Platonism in Metaphysics

First published Wed May 12, 2004; substantive revision Tue Apr 7, 2009

Platonism is the view that there exist such things as abstract objects — where an abstract object is an object that does not exist in space or time and which is therefore entirely non-physical and non-mental. Platonism in this sense is a contemporary view. It is obviously related to the views of Plato in important ways, but it is not entirely clear that Plato endorsed this view, as it is defined here. In order to remain neutral on this question, the term ‘platonism’ is spelled with a lower-case ‘p’. (See entry on Plato.) The most important figure in the development of modern platonism is Gottlob Frege (1884, 1892, 1893-1903, 1919). The view has also been endorsed by many others, including Kurt Gödel (1964), Bertrand Russell (1912), and W.V.O. Quine (1948, 1951).

Section 1 will describe the contemporary platonist view in detail. Section 2 will describe the alternatives to platonism — namely, conceptualism, nominalism, immanent realism, and Meinongianism. Section 3 will develop and assess the first important argument in favor of platonism, namely, the One Over Many argument. Section 4 will develop and assess a second argument for platonism, namely, the Singular Term argument. This argument emerged much later than the One Over Many argument, but as we will see, it is widely thought to be more powerful. Finally, section 5 will develop and assess the most important argument against platonism, namely, the epistemological argument.

1. What is Platonism?

Platonism is the view that there exist abstract (that is, non-spatial, non-temporal) objects. Because abstract objects are wholly non-spatiotemporal, it follows that they are also entirely non-physical (they do not exist in the physical world and are not made of physical stuff) and non-mental (they are not minds or ideas in minds; the are not disembodied souls, or Gods, or anything else along these lines). In addition, they are unchanging and entirely causally inert — that is, they cannot be involved in cause-and-effect relationships with other objects.[1] All of this might be somewhat perplexing; for with all of these statements about what abstract objects are not, it might be unclear what they are. We can clarify things, however, by looking at some examples.

Consider the sentence ‘3 is prime’. This sentence seems to say something about a particular object, namely, the number 3. Just as the sentence ‘The moon is round’ says something about the moon, so too ‘3 is prime’ seems to say something about the number 3. But what is the number 3? There are a few different views that one might endorse here, but the platonist view is that 3 is an abstract object. On this view, 3 is a real and objective thing that, like the moon, exists independently of us and our thinking (i.e., it is not just an idea in our heads). But according to platonism, 3 is different from the moon in that it is not a physical object; it is wholly non-physical, non-mental, and causally inert, and it does not exist in space or time. One might put this metaphorically by saying that on the platonist view, numbers exist “in platonic heaven”. But we should not infer from this that according to platonism, numbers exist in a place; they do not, for the concept of a place is a physical, spatial concept. It is more accurate to say that on the platonist view, numbers exist (independently of us and our thoughts) but do not exist in space and time.

Similarly, many philosophers take a platonistic view of properties. Consider, for instance, the property of being red. According to the platonist view of properties, the property of redness exists independently of any red thing. There are red balls and red houses and red shirts, and these all exist in the physical world. But platonists about properties believe that in addition to these things, redness — the property itself — also exists, and according to platonists, this property is an abstract object. Ordinary red objects are said to exemplify or instantiate redness. Plato said that they participate in redness, but this suggests a causal relationship between red objects and redness, and again, contemporary platonists would reject this.

Platonists of this sort say the same thing about other properties as well: in addition to all the beautiful things, there is also beauty; and in addition to all the tigers, there is also the property of being a tiger. Indeed, even when there are no instances of a property in reality, platonists will typically maintain that the property itself exists. This isn't to say that platonists are committed to the thesis that there is a property corresponding to every predicate in the English language. The point is simply that in typical cases, there will be a property. For instance, according to this sort of platonism, there exists a property of being a four-hundred-story building, even though there are no such things as four-hundred-story buildings. This property exists outside of space and time along with redness. The only difference is that in our physical world, the one property happens to be instantiated whereas the other does not.

In fact, platonists extend the position here even further, for on their view, properties are just a special case of a much broader category, namely, the category of universals. It's easy to see why one might think of a property like redness as a universal. A red ball that sits in a garage in Buffalo is a particular thing. But redness is something that is exemplified by many, many objects; it's something that all red objects share, or have in common. This is why platonists think of redness as a universal and of specific red objects — such as balls in Buffalo, or cars in Cleveland — as particulars.

But according to this sort of platonism, properties are not the only universals; there are other kinds of universals as well, most notably, relations. Consider, for instance, the relation to the north of; this relation is instantiated by many pairs of objects (or more accurately, by ordered pairs of objects, since order matters here — e.g., to the north of is instantiated by <San Francisco, Los Angeles>, and <Edinburgh, London>, but not by <Los Angeles, San Francisco>, or <London, Edinburgh>). So according to platonism, the relation to the north of is a two-place universal, whereas a property like redness is a one-place universal. There are also three-place relations (which are three-place universals), four-place relations, and so on. An example of a three-place relation is the gave relation, which admits of a giver, a givee, and a given — as in ‘Jane gave a CD to Tim’.

Finally, some philosophers claim that propositions are abstract objects. One way to think of a proposition is as the meaning of a sentence. Alternatively, we can say that a proposition is that which is expressed by a sentence on a particular occasion of use. Either way, we can say that, e.g., the English sentence ‘Snow is white’ and the German sentence ‘Schnee ist weiss’ express the same proposition, namely, the proposition that snow is white.

There are many different platonistic conceptions of propositions. For instance, Frege (1892, 1919) held that propositions are composed of senses of words (e.g., on this view, the proposition that snow is white is composed of the senses of ‘snow’ and ‘is white’), whereas Russell at one point (1905, 1910-11) held that propositions are composed of properties, relations, and objects (e.g., on this view, the proposition that Mars is red is composed of Mars (the planet itself) and the property of redness). Others hold that propositions do not have significant internal structure. The differences between these views will not matter for our purposes. For more detail, see the entry on propositions.

Numbers, propositions, and universals (i.e., properties and relations) are not the only things that people have taken to be abstract objects. As we will see below, people have also endorsed platonistic views in connection with linguistic objects (most notably, sentences), possible worlds, logical objects, and fictional characters (e.g., Sherlock Holmes). And it is important to note here that one can be a platonist about some of these things without being a platonist about the others — e.g., one might be a platonist about numbers and propositions but not properties or fictional characters.

Of course, platonism about any of these kinds of objects is controversial. Many philosophers do not believe in abstract objects at all. The alternatives to platonism will be discussed in section 2, but it is worth noting here that the primary argument that platonists give for their view is that, according to them, there are good arguments against all other views. That is, platonists think we have to believe in abstract objects, because (a) there are good reasons for thinking that things like numbers and universals exist, and (b) the only tenable view of these things is that they are abstract objects. We will consider these arguments in detail below.

2. A Taxonomy of Positions

There are not very many alternatives to platonism. One can reject the existence of things like numbers and universals altogether. Or one can maintain that there do exist such things as numbers and universals, and instead of saying that they are abstract objects, one can say that they are mental objects of some sort (usually, the claim is that they are ideas in our heads) or physical objects of some sort. Thus, the four mainstream views here are as follows (and keep in mind that anti-platonists can pursue different strategies with respect to different kinds of alleged abstract objects, taking one view of, say, numbers, and another view of properties or propositions).

  1. Platonism: This is the view described in section 1.
  2. Immanent Realism: Advocates of this view agree with platonists that there do exist such things as mathematical objects — or universals, or whatever category of alleged abstract objects we're talking about — and that these things are independent of us and our thinking; but immanent realists differ from platonists in holding that these objects exist in the physical world. Depending on the kind of object under discussion — i.e., whether we're talking about mathematical objects or properties or what have you — the details of this view will be worked out differently. In connection with properties, the standard immanent-realist view is that properties like redness exist only in the physical world, in particular, in actual red things, as nonspatial parts or aspects of those things (this view traces back to Aristotle; in contemporary times, it has been defended by Armstrong (1978)). There is certainly some initial plausibility to this idea: if you are looking at a red ball, and you think that in addition to the ball, its redness exists, then it seems a bit odd to say (as platonists do) that its redness exists outside of spacetime. After all, the ball is sitting right here in spacetime and we can see that it's red; so it seems initially plausible to think that if the redness exists at all, then it exists in the ball. As we will see below, however, there are serious problems with this view.

    In connection with numbers, one strategy is to take numbers to be universals of some sort — e.g., one might take them to be properties of piles of physical objects, so that, for instance, the number 3 would be a property of, e.g., a pile of three books — and to take an immanent realist view of universals. (This sort of view has been defended by Armstrong (1978).) But views of this kind have not been very influential in the philosophy of mathematics. A more prominent strategy for taking number talk to be about the physical world is to take it to be about actual piles of physical objects, rather than properties of piles. Thus, for instance, one might maintain that to say that 2 + 3 = 5 is not really to say something about specific entities (numbers); rather, it is to say that whenever we push a pile of two objects together with a pile of three objects, we will wind up with a pile of five objects — or something along these lines. Thus, on this view, arithmetic is just a very general natural science. A view of this sort was developed by Mill (1843) and, more recently, a similar view has been defended by Philip Kitcher (1984). It should be noted, however, that while there are certainly physicalist themes running through the views of Mill and Kitcher, it is not clear that either of them should be interpreted as an immanent realist. Kitcher is probably best classified as a kind of anti-realist (I'll say a bit more about this in section 4.1), and it's not entirely clear how Mill ought to be classified, relative to our taxonomy, because it's not clear how he would answer the question, “Are there numbers, and if so, what are they?”

    Finally, Penelope Maddy (1990) has also developed a sort of immanent realist view of mathematics. Concentrating mainly on set theory, Maddy maintains that sets of physical objects are located in space and time, right where their members are located. But Maddian sets cannot be identified with the physical matter that constitutes their members. On Maddy's view, corresponding to every physical object, there is a huge infinity of sets (e.g., the set containing the given object, the set containing that set, and so on) that are all distinct from one another but which all share the same matter and the same spatiotemporal location. Thus, on this view, there is more to a set than the physical stuff that makes up its members.

