Plato's Parmenides

First published Fri Aug 17, 2007; substantive revision Fri Jun 17, 2011

The Parmenides is, quite possibly, the most enigmatic of Plato's dialogues. The dialogue recounts an almost certainly fictitious conversation between a venerable Parmenides (the Eleatic Monist) and a youthful Socrates, followed by a dizzying array of interconnected arguments presented by Parmenides to a young and compliant interlocutor named “Aristotle” (not the philosopher, but rather a man who became one of the Thirty Tyrants after Athens' surrender to Sparta at the conclusion of the Peloponnesian War). Most commentators agree that Socrates articulates a version of the theory of forms defended by his much older namesake in the dialogues of Plato's middle period, that Parmenides mounts a number of potentially devastating challenges to this theory, and that these challenges are followed by a piece of intellectual “gymnastics” consisting of eight strings of arguments (Deductions) that are in some way designed to help us see how to protect the theory of forms against the challenges. Beyond this, there is precious little scholarly consensus. Commentators disagree about the proper way to reconstruct Parmenides' challenges, about the overall logical structure of the Deductions, about the main subject of the Deductions, about the function of the Deductions in relation to the challenges, and about the final philosophical moral of the dialogue as a whole.

The Parmenides inspired the metaphysical and mystical theories of the later Neoplatonists (notably Plotinus and later, Proclus), who saw in the Deductions the key to the hierarchical ontological structure of the universe.

1. Overview of the Dialogue

Plato's Parmenides consists in a critical examination of the theory of forms, a set of metaphysical and epistemological doctrines articulated and defended by the character Socrates in the dialogues of Plato's middle period (principally Phaedo, Republic II–X, Symposium). According to this theory, there is a single, eternal, unchanging, indivisible, and non-sensible form corresponding to every predicate or property. The theoretical function of these forms is to explain why things (particularly, sensible things) have the properties they do. Thus, it is by virtue of being in some way related to (i.e., by participating in, or partaking of) the form of beauty that beautiful things (other than beauty) are beautiful, it is by virtue of partaking of the form of largeness that large things are large, and so on. Fundamental to this theory is the claim that forms are separate from (at least in the sense of being not identical to) the things that partake of them.

In the metaphysics of his middle period, Plato does not provide a theory of the nature of the partaking relation. But in the Parmenides, Plato considers two accounts of the partaking relation. According to the first “Pie Model” account, for X to partake of Y is for the whole or a part of Y to be in X (as a part of X). According to the second “Paradigmatistic” account, for X to partake of Y is for X to resemble Y. In the first part of the dialogue, Plato sets out reasons for thinking that, on either of these accounts of partaking, the theory of forms is internally inconsistent.

Immediately following these criticisms, Plato describes a general method of training designed to save the forms. The method consists of a series of eight Deductions (with an Appendix to the first two) focusing on consequences that may be derived from positing the being of a particular form and consequences that may be derived from positing the non-being of that form.

In the second part of the dialogue, Plato instantiates this method, taking the form, the one, as his example. Plato shows, in particular, that whether the one is or is not, the one (and also things other than the one: the others) have none of a series of pairs of contrary properties (whole/divided, in motion/at rest, same/different, like/unlike, equal/unequal, older/younger). Plato also shows that, whether the one is or is not, the one (and also the others) have (or, at least, appear to have) all of these contrary properties.

2. The Introductory Section: Zeno's Argument 126a–128e

The dialogue's narrator is Cephalus, who has just arrived in Athens after a trip from his home in Clazomenae. Cephalus runs into Plato's half brothers, Adeimantus and Glaucon, and asks them to confirm the existence of someone who has completely memorized a conversation that Parmenides and Zeno once had with Socrates. Adeimantus confirms that his half brother, Antiphon, can recite the conversation in toto, having heard it from a friend of Zeno's, Pythodorus, in whose house the conversation took place. Cephalus, Adeimantus, and Glaucon then pay a visit to Antiphon, who, after a bit of prodding, agrees to replay the conversation. As most scholars agree, the conversation putatively recorded by Pythodorus, passed on to Antiphon, and then recounted to Cephalus, is almost certainly fictitious. This hypothesis partly explains why Plato chose to frame the dialogue at third remove.

As Antiphon tells the story, the noted Eleatic philosophers, Parmenides (then around 65 years old) and Zeno (then around 40 years old), have come to Athens for the Great Panathenaea. Having heard of their arrival, a youthful Socrates (then around 20 years old) and some friends of his have come to Pythodorus's house to listen to Zeno read from his book. At the end of Zeno's performance, Pythodorus, Parmenides, and Aristotle, who have been waiting outside the house, return and witness an exchange between Zeno and Socrates.

The exchange begins with Socrates' summary of the general structure of one of Zeno's arguments:

  1. If the things that are are many, then they are both like and unlike.
  2. Nothing can be both like and unlike.

So,

  1. The things that are are not many.

Zeno then explains that he intends this argument as a kind of defense of Parmenides' monism: just as others have argued that monism leads to absurd results (Zeno may be thinking here of the sorts of absurdities mentioned by Plato at Sophist 244b–245e), so pluralism suffers consequences that are, if anything, even more absurd.

3. Socrates' Speech: The Theory of Forms 128e–130a

Socrates then objects to Zeno's argument by denying premise (2). His lengthy objection depends on the theory of forms articulated in Plato's middle period dialogues.

One of the main principles of this theory is Causality (Phaedo 100c4–6, 100d7–8, 100e5–6, 101b4–6, 101c4–5):

(Causality) Things that are F (other than the F) are F by virtue of partaking of the F.

Another crucial principle is Separation (Phaedo 75c11–d2, 100b6–7; Republic 476b10, 480a11):

(Separation) The F is itself by itself, at least in the sense of being separate from, and hence not identical with, the things that partake of it.

According to Separation, like things are like by partaking of a separate form of likeness and unlike things are unlike by partaking of a separate form of unlikeness. Although the properties of being like and being unlike are contraries, they are not contradictories. As Socrates emphasizes, it is possible for sensible things to partake of both likeness and unlikeness, and hence be both like and unlike.

Socrates does not explain how this is supposed to be possible, but we can extract an explanation from what he says later in his speech about the properties of being one and being many, and from what the Phaedo tells us about the properties of being tall and short. At Parmenides 129c, Socrates claims that he himself is one (being one among the seven persons who are present) and many (in having many parts: right/left, front/back, upper/lower). At Phaedo 102b ff., Socrates points out that Simmias is taller than Socrates (and hence tall), but that Simmias is also shorter than Phaedo (and hence short). Thus, Simmias is both tall and short. Clearly Socrates envisages the possibility of sensible things being both like in one way and unlike in another. For example, Socrates is like Plato (in that each is a philosopher) and unlike Meletus (in that one, but not the other, is a poet). Being like Plato, Socrates is like. Being unlike Meletus, Socrates is unlike. Hence Socrates is both like and unlike. The general principle here is Impurity-S:

(Impurity-S) Sensible things are impure inasmuch as they can (and, in fact, often do) have contrary properties.

It follows from Impurity-S that premise (2) of Zeno's argument is false. But Socrates is willing to grant that Zeno is not entirely mistaken. He insists that although it is far from surprising to be told that sensible things have contrary properties, he would be astonished to learn that forms have contrary properties. Socrates, then, holds that forms are pure, in the following sense:

(Purity-F) Forms cannot have contrary properties.

According to Purity-F, not only is it the case that the one cannot be both one and many and the like cannot be both like and unlike, but it is also the case that the one cannot be both like and unlike and the like cannot be both one and many. (Notice that Purity-F and Impurity-S together entail Non-Identity, the claim that no form is identical to any sensible thing. A similar form of argument appears at Phaedo 74b–c, a passage in which Socrates argues that whereas sensible things that are equal are also unequal, the equal is not unequal, and hence the equal is not identical to any equal sensible thing.)

Socrates' speech therefore articulates some of the basic elements of the theory of forms, namely Causality and Separation, along with Impurity-S and Purity-F. The theory to which Socrates alludes is richer than his brief description of it suggests. As the dialogue proceeds, the interlocutors invoke a number of additional middle period principles. One principle that plays an important role in the sequel is One-over-Many (see Republic 596a6–7):

(One-over-Many) For any plurality of F things, there is a form of F-ness by virtue of partaking of which each member of the plurality is F.

It is from this principle that Plato infers, by means of the Third Bed Argument (Republic 597c1–d3), the principle of Uniqueness:

(Uniqueness) For any property F, there is exactly one form of F-ness.

(Notice that the conjunction of One-over-Many and Uniqueness entails Causality.) The sequel also depends on yet another important middle period principle, Self-Predication:

(Self-Predication) For any property F, the F is F.

For example, the beautiful is beautiful (Euthydemus 301b5, Cratylus 439d5–6, Hippias Major 292e6–7). It is clear that the point generalizes to all properties, including the property of being large (see Phaedo 100c4–6, 102e5–6). (Notice that Purity-F and Self-Predication together entail the principle that the F cannot possess the property that is contrary to F, instances of which appear throughout the middle dialogues (Hippias Major 291d1–3, Phaedo 102e5–6) and in Socrates' speech (Parmenides 129b1–3, 129b6–c1).) And finally, the sequel also repeatedly refers to the principle of Oneness:

(Oneness) Each form is one.

Oneness and Uniqueness are different principles: to say that a form is one is to say not that it is unique, but rather that it is something that can be counted. For Plato infers the oneness of the beautiful from the fact that the beautiful and the ugly are two, the oneness of the large from the fact that the large and the small are two, and so on (Republic 475e9–476a6, 524b3–9). Thus the sense in which each form is one is similar to the sense in which Socrates is one, in being one among many (Parmenides 129c8–d2).

4. Problems for the Theory of Forms 130a–134e

At the conclusion of Socrates' speech, Parmenides articulates six different lines of criticism directed at the theory of forms.

