their potential competence and the scalar character of competence. We should not treat children or other potentially competent individuals the way we would treat the permanently childlike. We need to teach them skills and allow them to acquire varied experiences safely. Children need to play an active part in their own development and education; in particular, they need to be given various sorts of deliberative opportunities and responsibilities, including the freedom to make and learn from their own mistakes in certain circumscribed ways. As they get older and their competence grows, they need to be given more freedom, opportunities, and responsibilities. Only in this way will individuals develop the requisite competence.
These ideas about transitional justice raise the question whether the history of sexual discrimination has put women in a comparatively backward state that should be addressed by an account of transitional justice. One way to pursue this issue is by thinking about how Mill responds to what he regards as the backward condition of the working classes.
We noted earlier that, as an advocate of greater equality of income, equality of educational opportunity, the extension of the franchise, healthcare reform, and labor regulations that tended to improve the safety and quality of factory work, Mill saw himself, with good reason, as a friend of the working classes. Nonetheless this friendship was mixed with doubts about their present intellectual and moral abilities. This comparative incompetence was not a natural condition, and Mill hoped to improve their competence by better education, better working conditions, and greater scope for civic participation. This commitment to improving their lot, however, was tempered by concerns about letting them dominate civic life in their current backward state. This ambivalence is clearly expressed in Mill's conception of democracy in Considerations on Representative Government. He thought that the proper representation of workers' interests in political decision-making required that they be allowed to vote. He also thought that their political participation required them to be better educated and that their active participation in civic affairs would improve their competence. But he worried about Parliament being dominated by “a low grade of intelligence” (VII/448), and he endorsed a scheme for weighted voting in which everyone voted but plural votes were given, not on the basis of wealth, but on the basis of education (VIII). In matters of political economy, Mill was generally supportive of workers cooperative associations, which introduced democratic principles into the governance of the workplace. Such associations, like their political counterparts, were to be welcomed insofar as they better protected workers' interests and extended the scope of the autonomy of workers. But, also like their political counterparts, they introduced the threat of bad and, in particular, inefficient economic management until such time as workers were better educated (PPE IV.vii.6).
So, in the case of the working classes, Mill recognized their comparative backward condition as a temporary condition, but as one that affected the political and economic liberties they should be permitted, if not in the long run, at least during the transitional phase during which their competence needs to be raised. Whatever one thinks of these qualifications to the political and economic liberties of the working classes, it is a striking fact that Mill does not mention similar qualifications to the domestic, social, and political liberties of women. This is striking, inasmuch as one might think that the same sort of social conditions that explain the comparative backwardness of the working classes and call for the application of a scheme of transitional justice for them would also explain the comparative backwardness of women and call for a scheme of transitional justice for them.
Indeed, one might wonder whether Mill wasn't committed to accepting an account of transitional justice that treated women more like the recipient's public charities than like the working class. For both law and custom treats women, as Mill repeatedly criticizes, as dependent on the will of their fathers, husbands, and brothers. But in this respect, at least, they are likely to develop the same culture of dependency and deference that Mill criticizes public and private charities for fostering (IV 11). Indeed, we know that Mill disqualifies those on parish relief from the franchise (CRG VIII 472-73). It is not that, like the (literate) working class, their votes counts for less than those of the better educated; rather, they are excluded from the franchise altogether, until such time as they are productively employed. But if he accepted this analogy, Mill would be forced to exclude women from the franchise altogether, at least as a temporary measure, required by transitional justice.
While I don't think that Mill can entirely ignore the culture of dependency that sexual inequality breeds, he may want to reply by distinguishing productive employment and wage labor. In rejecting the idea that women should be expected to work outside the home for wages as well as assume domestic responsibilities as constituting overtime or moon-lighting (II 16), Mill treats domestic labor as productive work. Indeed, domestic tasks of household management and raising children obviously call for considerable practical skills. So Mill can distinguish the backward condition of women in systems of sexual inequality from the more backward condition of those subsisting on charity.
What about the comparison with the backward condition of the working classes? Mill may well apply the same principles of transitional justice to women as to the working class. For in defending female suffrage in Considerations on Representative Government he denies that gender justifies differential treatment.
In the preceding argument for universal, but graduated suffrage, I have taken no account of difference of sex. I consider it to be entirely irrelevant to political rights, as difference in height, or in the colour of the hair. All human beings have the same interest in good government; the welfare of all is alike affected by it, and they have an equal need of a voice in it to secure their share of its benefits [VIII/479].