  3. Conceptualism (also called psychologism and mentalism, depending on the sorts of objects under discussion): This is the view that there do exist numbers — or properties, or propositions, or whatever — but that they do not exist independently of us; instead, they are mental objects; in particular, the claim is usually that they are something like ideas in our heads. As we will see below, this view has serious problems and not very many people endorse it. Nonetheless, it has had periods of popularity in the history of philosophy. It is very often thought that Locke held a conceptualistic view of universals, and prior to the twentieth century, this was the standard view of concepts and propositions. In the philosophy of mathematics, psychologistic views were popular in the late nineteenth century (the most notable proponent being the early Husserl (1891)) and even in the first part of the twentieth century with the advent of psychologistic intuitionism (Brouwer 1912 and 1948, and Heyting 1956). Finally, Noam Chomsky (1965) has endorsed a mentalistic view of sentences and other linguistic objects, and he has been followed here by others, most notably, Fodor (1975, 1987).

  4. Nominalism (also called anti-realism): This is the view that there are no such things as numbers, or universals, or whatever sort of alleged abstract objects are under discussion. Thus, for instance, a nominalist about properties would say that while there are such things as red balls and red houses, there is no such thing as the property of redness, over and above the red balls and red houses. And a nominalist about numbers would say that while there are such things as piles of three stones, and perhaps “3-ideas” existing in people's heads, there is no such thing as the number 3. As we will see below, there are many different versions of each of these kinds of nominalism, but for now, we don't need anything more than this general formulation of the view. (Sometimes ‘nominalism’ is used to denote the view that there are no such things as abstract objects; on this usage, ‘nominalism’ is synonymous with ‘anti-platonism’, and views like immanent realism count as versions of nominalism. In contrast, on the usage employed in this essay, ‘nominalism’ is essentially synonymous with ‘anti-realism’, and so views like immanent realism will not count as versions of nominalism here.)

Prima facie, it might seem that nominalism, or anti-realism, is further from the platonist view than immanent realism and conceptualism are for the simple reason that the latter two views admit that there do exist such things as numbers (or universals, or whatever). It is important to note, however, that nominalists agree with platonists on an important point that immanent realists and conceptualists reject; in particular, nominalists (in agreement with platonists) endorse the following thesis:

(S) If there were such things as numbers (or universals, or whatever sort of alleged abstract objects we're talking about), then they would be abstract objects; that is, they would be non-spatiotemporal, non-physical, and non-mental.

This is an extremely important point, because it turns out that there are some very compelling arguments (which we will discuss) in favor of (S). As a result, there are very few advocates of immanent realism and conceptualism. There is wide-spread agreement about what numbers, propositions, and universals would be if there were such things (namely, abstract objects), but very little agreement as to whether there do exist such things. Thus, today, the controversial question here is a purely ontological one: Are there any such things as abstract objects (e.g., mathematical objects, universals, propositions, and so on)?

It is worth noting that while there are only four mainstream views here (viz., platonism, immanent realism, conceptualism, and nominalism) a fifth view deserves mention, namely, Meinongianism. On this view, every singular term — e.g., ‘Clinton’, ‘3’, and ‘Sherlock Holmes’ — picks out an object that has some sort of being (that subsists, or that is, in some sense) but only some of these objects have full-blown existence. According to Meinongianism, sentences that platonists take to be about abstract objects — sentences like ‘3 is prime’ and ‘Red is a color’ — express truths about objects that don't exist.

Meinongianism has been almost universally rejected by philosophers. The standard argument against it (see, e.g., Quine 1948, p. 3) is that it does not provide a view that is clearly distinct from platonism and merely creates the illusion of a different view by altering the meaning of the term ‘exist’. The idea here is that on the standard meaning of ‘exist’, any object that has any being at all exists, and so according to standard usage, Meinongianism entails that numbers and universals exist; but this view clearly doesn't take such things to exist in spacetime and so, the argument concludes, Meinongianism entails that numbers and universals are abstract objects — just as platonism does.

So today it is widely thought that Meinongianism does not provide a genuine alternative to the four views sketched above. It is worth noting, however, that Richard Routley (or Sylvan, as he later became known) defended a slightly different view, which can be called neo-Meinongianism, that holds that (a) things like numbers and universals don't exist at all (i.e., have no sort of being whatsoever), but (b) we can still say true things about them — e.g., we can say (truly) that 3 is prime, even though there's no such thing as 3 (see Routley (1980), and for similar views, see Azzouni (1994, 2004), Salmon (1998), Priest (2003, 2005), and Bueno (2005)). Neo-Meinongianism does not collapse into platonism in the way that Meinongianism does; it is rather a specific version of nominalism, and as such, it will be discussed below.[2]

3. The One Over Many Argument

There are two mainstream arguments for platonism. The first, which goes back to Plato, is an argument for the existence of properties and relations only; this is the One Over Many argument. The second is also present in some sense in the works of Plato (at least on some readings of those works), but its first modern formulation was given by Frege (1884, 1892, 1893-1903, 1919); I will call this the singular term argument, and unlike the One Over Many, it can be used in connection with all the different kinds of abstract objects, i.e., numbers, properties, propositions, and so on. In the present section, we will discuss the One Over Many argument, and in the next section, we will discuss the singular term argument.

The One Over Many argument can be formulated as follows:

I have in front of me three red objects (say a ball, a hat, and a rose). These objects resemble one another. Therefore, they have something in common. What they have in common is clearly a property, namely, redness; therefore, redness exists.

We can think of this argument as an inference to the best explanation. There is a fact that requires explanation, namely, that the three objects resemble each other. The explanation is that they all possess a single property, namely, redness. Thus, platonists argue, if there is no other explanation of this fact (i.e., the fact of resemblance) that is as good as their explanation (i.e., the one that appeals to properties), then we are justified in believing in properties.

Notice that as the argument has been stated here, it is not an argument for a platonistic view of properties; it is an argument for the thesis that properties exist, but not for the thesis that properties are abstract objects. Thus, in order to use this argument to motivate platonism, one would have to supplement it with some reason for thinking that the properties in question here could not be ideas in our heads or immanent properties existing in particular physical objects. There are a number of arguments that one might use here, and in section 4.3, we will discuss some of these. But there is no need to pursue this here, because there is good reason to think that the One Over Many argument doesn't succeed anyway — i.e., that it doesn't provide a good reason for believing in properties of any sort. In other words, the One Over Many argument fails to refute nominalism about properties.

Before proceeding, it is worth pointing out that the One Over Many argument described above can be simplified. As Michael Devitt (1980) points out, the appeal to resemblance, or to multiple things having a given property, is a red herring. On the traditional formulation, nominalists are challenged to account for the following fact: the ball is red and the hat is red. But if nominalists can account for the fact that the ball is red, then presumably, they can simply repeat the same sort of explanation in connection with the hat, and they will have accounted for the fact that both things are red. Thus, the real challenge for the nominalist is to explain simple predicative facts, e.g., the fact that the ball is red, without appealing to properties, e.g., redness. More generally, they need to show how we can account for the truth of sentences of the form ‘a is F’ without appealing to a property of Fness.[3]

There is a very well-known nominalist response to the One Over Many argument. The heart of the response is captured by the following remark from Quine (1948, p. 10):

That the houses and roses and sunsets are all of them red may be taken as ultimate and irreducible, and it may be held that...[the platonist] is no better off, in point of real explanatory power, for all the occult entities which he posits under such names as ‘redness’.

There are two different ideas here. The first is that nominalists can respond to the One Over Many with an appeal to irreducible facts, or brute facts. The second is that platonists are no better off than such brute-fact nominalists in terms of real explanatory power. Now, Quine didn't say very much about these two ideas, but both ideas have been developed by Devitt (1980), whose exposition we follow here.

The challenge to nominalists is to provide an explanation for facts of a certain kind, namely, predicative facts described by sentences of the form ‘a is F’, e.g., the fact that a given ball is red. Now, whenever we are challenged to provide an explanation for a fact, or alleged fact, we have a number options. The most obvious response is simply to provide the requested explanation. But we can also argue that the alleged fact isn't really a fact at all. Or, third, we can argue that the fact in question is a brute fact — i.e., a fact that does not have an explanation. Now, in the present case, nominalists cannot claim that all predicative facts are brute facts, because it is clear that we can explain at least some facts of this sort. For instance, it seems that the fact that a given ball is red can be explained very easily by saying that it is red because it reflects light in such and such a way, and that it reflects light in this way because its surface is structured in thus and so a manner. So nominalists should not claim that all predicative facts are brute facts. But as Devitt points out, there is a more subtle way to appeal to bruteness here, and if Quinean nominalists make use of this, they can block the One Over Many argument.

The Quine-Devitt response to the One Over Many begins with the claim that we can account for the fact that the ball is red, without appealing to the property of redness, by simply using whatever explanation scientists give of this fact. Now, by itself, this explanation will not satisfy advocates of the One Over Many argument. If we explain the fact that the ball is red by pointing out that its surface is structured in some specific way, then advocates of the One Over Many argument will say that we have only moved the problem back a step, because nominalists will now have to account for the fact that the ball's surface is structured in the given way, and they will have to do this without appealing to the property of being structured in the given way. More generally, the point is this: it is of course true that if nominalists are asked to account for the fact that some object a is F, without appealing to the property of Fness, they can do this by pointing out that (i) a is G and (ii) all Fs are Gs (this is the sort of explanation they will get, if they borrow their explanations from scientists); but such explanations only move the problem back a step, for they leave us with the task of having to explain the fact that a is G, and if we want to endorse nominalism, we will have to do this without appealing to the property of Gness.

This is where the appeal to bruteness comes in. Nominalists can say that (a) we can keep giving explanations of the above sort (i.e., explanations of the sort ‘a is F because it is G,’ or because its parts are Gs, Hs, and Is, or whatever) for as long as we can, and (b) when explanations of this sort cannot be given, no explanation at all can be given. The thought here is that at this point, we will have arrived at fundamental facts that do not admit of explanations — e.g., facts about the basic physical natures of elementary particles. When we arrive at facts like this, we will say: “There's no reason why these particles are this way; they just are.”

