Pietro Pomponazzi

First published Thu Dec 16, 2004; substantive revision Tue Dec 18, 2012

As an author of both commentaries and original philosophical treatises, Pietro Pomponazzi (1462–1525) was a key figure in the Aristotelian tradition of the first quarter of the 16th century. Soon at odds with Averroist and Thomist interpretations, he tried to establish Aristotle's original thought on a number of issues. Though his outlook was fundamentally Peripatetic, this did not prevent him from criticizing Aristotle's views, when necessary, or from drawing on Neoplatonic and Stoic assumptions. His spirit of intellectual independence and his dissatisfaction with conventional interpretations often led him to adopt a skeptical tone, which played a large part in his teaching style. Pomponazzi's main philosophical contributions were: (i) a reassessment of the “mortalist” interpretation of Aristotelian psychology; (ii) a radical critique of what are commonly thought of as miracles, which he instead explained in terms of a concatenation of natural causes; (iii) an interpretation of religions as pedagogical instruments whose rise and fall is determined by God through heavenly cycles as a means of educating the masses; (iv) an attempt at grounding free will outside the deterministic framework of traditional philosophical systems.

1. Life and main works

Pietro Pomponazzi (Petrus Pomponatius, often called Peretto or Perettus, “little Peter”, on account of his short stature) was born in Mantua in 1462 and studied “Artes” (i.e., the philosophical disciplines) at the University of Padua under Francesco Securo da Nardò, Pietro Trapolino and Nicoletto Vernia. Pomponazzi himself taught at Padua from 1488 to 1496, in the final year receiving a doctorate in medicine and writing the treatise De maximo et minimo (“On Maxima and Minima”), a polemical discussion of William Heytesbury's theories. He then spent three years teaching logic at the court of Alberto Pio, prince of Carpi, who was in exile at Ferrara (1496–1499); this was followed by another period of teaching at Padua (1499–1509). After briefly holding a post at the University of Ferrara, Pomponazzi was appointed professor at Bologna in 1511, remaining there until his death in 1525. It was at Bologna that he wrote his major works, including the Tractatus de immortalitate animae, De nutritione, De fato and De incantationibus, as well as commentaries on Aristotle, most of which are preserved in notes or reportationes, i.e., notes taken down by his students (for a list of these works, see Nardi 1965, 54–103 and Lohr). His Tractatus de immortalitate animae (“Treatise on the Immortality of the Soul”, 1516), in which he argues that the soul's immortality cannot be rationally demonstrated, provoked something of a scandal: his ideas were attacked by several polemicists, the book was publicly burned in Venice, and it was only the support of Cardinal Pietro Bembo that enabled Pomponazzi to avoid the charge of heresy and the extreme penalties which it entailed. Nevertheless, he was forced to defend his views, which he did in the Apologia (1518) and the Defensorium adversus Augustinum Niphum (1519), a reply to De immortalitate libellus, written against him by Agostino Nifo (on the immortality debate, see Gilson 1961; Pine 1986, 124–234; Kessler 1988, 504–507). These controversies induced him not to publish two other works which he completed in 1520: De naturalium effectuum causis sive de incantationibus (“On the Causes of Natural Effects or On Incantations”) and the Libri quinque de fato, de libero arbitrio et de praedestinatione (“Five Books on Fate, Free Will and Predestination”); the two treatises were published posthumously in 1556 and 1557 at Basle by Guglielmo Grataroli, who slightly modified them. The final work printed in his lifetime was De nutritione et augmentatione (“On Nutrition and Growth” 1521), witnessing a shift of interest on his part towards “theoretical biology” (see Zanier 1992), further developed in his last Aristotelian courses, on De partibus animalium, 1521–24 (see Perfetti 2000; Pomponazzi 2004), and De sensu, 1524–25 (see Graiff 1979).