Mill seems to be advocating the same educational and professional qualifications for plural voting for women as for men. So his principles of transitional justice appear, after all, to be gender-neutral. They will justify fractional suffrage for women only to the extent that women receive less education than their male counterparts. Because Mill thinks that the progressive application of principles of sexual equality will equalize access of men and women to educational opportunities, any fractional suffrage women must endure should be temporary and transitional in nature.
As perhaps the leading historical proponent of two important normative traditions — utilitarianism and liberalism — Mill occupies an unusually important position in the history of western moral and political philosophy. Viewed in historical context, both utilitarianism and liberalism have exerted considerable progressive influence on the scope of moral concern, the design of public institutions, the responsibilities of government, and the interests and rights of the governed. Mill did much to articulate the justification, content, and implications of utilitarian and liberal principles. Inevitably, there are questions about the proper interpretation, adequacy, and consistency of his various claims on these topics. But he has left an enduring legacy in both utilitarian and liberal traditions. Both traditions figure centrally in contemporary discussions of analytical ethical and political theory. Further progress in these traditions must take account of his contributions.
There are many editions of Mill's more popular and influential works, including many of his writings in moral and political philosophy. The definitive edition of Mill's writings is Collected Works of John Stuart Mill [CW], 33 vols., ed. J. Robson, Toronto: University of Toronto Press, 1965-91. In order to facilitate common reference among readers using different editions, I will, in general, refer to Mill's writings using natural divisions in his texts, such as chapter, section, and/or paragraph. I refer to the following works, employing the associated abbreviations.
- “Remarks on Bentham's Philosophy” (1833) [CW X]
- “Civilization” (1836) [CW XVIII]
- “Bentham” (1838) [CW X]
- A System of Logic [SL] (1843) [CW VII-VIII]
- Principles of Political Economy [PPE] (1848) [CW II-III]
- “Whewell on Moral Philosophy” (1852) [CW X]
- On Liberty [OL] (1859) [CW XVIII]
- “Thoughts on Parliamentary Reform” [“Parliamentary Reform”] (1859) [CW XIX]
- Utilitarianism [U] (1861) [CW X]
- Considerations on Representative Government [CRG] (1861) [CW XIX]
- The Subjection of Women [SW] (1869) [CW XXI]
- Notes to James Mill, Analysis of the Phenomena of the Human Mind [Notes], 2 vols., 2d ed., J.S. Mill, London: Longmans, 1869.
- Autobiography [Auto] (1873) [CW I]
- “Chapters on Socialism” (1879) [CW V]
So, for instance, OL I 11 refers to paragraph 11 of chapter I in On Liberty and SL VI.xii.6 refers to book VI, chapter xii, section 6 of A System of Logic. Where it helps to include a specific page reference to Mill's Collected Works, I will use volume and page number. So, for instance, “Bentham” CW X 110 would refer to page 110 in Mill's essay “Bentham” in volume X of Mill's Collected Works.
This is a very select bibliography of other primary and secondary work relevant to the study of Mill's moral and political philosophy. It is selective, because Mill scholarship is voluminous and my knowledge of it is limited. While it does include those works I have found especially interesting or useful, it is not intended to be comprehensive.
- Ackerman, B., 1980, Social Justice and the Liberal State, New Haven: Yale University Press.
- Anderson, E., 1991, “John Stuart Mill and Experiments in Living” reprinted in Mill's Utilitarianism: Critical Essays, ed. Lyons, 123-48.
- Annas, J., 1977, “Mill and the Subjection of Women” Philosophy, 52: 179-94.
- Arneson, R., 1979, “Mill's Doubts about Freedom under Socialism” in New Essays on Mill and Utilitarianism, ed. Copp, 231-49.
- Arneson, R., 1980, “Mill versus Paternalism” Ethics 90: 470-89.
- Arneson, R., 1982, “Democracy and Liberty in Mill's Theory of Government” Journal of the History of Philosophy 20: 43-64.
- Arneson, R., 1989, “Paternalism, Utility, and Fairness” reprinted in Mill's On Liberty: Critical Essays, ed. G. Dworkin, 83-114.
- Bain, A., 1882a, James Mill: A Biography, London: Thoemmes, 1995.