This gives us a way of understanding how nominalists can plausibly use an appeal to bruteness to respond to the One Over Many argument. But the appeal to bruteness is only half of the Quinean remark quoted above. What about the other half, i.e., the part about the platonist being no better off than brute-fact nominalists in terms of real explanatory power? To appreciate this claim, let us suppose that we have arrived at a bottom-level fact that Quinean nominalists take to be a brute fact (e.g., the fact that physical particles of some particular kind — say, gluons — are G). Advocates of the One Over Many would say that their view is superior to Quinean nominalism because they can provide an explanation of the fact in question. Now, when they announce this, people who were interested in the question of why gluons are G, and who had been disappointed to hear from scientists and Quineans that this is simply a brute fact, might get very excited and listen eagerly to what advocates of the One Over Many have to say. What they say is this:

Gluons are G because they possess the property of Gness.

This doesn't seem very helpful. The claim that gluons possess Gness seems to do little more than tell us that gluons have some nature that makes it the case that they are G, and so it seems that no genuine explanation has been given. After all, those who had been interested in learning why gluons are G would not be very satisfied by this so-called “explanation”. Thus, to use Quine's words, it seems that advocates of the One Over Many are “no better off, in point of real explanatory power” than brute-fact nominalists are.

Nominalists might try to push the argument a bit further here, claiming that the sentence

(P) Gluons possesses the property of Gness

is just a paraphrase of the sentence

(N) Gluons are G.

On this view, (P) is equivalent to (N). That is, it says the very same thing. And neither sentence, according to this view, entails the existence of Gness. We can call this a paraphrase-nominalist view of sentences like (P). But nominalists needn't endorse this view. They can also endorse a fictionalist view of sentences like (P). On this view, (P) and (N) do not, strictly speaking, say the same thing, because (P) talks about the property of Gness and (N) does not. According to this fictionalist view, (P) is strictly speaking untrue, because it talks about the property of Gness, and according to nominalism, there is no such thing as Gness. In short, (P) is strictly speaking untrue, on this view, for the same reason that, e.g., ‘The tooth fairy is nice’ is untrue. But while (P) is not literally true on this view, it is “for-all-practical-purposes true”, or some such thing, because colloquially, it can be used to say what (N) says literally. This idea is often captured by saying that (P) is just a manner of speaking, or a façon de parler. (Notice that the dispute between fictionalism and paraphrase nominalism is best understood as a straightforward empirical dispute about the ordinary-language semantics of sentences like (P); the question is whether such utterances literally say the same things that the corresponding sentences like (N) say.)

Whichever view nominalists adopt here, they can respond to the One Over Many argument — i.e., to the claim that we can explain (N) by endorsing (P) — in the same way, namely, by pointing out that as an explanation of (N), (P) is completely uninformative. Even if nominalists endorse a fictionalist view according to which (P) is not equivalent to (N), they can still say that the above explanation is uninformative, because it really just says that gluons are G because they possess a nature that makes it the case that they are G.

Having made the point that the platonist explanation of (N) is uninformative, the nominalist's next move is to appeal to Ockham's razor to argue that we shouldn't believe in Gness (or at least that we shouldn't believe in Gness for any reason that has anything to do with the need to explain things like (N)). Ockham's razor is a principle that tells us that we should believe in objects of a given kind only if they play a genuine explanatory role. This principle suggests that if Gness does not play a genuine role in an explanation of the fact that gluons are G, then we shouldn't believe in Gness — or, again, we shouldn't believe in it for any reason having to do with the need to explain the fact that gluons are G.

The Quinean response to the One Over Many argument is often couched in terms of a criterion of ontological commitment. A criterion of ontological commitment is a principle that tells us when we are committed to believing in objects of a certain kind in virtue of having assented to certain sentences. What the above response to the One Over Many suggests is that we are ontologically committed not by predicates like ‘is red’ and ‘is a rock’, but by singular terms. (A singular term is just a denoting phrase, i.e., an expression that purports to refer to a specific object, e.g., proper names like ‘Mars’ and ‘Clinton’, certain uses of pronouns like ‘she’, and on some views, definite descriptions like ‘the oldest U.S. senator’.) More specifically, the idea here seems to be this: if you think that a sentence of the form ‘a is F’ is true, then you have to accept the existence of the object a, but you do not have to accept the existence of a property of Fness; for instance, if you think that ‘The ball is red’ is true, then you have to believe in the ball, but you do not have to believe in redness; or if you think that ‘Fido is a dog’ is true, then you have to believe in Fido but not in the property of doghood.

Three points need to be made here. First, the above criterion needs to be generalized so that it covers the use of singular terms in other kinds of sentences, e.g., sentences of the form ‘a is R-related to b’. Second, on the standard view, we are ontologically committed not just by singular terms but also by existential statements — e.g., by sentences like ‘There are some Fs’, ‘There is at least one F’, and so on (in first-order logic, such sentences are symbolized as ‘(∃x)Fx’, and the ‘∃’ is called an existential quantifier). The standard view here is that if you think that a sentence like this is true, then you are committed to believing in the existence of some Fs (or at least one F) but you do not have to believe in Fness; for instance, if we assent to ‘There are some dogs’, then we are committed to believing in the existence of some dogs, but we are not thereby committed to believing in the existence of the property of doghood. Third and finally, it is usually held that we are ontologically committed by singular terms and existential expressions (or existential quantifiers) only when they appear in sentences that we think are literally true and only when we think the singular term or existential quantifier in question can't be paraphrased away. We can see what's meant by this by returning to the sentence

(R) The ball possesses the property of redness.

In this sentence, the expression ‘the property of redness’ seems to be a singular term — it seems to denote the property of redness; thus, using the above criterion of ontological commitment, if we think (R) is true, then it would seem, we are committed to believing in the property of redness. But there are two different responses that nominalists can make to this. First, they can endorse paraphrase nominalism (defined a few paragraphs back) with respect to (R). If they do this, they will claim that (R) doesn't really carry an ontological commitment to the property of redness, because it is really just equivalent to the sentence ‘The ball is red’. This idea is often expressed by saying that in (R), the singular term ‘the property of redness’ can be paraphrased away — which is just to say that (R) can be paraphrased by (or is equivalent to) a sentence that doesn't contain the singular term ‘the property of redness’ (namely, ‘The ball is red’). The second view that nominalists can endorse with respect to (R) is fictionalism. In other words, they can admit that (R) does commit to the existence of the property of redness, but they can maintain that because of this (and because there are no such things as properties), (R) is, strictly speaking, untrue, even if it is “for-all-practical-purposes true,” or some such thing.

Having said all of this, we can summarize by saying that the standard view of ontological commitment is as follows:

Criterion of Ontological Commitment: We are ontologically committed by the singular terms (that can't be paraphrased away) in the (simple) sentences that we take to be literally true; and we are ontologically committed by the existential quantifiers (that can't be paraphrased away) in the (existential) sentences that we take to be literally true; but we are not committed by the predicates in such sentences. Thus, for instance, if we believe that a sentence of the form ‘a is F’ is literally true, and if we think that it cannot be paraphrased into some other sentence that avoids reference to a, then we are committed to believing in the object a but not the property of Fness; and, likewise, if we assent to a sentence of the form ‘a is R-related to b’, then we are committed to believing in the objects a and b but not the relation R; and if we assent to a sentence of the form ‘There is an F’ then we are committed to believing in an object that is F but we are not committed to the property of Fness.[4]

The One Over Many argument is now widely considered to be a bad argument. Ironically, though, the above criterion of ontological commitment — which Quinean nominalists appeal to in responding to the One Over Many argument — is one of the central premises in what is now thought to be the best argument for platonism. We will call this argument the singular term argument, although one might just as well call it the sucker-punch-on-the-Quinean-nominalist argument, for as we will see, the strategy is to accept the above criterion of ontological commitment and turn it against the Quinean nominalist.

4. The Singular Term Argument

The general argument strategy here has roots in the work of Plato, but its first clear formulation was given by Frege (1884, 1892, 1893-1903, and 1919). We begin with a general formulation of the argument:

  1. If a simple sentence (i.e., a sentence of the form ‘a is F’, or ‘a is R-related to b’, or…) is literally true, then the objects that its singular terms denote exist. (Likewise, if an existential sentence is literally true, then there exist objects of the relevant kinds; e.g., if ‘There is an F’ is true, then there exist some Fs.)
  2. There are literally true simple sentences containing singular terms that refer to things that could only be abstract objects. (Likewise, there are literally true existential statements whose existential quantifiers range over things that could only be abstract objects.) Therefore,
  3. Abstract objects exist.

Premise (1) follows straightaway from the criterion of ontological commitment that we discussed in the last section. Again, this is widely accepted among contemporary philosophers, and for good reason — if you think that a sentence of the form ‘a is F’ is literally true and that it cannot be paraphrased into some other sentence, then it's hard to see how you can deny that there is such a thing as the object a. Therefore, since (3) follows trivially from (1) and (2), the central question we have to answer, in order to evaluate the above argument, is whether (2) is true. Now, in order to motivate (2), platonists need to provide some examples; that is, they have to produce some sentences and argue that (i) they contain singular terms that can only be taken as referring to abstract objects (and that can't be paraphrased away) and (ii) they are literally true. Platonists maintain that there are many different kinds of such sentences. In what follows, we will consider versions of this argument that attempt to establish the existence of mathematical objects (e.g., numbers), propositions, properties, relations, sentence types, possible worlds, logical objects, and fictional objects.

4.1 Mathematical Objects

Platonists about mathematical objects claim that the theorems of our mathematical theories — sentences like ‘3 is prime’ (a theorem of arithmetic) and ‘There are infinitely many transfinite cardinal numbers’ (a theorem of set theory) — are literally true and that the only plausible view of such sentences is that they are about abstract objects (i.e., that their singular terms denote abstract objects and their existential quantifiers range over abstract objects). This general stance toward mathematics goes back to Plato, but the first clear statement of the argument in this form was given by Frege (1884); other advocates include Quine (see his 1948 and 1951, though he doesn't explicitly state the argument there), Gödel (1964), Parsons (1965, 1971, 1994), Putnam (1971), Steiner (1975), Zalta (1983, 1999), Wright (1983), Hale (1987), Resnik (1981, 1997), Shapiro (1989, 1997), the early Maddy (1990),[5] Katz (1998), and Colyvan (2001).

Let's begin our discussion of the platonists' argument here by considering their reasons for thinking that we have to take sentences like ‘3 is prime’ to be about abstract objects rather than mental or physical objects of some kind. And let's start with a discussion of the psychologistic view that mathematics is about mental objects.