2. The immortality of the soul

The doctrine of the immortality of the human soul and of its continued existence independently from the body has a long tradition in philosophy. It can be traced back to Pythagorean speculation and was embraced by every form of Platonism, pagan and Christian, culminating in Marsilio Ficino's pia philosophia (“pious philosophy”), which he expounded in his Theologia platonica de immortalitate animorum (“Platonic Theology of the Immortality of Souls”, 1474). But the question was by no means uncontroversial; and Peripatetic theories, which had circulated widely in universities since the 13th century, went in quite different directions. For instance, the “rediscovery” of Aristotle's De anima had led scholastic thinkers to wonder whether the Aristotelian doctrine of the soul as the “form of the body” could be reconciled with Platonic assumptions. Furthermore, the Averroist doctrine of one single “possible intellect” for the whole of humankind (another theory widely discussed in universities) challenged the Christian belief in individual immortality. To neutralize the risk that these philosophical positions would lead to heterodox beliefs, a decree of the Fifth Lateran Council (Apostolici regiminis, 1513) had made the immortality of the soul a dogma of the Church and had commanded all university professors of philosophy, when lecturing on doctrines that deviated from it, to make every effort to teach the truth of the Christian religion and to refute any philosophical arguments that challenged it.

The fundamental presupposition of every theory of immortality is that the soul can exist separately from the body, which is itself undoubtedly mortal. In his most famous work, The Treatise on the Immortality of the Soul (1516), Pomponazzi instead maintains that, from an Aristotelian viewpoint, our soul is mortal in so far as it is inseparable from the body. He adopts the strategy of showing that the human soul can never performs its activities—including the highest ones involving the intellect—without bodily assistance; so, in order to preserve the unity of the individual, the separate existence of the soul cannot be maintained. After a critical examination aimed at rejecting the views of Plato, Averroes and Thomas Aquinas (chapters 3–8), Pomponazzi endorses a “mortalist” solution to the problem, which at least in part revived the thesis of the animal nature and thus the mortality of the human soul, a theory which had been put forward by Alexander of Aphrodisias, one of the most important late ancient Greek interpreters of Aristotle (2nd-3rd century AD). Pomponazzi starts from Aristotle's dictum that “if knowing is imagination or not without imagination, the soul cannot be separated” (De anima, I. 1, 403a8–9). Certainly, thought does not depend on the body as its material or instrumental substrate, in other words, as subject. Nonetheless, thought receives from the body representational objects, that is, images or phantasmata (and here Pomponazzi refers to the Aristotelian doctrine that intelligibles are abstracted from the mental images in the fantasía or imagination which, in turn, derive from sense impressions). Therefore, thought cannot continue to exist without the assistance of the body “as object” (dependet a corpore ut obiecto), precisely because intelligibles come to be known by our soul through images received by the senses. Modern critics have noted that, notwithstanding the dictum from De anima which Pomponazzi invokes as his starting-point, his conclusion is not perfectly Aristotelian; for elsewhere Aristotle clearly maintains that not all knowledge is ultimately derived from sense impressions and that the intellect can also directly grasp forms and first principles, which are self-evident (see Kristeller 1983, 14–15; Mojsisch 1990, xix–xx).

Pomponazzi then observes that in the ladder of beings man holds an intermediate position: though not completely immersed in the body, like animals, he nevertheless does not enjoy the condition of the Intelligences, or immaterial forms, which have no need of the body either as substrate or as object of representation. Human knowledge can extend to the level of the universal, but only imperfectly, abstracting it from individual instances by means of discursive operations. As Pomponazzi puts it: “in us intellect and will are not truly immaterial but relatively and to a slight extent (secundum quid et deminute)”, so that our “soul is essentially and truly mortal” and only “relatively immortal”, by virtue of its imperfect participation in an activity which, properly speaking, is performed only by the Intelligences. Thus, even an analysis of the highest human faculty—intellectual knowledge—reveals our inability to escape from our material condition. For this reason, philosophical arguments necessarily lead to the conclusion that, since our soul is never devoid of materiality, it must be mortal.