- Bain, A., 1882b, John Stuart Mill: A Criticism with Personal Recollections, London: Longmans.
- Bentham, J., 1838, The Works of Jeremy Bentham, ed. J. Bowring, London: Longmans.
- Bentham, J., 1789, An Introduction to the Principles of Morals and Legislation, ed. J. Burns and H.L.A. Hart, London: Athlone Press, 1970.
- Bentham, J., 1770s, The Rationale of Reward. [Available online]
- Berger, F., 1984, Happiness, Justice and Freedom: The Moral and Political Philosophy of John Stuart Mill, Berkeley: University of California Press.
- Bogen, J. and Farrell, D., 1978, “Freedom and Happiness in Mill's Defence of Liberty” Philosophical Quarterly 28: 325-28.
- Bosanquet, B., 1899, The Philosophical Theory of the State, London: Macmillan.
- Bradley, F.H., 1876, Ethical Studies, Oxford: Clarendon Press.
- Brink, D., 1992, “Mill's Deliberative Utilitarianism” Philosophy & Public Affairs 21: 67-103.
- Brink, D., 2001, “Millian Principles, Freedom of Expression, and Hate Speech” Legal Theory 7: 119-57.
- Brink, D., 2003, Perfectionism and the Common Good: Themes in the Philosophy of T.H. Green, Oxford: Clarendon Press.
- Brink, D., 2008, “Mill's Liberal Principles and Freedom of Expression” in Mill's On Liberty: A Critical Guide, ed. C.L. Ten, London: Cambridge University Press.
- Brown, D.G., 1972, “Mill on Liberty and Morality” Philosophical Review 81: 133-58.
- Brown, D.G., 1973, “What is Mill's Principle of Utility?” Canadian Journal of Philosophy 3: 1-12 and reprinted in Mill's Utilitarianism: Critical Essays, ed. Lyons, 9-24.
- Brown, D.G., 1974, “Mill's Act-Utilitarianism” Philosophical Quarterly 24: 67-68 and reprinted in Mill's Utilitarianism: Critical Essays, ed. Lyons, 25-28.
- Capaldi, N., 2004, John Stuart Mill: A Biography, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.
- Clarke, P., 1978, Liberals and Social Democrats, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.
- Collini, S., 1979, Liberalism and Sociology: L.T. Hobhouse and Political Argument in England 1880-1914, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.
- Copp, D., ed., 1979, New Essays on Mill and Utilitarianism Canadian Journal of Philosophy Supp. Vol. V.
- Crisp, R., 1997, Mill on Utilitarianism, London: Routledge.
- Devlin, P., 1965, The Enforcement of Morals, Oxford: Oxford University Press.
- Donner, W., 1993, The Liberal Self: John Stuart Mill's Moral and Political Philosophy, Ithaca: Cornell University Press.
- Dryer, J.P., 1979, “Justice, Liberty, and the Principle of Utility in Mill” in New Essays on Mill and Utilitarianism, ed. Copp, 63-74.
- Dworkin, G., ed., 1997, Mill's On Liberty: Critical Essays, Totowa, NJ: Roman and Littlefield.
- Dworkin, G., 1972, “Paternalism” reprinted in Mill's On Liberty: Critical Essays, ed. Dworkin, 61-82.
- Dworkin, R., 1966, “Liberty and Moralism” reprinted in Dworkin 1977, 240-58.
- Dworkin, R., 1977, Taking Rights Seriously, Cambridge: Harvard University Press.
- Dworkin, R., 1978, “Liberalism” reprinted in Dworkin 1985, 181-204.
- Dworkin, R., 1985, A Matter of Principle, Cambridge: Harvard University Press.
- Feinberg, J., 1984-88, The Moral Limits of the Criminal Law, 4 vols., New York: Oxford University Press.
- Feinberg, J., 1985, Offense to Others [vol. 2 of The Moral Limits of the Criminal Law], New York: Oxford University Press.
- Gorovitz, S., ed. 1971, Mill's Utilitarianism: Text and Critical Essays, Indianapolis: Bobbs-Merrill.
- Gray, J., 1983, Mill on Liberty: A Defence, London: Routledge.
- Green, T.H., 1883, Prolegomena to Ethics, ed. D. Brink, Oxford: Clarendon Press, 2003.
- Hampton, J., 1997, “The Wisdom of the Egoist: The Moral and Political Implications of Valuing the Self” Social Philosophy & Policy 16: 21-51.