Frege (1884, introduction and section 27; 1893-1903, introduction; 1894; and 1919) gave several compelling arguments against psychologism. First, it seems that psychologism is incapable of accounting for the truth of sentences that are about all natural numbers, because there are infinitely many natural numbers and clearly, there could not be infinitely many number-ideas in human minds. Second, psychologism seems to entail that sentences about very large numbers (in particular, numbers that no one has ever had a thought about) are not true; for if none of us has ever had a thought about some very large number, then psychologism entails that there is no such number and, hence, that no sentence about that number could be true. Third, psychologism turns mathematics into a branch of psychology, and it makes mathematical truths contingent upon psychological truths, so that, for instance, if we all died, ‘4 is greater than 2’ would suddenly become untrue. But this seems wrong: it seems that mathematics is true independently of us; that is, it seems that the question of whether 4 is greater than 2 has nothing at all to do with the question of how many humans are alive. Fourth and finally, psychologism suggests that the proper methodology for mathematics is that of empirical psychology; that is, it seems that if psychologism were true, then the proper way to discover whether, say, there is a prime number between 10,000,000 and 10,000,020, would be to do an empirical study of humans and ascertain whether there is, in fact, an idea of such a number in one of our heads; but of course, this is not the proper methodology for mathematics. As Frege says (1884, section 27), “Weird and wonderful…are the results of taking seriously the suggestion that number is an idea.”

Platonists do not deny that we have ideas of mathematical objects. What they deny is that our mathematical sentences are about these ideas. Thus, the dispute between platonism and psychologism is primarily a semantic one. Advocates of psychologism agree with platonists that in the sentence ‘3 is prime’, ‘3’ functions as a singular term (i.e., as a denoting expression). But they disagree about the referent of this expression. They think that ‘3’ refers to a mental object, in particular, an idea in our heads. It is this semantic thesis that platonists reject and that the above Fregean arguments are supposed to refute. More specifically, they're supposed to show that the psychologistic semantics of mathematical discourse is not correct because it has consequences that fly in the face of the actual usage of mathematical language.

Another argument for the superiority of the platonist semantics of mathematical discourse over the psychologist semantics is based on the fact that in ordinary usage, one way to say that something doesn't exist is to say that “it exists only in your head”.[6] To say that mathematical objects exist only in our heads, it seems, is just to say that they don't exist. For to say that they (as opposed to our ideas of them) exist is to say that they exist independently of us and our thinking. Quine put this point in a very compelling way in connection with a conceptualistic view of mythical objects like Pegasus. He writes (1948, p. 2):

McX [who maintains that Pegasus exists and is an idea in our heads] never confuses the Parthenon with the Parthenon-idea. The Parthenon is physical; the Parthenon-idea is mental…We cannot easily imagine two things more unlike…But when we shift from the Parthenon to Pegasus, the confusion sets in — for no other reason than that McX would sooner be deceived by the crudest and most flagrant counterfeit than grant the nonbeing of Pegasus.

The same argument can be run against the psychologistic conflation of 3-ideas with 3: you might doubt that there really is such a thing as the number 3, existing objectively and independently of us, but you should not for that reason claim that your idea of 3 is 3, for that is just a confusion — it is like saying that your idea of Pegasus is Pegasus, or that your idea of the Parthenon is the Parthenon.

Let us move on now to immanent-realist, or physicalist, views of mathematics, and let us concentrate first on views like Mill's (1843, book II, chapters 5 and 6), i.e., views that maintain that sentences about numbers are really just general claims about bunches of ordinary objects. On this view, the sentence ‘2 + 1 = 3’, for instance, isn't really about specific objects (the numbers 1, 2, and 3). Rather, it says that whenever we add one object to a pile of two objects, we will get a pile of three objects. Now, in order to account for contemporary mathematics in this way, a contemporary Millian would have to take set theory to be about ordinary objects as well. This, however, is untenable. One argument here is that set theory could not be about bunches of ordinary objects, or piles of physical stuff, because corresponding to every physical pile, there are many, many sets. Corresponding to a ball, for instance, is the set containing the ball, the set containing its molecules, the set containing its atoms, and so on. (And we know that these are different sets, because they have different members, and it follows from set theory that if set A and set B have different members, then A is not identical to B.) Indeed, the principles of set theory entail that corresponding to every physical object, there is a huge infinity of sets. Corresponding to our ball, for instance, there is the set containing the ball, the set containing that set, the set containing that set, and so on; and there is the set containing the ball and the set containing the set containing the ball; and so on and on and on. Clearly, these sets are not just piles of physical stuff, because (a) there are infinitely many of them (again, this follows from the principles of set theory) and (b) all of these infinitely many sets share the same physical base. Thus, it seems that claims about sets are not claims about bunches of ordinary objects, or even generalized claims about such bunches. They are claims about sets, which are objects of a different kind.

Another problem with physicalistic views along the lines of Mill's is that they seem incapable of accounting for the sheer size of the infinities involved in set theory. Standard set theory entails not just that there are infinitely large sets, but that there are infinitely many sizes of infinity, which get larger and larger with no end, and that there actually exist sets of all of these different sizes of infinity. There is simply no plausible way to take this theory to be about physical stuff.

These arguments do not refute the kind of immanent realism defended by the early Maddy (1990). On Maddy's view, sets of physical objects are located in spacetime, right where their members are. Thus, if you have two eggs in your hand, then you also have the set containing those eggs in your hand. Maddy's view has no problem accounting for the massive infinities in mathematics, for on her view, corresponding to every physical object, there is a huge infinity of sets that exist in space and time, right where the given physical object exists. This view is very subtle and the question of how platonists could most plausibly undermine it is tricky. See, e.g., Lavine (1992), Dieterle and Shapiro (1993), Balaguer (1998a), Milne (1994), Riskin (1994), Carson (1996), and the later Maddy (1997). Here I will say just a few words about one line of argument. Platonists might claim that Maddy's view encounters problems with branches of mathematics that deal with concepts and properties not instantiated in the physical world. Indeed, one might argue that this problem arises within set theory itself. According to Maddy's theory, the infinity of sets associated with a given physical object is formed into a unique structure, and all set-theoretic questions are answerable by studying that specific structure. But in fact, there are infinitely many different kinds of set-theoretic structures, and platonists can argue that physicalistic views like Maddy's are incompatible with this. For instance, one might argue that views like Maddy's are incompatible with the way that set theorists deal with questions that are undecidable in standard axiomatic set theories, e.g., the question about the truth of the Continuum Hypothesis. Alternatively, one might argue that on Maddy's view, it is a mystery how human beings could acquire certain kinds of set-theoretic knowledge, because it is a mystery how they could know which kinds of set-theoretic structures are instantiated in the physical world.

If arguments like the ones we've been discussing here are cogent, then sentences like ‘3 is prime’ are not about physical or mental objects, and therefore, psychologism and immanent realism are not tenable views of mathematics. But that is not the end of the singular term argument for the existence of abstract mathematical objects, for we still need to consider nominalistic views of sentences like ‘3 is prime’. In order for platonists to establish their view, they need to refute these nominalistic views as well as psychologistic and physicalistic views. And it should be noted that this is the hard part. There is a good deal of agreement among philosophers of mathematics that psychologism and immanent realism are untenable; that is, most philosophers of mathematics are either platonists or nominalists; but there is very little agreement as to whether platonism or nominalism is correct.

How can nominalists proceed in developing an account of sentences like ‘3 is prime’? One strategy is to reject premise (1) and the standard criterion of ontological commitment discussed above. This is exactly what neo-Meinongians do. Neo-Meinongianism was already mentioned above, in section 1; it has been developed by Routley (1980), Azzouni (1994, 2004), Salmon (1998), Priest (2003, 2005), and Bueno (2005). The view here is that (a) ‘3 is prime’ should be given a face-value interpretation according to which it really is of the form ‘Fa’ and doesn't need to be paraphrased into any other sentence, and (b) there is no such thing as the number 3, and yet (c) ‘3 is prime’ is literally true. (Neo-Meinongians might also want to say that on their view, ‘3 is prime’ is about the number 3, but in saying this, they would be using ‘about’ in a way that doesn't entail the existence of 3.)

Neo-Meinongians endorse a similar view of existence claims. For instance, on their view, the sentence ‘There are infinitely many prime numbers’ is literally true, even though there are no such things as numbers. This might look like a contradiction, but it's not, because according to neo-Meinongianism, existential expressions (or quantifiers) like 'there is' are ambiguous.

Most philosophers find this view extremely hard to believe. Indeed, a lot of philosophers would say that it is simply confused, or incoherent. But in fact, neo-Meinongianism is not incoherent. A better way to formulate the problem with the view is as follows: in giving up on the standard criterion of ontological commitment, neo-Meinongians seem to be using ‘true’ in a non-standard way. Most of us would say that if there is no such thing as the number 3, and if ‘3 is prime’ is read at face value (i.e., as being about the number 3), then it follows trivially that ‘3 is prime’ could not be true. Or more generally, most of us would say that if there is no such thing as the object a, then sentences of the form ‘a is F’ cannot be literally true. This, of course, is just to say that most of us accept the standard criterion of ontological commitment discussed above, but the point here is that this criterion seems to be built into the standard meaning of words like ‘true’. Indeed, this explains why the standard criterion of ontological commitment is so widely accepted. (For a different argument against Routley's neo-Meinongianism, see David Lewis (1990).)

Given that we want to hang onto the standard criterion of ontological commitment, there are two general strategies that nominalists can adopt in giving a view of mathematical sentences like ‘3 is prime’. First, they can endorse a paraphrase view, and second, they can endorse a fictionalist view. Those who endorse paraphrase views claim that while sentences like ‘3 is prime’ are true, they should not be read as platonists read them, because we can paraphrase these sentences with other sentences that do not commit us to the existence of abstract objects. One view of this sort, known as if-thenism, holds that ‘3 is prime’ can be paraphrased by ‘If there were numbers, then 3 would be prime’ (for an early version of this sort of view, see the early Hilbert (1899 and his letters to Frege in Frege (1980)); for later versions, see Putnam (1967a and 1967b) and Hellman (1989)). A second version of the paraphrase strategy, which we can call metamathematical formalism (see Curry (1951)), is that ‘3 is prime’ can be paraphrased by “‘3 is prime’ follows from the axioms of arithmetic”.[7] A third version, developed by Chihara (1990), is that mathematical sentences that seem to make claims about what mathematical objects exist — e.g., ‘There is a prime number between 2 and 4’ — can be paraphrased into sentences about what it's possible for us to do (in particular, what it's possible for us to write down).