Such a philosophical conclusion obviously raises serious challenges at the anthropological, moral and religious level. With regard to these issues, Pomponazzi adopts an ambivalent strategy. In chapter 14, the next to last in the treatise, he explores some of the radical consequences which arise from the thesis of the mortality of the human soul. The major objection to this thesis is that the prospect of eternal punishments and rewards would vanish, so that we would lose the main incentives to morality. This might be true, admits Pomponazzi, since coarse and uncouth individuals, prone to evil (who are in the majority), cannot be driven towards virtuous actions except by the hope of eternal rewards and the fear of eternal punishments. It is for them that the founders of religions have “decreed that the soul is immortal, not caring for truth but only for righteousness, to lead men to virtue.” Even the fact that all religions hold the soul to be immortal can be explained in terms of the need to educate the masses. Those who truly live according to philosophy, however, have a different attitude: they fulfill the potentiality of their own natures entirely within the present life and understand that virtue is its own reward and vice is its own punishment (a claim with a decidedly Stoic flavor).

In the fifteenth and final chapter, Pomponazzi takes the surprising tack of stating that the philosophical conclusions which he has developed and explored throughout the treatise are merely probable, in contrast to the certain truth taught by Church doctrine, which maintains that the human soul is immortal. So, having deliberately limited himself at the outset of the treatise to tackling his theme philosophically, “leaving aside revelation and miracles, and remaining entirely within natural limits,” Pomponazzi, in the final chapter, suddenly approaches it from a religious standpoint. First, he declares that the immortality of the soul is “a neutral problem,” which cannot be decisively demonstrated one way or the other. Then, he says that knowledge of the truth in this matter is a necessary guide for our actions. Finally, he concludes that the immortality of the soul is an article of faith and, therefore, the proper means of demonstrating it is through revealed theology. Hence, “not knowing whether the soul is immortal or not,” it is better to follow the path of Christian faith. Scholars have long questioned whether these statements represent Pomponazzi's sincere convictions, or if they should instead be seen as an opportunistic shift towards religious conformism (see the discussion in Perrone Compagni 1999, lxxxv–xcvi). It is certainly indisputable that in the previous chapters Pomponazzi was not at all shy about challenging widely held theories of immortality or about presenting a critique of religious beliefs which reduced them to instruments of social control (a subject which he would develop further in On Incantations; see § 3 below). If we consider his overall strategy, it seems that Pomponazzi was drawing on the distinction between methods of science and methods of faith, by means of which 13th-century secular masters of philosophy at the University of Paris such as Boethius of Dacia had claimed the freedom to pursue their philosophical enquiries without theological constraints.

3. The hidden causes of “miracles”

In his treatise On Incantations, completed in 1520, Pomponazzi carries out a systematic critique, on naturalistic grounds, of widely held beliefs concerning miracles, charms, oracles, demonic possession, and magical operations. Believing certain events to be miraculous entails that such suspensions of the normal order of things are caused by incorporeal entities (angels or demons) acting on corporeal ones. Pomponazzi first attacks the root of this presupposition by showing that the existence of demons is not rationally demonstrable and that, in any case, it would not explain miraculous events. It is not rationally demonstrable because, from a strictly Aristotelian viewpoint, an immaterial being cannot directly act on a corporeal one—in his view, the motions of heavenly bodies acted as intermediaries between eternal beings and those which were generated and perishable. Moreover, if an incorporeal being were to act directly on a corporeal one, it too would be changed (by becoming a cause or a moved mover), which is unthinkable given the unchangeable nature of incorporeal entities.