- Hart, H.L.A., 1963, Law, Liberty, and Morality, Stanford: Stanford University Press.
- Hart, H.L.A., 1982, Essays on Bentham, Oxford: Clarendon Press.
- Hart, H.L.A., 1979, “Between Utility and Rights” reprinted in Hart, Essays on Bentham, 198-222.
- Himmelfarb, G., 1974, On Liberty and Liberalism: The Case of John Stuart Mill, New York: Knopf.
- Irwin, T., 1998, “Mill and the Classical World” in The Cambridge Companion to Mill, ed. Skorupski, 423-63.
- Jacobson, D., 2000, “Mill on Liberty, Speech, and the Free Society” Philosophy & Public Affairs 29: 276-309.
- Jacobson, D., 2003, “J.S. Mill and the Diversity of Utilitarianism” Philosophers' Imprint 3: 1-18. [Available online]
- Kymlicka, W., 1989, Liberalism, Community, and Culture, Oxford: Oxford University Press.
- Larmore, C., 1987, Patterns of Moral Complexity, New York: Cambridge University Press.
- Lewis, D., 1989, “Mill and Milquetoast” reprinted in Mill's On Liberty: Critical Essays, ed. G. Dworkin, 1-30.
- Lively, J and Rees, J, eds., 1978, Utilitarian Logic and Politics, Oxford: Clarendon Press.
- Lyons, D., 1965, The Forms and Limits of Utilitarianism, Oxford: Clarendon Press.
- Lyons, D., 1970, In the Interest of the Governed, Oxford: Clarendon Press.
- Lyons, D., 1977, “Human Rights and the General Welfare” Philosophy & Public Affairs 6: 113-29 and reprinted in Mill's Utilitarianism: Critical Essays, ed. Lyons, 29-44.
- Lyons, D., 1980, “Utility as a Possible Ground of Rights” Nous 14: 17-28.
- Lyons, D., 1979, “Liberty and Harm to Others” reprinted in Mill's On Liberty: Critical Essays, ed. Dworkin, 115-36.
- Lyons, D., 1994, Rights, Welfare, and Mill's Moral Theory, Oxford: Clarendon Press.
- Lyons, D. (ed)., 1997, Mill's Utilitarianism: Critical Essays, Totowa, NJ: Roman and Littlefield.
- Macaulay, T.B., 1852, “Mill's Essay on Government: Utilitarian Logic and Politics” reprinted in Utilitarian Logic and Politics, ed. Lively and Rees, 97-130.
- Millgram, E., 2000, “Mill's Proof of the Principle of Utility” Ethics 110: 282-310.
- Mill, James, 1824, An Essay on Government, reprinted in Utilitarian Logic and Politics, ed. Lively and Rees.
- Moore, G.E., 1903, Principia Ethica, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.
- Moore, M., 1997, Placing Blame, Oxford: Clarendon Press.
- Nicholson, P., 1990, The Political Philosophy of the British Idealists, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.
- Nicholson, P., 1998, “The Reception and Early Reputation of Mill's Political Thought” in The Cambridge Companion to Mill, ed. Skorupski, 464-96.
- Nozick, R., 1974, Anarchy, State, and Utopia, New York: Basic Books.
- Okin, S., 1979, Women in Western Political Thought, Princeton: Princeton University Press.
- Packe, M.S.J., 1954, The Life of John Stuart Mill, London: Secker and Warburg.
- Parfit, D., 1984, Reasons and Persons, Oxford: Clarendon Press.
- Plamenatz, J.P., 1958, The English Utilitarians, Oxford: Blackwell.
- Rawls, J., 1955, “Two Concepts of Rules” Philosophical Review 64: 3-32.
- Rawls, J., 1971, A Theory of Justice, Harvard: Harvard University Press.
- Rawls, J., 1993, Political Liberalism. New York: Columbia University Press.
- Robson, J., 1998, “Civilization and Culture as Moral Concepts” in The Cambridge Companion to Mill, ed. Skorupski, 338-71.
- Ryan, A., 1988, The Philosophy of John Stuart Mill, 2d ed. London: Macmillan.
- Ryan, A., 1974, J.S. Mill, London: Routledge.
- Ryan, A., 1998, “Mill in a Liberal Landscape” in The Cambridge Companion to Mill, ed. Skorupski, 497-540.