One problem with the various paraphrase views (not to put too fine a point on it) is that none of the paraphrases seems very good. That is, the paraphrases seem to misrepresent what we actually mean when we say things like ‘3 is prime’ (and by ‘we’, I mean both mathematicians and ordinary folk). What we mean, it seems, is that 3 is prime — not that if there were numbers, then 3 would be prime, or that the sentence ‘3 is prime’ follows from the axioms of arithmetic, or any such thing. And notice how the situation here differs from cases where we do seem to have good paraphrases. For instance, one might try to claim that if we endorse the sentence

(A1) The average accountant has two children,

then we are ontologically committed to the existence of the average accountant; but it is plausible to suppose that, in fact, we are not so committed, because (A1) can be paraphrased by the sentence

(A2) On average, accountants have two children.

Moreover, it seems plausible to maintain that this is a good paraphrase of (A1), because it seems clear that when people say things like (A1), what they really mean are things like (A2). But in the present case, this seems wrong: it does not seem plausible to suppose that when people say ‘3 is prime’, what they really mean is ‘If there were numbers, then 3 would be prime’. Again, it seems that what we mean here is, very simply, that 3 is prime. In short, when people say things like ‘3 is prime’, they do not usually have any intention to be saying anything other than what the these sentences seem to say; and because of this, it seems that the platonist's face-value semantics for mathematical discourse is correct.

Some paraphrase nominalists (e.g., Chihara 1990) maintain that it doesn't matter what we really mean, that paraphrase nominalists aren't committed to the thesis that their paraphrases capture the real ordinary-language meanings of our mathematical sentences. But this is false. If paraphrase nominalists admit that platonists are right about the ordinary-language meanings of mathematical sentences like ‘3 is prime’, then their view will collapse into a fictionalist view, according to which sentences like ‘3 is prime’ are not literally true. For since paraphrase nominalists don't believe in the existence of mathematical objects, if they admit that ordinary utterances of ‘3 is prime’ are best interpreted as being about mathematical objects, or purporting to be about such objects, then they will have to admit that such sentences are literally untrue, as fictionalists maintain. Thus, if the paraphrase nominalist view is going to be a genuine alternative to fictionalism, it has to involve the thesis that the paraphrases that nominalists are offering capture the real meanings of ordinary mathematical sentences.

On the other hand, paraphrase nominalists might try to argue that they are right about the ordinary-language meanings of sentences like ‘3 is prime’, even though this is not obvious or transparent to ordinary speakers. This stance, however, would be extremely controversial and difficult to motivate.

(For a good in-depth discussion and critique of the various paraphrase nominalist views, see Burgess and Rosen (1997).)

Let's move on now to a discussion of fictionalism, which is the last option for nominalists. Unlike paraphrase nominalists, fictionalists admit that the platonist's face-value semantics for mathematical discourse is correct; but because fictionalists don't believe in abstract objects, they think that mathematical sentences like ‘3 is prime’ are not true. In other words, fictionalists maintain that (a) platonists are right that sentences like ‘3 is prime’ do purport to be about abstract objects, but (b) there are no such things as abstract objects, and so (c) these sentences — and, indeed, our mathematical theories — are untrue. Thus, on this view, just as Alice in Wonderland is not true because there are no such things as talking rabbits, hookah-smoking caterpillars, and so on, so too our mathematical theories are not true because there are no such things as numbers and sets and so on.[8]. (Fictionalism has been developed by Field (1980, 1989, 1998), Balaguer (1998a, 2009), Rosen (2001), Yablo (2002a, 2002b, 2005), and Leng (2005, forthcoming). One might also interpret Melia (2000) as a fictionalist. Finally, Hoffman (2004) endorses a kind of fictionalism, but her view is very different from the one under discussion here; for a bit more on her view, see the entry on fictionalism in the philosophy of mathematics.)

There are a few different ways that platonists might try to argue against fictionalism. The most famous and widely discussed argument against fictionalism is the Quine-Putnam indispensability argument (see Quine (1948, 1951), Putnam (1971), Colyvan (2001), and Baker (2005)). This argument (or at any rate, one version of it) proceeds as follows: it cannot be that mathematics is untrue, as fictionalists suggest, because (a) mathematics is an indispensable part of our physical theories (e.g., quantum mechanics, general relativity theory, evolutionary theory, and so on) and so (b) if we want to maintain that our physical theories are true (and surely we do — we don't want our disbelief in abstract objects to force us to be anti-realists about natural science), then we have to maintain that our mathematical theories are true.

Fictionalists have developed two different responses to the Quine-Putnam argument. The first, developed by Field (1980) and Balaguer (1998a), is based on the claim that mathematics is, in fact, not indispensable to empirical science — i.e., that our empirical theories can be nominalized, or reformulated in a way that avoids reference to abstract objects. The second response, developed by Balaguer (1998a), Rosen (2001), Yablo (2005), Leng (forthcoming), and perhaps Melia (2000), is to grant the indispensability of mathematics to empirical science and to simply account for the relevant applications from a fictionalist point of view.

There is no consensus on whether the fictionalist responses to the Quine-Putnam argument are successful. But even if they are, there are other objections that platonists might raise against fictionalism. For instance, one might argue that fictionalists cannot account for the objectivity of mathematics (for responses to this, see Field (1980, 1989, 1998) and Balaguer (2009)). Or, second, one might argue that fictionalism is not a nominalistically acceptable view because formulations of it invariably involve tacit reference to various kinds of abstract objects, such as sentence types, or stories, or possible worlds (for responses to this, see Field (1989), Balaguer (1998a), and Rosen (2001)). For other objections to fictionalism, see, e.g., Malament (1982), Shaprio (1983a), Resnik (1985), Chihara (1990, chapter 8, section 5), Burgess and Rosen (1997), Katz (1998), Thomas (2000, 2002), Stanley (2002), Bueno (2003), Hoffman (2004), and Burgess (2004). And for a discussion of all these objections, as well as fictionalist responses to them, see the entry on fictionalism in the philosophy of mathematics.)

In the end, it's not obvious whether platonists can successfully refute fictionalism, and more generally, it's not obvious whether the version of the singular term argument rehearsed in this subsection provides a good reason for believing in abstract mathematical objects.

4.2 Propositions

We turn now to a version of the singular term argument aimed at establishing the existence of propositions. Once again, the most important figure in the development of this argument is Frege (1892, 1919). Other relevant figures (who wouldn't all endorse an argument like the one sketched below) include Russell (1905, 1910-1911), Church (1950, 1954), Quine (1956), Kaplan (1968-69, 1989), Kripke (1972, 1979), Schiffer (1977, 1987, 1994), Perry (1979), Evans (1981), Peacocke (1981), Barwise and Perry (1983), Bealer (1982, 1993), Zalta (1983, 1988), Katz (1986), Salmon (1986), Soames (1987), Forbes (1987), Crimmins and Perry (1989), Richard (1990), Crimmins (1998), Recanati (1993, 2000), King (1995), Braun (1998), and Saul (1999).

The relevant sentences here are belief ascriptions, i.e., sentences like ‘Clinton believes that snow is white’ and ‘Emily believes that Santa Claus is fat’. The first point to note about these sentences is that they involve ‘that’-clauses, where a ‘that’-clause is simply the word ‘that’ added to the front of a complete sentence — e.g., ‘that snow is white’. The second point to be made is that ‘that’-clauses, in English, are singular terms. A common way to illustrate this point — see, e.g., Bealer (1982 and 1993) and Schiffer (1994) — is to appeal to arguments like the following:

I. Clinton believes that snow is white.
Therefore, Clinton believes something (namely, that snow is white).

This argument seems to be valid, and platonists claim that the best and only tenable explanation of this fact involves a commitment to the idea that the ‘that’-clause in this argument, i.e., ‘that snow is white’, is a singular term.

But if ‘that’-clauses are singular terms, what sorts of objects do they refer to? Well, it might seem that they refer to facts, or states of affairs. For instance, it might seem that ‘that snow is white’ refers to the fact that snow is white. This, however, is a mistake (at least in connection with the ‘that’-clauses that appear in belief reports). For since beliefs can be false, it follows that the ‘that’-clauses in our belief reports refer to things that can be false. E.g., if Sammy is seven years old, then the sentence ‘Sammy believes that snow is powdered sugar’ could be true; but if this sentence is true, then (by our criterion of ontological commitment) its ‘that’-clause refers to a real object; but then it cannot refer to a fact, because (obviously) there is no such thing as the fact that snow is powdered sugar.

These considerations suggest that the referents of the ‘that’-clauses that appear in belief ascriptions are things that can be true or false. But if this is right, then it seems that the objects of belief must be either sentences or propositions. The standard platonist view is that they are propositions. Before we consider their arguments for this claim, we need to say a few words about the different kinds of sentential views that one might endorse.

To begin with, we need to distinguish between sentence types and sentence tokens. To appreciate the difference, consider the following indented sentences:

Cats are cute.
Cats are cute.

We have here two different tokens of a single sentence type. Thus, a token is an actual physical thing, located at a specific place in spacetime; it is a pile of ink on a page (structured in an appropriate way), or a sound wave, or a collection of pixels on a computer screen, or something of this sort. A type, on the other hand, can be tokened numerous times but is not identical with any single token. Thus, a sentence type is an abstract object. And so if we are looking for an anti-platonist view of what ‘that’-clauses refer to, or what belief reports are about, we cannot say that they're about sentence types; we have to say they're about sentence tokens.

A second distinction that needs to be drawn here is between sentence tokens that are external, or public, and sentence tokens that are internal, or private. Examples of external sentence tokens were given in the last paragraph — piles of ink, sound waves, and so on. An internal sentence token, on the other hand, exists inside a particular person's head. There is a wide-spread view — due mainly to Jerry Fodor (1975 and 1987) but adopted by many others, e.g., Stich (1983) — that we are able to perform cognitive tasks (e.g., think, remember information, and have beliefs) only because we are capable of storing information in our heads in a neural language (often called mentalese, or the language of thought). In connection with beliefs, the idea here is that to believe that, say, snow is white, is to have a neural sentence stored in your head (in a belief way, as opposed to a desire way, or some other way) that means in mentalese that snow is white.