In the economy of the Aristotelian system, according to Pomponazzi, God and the Intelligences are sufficient to explain sublunary processes and heavenly motions. Many extraordinary events (which uneducated people, out of ignorance of their true—but not immediately evident—causes, believe to be miracles) can be explained in terms of natural causality, whether astral influences, the hidden powers of earthly beings or the collective imagination. Referring to contemporary chronicles, Pomponazzi recalls events which many considered to be miraculous, such as a group prayers driving away clouds or entire communities persuaded that they had seen saints appear in the sky. In such cases, he explains, it is not necessary to assume the intervention of supernatural entities interfering with the ordinary system of cosmic causality. The disappearance of clouds or the apparition of saints are to be explained instead by the physical influence which a crowd at prayer exerts on vapors in the atmosphere or by species in the sky.

Pomponazzi also developed corollaries to his rational critique of religion in On Incantations. He did so by applying to religions the general framework, laid out in the treatise, of a heavenly causality whose effects extended to sublunary events, making it responsible for the historical succession of different religious systems. The appearance of each new religion, accompanied by miraculous events, and the rise of prophets and lawgivers, was merely the natural effect of astral cycles, set in motion by God and the Intelligences through the agency of the heavenly bodies—miraculous events and exceptional men were needed in order to persuade the masses to abandon their old beliefs and customs. Cosmic causality also ruled the trajectory of each religion. Hence, “religious laws” follow a process of “birth, growth, stasis and decay,” just like other beings which are “of long duration” and “soulless”, such as “rivers, seas, cities.” It is precisely because of this long duration that their physical explanations are not perceived by the ignorant multitude, who regard them as miracles. Thus, “in our religion too everything cools down, miracles decay, except those artfully counterfeited,” a sign that “its end is near” (see Bertozzi 1996, 40–44).

4. Fate and human freedom

In the writings considered so far we have seen that the moral autonomy of the wise man, expressing itself in his free exercise of virtue, is the trait which distinguishes him from the masses who are subject to external laws of conduct. In his treatise On Fate, completed in 1520—the most complex of Pomponazzi's works—he considers whether the human will can be free, faced with the conflicting points of view of philosophical determinism and Christian theology. The intricate structure of this treatise, which intermingles doxography, interpretation and speculation, makes it difficult to establish which views Pomponazzi himself actually held (as can be seen from the differing accounts of this work which have been advanced by scholars: see Ingegno; Scribano; Pine 1986, 275–343; 1999; Poppi 1988; Ramberti). Broadly speaking, the treatise is structured as follows. In the first part (books I–II), he investigates, on the level of philosophy, the compatibility between the divine government of the world and human free will, specifically in light of the contrast between the position defended by Alexander of Aphrodisias in his De fato (On Fate), that the human will is able to choose between two equally possible alternatives, and the deterministic Stoic theories which Alexander criticizes in his treatise. Pomponazzi ends up by submitting free will to the determinism of natural laws. In the second part (books III–V) he moves on to a theological plane, searching for a way to reconcile the indeterminacy of human freedom and the immutability of divine foreknowledge.

The main precondition of human liberum arbitrium (“free will” or, more accurately, “free choice”) is the contingency of the sublunary world, that is, the possibility that events of undetermined outcome may occur, so that our will is able to choose freely between two equally possible alternatives (as Alexander claimed in his On Fate). Pomponazzi, who was opposed to this view and who leant toward a more Stoic position, points out that, if we draw the ultimate consequences from Aristotle's worldview, there appears to be a unified order of causes and effects in the universe, descending from God, who is the Unmoved Mover and First Cause. If we accept this picture of a concatenation of causes and effects throughout the universe, we are forced to rethink the role of chance and contingency. Although certain events appear contingent to us, this is merely because we are unaware of the causes which determine them. In other words, we describe as “contingent” events which sometimes happen and sometimes do not. Yet, when they do happen, they do so necessarily. To assert our free will would imply an exception to the necessary character of divine providence: freedom of choice clashes with the universal government exercised by the First Mover, a cause which is always identical to itself and whose effects are determined. Taking all its consequences into account, the philosophical system of the world seems to eliminate the indeterminacy required for us to be genuinely free, in our ethical deliberations, to choose between equally possible courses. Thus, our will is not a self-initiating principle, but rather a cause moved by a series of superior causes (of which we are at least partly unaware). Consequently, virtues and vices, along with the praise and blame which accompany them, are reduced to natural events, inscribed within the providential order of fate.