4.1 The Extent of the Forms 130a–e

Parmenides begins by questioning Socrates' initial acceptance of the claim that there is a separate form corresponding to every predicate or property. Socrates expresses confidence in the existence of separate forms of justice, beauty, goodness, and every form of that sort, uncertainty about the existence of separate forms of humanity, fire, and water, and outright skepticism about the existence of separate forms for hair, mud, and dirt.

It is unclear why Socrates finds himself in doubt about the existence of forms for natural kinds (such as humans and water) and stuffs or mixtures (such as hair and mud). For some commentators, Socrates simply makes “a wrong admission” as a result of his youth and inexperience (Allen 1997, 124; see also Sayre 1996, 74). After all, Plato alludes to a form of bee at Meno 72b–c, a form of shuttle at Cratylus 389d, and forms of bed and of table at Republic 596b. Although shuttles, tables, and beds are artifacts, and hence perhaps relevantly different from natural kinds, such as human beings and water, there seems no reason to think that humans differ from bees in regard to whether they have corresponding forms. However, it is difficult to understand why Plato would pen a conversation in which a character who embodies his own middle period theory would admit something he has no good reason to admit.

One possibility (see Gill 1996, 22) is that Plato is alluding to the middle period thesis that only certain types of properties summon the understanding to think about forms. For example, in the Republic, Socrates claims that whereas “the soul isn't compelled to ask the understanding what a finger is, since sight doesn't suggest to it that a finger is at the same time the opposite of a finger” (523d2–6), the soul is compelled to ask what the large is and what the small is when sight suggests to it that the index finger is both big (relative to the pinky) and small (relative to the middle finger). If forms were merely posited to explain the compresence of contrary properties in sensible things, then there would be no need to posit a form corresponding to properties (such as water and dirt) that have no contraries. However, this is unlikely to be the source of Socrates' worry here, for the Republic passage does not discuss metaphysical reasons for positing the existence of forms, but rather discusses the psychological and epistemic question of what prompts the soul to think of forms that have already been posited.

Another option (Rickless 2007, 54–55; see also Miller 1986, 46) is that Plato means us to recognize a tension between Self-Predication and Separation (or Non-Identity) in the theory of forms. On the one hand, the fact that justice is just, beauty beautiful, and goodness good does not suggest that justice, beauty, and goodness are concrete, sensible things. That is, Self-Predication gives us no reason to deny that justice, beauty, and goodness are separate forms, numerically distinct from sensible things. By contrast, if there are forms for human and mud, then Self-Predication requires that the human be a human being and the mud be muddy. It is difficult to see how human things and muddy things could be non-sensible. So Self-Predication gives us at least some reason to deny that there is a form for human and mud that is distinct from every sensible thing. This interpretation meshes well with Socrates' remark that hair, mud, and dirt “are in fact just what we see” and that it is for this reason that “it's too outlandish to think there is a form for them” (Parmenides 130d3–5).

4.2 The Whole-Part Dilemma 130e–131e

After leading Socrates to worry about whether there is indeed a form corresponding to every property, Parmenides derives a number of absurdities from the result of combining the theory of forms with a particular conception of the partaking relation, the Pie Model. According to the Pie Model, participants literally get a share of the forms of which they partake, in a way analogous to the way in which those who partake of a pie literally get a share of the pie. The Pie Model comes in two versions: according to the Whole Pie Model, for X to partake of Y is for X to get the whole of Y as its share of Y (i.e., for the whole of Y to be in X); according to the Piece-of-Pie Model, for X to partake of Y is for X to get a (proper) part of Y as its share of Y (i.e., for a (proper) part of Y to be in X). What Parmenides goes on to argue is that the theory of forms is internally inconsistent on either version of the Pie Model.

Suppose, first, that partaking conforms to the Whole Pie Model. Now imagine that there are at one time three sensible F things, A, B, and C, each separate from each of the others. According to Causality, each of A, B, C is F by virtue of partaking of the F, and hence each of A, B, C partakes of the F. Given the Whole Pie Model, it follows that the F is, as a whole and at a single time, in each of A, B, C. Thus, the whole of the F is in A, the whole of the F is in B, and the whole of the F is in C. If A, B, and C are in separate places, then Causality and the Whole Pie Model together require that one and the same form be, as a whole, in separate places at the same time. Parmenides concludes that, on this picture, the relevant form would be “separate from itself” (Parmenides 131b2).

On some interpretations (Meinwald 1991, 13–14; Allen 1997, 130; Rickless 2007, 57–58), Plato thinks of the claim that a form is separate from itself as an absurdity in itself. On other interpretations (Teloh 1981, 155; Miller 1986, 48; Sayre 1996, 76), Plato does not treat this result as absurd in itself. Absurdity only arises when this result is combined with the further thought that nothing that is separate from itself could be a single thing. (In this case, the same form would have to be three things, rather than one thing.) For the claim that the relevant form is not one contradicts Oneness, the claim that every form is one.

Socrates tries to avoid the relevant absurdity, however it is understood, by supposing that a form is like a day, in the following sense: just as a day can be in many separate places at the same time without being separate from itself, so a form can be in many separate places at the same time without being separate from itself. Parmenides does not think much of Socrates' suggestion. He immediately counters that Socrates' day is like a sail: a day can be in many separate places at the same time only inasmuch as different parts of it are over the separate places, just as a sail can cover many separate people only inasmuch as each person is covered by a different part of the sail. Parmenides' point, then, is that the only way to make sense of Socrates' day analogy is to reduce it to the Piece-of-Pie Model, the very model against which Parmenides goes on to argue.

A number of scholars have balked at Parmenides' assimilation of the day analogy to the sail analogy (Cherniss 1932, 135; Peck 1953, 132; Crombie 1963, 330–331; Sprague 1967, 96; Miller 1986, 49–50; Sayre 1996, 76). They have assumed that, whether a day is thought of as a time-interval or as the sun's rays (the light of day), it is in fact possible for one and the same day to be in separate places at the same time. However, it does not in fact make sense to suppose that a time-interval is in separate places at the same time (Rickless 2007, 58). And it is not in fact true that the same packet of rays shines on the separate places bathed by the light of day; rather, different packets of rays shine on different places (Panagiotou 1987, 18). Moreover, it makes little sense to suppose that Plato would introduce a way out of the dilemma he himself has constructed without explicitly alerting his readers to that fact. To suppose otherwise would be to defend a particularly esoteric reading of Plato's intentions.

Having assimilated Socrates' day analogy to the Piece-of-Pie Model, Parmenides turns to a criticism of this second version of the Pie Model. Suppose, then, the same three sensible F things—A, B, and C—in separate places at the same time. According to Causality, A, B, and C are F by virtue of partaking of the F, and hence A, B, and C partake of the F. Given the Piece-of-Pie Model, there is a part of the F in each of A, B, and C. If the same absurdity generated from the Whole Pie Model is to be avoided, we must suppose that the part of the F that is in A is numerically distinct from the part of the F that is in B and from the part of the F that is in C, and also that the part of the F that is in B must be numerically distinct from the part of the F that is in C. (Otherwise we would have the same part of the F existing, as a whole, in separate places at the same time; and hence we would have something that is separate from itself.) Thus the F must have numerically distinct parts, and must therefore be divided (or, at least, divisible). Parmenides concludes from this that the F cannot be one, a conclusion that clearly contradicts Oneness.

Although many commentators take it for granted that Parmenides' conclusion follows from the principle that divided (or divisible) things automatically lose their unity, this supposition makes little sense in the wake of Socrates' speech. There Socrates insisted that he himself is one (in being one among many) even though he has many parts (front and back, upper and lower, and so on). So Socrates does not suppose that it is true in general that a thing with parts cannot be one. The hypothesis that makes most sense of Socrates' admission at the end of Parmenides' criticism of the Piece-of-Pie Model that the F cannot be one is that Socrates is antecedently committed to Purity-F. For anything that has many parts is ipso facto many (just as Socrates' having many parts is sufficient for his being many), and yet, by Purity-F, no form can have contrary properties. Given that the property of being one and the property of being many are contraries, it follows from Purity-F and the claim that the F is many that the F cannot be one (Rickless 2007, 59–60).

The upshot of the Whole-Part Dilemma is that absurdity or inconsistency follows from the theory of forms on either of the two possible versions of the Pie Model conception of partaking. If X's partaking of Y amounts to the whole of Y being in X (the Whole Pie model), then Causality conjoined with the existence of sensible things in separate places at the same time entails the absurd conclusion that forms are separate from themselves; but if X's partaking of Y amounts to a part of Y being in X (the Piece-of-Pie Model), then Causality and Purity-F (along with the claim that having many parts is sufficient for being many and the claim that being one and being many are contrary properties) are inconsistent with Oneness.

At the conclusion of the Whole-Part Dilemma, Parmenides extracts four more absurdities from the result of combining Causality with the Piece-of-Pie model:

  1. By Causality, every F thing (other than the F) is F by partaking of the F. But, by the Piece-of-Pie Model, for X to partake of Y is for X to get a part of Y. Thus, every F thing (other than the F) is F by getting a part of the F. Now let F be the property of being large. In that case, every large thing (other than the large) is large by getting a part of the large. But, Parmenides assumes, if X is a part of Y, then X is smaller than Y (and Y is larger than X), and hence X is (in some way) small. So every large thing (other than the large) is large by getting something small. But this is absurd: as Socrates himself emphasizes at Phaedo 101b, it would be monstrous to say that something is made larger by something small. This is an instance of a general claim we might call “No Causation by Contraries”:

    (No Causation by Contraries) For any property F, nothing that is F could make something possess a property that is contrary to the property of being F.
  2. The result of combining Causality with the Piece-of-Pie Model entails that equal things (other than the equal) are equal by getting a part of the equal. Given that any part of X must be smaller than X (see above), it follows that equal things (other than the equal) are equal by getting something that is smaller than the equal. But, Parmenides assumes, if X is smaller than Y, then X is unequal to Y, and hence X is (in some way) unequal. So every equal thing (other than the equal) is equal by getting something unequal. But, again by No Causation by Contraries, this result is absurd: nothing that is unequal could make something be equal.