This gives us two different anti-platonist alternatives to the view that belief reports involve references to propositions. First, there is the conceptualistic (or mentalistic) view that belief reports involve references to sentences in our heads, or mentalese sentence tokens. And, second, there is the physicalistic view that belief reports involve references to external sentence tokens, i.e., to piles of ink, and so on (versions of this view have been endorsed by Carnap (1947), Davidson (1967), and Leeds (1979)).

There are a number of arguments that suggest that ordinary belief reports cannot be taken to be about (internal or external) sentences and that we have to take them to be about propositions. We will rehearse one such argument here, an argument that goes back at least to Church (1950). Suppose that Boris and Jerry both live in cold climates and are very familiar with snow. Thus, they both believe that snow is white. But Boris lives in Russia and speaks only Russian, whereas Jerry lives in Minnesota and speaks only English. Now, consider the following argument:

II. Boris believes that snow is white.
Jerry believes that snow is white.
Therefore, there's at least one thing that Boris and Jerry both believe, namely, that snow is white.

This argument seems clearly valid; but this seems to rule out the idea that the belief reports here are about sentence tokens. For (a) in order to account for the validity of the argument, we have to take the two ‘that’-clauses to refer to the same thing, and (b) there is no sentence token that they could both refer to. First of all, they couldn't refer to any external sentence token (or, for that matter, any sentence type associated with any natural language), because (i) if the first ‘that’-clause refers to such a sentence, it would presumably be a Russian sentence, since Boris speaks only Russian;[9] and (ii) if the second ‘that’-clause refers to such a sentence, it would presumably be an English sentence, since Jerry speaks only English; and so (iii) the two ‘that’-clauses cannot both refer to the same external sentence token (or natural-language sentence type). And second, they cannot refer to any mentalese sentence token, because (i) if the first ‘that’-clause refers to such a sentence, it would presumably be in Boris's head; and (ii) if the second ‘that’-clause refers to such a sentence, it would presumably be in Jerry's head; and so (iii) the two ‘that’-clauses cannot both refer to the same mentalese sentence token. Therefore, it seems to follow that the ‘that’-clauses in the above argument do not refer to sentence tokens of any kind. And since these are ordinary belief ascriptions, it follows that, in general, the ‘that’-clauses that appear in ordinary belief ascriptions do not refer to sentence tokens.

Now as it's formulated here, this argument doesn't rule out the view that ‘that’-clauses refer to mentalese sentence types, but the argument can be extended to rule out that view as well (e.g., one might do this by talking not of an American and a Russian but of two creatures with different internal languages of thought). I won't run through the details of this here, since, as we've seen, anti-platonists can't claim that ‘that’-clauses refer to types anyway, because types are abstract objects. But if we assume that that version of the argument is cogent as well, then it follows that ‘that’-clauses don't refer to sentences of any kind at all and, hence, that they must refer to propositions.[10]

Now, notice that the issue so far has been purely semantic. What the above argument suggests is that regardless of whether there are any such things as propositions, our ‘that’-clauses are best interpreted as purporting to refer to such objects. Platonists then claim that if this is correct, then there must be such things as propositions, because, clearly, many of our belief ascriptions are true. For instance, ‘Clinton believes that snow is white’ is true; thus, if the above analysis of ‘that’-clauses is correct, and if our criterion of ontological commitment is correct, it follows that there is such a thing as the proposition that snow is white.

This version of the singular term argument might seem even more powerful than the mathematical-object version of the singular term argument sketched in section 4.1, because in this case, it doesn't seem that there is as much room for paraphrase nominalism. We saw in section 4.1 that there are a number of programs for paraphrasing the statements of mathematics, but there are no obvious strategies for paraphrasing ordinary belief ascriptions. One might think this could be done by taking sentences of the form ‘S believes that p’ to mean ‘If there existed propositions, then S would believe that p’; but this sort of view is even less plausible here than it is in the mathematical case. It is just wildly implausible to suppose that when common folk say things like ‘Clinton believes that his presidency was successful’, they mean to be making hypothetical claims about what the person in question would believe in some alternate situation; it seems entirely obvious that when we say things like this, we mean to be making straightforward factual claims about what the people in question do believe.

However, while paraphrase nominalism seems hopeless in the case of propositions, Balaguer (1998b) has argued that fictionalistic nominalism carries over very well to the case of propositions. More specifically, fictionalists can say that ‘Clinton believes that snow is white’ is strictly speaking not true (because its ‘that’-clause is supposed to refer to a proposition, and there are no such things as propositions) but that we can still use it to say something essentially accurate about Clinton's belief state, because there are facts about Clinton that make it the case that if there existed propositions, then it would be true that he believes that snow is white.

4.3 Properties and Relations

One way to argue for a platonistic view of properties and relations is first to use the argument of section 4.2 to argue for a platonistic view of propositions, and then to claim that this argument already contains an argument for properties and relations, because properties and relations are components of propositions. If we adopt a Russellian view of propositions, this is straightforward, because it is built into the Russellian view that propositions are composed of objects, properties, and relations (see section 1). If we adopt a Fregean view of propositions, however, the situation is different. On the Fregean view, propositions are composed of senses, or meanings, or concepts. Thus, on this view, if we have good reason to countenance the existence of, e.g., the proposition that roses are red, then we also have good reason to countenance the existence of the concept red. Now, some Fregeans might want to say that the property of redness just is the concept of redness, and if so, then they could maintain with Russellians that if there exist propositions, then there also exist properties and relations. But most Fregeans would want to deny that properties are concepts, so in order to motivate a platonistic view of properties and relations, they would need an entirely different argument. And since we have already found that the One Over Many argument for properties and relations is not cogent, this other argument would presumably be a version of the singular term argument, one that was aimed specifically at establishing the existence of properties and relations.

The most obvious way to formulate an independent property-and-relation version of the singular term argument would be to appeal to sentences like

(P1) Mars possesses the property of redness

and

(R1) San Francisco stands in the north-of relation to Los Angeles.

In order to make out a version of the singular term argument here, platonists would need to begin by arguing that these sentences commit us to the existence of the property of redness and the north-of relation, respectively, because (a) they have singular terms that denote those things, and (b) they are true. In order to motivate claim (a), platonists would have to refute the paraphrase-nominalist claim that sentences like (P1) and (R1) are equivalent to sentences like ‘Mars is red’ and ‘San Francisco is north of Los Angeles’ and that none of these sentences entails the existence of properties or relations. And in order to motivate claim (b), platonists would have to refute the fictionalist view that sentences like (P1) and (R1) are untrue because they do entail the existence of properties and relations and because there are no such things as properties or relations (of course, fictionalists maintain that while (P1) and (R1) aren't literally true, they can still be used colloquially to say things that about the world that are essentially accurate — see section 3).[11]

If platonists managed to establish the existence of properties and relations in this way, they would still need to argue that such things could only be abstract objects. That is, they would have to argue that properties and relations are not ideas (as conceptualists claim) or universals inhering in physical things (as immanent realists claim).

The arguments listed above against conceptualistic or psychologistic views of numbers also tell against conceptualism about properties and relations. For instance, as Russell (1912, chapter IX) points out, property claims and relational claims seem to be objective; e.g., the fact that Mount Everest is taller than Mont Blanc is a fact that holds independently of us; but conceptualism about universals entails that if we all died, it would no longer be true that Mount Everest bears the taller than relation to Mont Blanc, because that relation would no longer exist. And, second, conceptualism seems simply to get the semantics of our property discourse wrong, for it seems to confuse properties with our ideas of them. The English sentence ‘Red is a color’ does not seem to be about anybody's idea of redness; it seems to be about redness, the actual color, which, it seems, is something objective.

There are also some very famous arguments against the immanent realist view of properties and relations. First, it is not clear that it is coherent to say that there is such a thing as redness and that this one thing exists in many different objects at the same time. Second, it is not clear what it is for an object to possess a property on the immanent realist view. Most immanent realists would not say that property possession is a full-blown relation, for this would just be another universal, and it is commonly thought that if immanent realists adopted this view, it would lead to an unacceptable infinite regress. (If we're told that an object a possesses Fness iff a stands in the possession relation to Fness, then one might ask, “What is it for an object and a property to stand in the possession relation to one another?”, and so on.) In light of this, many immanent realists maintain that when an object a possesses a property Fness, a and Fness are “linked together” in some non-relational way, e.g., a way that is more intimate, or primitive, than ordinary relational connections. But it is not clear what this really amounts to. (Immanent realists might respond that platonists also have a problem here — i.e., that platonists also have to provide an account of the relation, or “connection”, between objects and properties. But some platonists might argue that the problem isn't as bad for them because platonistic properties are causally inert, and so they are not responsible in any way for objects having the natures they have, and they do not play any important role in our explanations of why objects have the natures they have. For instance, if a is F, Fness is not responsible in any way for a having the nature that it has. Thus, platonists might claim that a is simply an example of Fness and that there is no more to their relation than that.[12] Immanent realists, however, think that ordinary physical objects are the way they are because they possess the properties they do. Thus, they seem committed to the thesis that there is some sort of physically substantial connection, or link, between objects and their properties, and it is not at all clear what this could be. There has been a lot of philosophy dedicated to this problem, but there is no consensus on how (or whether) it can be solved.)