- Sayre-McCord, G., 2001, “Mill's ‘Proof’ of the Principle of Utility: A More than Half-Hearted Defense” Social Philosophy & Policy 18: 330-60.
- Scanlon, T.M., 1972, “A Theory of Freedom of Expression” Philosophy & Public Affairs 1: 204-26.
- Schneewind, J., 1977, Sidgwick and Victorian Moral Philosophy, Oxford: Clarendon Press.
- Schofield, P., 2006, Utility and Democracy: The Political Thought of Jeremy Bentham, Oxford: Clarendon Press.
- Shanley, M., 1998, “The Subjection of Women” in The Cambridge Companion to Mill, ed. Skorupski, 396-422.
- Sidgwick, H., 1873, “John Stuart Mill” Academy May 15.
- Sidgwick, H., The Methods of Ethics, 7th ed., London: Macmillan, 1907.
- Singer, P., 1972, “Famine, Affluence, and Morality” Philosophy & Public Affairs 1: 229-43.
- Skorupski, J., 1989, John Stuart Mill, London: Routledge.
- Skorupski, J., 1998a, “The Fortunes of Liberal Naturalism” in The Cambridge Companion to Mill, ed. Skorupski, 1-34.
- Skorupski, J, ed., 1998b, The Cambridge Companion to Mill, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.
- Skorupski, J., 2006, Why Read Mill Today?, London: Routledge.
- Smart, J.J.C., 1973, “An Outline of a System of Utilitarian Ethics” in Smart and Williams, Utilitarianism: for and Against, 3-74.
- Smart, J.J.C. and Williams, B., 1973, Utilitarianism: For and Against, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.
- Spencer, H., 1896, The Principles of Sociology, 3 vols., New York: Appleton.
- Stephen, J.F., 1874, Liberty, Equality, Fraternity, Chicago: University of Chicago Press, 1991.
- Ten, C.L., 1980, Mill on Liberty, Oxford: Clarendon Press.
- Ten, C.L., 1998, “Democracy, Socialism, and the Working Classes” in The Cambridge Companion to Mill, ed. Skorupski, 372-95.
- Ten, C.L., ed., 2008, Mill's On Liberty: Critical Essays, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.
- Thompson, D., 1976, John Stuart Mill and Representative Government, Princeton: Princeton University Press.
- Urmson, J.O., 1953, “An Interpretation of the Philosophy of J.S. Mill” reprinted in Mill's Utilitarianism: Critical Essays, ed. Lyons.
- West, H., 1982, “Mill's ‘Proof’ of the Principle of Utility” reprinted in Mill's Utilitarianism: Critical Essays, ed. Lyons.
- West, H., 2004, An Introduction to Mill's Utilitarianism, New York: Cambridge University Press.
- Williams, B., 1973, “A Critique of Utilitarianism” in Smart and Williams, Utilitarianism: for and Against, 77-150.
- Wilson, F., 1998, “Mill on Psychology and the Moral Sciences” in The Cambridge Companion to Mill, ed. Skorupski, 203-54.
- John Stuart Mill (Internet Encyclopedia of Philosophy)
- John Stuart Mill, part of Pablo Stafforini's Utilitarian Philosophers series.
- The Bentham Project
- Bentham Links
- Bentham's Labyrinth
- Utilitarianism Resources
- Classical Utilitarianism
Austin, John | autonomy: in moral and political philosophy | Bentham, Jeremy | consequentialism | democracy | egalitarianism | freedom: of speech | Green, Thomas Hill | happiness | hedonism | justice: distributive | liberalism | libertarianism | liberty: positive and negative | Mill, Harriet Taylor | Mill, James | Mill, John Stuart | paternalism | perfectionism, in moral and political philosophy | reasoning: moral | rights | value theory | well-being | Whewell, William
I would like to thank the Academic Senate of the University of California, San Diego for two summer grants which supported valuable research assistance from Kory Schaff and Charlie Kurth. In writing this essay, I am conscious of intellectual debts of various kinds to Richard Arneson, Joshua Cohen, Garrett Cullity, Stephen Darwall, Dale Dorsey, Michael Hardimon, David Lyons, Peter Nicholson, Alastair Norcross, Luke Robinson, Sharon Skare, Adam Streed, Eric Watkins, and the editors of the Stanford Encyclopedia of Philosophy.