  3. The result of combining Causality with the Piece-of-Pie Model entails that small things (other than the small) are small by getting a part of the small. This result entails that if there are any small things (as indeed there are), then the small must have parts. But if X is a part of Y, then Y is larger than X (see above), and hence Y is (in some way) large. Consequently, the small must be large. But, by Self-Predication, the small is small. So the small is both large and small. But this result contradicts Purity-F, according to which the small cannot have contrary properties, and hence cannot be both large and small.

  4. As before, the result of combining Causality with the Piece-of-Pie Model entails that small things (other than the small) are small by getting a part of the small. But, Parmenides assumes, for X to get Y is just for Y to be added to X. It follows that small things (other than the small) are small by having a part of the small added to them. But this is absurd: it is impossible to make something small by adding something to it.

These four quick arguments show that the result of combining Causality with the Piece-of-Pie Model does not sit well with other aspects of the theory of forms, in particular No Causation by Contraries (1 and 2), and the conjunction of Purity-F and Self-Predication (3).

4.3 The Third Man Argument 132a–b

Plato never refers to any argument as the “Third Man”. The moniker derives from Aristotle, who in various places (e.g., Metaphysics 990b17 = 1079a13, 1039a2; Sophistical Refutations 178b36 ff.) discusses (something akin to) the argument at Parmenides 132a–b in these terms.

Parmenides sets up the argument by pointing out that, according to the theory of forms, Oneness is supposed to follow from One-over-Many. (Some, e.g., Fine (1993, 204), claim that Plato means the sentence “each form is one” to express Uniqueness, not Oneness. But this is certainly not what a relevantly similar sentence expresses at Republic 476a2–6 and 524b7–11—see above.) From the existence of a plurality of F things and the fact that, for any such plurality P, there is a form of F-ness by virtue of partaking of which each member of P is F, it follows that there is one form “over” the many members of P (in the sense of being that by virtue of partaking of which each member of P is F). And given that anything that is one “over” many is (in some sense) one, it follows that any form that has participants is one.

There is a vast literature on the Third Man argument, initiated by the groundbreaking analysis of the reasoning in Vlastos (1954). (See, among others, Sellars (1955), Vlastos (1955), Geach (1956), Vlastos (1956), Cherniss (1957), Peck (1962), Moravcsik (1963), Strang (1963), Vlastos (1969), Cohen (1971), Teloh and Louzecky (1972), Peterson (1973), Goldstein and Mannick (1978), Mann (1979), Mates (1979), Pickering (1981), Teloh (1981, 158–167), Waterlow (1982), Prior (1985, 64–75), Curd (1986), Sharvy (1986), Penner (1987, 251–299), Scaltsas (1989), Malcolm (1991, 47–53), Meinwald (1992), Scaltsas (1992), Fine (1993, 203–241), McCabe (1994, 84–87), Schweizer (1994), Frances (1996), Allen (1997, 152–167), Hunt (1997), Rickless (1998), Pelletier and Zalta (2000), and Rickless (2007, 64–75).) Most commentators agree that the reasoning relies on at least three principles: One-over-Many, Self-Predication, and Non-Identity (about which more anon). (Allen (1997, 163) accepts that the reasoning relies on the claim that the large is large—an instance of Self-Predication, but denies that the argument, when generalized to forms other than the large, relies on Self-Predication.) They also agree that the reasoning generates an infinite regress of forms of largeness, and that the argument could be generalized to generate an infinite regress of forms corresponding to any predicate. But commentators differ over why Plato takes the regress to be vicious or problematic, and what Plato would have recommended as a way of avoiding the absurdity generated by the reasoning.

Parmenides generates the infinite regress as follows. Consider a plurality of large things, A, B, and C. By One-over-Many, there is a form of largeness (call it “L1”) by virtue of partaking of which A, B, and C are large. By Self-Predication, L1 is large. So there is now a new plurality of large things, A, B, C, and L1. Thus, by One-over-Many, there is a form of largeness (call it “L2”) by virtue of partaking of which A, B, C, and L1 are large. Hence L1 partakes of L2. At this point, Parmenides assumes something like the following Non-Identity assumption:

(Non-Identity) No form is identical to anything that partakes of it.

(Notice that Non-Identity follows directly from Separation.) From the fact that L1 partakes of L2, Non-Identity entails that L2 is numerically distinct from L1. Thus, there must be at least two forms of largeness, L1 and L2. But this is not all. By Self-Predication, L2 is large. So there is now a new plurality of large things, A, B, C, L1, and L2. Thus, by One-over-Many, there is a form of largeness (call it “L3”) by virtue of partaking of which A, B, C, L1, and L2 are large. Hence L1 and L2 both partake of L3. But then, by Non-Identity, L3 is numerically distinct from both L1 and L2. Thus, there must be at least three forms of largeness, L1, L2, and L3. Repetition of this reasoning, based on One-over-Many, Self-Predication, and Non-Identity, then generates an infinite hierarchy of forms of largeness, with each form partaking of every form that lies above it in the hierarchy. (That is, for every m and n such that m<n, Lm partakes of Ln.)

In what way does the existence of an infinite regress of forms represent a problem for the theory of forms? One answer to this question (see Vlastos (1954, 328, fn. 12; 1955), Goldstein and Mannick (1978), Penner (1987, 279–282), and Fine (1993, 204)) is that the nature of the problem is fundamentally epistemic. On this view, the theory of forms includes the thesis that, for any property F, the primary function of the F is to explain the F-ness of F things, and hence to make it possible for humans to apprehend and know things as F. But, so the story goes, Plato assumes that an infinite regress of forms of F-ness, each of which explains the F-ness of the forms of F-ness below it in the hierarchy, cannot explain the F-ness of the original plurality of F things: explanation must come to an end somewhere. Although this interpretation makes sense of the epistemic language that Plato sprinkles throughout the Third Man passage, it does not make sense of the fact that Parmenides sets up the argument by pointing out that the oneness of the large follows from its being one “over” many large things (see above). So it is unlikely that the epistemic reading of the Third Man is what Plato had in mind.

Other scholars claim, quite correctly, that the existence of infinitely many forms (indeed, the existence of so much as two forms) corresponding to any predicate is inconsistent with Uniqueness. And, indeed, this result appears to be at least part of what the Third Man argument is designed to uncover. But Plato seems to be looking to establish more than this. For in the last sentence of the relevant passage, Parmenides announces that the argument shows that each form is no longer one, but infinitely many. Although most commentators gloss this comment as the claim that there is no longer one form per predicate, but rather infinitely many, this is not what the sentence actually says. What the sentence suggests is that the existence of infinitely many forms of largeness conflicts with Oneness.

One way to make sense of this claim is by way of the following chain of reasoning. As we've seen, One-over-Many, Self-Predication, and Non-Identity together generate an infinite hierarchy of forms of largeness, each of which partakes of the forms above it in the hierarchy. Thus, L1 partakes of infinitely many forms, L2 partakes of infinitely many forms, L3 partakes of infinitely many forms, and so on. Now there are passages in which Plato appears to assume that forms are as many as the predicates that can be truly applied to them (see Philebus 14c8–d3, and Rickless (2007, 71)). And if we assume that Parmenides is still working with the Piece-of-Pie model of partaking, then the fact that a form partakes of infinitely many forms entails that it has infinitely many parts, and hence is itself infinitely many. So from the existence of an infinite regress of forms and from what appear to be dialectically appropriate assumptions, it is possible to argue that each form in the hierarchy is infinitely many. Given that the property of being one and the property of being many are contraries, it then follows directly from Purity-F that each form in the hierarchy is not one. This interpretation explains why Parmenides announces at the end of the argument that each form is no longer one, but infinitely many (see Rickless (2007, 64–75)).

Many commentators think that the fundamental inconsistency revealed by the Third Man argument rests with the combination of One-over-Many, Self-Predication, and Non-Identity. For them, the Third Man requires that Plato give up at least one of these principles. But on the interpretation that best explains the set-up and final sentence of the passage, Plato need not give up any of these principles in order to avoid inconsistency: he can simply abandon Purity-F (and perhaps also Uniqueness).

4.4 Forms as Thoughts 132b–c

At the conclusion of the Third Man argument, Socrates suggests that it might be possible to avoid all previous inconsistencies at the heart of the theory of forms by supposing that forms are thoughts that reside only in minds. In what appears to be a severely truncated argument, Parmenides provides two sets of reasons for thinking that this suggestion will not avoid absurdity either. (Allen (1997, 174) argues that Parmenides only provides a single argument here, one that most would identify as the second of two.)

Parmenides' first argument appears to have the following structure. First, all thoughts have intentional objects: every thought is of something rather than nothing. Second, the object of any thought T is something that T thinks to be one over all the instances. But anything that is thought to be one over all the instances is a form. Parmenides concludes that the intentional object of every thought is a form, and hence if every form is a thought then every form is a thought of a form. Although Parmenides does not make this explicit, it is plain that if every form is numerically distinct from the form of which it is the intentional object, then (thanks to Self-Predication and Non-Identity) an infinite regress of forms beckons (see Rickless (2007, 75–79), and also Gill (1996, 40) and Sayre (1996, 84)). Again, there is nothing to suggest that Plato finds the existence of an infinite regress problematic in itself. Rather, the existence of a regress threatens Uniqueness, and, when combined in the appropriate way with Purity-F, threatens Oneness. The reasoning that leads to conflict with Oneness is parallel to the relevantly similar portion of the Third Man argument (see section 4.3 above, and Rickless (2007, 79–80) for details).

As if this weren't bad enough, Parmenides goes on to derive a further absurdity from the result of combining the proposal that forms are thoughts with the Pie Model conception of partaking. Assuming that thoughts do not have parts, the only way for an object to partake of a thought in accordance with the Pie Model is for the object to get the thought as a whole. So if forms are thoughts, then according to the Pie Model everything is composed of thoughts, and hence all things think. But, Parmenides assumes, this panpsychist thesis is absurd. Parmenides considers a way of avoiding this absurdity that depends on assuming that something's having a thought as a part does not entail that it is a thinking thing. But, argues Parmenides, the only way to make sense of this proposal is to assume that thoughts are unthinking, an assumption that is also absurd in itself.