It is worth noting that platonists who argue for properties and relations in conjunction with propositions — i.e., by first arguing for propositions and then claiming that properties and relations are components of propositions — will have an easier time arguing that properties and relations couldn't exist in our minds (as conceptualists say) or in things (as immanent realists say). In connection with conceptualism, platonists of this sort could claim that the argument given in section 4.2 for thinking that ‘that’-clauses don't refer to mentalese sentence tokens suggests that propositions (which are the referents of ‘that’-clauses) could not be made up of properties that exist in our heads. And in connection with immanent realism, platonists of this sort could argue that propositions couldn't be composed of immanent-realist properties, because people can believe propositions that are composed of properties that are not instantiated in the physical world. For instance, it seems that sentences like ‘Johnny believes that there is a four-hundred-story building in Sally's backyard’ can be true, and so according to the above platonist argument for propositions, there must be such a thing as the proposition that there is a four-hundred-story building in Sally's backyard. But if propositions have properties as components, then this proposition has as a component the property of being a four-hundred-story building. But if properties exist only in physical things, as immanent realists suggest, then there is no such thing as the property of being a four-hundred-story building, since presumably, nothing in the universe has this property. Thus, the conclusion here is that if propositions have properties as components, then the properties in question have to be transcendent, platonist properties, not immanent properties.[13]

4.4 Sentence Types

Linguistics is a branch of science that tells us things about sentences. For instance, it says things like

(A) ‘The cat is on the mat’ is a well-formed sentence of English,

and

(B) ‘Visiting relatives can be boring’ is structurally ambiguous.

The quoted sentences that appear in (A) and (B) are singular terms; e.g., “‘The cat is on the mat’” refers to the sentence ‘The cat is on the mat’, and (A) says of this sentence that it has a certain property, namely, that of being a well-formed English sentence. Thus, if sentences like (A) are true — and it certainly seems that they are — then they commit us to believing in the existence of sentences. Now, one might hold a physicalistic view here according to which linguistics is about actual (external) sentence tokens, e.g., piles of ink and verbal sound waves. (This view was popular in the early part of the 20th century — see, e.g., Bloomfield (1933), Harris (1954), and Quine (1953).) Or alternatively, one might hold a conceptualistic view, maintaining that linguistics is essentially a branch of psychology; the main proponent of this view is Noam Chomsky (1965, chapter 1), who thinks of a grammar for a natural language as being about an ideal speaker-hearer's knowledge of the given language, but see also Sapir (1921), Stich (1972), and Fodor (1981). But there are reasons for thinking that neither the physicalist nor the conceptualist approach is tenable and that the only plausible way to interpret linguistic theory is as being about sentence types, which of course, are abstract objects (proponents of the platonistic view include Katz (1981), Soames (1985), and Langendoen and Postal (1985)). Katz constructs arguments here that are very similar to the ones we considered above, in connection with mathematical objects (section 4.1). One argument here is that linguistic theory seems to have consequences that are (a) true and (b) about sentences that have never been tokened (internally or externally), e.g., sentences like ‘Green Elvises slithered unwittingly toward Arizona's favorite toaster’. (Of course, now that I've written this sentence down, it has been tokened, but it seems likely that before I wrote it down, it had never been tokened.) Standard linguistic theory entails that many sentences that have never been tokened (internally or externally) are well-formed English sentences. Thus, if we want to claim that our linguistic theories are true, then we have to accept these consequences, or theorems, of linguistic theory. But these theorems are clearly not true of any sentence tokens (because the sentences in question have never been tokened) and so, it is argued, they must be true of sentence types.

4.5 Possible Worlds

It is a very widely held view among contemporary philosophers that we need to appeal to entities known as possible worlds in order to account for various phenomena. There are dozens of phenomena that philosophers have thought should be explained in terms of possible worlds, but to name just one, it is often argued that semantic theory is best carried out in terms of possible worlds. Consider, for example, the attempt to state the truth conditions of sentences of the form ‘It is necessary that S’ and ‘It is possible that S’ (where S is any sentence). It is widely believed that the best theory here is that a sentence of the form ‘It is necessary that S’ is true if and only if S is true in all possible worlds, and a sentence of the form ‘It is possible that S’ is true if and only if S is true in at least one possible world. Now, if we add to this theory the premise that at least one sentence of the form ‘It is possible that S’ is true — and this seems undeniable — then we are led to the result that possible worlds exist.

Now, as was the case with numbers, properties, and sentences, not everyone who endorses possible worlds thinks that they are abstract objects; indeed, one leading proponent of the use of possible worlds in philosophy and semantics — namely, David Lewis (1986) — maintains that possible worlds are of the same kind as the actual world, and so he takes them to be concrete objects. However, most philosophers who endorse possible worlds take them to be abstract objects (see, e.g., Plantinga (1974, 1976), Adams (1974), Chisholm (1976), and Pollock (1984)). It is important to note, however, that possible worlds are very often not taken to constitute a new kind of abstract object. For instance, it is very popular to maintain that a possible world is just a set of propositions. (To see how a set of propositions could serve as a possible world, notice that if you believed in full-blown possible worlds — worlds that are just like the actual world in kind — then you would say that corresponding to each of these worlds, there is a set of propositions that completely and accurately describes the given world, or is true of that world. Many philosophers who don't believe in full-blown possible worlds maintain that these sets of propositions are good enough — i.e., that we can take them to be possible worlds.) Or alternatively, one might think of a possible world as a state of affairs, or as a way things could be. In so doing, one might think of these as constituting a new kind of abstract object, or one might think of them as properties — giant, complex properties that the entire universe may or may not possess. For instance, one might say that the actual universe possesses the property of being such that snow is white and grass is green and San Francisco is north of Los Angeles, and so on.

In any event, if possible worlds are indeed abstract objects, and if the above argument for the existence of possible worlds is cogent, then this would give us another argument for platonism.

4.6 Logical Objects

Frege (1884, 1893-1903) appealed to sentences like the following:

(D) The number of Fs is identical to the number of Gs if and only if there is a one-to-one correspondence between the Fs and the Gs.

(E) The direction of line a is identical to the direction of line b if and only if a is parallel to b.

(F) The shape of figure a is identical to the shape of figure b if and only if a is geometrically similar to b.

On Frege's view, principles like these are true, and so they commit us to the existence of numbers, lines, and shapes. Now, of course, we have already gone through a platonistic argument — indeed, a Fregean argument — for the existence of numbers. Moreover, the standard platonist view is that the argument for the existence of mathematical objects is entirely general, covering all branches of mathematics, including geometry, so that on this view, we already have reason to believe in lines and shapes, as well as numbers. But it is worth noting that in contrast to most contemporary platonists, Frege thought of numbers, lines, and shapes as logical objects, because on this view, these things can be identified with extensions of concepts. What is the extension of a concept? Well, simplifying a bit, it is just the set of things falling under the given concept. Thus, for instance, the extension of the concept white is just the set of white things.[14] And so the idea here is that since logic is centrally concerned with predicates and their corresponding concepts, and since extensions are tied to concepts, we can think of extensions as logical objects. Thus, since Frege thinks that numbers, lines, and shapes can be identified with extensions, on his view, we can think of these things as logical objects.

Frege's definitions of numbers, lines, and shapes in terms of extensions can be formulated as follows: (i) the number of Fs is the extension of the concept equinumerous with F (that is, it is the set of all concepts that have exactly as many objects falling under them as does F); and (ii) the direction of line a is the extension of the concept parallel to a; and (iii) the shape of figure a is the extension of the concept geometrically similar to a. A similar approach can be used to define other kinds of logical objects. For instance, the truth value of the proposition p can be identified with the extension of the concept equivalent to p (i.e., the concept true if and only if p is true).

For contemporary work on this issue, see, e.g., Wright (1983), Boolos (1986-87), and Anderson and Zalta (2004).

4.7 Fictional Objects

Finally, a number of philosophers (see, most notably, van Inwagen (1977), Zalta (1983, 1988), Salmon (1998), and Thomasson (1999)) think that fictional objects, or fictional characters, are best thought of as abstract objects. To see why one might be drawn to this view, consider the following sentence:

(G) Sherlock Holmes is a detective.

Now, if this sentence actually appeared in one of the Holmes stories by Arthur Conan Doyle, then that token of it would not be true — it would be a bit of fiction. But if you were telling a child about these stories, and the child asked, “What does Holmes do for a living?”, and you answered by uttering (G), then it seems plausible to suppose that what you have said is true. But if it is true, then it seems that its singular term, ‘Sherlock Holmes’, must refer to something. What it refers to, according to the view in question, is an abstract object, in particular, a fictional character. In short, present-day utterances of (G) are true statements about a fictional character; but if Doyle had put (G) into one his stories, it would not have been true, and its singular term would not have referred to anything.

There is a worry about this view that can be put in the following way: if there is such a thing as Sherlock Holmes, then it has arms and legs; but if Sherlock Holmes is an abstract object, as this view supposes, then it does not have arms and legs (because abstract objects are non-physical); therefore, it cannot be the case that Sherlock Holmes exists and is an abstract object, for this leads to contradiction. Various solutions to this problem have been proposed. For instance, Zalta argues that in addition to exemplifying certain properties, abstract objects also encode properties. The fictional character Sherlock Holmes encodes the properties of being a detective, being male, being English, having arms and legs, and so on. But it does not exemplify any of these properties. It exemplifies the properties of being abstract, being a fictional character, having been thought of first by Arthur Conan Doyle, and so on. Zalta maintains that in English, the copula ‘is’ — as in ‘a is F’ — is ambiguous; it can be read as ascribing either property exemplification or property encoding. When we say ‘Sherlock Holmes is a detective’, we are saying that Holmes encodes the property of being a detective; and when we say ‘Sherlock Holmes is a fictional character’, we are saying that Holmes exemplifies the property of being a fictional character. (It should be noted that Zalta employs the device of encoding with respect to all abstract objects — mathematical objects, logical objects, and so on — not just fictional objects. Also, Zalta points out that his theory of encoding is based on a similar theory developed by Ernst Mally (1912).)

Those who endorse a platonistic view of fictional objects maintain that there is no good paraphrase of sentences like (G), but one might question this. For instance, one might maintain that (G) can be paraphrased by a sentence like this:

‘Sherlock Holmes is a detective’ is true-in-the-Holmes-stories.

If we read (G) in this way, then it is not be about Sherlock Holmes at all; rather, it is about the Sherlock Holmes stories. Thus, in order to believe (G), so interpreted, one would have to believe in the existence of these stories. Now, one might try to take an anti-platonistic view of the nature of stories, but there are problems with such views, and so we might end up with a platonistic view here anyway — a view that takes sentences like (G) to be about stories and stories to be abstract objects of some sort, e.g., ordered sets of propositions.[15] Which of these platonistic views is superior can be settled by determining which (if either) captures the correct interpretation of sentences like (G) — i.e., by determining whether ordinary people who utter sentences like (G) are best interpreted as talking about stories or fictional characters.