4.5 The Likeness Regress 132c–133a

At the conclusion of Parmenides' criticism of Socrates' suggestion that forms might be thoughts, Socrates tries a completely different tack: he suggests that forms are patterns set in nature (paradeigmata) and that partaking of a form amounts to being like it (call the combination of these claims “Paradigmatism”). Paradigmatism is incompatible both with the proposal that forms are thoughts and with the Pie Model conception of partaking. The idea that forms are patterns that serve as models for their participants is not new, for it appears in various places in the dialogues of Plato's middle period (see Republic 472b7–c7, 510a ff., 597a4–5, 596b6–8—and also Timaeus 29c1–2, 48e5–49a1, 50c4–6).

Most commentators agree that Parmenides' criticism of Socrates' Paradigmatism depends (at least in part) on the construction of an infinite regress. But scholars are divided over the identity and structure of the regress: whereas some see the reasoning as basically indistinguishable from the Third Man argument (e.g., Owen (1953), Vlastos (1954), Cherniss (1957), Hathaway (1973), Lee (1973), Teloh (1981, 166), Spellman (1983), Prior (1985, 71–75), and Fine (1993, 211–215)), others see the reasoning as generating a regress of forms of likeness (e.g., McCabe (1994, 87–89), Schofield (1996), Allen (1997, 179–186), and Rickless (2007, 80–85)). (The main textual and thematic reasons for preferring the latter reading to the former are clearly described in Schofield (1996)—see also Gill (1996, 44–45). For a rejoinder to Schofield, see Scolnicov (2003, 67–68).)

On the first view, the regress arises as follows. Consider a plurality of F things, A, B, and C. By One-over-Many, each of A, B, C is F by virtue of partaking of a form of F-ness (say, F1). By Self-Predication, F1 is F. Hence A, B, C and F1 are all F, and each is like the others in being F. Now consider the new plurality of F things, A, B, C, and F1. By One-over-Many, each of A, B, C, and F1 is F by virtue of partaking of a form of F-ness (say, F2). By Non-Identity, F2 is numerically distinct from F1. By Self-Predication, F2 is F. Hence A, B, C, F1, and F2 are all F, and each is like the others in being F. Now consider the new plurality of F things, A, B, C, F1, and F2. By One-over-Many, each of A, B, C, F1, and F2 is F by virtue of partaking of a form of F-ness (say, F3). By Non-Identity, F3 is numerically distinct from both F1 and F2. We therefore have three distinct forms of F-ness. Repetition of the same pattern of reasoning then establishes the existence of an infinite regress of forms of F-ness. This reasoning is homologous to the Third Man argument inasmuch as both arguments rely in the very same way on One-over-Many, Self-Predication, and Non-Identity.

On the second view, the regress arises differently. In particular, the reasoning relies explicitly on Paradigmatism and on an assumption that Parmenides emphasizes as he is setting up his criticism, namely that the relation of likeness is symmetrical: if X is like Y, then Y is like X (Parmenides 132d5–7). Consider two things, A and B, that both have the property of being F. Given that there is a property that A and B both share, it follows that A is like B and that B is like A. Thus, A is like something (and hence, in some way, like) and B is like something (and hence, in some way, like). But, by One-over-Many, A and B are both like by virtue of partaking of a form of likeness (say, L1). Now assume for reductio that something is like L1 or L1 is like something. Clearly if L1 is like something, then L1 is (in some way) like. And if something is like L1, then, by symmetry of likeness, L1 is like it, and hence again L1 is (in some way) like. So, whether something is like L1 or L1 is like something, L1 is like. Now, by One-over-Many, L1 is like by virtue of partaking of a form of likeness (say, L2), and hence L1 partakes of L2. By Non-Identity, L2 is numerically distinct from L1. But also, by Paradigmatism, L1 is like L2, and hence, by symmetry of likeness, L2 is like L1. So L2 is (in some way) like. By One-over-Many, then, L1 and L2 are like by virtue of partaking of a form of likeness (say, L3), and hence L1 and L2 both partake of L3. By Non-Identity, L3 is numerically distinct from both L1 and L2. This gives us three distinct forms of likeness. Repetition of the same pattern of reasoning then establishes the existence of an infinite regress of forms of likeness. Taking for granted that the existence of such a regress is in some way absurd or problematic, Parmenides infers that the assumption for reductio is false, i.e., that nothing is like L1 and L1 is like nothing. But this result is itself unacceptable. For we already have it that A and B are like by virtue of partaking of L1, and hence that A and B partake of L1. By Paradigmatism, A and B are like L1, and hence something is like L1. Moreover, by symmetry of likeness, L1 is like A and B, and hence L1 is like something. Thus the assumption for reductio is true. Contradiction. Notice that, on the second view, the reasoning leading to the relevant regress is not homologous to the Third Man argument: instead of deriving the claim that each form of likeness is like from Self-Predication, Parmenides infers it from the conjunction of Paradigmatism and the symmetry of likeness.

On either interpretation of the identity and structure of the relevant regress, it is as yet unclear why Parmenides finds the regress problematic. It is reasonable to assume that Parmenides' reason for finding the likeness regress problematic is the same as his reason for finding the largeness regress problematic in the Third Man argument. The same three options canvassed in section 4.3 are available. Some contend that the regress is epistemic and vicious by its very nature, others that the regress conflicts with Uniqueness, and yet others that the regress leads to the claim that each form in the relevant infinite hierarchy is many, and hence, by Oneness and Purity-F, both one and not one.

4.6 The Greatest Difficulty 133a–134e

At the conclusion of the Likeness Regress, Parmenides raises what he characterizes as the greatest difficulty for the theory of forms. This difficulty takes the form of two arguments, the first designed to show that, if the forms are as Socrates has described them, they cannot be known by human beings, the second designed to show that, if the forms are as Socrates has described them, then the gods cannot know human affairs. Both of these conclusions, if true, would be devastating to the theory of forms. For, first, in the middle dialogues, Plato takes for granted that humans can know at least some forms (see Meno 76a6–7 and Phaedo 74b2–3) and sketches a method (i.e., dialectic) that is designed to provide humans with knowledge of the forms (Republic 534b3–c5); and, second, as Socrates himself accepts, it would be “shocking” (134c4) and “astonishing” (134d8) to be told that the gods cannot know human affairs.

Commentators differ over the proper way to reconstruct and evaluate the two arguments. With respect to the first argument, some scholars (such as Lewis (1979)) claim that the argument is invalid, some (such as Peterson (1981)) that there are two different valid ways of reconstructing it, others (such as Yi and Bae (1998), and Rickless (2007, 86–90)) that there is a single way to reconstruct the argument, one on which it comes out valid. The second argument is usually thought to be largely homologous to the first.

The first argument begins with the assumption (call it P1) that nothing that is itself by itself is in (or among) humans (Parmenides 133c3–6). This assumption reflects a particular understanding of what Separation requires, a conception that is emphasized in the dialogues of the middle period (see Symposium 211a8–b1 and Timaeus 52a1–3—for discussion, see Rickless (2007, 19–20)). Parmenides then adds, and provides instances of, two further premises, P2 and P3:

(P2) If X is a form and X is what it is in relation to Y, then Y is a form.

(P3) If X is in humans and X is what it is in relation to Y, then Y is in humans.

For many commentators, P2 states that forms are related to other forms, but not to sensible things, and P3 states that sensible things are related to other sensible things, but not to forms (see, e.g., Ryle (1939), Cherniss (1944, 282 ff.), Chen (1944), Runciman (1959), Schipper (1965, 15), Matthews (1972), Weingartner (1973, 185–187), Fujisawa (1974, 30 ff.), Shiner (1974, 24 and 31), McCabe (1994, 90–94), Gill (1996, 45–48), Sayre (1996, 88–91), and Allen (1997, 193–203)). But there are good reasons for thinking that this interpretation is incorrect (see Forrester (1974), Lewis (1979), Peterson (1981), Yi and Bae (1998), and Rickless (2007, 88)). Plato's formulation of P2 and P3 presupposes a distinction between two ways of being: relative being and absolute being. Something has relative being if it is impossible to describe its nature without mentioning something else to which it is related. Something has absolute being if it does not have relative being. The point of P2 is that it is in relation to another form that any form with merely relative being is defined. The point of P3 is that it is in relation to another sensible thing that any sensible thing with merely relative being is defined. This reading is confirmed by Parmenides' illustrations of P2 and P3. Mastery itself, he says, is what it is in relation to slavery itself, but it is not the case that mastery itself is what it is in relation to a human slave. Similarly, slavery itself is what it is in relation to mastery itself, but it is not the case that slavery itself is what it is in relation to a human master. Moreover, a human master is what he is in relation to a human slave, but it is not the case that a human master is what he is in relation to slavery itself. Similarly, a human slave is what he is in relation to a human master, but it is not the case that a human slave is what he is in relation to mastery itself. Parmenides then instantiates P3 using the example of knowledge:

(P3K) If X is knowledge in humans and X is what it is in relation to Y, then Y is in humans.

And finally, Parmenides assumes that knowledge has merely relative being:

(P4) Knowledge is what it is in relation to what it is knowledge of.

The reasoning to the first conclusion is straightforward. By P4, knowledge is what it is in relation to what it is knowledge of. Consequently, by P3K, if X is knowledge in humans, then the object of X (i.e., what X is knowledge of) is in humans. Now, according to Separation, every form is itself by itself. But, by P1, nothing that is itself by itself is in humans. Consequently, whatever is in humans is not a form. So if X is knowledge in humans, then the object of X is not a form. That is to say, no knowledge in humans (i.e., no knowledge that humans have) has any form as its object. Thus, from Separation, P1, P3K, and P4, it follows that humans do not know any forms.

The second argument begins with two assumptions: (i) that any knowledge that is a form is more precise than any knowledge that is in humans, and (ii) that the gods have any knowledge that is more precise than any knowledge that is in humans. From these two assumptions, what follows is:

(P5) If X is a knowledge and X is a form, then the gods have X.

Parmenides then reasons as follows. By P2, if X is a form and X is what it is in relation to Y, then Y is a form. By P4, knowledge is what it is in relation to what it is knowledge of. So P2 and P4 together entail P6:

(P6) If X is a form and X is a knowledge of Y, then Y is a form.

Now, by P1, anything that is itself by itself is not in humans, and, by Separation, every form is itself by itself. Hence P1 and Separation entail that no form is in humans, i.e., that if Y is a form, then Y is not in humans. This result, taken together with P6, entails P7:

(P7) If X is a form and X is a knowledge of Y, then Y is not in humans.

Parmenides then infers the following conclusion from the conjunction of P5 and P7:

(C) If X is a knowledge of Y and the gods have X, then Y is not in humans.

If this inference were valid, then Parmenides would have shown that the object of any knowledge the gods have is not in humans, i.e., that the gods do not know human affairs. However, C does not follow validly from the conjunction of P7 and P5. Rather C follows validly from the conjunction of P7 and P5* (for details, see Rickless (2007, 92)):

(P5*) If X is a knowledge and the gods have X, then X is a form.

There are three main possibilities here: (i) Plato simply missed the fact that the second argument is invalid; (ii) Plato intended his readers to recognize the argument as invalid; and (ii) Plato unintentionally misstated P5* as P5. (In any event, it is interesting to note that, whereas P3 but not P2 functions as a premise in the first argument, P2 but not P3 functions as a premise in the second argument.)

5. How to Save the Forms: The Plan of the Deductions 134e–137c

After having articulated potentially devastating criticisms of the theory of forms, one might expect Parmenides to conclude that the theory is a lost cause and should be abandoned. But, surprisingly, Parmenides does exactly the opposite. He claims, rather, that one who does not “allow that for each thing there is a character that is always the same” (a clear reference to One-over-Many) will “destroy the power of dialectic entirely” (135b8–c2). Here Parmenides means one of two things, depending on whether “dialectic” is taken in a technical sense (as meaning the process by which a philosopher is supposed to acquire knowledge of the forms—see Republic 534b3–c5) or in a non-technical sense (as meaning the ability to converse or communicate).

In any event, Parmenides makes it clear that the power of dialectic (however this is understood) cannot be saved unless the forms themselves are saved. As a means of saving the forms, Parmenides recommends a process of training that focuses on forms and takes note of the fact that forms wander (in the sense of having contrary properties, such as being like and unlike: 135e1–7). In particular, Parmenides suggests that the training process take the following shape. First, concerning some form, it must involve extracting consequences from the hypothesis that that form is; second, concerning the very same form, it must involve extracting consequences from the hypothesis that that form is not (135e8–136a2). Parmenides goes on to say that it is also important to consider different sorts of consequences: first, consequences for the form that is hypothesized to be (or to not be), and second, consequences for things other than the form that is hypothesized to be (or not to be). Parmenides also says that the training process should involve extracting consequences for the relevant form in relation to itself and in relation to the others, and consequences for things other than the relevant form in relation to themselves and in relation to the relevant form.

As most commentators agree, the arguments that occupy the second part of the dialogue may be grouped into eight distinct stretches of reasoning or Deductions (with an additional Appendix to the first two Deductions: 155e4–157b5). There is some controversy over the principles of division that Plato uses to generate the groupings. Some, notably Meinwald (1991), Peterson (1996; 2000; 2003), and Sayre (1996), argue that the division into eight Deductions should be explained by the three principles of division announced by Parmenides in his description of the method of training. On this (non-standard) picture, the Deductions should be understood as aiming at the following conclusions:

(D1) If the G is, then the G is not F and not con-F in relation to itself.
(D2) If the G is, then the G is F and con-F in relation to the others.
(D3) If the G is, then the others are F and con-F in relation to the G.
(D4) If the G is, then the others are not F and not con-F in relation to themselves.
(D5)If the G is not, then the G is F and con-F in relation to the others.
(D6)If the G is not, then the G is not F and not con-F in relation to itself.
(D7)If the G is not, then the others are F and con-F in relation to the G.
(D8) If the G is not, then the others are not F and not con-F in relation to themselves.

Others, including Miller (1986), Gill (1996), Allen (1997), and Rickless (2007), do not agree with this way of representing the proper way of generating eight Deductions. In particular, these scholars take issue with the claim that the third principle of division concerns whether the consequences for the relevant form (or for things other than the form) are relative to itself or relative to things other than it. As they see it, the third principle of division concerns whether the consequences for the relevant form (or for things other than the form) are positive or negative. According to this standard picture, the Deductions should be understood as aiming at the following conclusions:

(D1) If the G is, then the G is not F and not con-F (in relation to itself and in relation to the others).
(D2) If the G is, then the G is F and con-F (in relation to itself and in relation to the others).
(D3) If the G is, then the others are F and con-F (in relation to themselves and in relation to the G).
(D4) If the G is, then the others are not F and not con-F (in relation to themselves and in relation to the G).
(D5) If the G is not, then the G is F and con-F (in relation to itself and in relation to the others).
(D6) If the G is not, then the G is not F and not con-F (in relation to itself and in relation to the others).
(D7) If the G is not, then the others are F and con-F (in relation to themselves and in relation to the G).
(D8) If the G is not, then the others are not F and not con-F (in relation to themselves and in relation to the G).

(D7 represents something of an anomaly here, because many of the conclusions actually derived in that Deduction are of the form: If the G is not, then the others appear to be F and con-F. See section 6.8 below.) Parmenides then offers to engage in the training exercise himself, taking “one” as the relevant instance of “G”, and considering a range of properties as instances of “F” (being many, being a whole, being limited, having shape, being in oneself, being in another, being in motion, being the same as oneself, being the same as another, being like oneself, being like another, touching oneself, touching another, being equal to oneself, being equal to another, being (or coming to be) older than oneself, being (or coming to be) older than another, being in time, being, being named or spoken of, and being the object of an account, opinion, knowledge, or perception).

One of the primary motivations for adopting the non-standard picture is that the standard picture makes it difficult to understand the second part of the dialogue as anything other than incoherent. The problem is this. On the standard picture, D1 and D2 together appear to entail that if the one is, then the one is F and is not F (and the one is con-F and is not con-F), and hence that it is not the case that the one is. Similarly, D3 and D4 together appear to entail that if the one is, then the others are F and not F (and the others are con-F and not con-F), and hence again that it is not the case that the one is. On the other hand, according to the same picture, D5 and D6 together appear to entail that if the one is not, then the one is F and is not F (and the one is con-F and is not con-F), and hence that it is not the case that the one is not. And similarly, D7 and D8 appear to entail that if the one is not, then the others are (or at least appear to be) F and not F (and the others are, or at least appear to be, con-F and not con-F), and hence again that it is not the case that the one is not. Putting all eight Deductions together, the overall result on the standard picture is a straightforward contradiction. One advantage of the non-standard interpretation, then, is that it avoids reading the Deductions as an extended argument for a necessary falsehood.

However, there are also good textual reasons to think that the standard picture is superior to the non-standard proposal. For example, in D2, Parmenides argues that if the one is, then the one is both different and the same in relation to itself (147b7–8), both like and unlike in relation to itself (148d3–4), and both older and younger in relation to itself (152e2–3). But according to the non-standard picture Parmenides should not be using D2 to argue for consequences about the one in relation to itself; rather, Parmenides should be using D2 to argue for consequences about the one in relation to the others. (In reply to this sort of criticism, Meinwald (1991, 46–75) and Sayre (1996, 114) argue, though in different ways, that Plato uses the in-relation-to qualifications in a technical, rather than ordinary, sense. For criticisms of Meinwald's influential proposal, see Gill (1996, 56, fn. 90), Sayre (1996, 110–113), and Rickless (2007, 102–106).)

Another way out of the problem posed by the seeming incoherence of the Deductions is to suppose that the subject of one Deduction is numerically distinct from the subject of some of the other Deductions. Multisubjectist interpretations of this kind have been defended by the Neoplatonists (including Plotinus and Proclus), Cornford (1939), Miller (1986), and Sayre (1996). One of the major problems facing multisubjectism is the fact that Parmenides is quite explicit about the fact that the subject form of each Deduction is identical to the subject form of each of the other Deductions. (For further criticisms of multisubjectism, see Meinwald (1991, 24–26). For particular criticisms of the Neoplatonist version of multisubjectism, see Allen (1997, 211–215 and 218–224).)

The standard view (if there is one) is that the Deductions have an aporetic purpose: their aim is to perplex, to set problems that must be solved, either by rejecting some of the premises that lead to the master contradiction or by finding fault with the relevant reasoning. Aporetic interpretations of this sort have been defended by Gill (1996) and Allen (1997), with additional support provided by Patterson (1999). On this kind of view, Plato does not commit to any particular way of solving the problems: the second part of the dialogue is simply meant to serve as a challenge to the reader.

Yet another alternative is that detailed logical analysis of the Deductions reveals arguments sufficient to establish both that the one is and, importantly, that principles such as Purity-F and Uniqueness are false. As Rickless (2007, 136–137 and 211) argues, Purity-F is a background premise of both D1 and D4. Taken together, then, D1 and D2 are sufficient to establish that a contradiction follows from the hypothesis that the one is, on the assumption that Purity-F is true. That is, D1 and D2 together entail that if the one is, then Purity-F is false. But D5 and D6 together entail that the one is. It then follows directly that Purity-F must be false. Moreover, D2 contains an argument for the claim that if the one is, then there are infinitely many forms of oneness. Given that the one is (thanks to D5 and D6), it follows directly that there must be more than one form corresponding to the property of being one, and hence that Uniqueness is false. (Rickless (2007, 238–239) also argues that the second part of the dialogue provides sufficient reason to reject No Causation by Contraries.)