5. The Epistemological Argument Against Platonism

Over the years, anti-platonist philosophers have presented a number of arguments against platonism. One of these arguments stands out as the strongest, namely, the epistemological argument. This argument goes all the way back to Plato, but it has received renewed interest since 1973, when Paul Benacerraf presented a version of the argument. Most of the work on this problem has taken place in the philosophy of mathematics, in connection with the platonistic view of mathematical objects like numbers. We will therefore discuss the argument in this context, but all of the issues and arguments can be reproduced in connection with other kinds of abstract objects. The argument can be put in the following way:

  1. Human beings exist entirely within spacetime.
  2. If there exist any abstract mathematical objects, then they do not exist in spacetime. Therefore, it seems very plausible that:
  3. If there exist any abstract mathematical objects, then human beings could not attain knowledge of them. Therefore,
  4. If mathematical platonism is correct, then human beings could not attain mathematical knowledge.
  5. Human beings have mathematical knowledge. Therefore,
  6. Mathematical platonism is not correct.

The argument for (3) is everything here. If it can be established, then so can (6), because (3) trivially entails (4), (5) is beyond doubt, and (4) and (5) trivially entail (6). Now, (1) and (2) do not strictly entail (3), and so there is room for platonists to maneuver here — and as we'll see, this is precisely how most platonists have responded. However, it is important to notice that (1) and (2) provide a strong prima facie motivation for (3), because they seem to imply that mathematical objects (if there are such things) are totally inaccessible to us, i.e., that information cannot pass from mathematical objects to human beings. But this gives rise to a prima facie worry (which may or may not be answerable) about whether human beings could acquire knowledge of mathematical objects. Thus, we should think of this argument not as refuting platonism but as issuing a challenge to platonists. The challenge is simply to explain how human beings could acquire knowledge of abstract mathematical objects.

There are three ways for platonists to respond. First, they can argue that (1) is false and that the human mind is capable of somehow forging contact with abstract mathematical objects and thereby acquiring information about such objects. This strategy has been pursued by Plato in The Meno and The Phaedo, and by Gödel (1964). Plato's idea is that our immaterial souls acquired knowledge of abstract objects before we were born and that mathematical learning is really just a process of coming to remember what we knew before we were born. On Gödel's version of the view, we acquire knowledge of abstract objects in much the same way that we acquire knowledge of concrete physical objects; more specifically, just as we acquire information about physical objects via the faculty of sense perception, so we acquire information about abstract objects by means of a faculty of mathematical intuition. Now, other philosophers have endorsed the idea that we possess a faculty of mathematical intuition, but Gödel's version of this view — and he seems to be alone in this — involves the idea that the mind is non-physical in some sense and that we are capable of forging contact with, and acquiring information from, non-physical mathematical objects.[16] This view has been almost universally rejected. One problem is that denying (1) doesn't seem to help. The idea of an immaterial mind receiving information from an abstract object seems just as mysterious and confused as the idea of a physical brain receiving information from an abstract object.

The second strategy that platonists can pursue in responding to the epistemological argument is to argue that (2) is false and that human beings can acquire information about mathematical objects via normal perceptual means. The early Maddy (1990) pursued this idea in connection with set theory, claiming that sets of physical objects can be taken to exist in spacetime and, hence, that we can perceive them. For instance, on her view, if there are two books on a table, then the set containing these books exists on the table, in the same place that the books exist, and we can see the set and acquire information about it in this way. This view has been subjected to much criticism, including arguments from the later Maddy (1997). Others to attack the view include Lavine (1992), Dieterle and Shapiro (1993), Balaguer (1998a), Milne (1994), Riskin (1994), and Carson (1996).

It may be objected that according to the definitions we've been using, views like Maddy's are not versions of platonism at all, because they do not take mathematical objects to exist outside of spacetime. Nonetheless, there is some rationale for thinking of Maddy's view as a sort of non-traditional platonism. For since Maddy's view entails that there is an infinity of sets associated with every ordinary physical object, all sharing the same spatiotemporal location and the same physical matter, she has to allow that these sets differ from one another in some sort of non-physical way and, hence, that there is something about these sets that is non-physical, or perhaps abstract, in some sense of these terms. Now, of course, the question of whether Maddy's view counts as a version of platonism is purely terminological; but whatever we say about this, the view is still worth considering in the present context, because it is widely thought of as one of the available responses to the epistemological argument against platonism, and indeed, that is the spirit in which Maddy originally presented the view.

The third and final strategy that platonists can pursue is to accept (1) and (2) and explain why (3) is nonetheless false. This strategy is different from the first two in that it doesn't involve the postulation of an information-transferring contact between human beings and abstract objects. The idea here is to grant that human beings do not have such contact with abstract objects and to explain how they can nonetheless acquire knowledge of such objects. This has been the most popular strategy among contemporary platonists. Its advocates include Quine (1951, section 6), Steiner (1975, chapter 4), Parsons (1980, 1994), Katz (1981, 1998), Resnik (1982, 1997), Wright (1983), Lewis (1986, section 2.4), Hale (1987), Shapiro (1989, 1997), Burgess (1990), Balaguer (1995, 1998a), Linsky and Zalta (1995), and Linnebo (2006). There are several different versions of this view; we will look very briefly at the most prominent of them.

One version of the third strategy, implicit in the writings of Quine (1951, section 6) and developed by Steiner (1975, chapter four, especially section IV) and Resnik (1997, chapter 7), is to argue that we have good reason to believe that our mathematical theories are true, even though we don't have any contact with mathematical objects, because (a) these theories are embedded in our empirical theories, and (b) these empirical theories (including their mathematical parts) have been confirmed by empirical evidence, and so (c) we have empirical evidence for believing that our mathematical theories are true and, hence, that abstract mathematical objects exist. Notice that this view involves the controversial thesis that confirmation is holistic, i.e., that entire theories are confirmed by pieces of evidence that seem to confirm only parts of theories. One might doubt that confirmation is holistic in this way (see, e.g., Sober (1993), Maddy (1992), and Balaguer (1998a)). Moreover, even if one grants that confirmation is holistic, one might worry that this view leaves unexplained the fact that mathematicians are capable of acquiring knowledge of their theories before these theories are applied in empirical science.

A second version of the third strategy, developed by Katz (1981, 1998) and Lewis (1986, section 2.4), is to argue that we can know that our mathematical theories are true, without any sort of information-transferring contact with mathematical objects, because these theories are necessarily true. The reason we need information-transferring contact with ordinary physical objects in order to know what they're like is that these objects could have been different. For instance, we have to look at fire engines in order to know that they're red, because they could have been blue. But we don't need any contact with the number 4 in order to know that it is the sum of 3 and 1, because it is necessarily the sum of 3 and 1. (For criticisms of this view, see Field (1989, pp. 233-38) and Balaguer (1998a, chapter 2, section 6.4).)

A third version of the third strategy has been developed by Resnik (1997) and Shapiro (1997). Both of these philosophers endorse (platonistic) structuralism, a view that holds that our mathematical theories provide true descriptions of mathematical structures, which, according to this view, are abstract. Moreover, Resnik and Shapiro both claim that human beings can acquire knowledge of mathematical structures (without coming into any sort of information-transferring contact with such things) by simply constructing mathematical axiom systems; for, they argue, axiom systems provide implicit definitions of structures. One problem with this view, however, is that it does not explain how we could know which of the various axiom systems that we might formulate actually pick out structures that exist in the mathematical realm.

A fourth and final version of the third strategy, developed independently (and somewhat differently) by Balaguer (1995, 1998a) and Linsky & Zalta (1995), is based on the adoption of a particular version of platonism called plenitudinous platonism (Balaguer also calls it full-blooded platonism, or FBP, and Linsky and Zalta call it principled platonism). Balaguer defines plenitudinous platonism (somewhat roughly) as the view that there exist mathematical objects of all possible kinds, or the view that all the mathematical objects that possibly could exist actually do exist. But, in general, Balaguer would define a different plenitude principle for every different kind of abstract object. Linsky & Zalta develop plenitudinous platonism by proposing a distinctive plenitude principle for each of three basic domains of abstracta: abstract individuals, relations (properties and propositions), and contingently nonconcrete individuals (1995, 554). For example, on their view, the plenitude principle for abstract individuals asserts (again, somewhat roughly) that every possible description of an object characterizes an abstract object that encodes — and, thus, in an important sense, has — the properties expressed in the description.

Balaguer and Linsky & Zalta then argue that if platonists endorse plenitudinous platonism, they can solve the epistemological problem with platonism without positing any sort of information-transferring contact between human beings and abstract objects. Balaguer's version of the argument proceeds as follows. Since plenitudinous platonism, or FBP, says that there are mathematical objects of all possible kinds, it follows that if FBP is true, then every purely mathematical theory that could possibly be true (i.e., that's internally consistent) accurately describes some collection of actually existing mathematical objects. Thus, it follows from FBP that in order to attain knowledge of abstract mathematical objects, all we have to do is come up with an internally consistent purely mathematical theory (and know that it is consistent). But it seems clear that (i) we humans are capable of formulating internally consistent mathematical theories (and of knowing that they are internally consistent), and (ii) being able to do this does not require us to have any sort of information-transferring contact with the abstract objects that the theories in question are about. Thus, if this is right, then the epistemological problem with platonism has been solved.

One might object here that in order for humans to acquire knowledge of abstract objects in this way, they would first need to know that plenitudinous platonism is true. Linsky & Zalta respond to this by arguing that plenitudinous platonism (or in their lingo, principled platonism) is knowable a priori because it is required for our understanding of any possible scientific theory: it alone is capable of accounting for the mathematics that could be used in empirical science no matter what the physical world was like. Balaguer's response, on the other hand, is based on the claim that to demand that platonists explain how humans could know that FBP is true is exactly analogous to demanding that external-world realists (i.e., those who believe that there is a real physical world, existing independently of us and our thinking) explain how human beings could know that there is an external world of a kind that gives rise to accurate sense perceptions. Thus, Balaguer argues that while there may be some sort of Cartesian-style skeptical argument against FBP here (analogous to skeptical arguments against external-world realism), the argument in (1)–(6) is supposed to be a different kind of argument, and in order to respond to that argument, FBP-ists do not have to explain how humans could know that FBP is true.

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