6. The Deductions 137c–166c

Each Deduction consists of separate stretches of reasoning (call them “Arguments”) leading to a number of logically interconnected results (call them “Conclusions”). The summary to follow is governed by the following notational conventions. Each Deduction receives a number (“D1” for the first Deduction, “D2” for the second Deduction, and so on) and each Argument within each Deduction receives a number (“A1” for the first Argument, “A2” for the second Argument, and so on). (The Appendix to the first two Deductions will be called “App”.) If an Argument has exactly one Conclusion, the single Conclusion will be referred to as “C”. If an Argument has more than one Conclusion, the Conclusions will be numbered (“C1” for the first Conclusion, “C2” for the second Conclusion, and so on).

6.1 The First Deduction 137c–142a

The aim of D1 is to establish, for a variety of different properties F, that if the one is, then the one is neither F nor con-F. Within D1, there are eighteen separate Arguments with the following Conclusions: If the one is, then the one is not many (D1A1C), the one has no parts (D1A2C1), the one is not a whole (D1A2C2), the one has no beginning, middle, or end (D1A3C), the one is unlimited (D1A4C), the one has no shape (D1A5C), the one is not in another (D1A6C1), the one is not in itself (D1A6C2), the one is nowhere (D1A6C3), the one is not in motion (D1A7C), the one is not at rest (D1A8C), the one is not different from itself (D1A9C1), the one is not the same as another (D1A9C2), the one is not different from another (D1A10C), the one is not the same as itself (D1A11C), the one is not like another or itself (D1A12C), the one is not unlike itself or another (D1A13C), the one is not equal to itself or another (D1A14C1), the one is not unequal to itself or another (D1A14C2), the one is not the same age as itself or another (D1A15C1), the one is neither younger nor older than itself or another (D1A15C2), the one is not in time (D1A16C), the one neither comes to be nor ceases to be (D1A17C1), the one does not partake of being (D1A17C2), the one is not (D1A17C3), the one is not one (D1A17C4), the one is not named or spoken of, nor is it the object of an account, knowledge, perception, or opinion (D1A18C).

Most of the individual Arguments in D1 are logically interconnected. The exceptions are D1A1C, D1A9C1, D1A9C2, D1A10C, and D1A11C, which do not depend on any previously established Conclusions. (For details, see Rickless (2007, 112–137).)

The Arguments of D1 also rest on a large number of independent premises, among which we find the following: (i) the property of being one and the property of being many are contraries; (ii) anything that has parts is many; (iii) a whole is a thing with parts from which no part is missing; (iv) the beginning, middle, and end of X are parts of X; (v) the beginning and end of X are the limits of X; (vi) to be round is to have extremities that are equidistant in every direction from the middle; (vii) to be straight is to have a middle that stands in the way of the two extremities; (viii) anything that has shape must be either round or straight; (ix) if X is in Y, then X is contained all around by Y and X touches Y in many places with many parts; (x) if X is contained all around by Y and X touches Y in many places with many parts, then X is round; (xi) if X touches Y in many places with many parts, then X has parts; (xii) if X both contains itself and is contained by itself, then X is two; (xiii) if X is two, then X is many; (xiv) whatever is neither in itself nor in another is nowhere; (xv) if X is in motion, then X alters from itself or moves spatially; (xvi) if X moves spatially, then X either spins in a circle in the same location or changes from one place to another.

It appears that every Argument of D1 other than D1A9 is logically valid. (However, see Gill (1996, 81, n. 134), who contends that D1A12 and D1A13 are fallacious.)) D1A9 seems to commit the fallacy of equivocation (see Rickless (2007, 121–123). It also appears that almost all the independent premises of D1 are, at least from Plato's point of view, either definitionally true or self-evident. There are three exceptions to this claim. D1A10 depends on the questionable premise that if X is not different by itself, then X itself is not different in any way (see Rickless (2007, 123–124)), and D1A11 depends on the questionable premise that if the nature of the F is not identical to the nature of the G, then if X is G relative to itself, X is not F relative to itself (see Rickless (2007, 124–126)).

But the most interesting exception is D1A1. In D1A1, Parmenides argues for D1A1C: that if the one is, then the one is not many. The reasoning is simple. From Oneness or Self-Predication, it follows that the one is one. Consequently, if the one is, then the one is one. But the property of being one and the property of being many are contraries, and, by Purity-F, no form can have contrary properties. Given that the one is a form, it follows that if the one is, then the one is not many. The non-obvious premises here are Oneness (or Self-Predication) and Purity-F. Whereas some might argue that D1A1 is unsound because Oneness (or Self-Predication) is false, others might argue that the very point of D1A1 is to show that if the one is and is many, then Purity-F is false.

6.2 The Second Deduction 142b–155e

The aim of D2 is to establish, for a variety of different properties F, that if the one is, then the one is both F and con-F. Within D2 there are thirty-three separate Arguments with the following Conclusions: If the one is, then the one partakes of being (D2A1C1), the one is not the same as being (D2A1C2), the one is a whole (D2A2C1), being and the one are parts of the one (D2A2C2), the one is infinitely many (D2A3C and D2A5C), the different is not the same as the one (D2A4C1), the different is not the same as being (D2A4C2), the one has parts (D2A6C1), the one is a whole (D2A6C2), the one is limited (D2A6C3), the one is unlimited (D2A6C4), the one has a beginning, a middle, and an end (D2A7C1), the one has shape (D2A7C2), the one is in itself (D2A8C1), the one is not nowhere (D2A8C2), the one is in another (D2A8C3), the one is at rest (D2A9C1), the one is in motion (D2A9C2), the one is the same as itself (D2A10C1), the one is different from itself (D2A10C2), the one is different from the others (D2A11C), the one is the same as the others (D2A12C), the one is like the others (D2A13C and D2A15C1), the one is unlike the others (D2A14C and D2A15C2), the one is like itself (D2A16C1), the one is unlike itself (D2A16C2), the one touches itself (D2A17C1), the one touches the others (D2A17C2), the one does not touch itself (D2A18C), the one does not touch the others (D2A19C), the one is equal to itself (D2A20C1), the one is equal to the others (D2A20C2), the one is both greater than and less than itself (D2A21C1), the one is unequal to itself (D2A21C2), the one is both greater than and less than the others (D2A22C1), the one is unequal to the others (D2A22C2), the one is more than, less than, and equal to itself in number (D2A23C1), the one is more than, less than, and equal to the others in number (D2A23C2), the one partakes of time (D2A24C), the one comes to be older than itself (D2A25C1), the one comes to be younger than itself (D2A25C2), the one always is older than itself (D2A26C1), the one always is younger than itself (D2A26C2), the one is the same age as itself (D2A27C1), the one is neither older nor younger than itself (D2A27C2), the one neither comes to be older nor comes to be younger than itself (D2A27C3), the one is older than the others (D2A28C), the one is younger than the others (D2A29C), the one is the same age as the others (D2A30C1), the one is neither older nor younger than the others (D2A30C2), the one neither comes to be older nor comes to be younger than the others (D2A31C), the one comes to be younger than the others (D2A32C1), the one comes to be older than the others (D2A32C2), the one partakes of time past, future, and present (D2A33C1), the one is and comes to be, was and was coming to be, and will be and will be coming to be (D2A33C2), and the one could be named and spoken of, as well as be the object of an account, knowledge, perception, and opinion (D2A33C3).

Most of the individual Arguments in D2 are logically interconnected. The exceptions are D2A1C1, D2A1C2, D2A8C2, D2A10C1, D2A12C, D2A18C, D2A19C, D2A20C1, D2A20C2, and D2A24C, which do not depend on any previously established conclusions. (For details, see Rickless (2007, 138–187).)

It appears that every Argument of D2 is logically valid. (However, see Gill (1996, 64, n. 107), who contends that D2A8 and D2A9 are fallacious, and Patterson (1999, 98–100), who argues that D2A8 is fallacious.)) Like the Arguments of D1, the Arguments of D2 rest on a large number of independent premises, including many of the independent premises of D1. Again, most of these premises are, at least from Plato's point of view, either definitionally true or self-evident. (Gill (1996, 83–84) objects to one of the premises of D2A14 and Patterson objects to one of the premises of D2A28, but Rickless (2007, 160 and 175) claims that it is unclear whether Plato himself would have found these premises problematic.) There are three exceptions to this claim: D2A4, D2A12, and D2A14. D2A4 depends on Causality and No Causation by Contraries, D2A12 depends on No Causation by Contraries, and D2A14C depends on D2A12C. But there are reasons for thinking that No Causation by Contraries is false. When combined with Causality, No Causation by Contraries entails that, for any property F, the F cannot be con-F. But, assuming that the one is, this contradicts D2A3C, namely that if the one is, then the one is (infinitely) many. So, if Causality is true and the one is, then No Causation by Contraries must be false. This result is important, for the falsity of No Causation by Contraries would enable Plato to dispatch at least some of Parmenides' earlier criticisms of the theory of forms, notably the first two criticisms of the result of combining the theory of forms with the Piece-of-Pie Model conception of partaking—see the end of section 4.2 above.

Notice that D1 and D2 together entail that if the one is, then Purity-F is false. To see why, consider the following. D1 establishes that if Purity-F is true, then if the one is, then the one is neither F nor con-F; and D2 establishes that if the one is, then the one is both F and con-F. So if both D1 and D2 are valid and based on acceptable premises (other than Purity-F), then D1 and D2 together establish that if Purity-F is true and the one is, then the one has contradictory properties. Given that it is impossible for something to have contradictory properties, it is a direct consequence of the conjunction of D1 and D2 that if the one is, then Purity-F is false.

6.3 The Appendix to the First Two Deductions 155e–157b

The function of the Appendix is to show that the Conclusions of D1 and D2 together entail that, for a range of properties F, if the one is, then there is a moment outside of time (the so-called “instant”) at which the one changes from being F to being con-F. Within the Appendix, there are five Arguments with the following Conclusions: If the one is, then there are times T1 and T2 such that T1 is distinct from T2 and the one partakes of being at T1 and the one does not partake of being at T2 (AppA1C), there is a definite time at which the one comes to be (AppA2C1), there is a definite time at which the one ceases to be (AppA2C2), there is a time at which the one ceases to be many (AppA3C1), there is a time at which the one ceases to be one (AppA3C2), there is a time at which the one is combined (AppA3C3), there is a time at which the one is separated (AppA3C4), there is a time at which the one is made like (AppA3C5), there is a time at which the one is made unlike (AppA3C6), there is a time at which the one is increased (AppA3C7), there is a time at which the one is decreased (AppA3C8), there is a time at which the one is made equal (AppA3C9), there is something (call it “the instant”) (i) that is in no time at all and (ii) at which the one changes both from being in motion to being at rest and from being at rest to being in motion and (iii) at which the one is neither at rest nor in motion (AppA4C), there is something (call it “the instant”) (i) that is in no time at all and (ii) at which the one changes both from not-being to being and from being to not-being and (iii) at which the one neither is nor is not (AppA5C1), there is something (call it “the instant”) (i) that is in no time at all and (ii) at which the one changes both from being one to being many and from being many to being one and (iii) at which the one is neither one nor many (AppA5C2), there is something (call it “the instant”) (i) that is in no time at all and (ii) at which the one changes both from being like to being unlike and from being unlike to being like and (iii) at which the one is neither like nor unlike (AppA5C3), and there is something (call it “the instant”) (i) that is in no time at all and (ii) at which the one changes both from being small to being large and from being large to being small and (iii) at which the one is neither large nor small (AppA5C4).

All of the individual Arguments within the Appendix are logically interconnected. (For details, see Rickless (2007, 189–198).)

It appears that every Argument of the Appendix is logically valid. Like the Arguments of D1 and D2, the Arguments of the Appendix rest on a number of independent premises, including premises of D1 and D2. Again, most of the premises are, at least from Plato's point of view, either definitionally true or self-evident. (Gill (1996, 86) objects to one of the premises of AppA5. For a rejoinder, see Rickless (2007, 195, n. 2).) There is one major exception to this claim, however. All of the Arguments of the Appendix other than AppA1 depend for their soundness on the soundness of AppA1. But AppA1 depends for its soundness on the soundness of D1A17, which itself depends for its soundness on the truth of Purity-F. So if Purity-F were false, then all the Arguments of the Appendix would be unsound.

6.4 The Third Deduction 157b–159b

The aim of D3 is to establish, for a variety of different properties F, that if the one is, then the others are both F and con-F. Within D3, there are seven Arguments with the following Conclusions: If the one is, then the others are not the one (D3A1C), the others have parts (D3A2C1), the others are a whole (D3A2C2 and D3A3C2), the others are one (D3A2C3 and D3A3C1), the whole and the part of the others are many (D3A4C), the whole and the part of the others are unlimited in multitude (D3A5C1), the whole and the part of the others are unlimited (D3A5C2), the whole and the part of the others are limited (D3A6C), each of the others is like itself (D3A7C1), each of the others is like each of the others other than itself (D3A7C2), each of the others is unlike itself (D3A7C3), and each of the others is unlike each of the others other than itself (D3A7C4). There is also the promise of a number of Arguments establishing results of the form: If the one is, then the others are both F and con-F.

Most of the individual Arguments in D3 are logically interconnected, and connected to Arguments within previous Deductions. The only exception is D3A2C1, which does not depend on any previously established Conclusions. (For details, see Rickless (2007, 198–206).)

It appears that every argument of D3 is logically valid. Like the Arguments of D1 and D2, the Arguments of D3 rest on a number of independent premises, including premises of D1 and D2. Again, it appears that the premises are, at least from Plato's point of view, either definitionally true or self-evident. Thus it appears that, from Plato's point of view, D3 establishes, without reliance on Purity-F or any other potentially problematic assumption, that if the one is, then the others have a host of contrary properties.

6.5 The Fourth Deduction 159b–160b

The aim of D4 is to establish, for a variety of different properties F, that if the one is, then the others are neither F nor con-F. Within D4, there are four Arguments with the following Conclusions: If the one is, then the others are not one (D4A1C), the others are not many (D4A2C1), the others are not a whole (D4A2C2), the others do not have parts (D4A2C3), the others are not like (D4A3C1), the others are not unlike (D4A3C2), the others are not both like and unlike (D4A3C3), the others are not the same (D4A4C1), the others are not different (D4A4C2), the others are not in motion (D4A4C3), the others are not at rest (D4A4C4), the others are not coming to be (D4A4C5), the others are not ceasing to be (D4A4C6), the others are not greater (D4A4C7), the others are not equal (D4A4C8), and the others are not less (D4A4C9).

All of the individual Arguments in D4 are logically interconnected, and connected to Arguments within previous Deductions. (For details, see Rickless (2007, 207–211).)

It appears that all of the Arguments in D4 are valid. Like the Arguments of the first three Deductions, the Arguments of D4 rest on a number of independent premises, including premises of D1 and D2 (but not D3). Again, it appears that most of the premises are, at least from Plato's point of view, either definitionally true or self-evident. There is one major exception to this claim, however. All of the Arguments of D4 depend for their soundness on the soundness of D1A2. But D1A2 depends for its soundness on the soundness of D1A1, which itself depends for its soundness on the truth of Purity-F.

So we can redescribe the Conclusion of D4 as follows: If Purity-F is true, then if the one is, then the others do not have a host of contrary properties. This means that D3 and D4 together entail that if the one is, then Purity-F is false. For, by D3, if the one is, then the others are both F and con-F. But, by D4, if Purity-F is true and the one is, then the others are neither F nor con-F. So, if Purity-F is true and the one is, then the others have a host of contradictory properties. Given that it is impossible for anything to have contradictory properties, it follows directly that if the one is, then Purity-F is false.

6.6 The Fifth Deduction 160b–163b

The aim of D5 is to establish, for a variety of different properties F, that if the one is not, then the one is both F and con-F. Within D5, there are twelve Arguments with the following Conclusions: If the one is not, then the one is different from the others (D5A1C1), we have knowledge of the one (D5A1C2), the one is different in kind from the others (D5A2C), the one partakes of something, that, and this (D5A3C), the one is unlike the others (D5A4C1), the others are unlike the one (D5A4C2), the one partakes of the unlike (i.e., has unlikeness) in relation to the others (D5A4C3), the one partakes of the like in relation to itself (D5A5C1), the one is like itself (D5A5C2), the one is unequal to the others (D5A6C1), the others are unequal to the one (D5A6C2), the one partakes of the unequal in relation to the others (D5A6C3), the one partakes of the large (D5A7C1), the one partakes of the small (D5A7C2), the one partakes of the equal (D5A7C3), the one partakes of being (D5A8C1), the one partakes of not-being (D5A8C2), the one is in motion (D5A9C), the one is not in motion (D5A10C1), the one is at rest (D5A10C2), the one is altered (D5A11C1), the one is not altered (D5A11C2), the one comes to be (D5A12C1), the one ceases to be (D5A12C2), the one does not come to be (D5A12C3), and the one does not cease to be (D5A12C4).

Most of the individual Arguments in D5 are logically interconnected, and connected to Arguments within previous Deductions. The exceptions are D5A1C1, D5A1C2, D5A3C, D5A5C1, D5A8C1, D5A8C2, and D5A10C1, which do not depend on any previously established Conclusions. (For details, see Rickless (2007, 212–223).)

It appears that all of the Arguments in D5 are valid. Like the Arguments of the first four Deductions, the Arguments of D5 rest on a number of independent premises, including premises of D1, D2, and the Appendix (but not D3 or D4). Again, it appears that most of the premises are, at least from Plato's point of view, either definitionally true or self-evident. Thus it appears that, from Plato's point of view, D5 establishes, without reliance on Purity-F or any other potentially problematic assumption, that if the one is not, then the one has a host of contrary properties. In other words, as Plato sees it, D5 establishes that if the one is not, then Purity-F is false.

When combined with the results of D1 and D2 (or, alternatively, with the results of D3 and D4), this result entails that Purity-F is in fact false. To see this, recall that D1 and D2 (as well as D3 and D4) together entail that if the one is, then Purity-F is false. Now, by D5, if the one is not, then Purity-F is false. So, whether the one is or is not, Purity-F is false. So Purity-F is false.

6.7 The Sixth Deduction 163b–164b

The aim of D6 is to establish, for a variety of different properties F, that if the one is not, then the one is neither F nor con-F. Within D6, there are four Arguments with the following Conclusions: If the one is not, then the one in no way is (D6A1C1), the one in no way partakes of being (D6A1C2), the one in no way comes to be (D6A2C1), the one in no way ceases to be (D6A2C2), the one is not altered in any way (D6A2C3), the one is not in motion (D6A2C4), the one is not at rest (D6A2C5), the one does not partake of the small (D6A3C1), the one does not partake of the large (D6A3C2), the one does not partake of the equal (D6A3C3), the one does not partake of the like (D6A3C4), the one does not partake of the different (D6A3C5), the others are not like the one (D6A4C1), the others are not unlike the one (D6A4C2), the others are not the same as the one (D6A4C3), the others are not different from the one (D6A4C4), none of the following (namely, of that, to that, something, this, of this, of another, to another, time past, time future, time present, knowledge, perception, opinion, account, and name) is applicable to the one (D6A4C5), and the one is in no state at all (D6A4C6).

Most of the individual Arguments in D6 are logically interconnected, and connected to Arguments within previous Deductions. The exceptions are D6A1C1 and D6A4C5, which do not depend on any previously established Conclusions. (For details, see Rickless (2007, 223–228).)

It appears that all of the Arguments in D6 are valid. Like the Arguments of the first five Deductions, the Arguments of D6 rest on a number of independent premises, including premises of D5 (but not D1, D2, D3, D4, or the Appendix). Again, it appears that most of the premises are, at least from Plato's point of view, either definitionally true or just plain obvious. Thus it appears that, from Plato's point of view, D6 establishes, without reliance on Purity-F or any other potentially problematic assumption, that if the one is not, then the one has neither of a host of contrary properties.

When combined with the results of D5, this result entails that the one is. To see this, consider the following. D5 establishes that if the one is not, then the one is both F and con-F; and D6 establishes that if the one is not, then the one is neither F nor con-F. So if both D5 and D6 are valid and based on acceptable premises, then D5 and D6 together establish that if the one is not, then the one has contradictory properties. Given that it is impossible for something to have contradictory properties, it is a direct consequence of the conjunction of D5 and D6 that it is not the case that the one is not. That is to say, D5 and D6 together entail that the one is.

This is a significant result, for two reasons. First, it reinforces the earlier result obtained from the conjunction of D1, D2, and D5 (and from the conjunction of D3, D4, and D5), namely that Purity-F is false. For D1 and D2 (as well as D3 and D4) together entail that if the one is, then Purity-F is false. But D6 establishes that the one is. It then follows directly by modus ponens that Purity-F is false. Second, the result that the one is can be generalized to establish the being of any form whatever. The reason is that none of the reasoning in the Deductions up to this point depends on the one's having been chosen as the main subject of the Deductions. Every Argument of D1–D6 would go through if some other form were substituted for the one as the main topic of discussion. Earlier, Parmenides had said that “only a very gifted man can come to know that for each thing there is some kind, a being itself by itself” (135a–b). So he has now revealed himself to be the “very gifted man” of whom he had spoken.

6.8 The Seventh Deduction 164b–165e

The aim of D7 is to establish, for a variety of different properties F, that if the one is not, then the others are both F and con-F. Within D7, there are six Arguments with the following Conclusions: If the one is not, then the others are (D7A1C1), the others are other (D7A1C2), the others are different (D7A1C3), the others are other than each other (D7A1C4), the others are infinitely many (D7A2C), each of the others appears to be one (D7A3C1), each of the others is not one (D7A3C2), the others appear to be infinitely many (D7A3C3), some of the others appear to be even, others odd (D7A3C4), none of the others is either even or odd (D7A3C5), among the others there appears to be a smallest (D7A4C1), each of the others (even the other that appears smallest) appears large in relation to its parts (D7A4C2), each of the others appears to come to the equal (D7A4C3), each of the others appears to have no beginning, middle, or end in relation to itself (D7A5C1), each of the others appears unlimited in relation to itself (D7A5C2), each of the others appears limited in relation to another (D7A5C3), each of the others appears to be like itself and each of the others (D7A6C1), and each of the others appears to be unlike itself and each of the others (D7A6C2).

Most of the individual Arguments in D7 are logically interconnected, and connected to Arguments within previous Deductions. The exceptions are D7A1C1 and D7A3C5, which do not depend on any previously established Conclusions. (For details, see Rickless (2007, 228–236).)

It appears that all of the Arguments in D7 are valid. Like the Arguments of the first six Deductions, the Arguments of D7 rest on a number of independent premises, including premises of every Deduction other than D4 and the Appendix. Again, it appears that most of the premises are, at least from Plato's point of view, either definitionally true or just plain obvious. Thus it appears that, from Plato's point of view, D7 establishes, without reliance on Purity-F or any other potentially problematic assumption, that if the one is not, then the others appear to have a host of contrary properties. (Thus D7 does not conform exactly to Parmenides' earlier description of the method of the Deductions. What we would expect from that description is not that D7 would establish that if the one is not then the others appear to have contrary properties, but rather that D7 would establish that if the one is not then the others actually have contrary properties. This discrepancy remains something of a mystery.)

Still, it is possible to extract an interesting result from D7, when combined with a result from D3. D7A1 establishes that if the one is not, then the others are (D7A1C1). But D3 establishes (for many F's) that if the one is, then the others are F. But to be F is to be in some way or other. So if the others are F, then the others are. So D3 establishes (for many F's) that if the one is, then the others are. Thus, D3 and D7A1C1 together entail that, whether the one is or is not, the others are. Hence D3 and D7 together entail that the others are. Assuming that the others are (or, at least, include) all the forms other than the one, it follows, in conjunction with the previously established result that the one is (see section 6.7 above), that every form is. This reinforces the previous claim (see section 6.7 again) that the result that the one is can be generalized to all the forms.

6.9 The Eighth Deduction 165e–166c

The aim of D8 is to establish, for a variety of different properties F, that if the one is not, then the others are neither F nor con-F. Within D8, there are two Arguments with the following Conclusions: If the one is not, then none of the others is one (D8A1C1), the others are not many (D8A1C2), the others cannot be conceived to be either one or many (D8A2C).

Most of the individual Arguments in D8 are logically interconnected, and connected to Arguments within previous Deductions. The lone exception is D8A2C, which depends on none of the Conclusions established in previous Deductions. (For details, see Rickless (2007, 236–238).)

It appears that all of the Arguments in D8 are valid. Like the Arguments of the first seven Deductions, the Arguments of D8 rest on a number of independent premises, including premises of D1. Again, it appears that most of the premises are, at least from Plato's point of view, either definitionally true or just plain obvious. Thus it appears that, from Plato's point of view, D8 establishes, without reliance on Purity-F or any other potentially problematic assumption, that if the one is not, then the others are, at the very least, neither one nor many.

Taken together, D7 and D8 establish that the one is. For D7A2 shows that if the one is not, then the others are many. But D8A1 shows that if the one is not, then the others are not many. Thus D7 and D8 show that if the one is not, then the others have contradictory properties. Given that nothing can have contradictory properties, it follows directly that the one is. This reinforces the result previously established in section 6.7.

7. Conclusion

Scholars are deeply divided about the central interpretive questions relating to a proper understanding of Plato's Parmenides. What is the point of Parmenides' criticisms of Socrates' theory of forms, taken both individually and collectively, in the first part of the dialogue? What is the point of Parmenides' instantiation of his own recommended method of training in the second part of the dialogue? And how, in particular, is the second part of the dialogue supposed to bear on the first?

For some, Parmenides' criticisms are no more than a “record of honest perplexity” (see Vlastos (1954, 343); Gill (1996); Allen (1997)). On this view, Plato's intention was simply to put forward difficulties for the theory of forms that he himself did not, at least at the time he wrote the dialogue, see a way to resolve. The main problem for this interpretation is that, after having laid out his criticisms of the theory, Parmenides says that it should be possible for a “very gifted man” to defend the existence of the forms, and thereby explain the possibility of dialectic, through a method of training that Parmenides himself goes on to instantiate in the second part of the dialogue.

For others, Parmenides' criticisms are fallacies that someone who follows Parmenides' recommended method of training will thereby be in a position to diagnose. On this view, the theory of forms emerges relatively intact at the end of the dialogue. The most influential version of this view belongs to Meinwald (1991; 1992) and Peterson (1996; 2000; 2003). According to Meinwald, Plato meant us to recognize the invalidity of Parmenides' criticisms of the theory of forms by having us focus on the in-relation-to qualifications that are supposed to serve as one of the principles of division that explain the fact that the second part takes the shape of eight separate Deductions. These qualifications, properly understood, reveal that subject-predicate sentences (of the form “X is F”) are ambiguous: to say that X is F is to say either that X is F in relation to itself (i.e., pros heauto) or that X is F in relation to the others (i.e., pros ta alla), where to say that X is F pros heauto is to say that the F is definitionally true of X, and to say that X is F pros ta alla is to say that X displays the feature of being F. As Meinwald argues, if Plato meant us to recognize the existence of such an ambiguity, then he probably meant us to recognize that self-predicational sentences (of the form “The F is F”) are also ambiguous, and that the ambiguity of such sentences reveals that the Third Man argument and the Greatest Difficulty commit the fallacy of equivocation. The main problem with this particular interpretive strategy is that it is provably false that all versions of the Third Man argument (or Greatest Difficulty) come out fallacious if self-predicational sentences are ambiguous as between pros heauto and pros ta alla readings. (For details, see Frances (1996).)

There are other interpretations that are similar to the one defended by Meinwald and Peterson. Miller (1986), for example, argues that a discerning reader who is able to look beneath the surface of the text is in a position to recognize that Parmenides' criticisms are effective only on the wrong-headed supposition that forms are fundamentally similar to the sensible, material things that partake of them. The point of the dialogue, on this view, is to help the discerning reader see the forms for what they really are, transcendent beings that should be accessed by reason rather than with the help of categories drawn from sense experience. One of the problems with such an interpretation is a problem that is common to esoteric readings in general: once one has left the surface of the text, there are no interpretive constraints on what one might find beneath the surface. Virtually any interpretation will turn out to be justified by the text. Another problem with this approach is that it pays insufficient attention to the logical interconnections among individual criticisms of the theory of forms, and between the criticisms as a whole and the Deductions.

There is another way of answering the three central interpretive questions, one on which Parmenides' criticisms as well as the Deductions come out as serious and valid (This is the interpretation defended in Rickless (2007).) What Parmenides' criticisms reveal is that, whether combined with the Pie Model conception of partaking or with Paradigmatism, Plato's middle period theory of forms is internally inconsistent. It turns out that there are three principles the abandonment of which would eliminate all inconsistencies apart from the Greatest Difficulty: Purity-F, Uniqueness, and No Causation by Contraries. Careful logical analysis of the second part of the dialogue then reveals that the Deductions establish not only that the forms posited by the middle period theory exist, but also that Purity-F, Uniqueness, and No Causation by Contraries are all false. It is then reasonable to suppose that Plato meant the reader to recognize that the proper way to save the forms is by abandoning these three basic assumptions. And, importantly, this can be done without abandoning the most important principles at the heart of the middle period theory, namely One-over-Many and Separation. The aptly-named Greatest Difficulty is then left as a challenge for future work.

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