Having undermined the possibility of a philosophical foundation for human freedom, Pomponazzi now searches for a theological foundation. He does this by analyzing the theories of previous thinkers, including Boethius, Thomas Aquinas and Duns Scotus, devoting many pages to detailed discussions of the scholastic doctrines of freedom, the will and the intellect (III, 1–10), the relationship between human freedom and divine providence (III,11–IV), and predestination (V) (see Pine 1973; 1986, 322–343; 1999; Scribano; Poppi 1988, 658–660; Ramberti, 75–84). Among the many issues discussed in these lengthy books, two positions, which seem (at least provisionally) to have been endorsed by Pomponazzi, deserve to be highlighted. In the third book he maintains that, even though the intellect deliberates about the objects of volition and represents them to the will, it is the will which has the ultimate power to suspend an act of volition, i.e., not to want a particular object. Such a suspension apparently grants to the will a sort of negative freedom, which seems to escape the universal chain of necessity. In the fourth book Pomponazzi tries to reconcile the indeterminacy demanded by free will with God's omniscience and omnipotence by drawing subtle distinctions, involving self-limitations on the part of God. Regarding divine omniscience (and, consequently, divine foreknowledge), he states that, according to several theologians, God foresees the future both as a completely actualized present and as a yet to be determined future. This second mode of foreknowledge, mirroring the nature of time, seems to leave some space for human freedom. Even in the exercise of his omnipotence, God, in order to preserve the specific character of time, predetermines the future as undetermined and contingent; hence, there is a possibility of human freedom.

Despite these views, Pomponazzi's theological discussions in books III–V do not provide a valid escape route from the philosophically based determinism expounded in the first two books. It has been suggested that his real aim was to show how weak the premises of Christian faith were, in order to establish a theodicy compatible with human freedom (Scribano, 65–69). And, indeed, in the epilogue, Pomponazzi maintains that the Stoic doctrine of fate and freedom is “less contradictory,” since, according to it, all human souls are mortal and both good and evil are present in nature and in human affairs for the sake of a cosmic harmony (“pro decore universi”) which remains completely within the limits of physical reality and is ruled by divine fate (the Stoic God is the immanent principle of order in the universe, while the Christian God, though transcendent, good, merciful and all-powerful, is inexplicably unwilling to prevent evil and wrongdoing). The final page of the treatise, however, echoes the conclusion of his Treatise on the Immortality of the Soul; for Pomponazzi admits that all philosophical demonstrations are provisional and liable to be mistaken in light of the truth taught by the Church, which condemns the Stoic doctrine on fate.

Modern scholars have taken different views of this treatise. Some have argued that the deterministic stance of books I–II represents Pomponazzi's own position, which was intended to discredit Christian doctrine (Di Napoli 1973; Poppi 1988). Others have stressed its inconclusive and aporetic character, describing it as a dramatic and irreconcilable confrontation between the Stoic and the Christian universe, between deterministic naturalism and human freedom (Pine 1986, 340–343), or noting its “failure to provide a theory of freedom, since all the traditional philosophical solutions had been undermined in the first part, while the truth of faith had lost its traditional philosophical and theological supports” (Ingegno 1977, 54). It has also been suggested that a more unified reading of the work indicates that Pomponazzi was trying to elaborate a new form of determinism, modifying Aristotelian naturalism by giving it Stoic inflections and by borrowing elements from Averroism and from the Neoplatonism of Pseudo-Dionysius the Areopagite (Ramberti, 78–80). According to this interpretation, if God limits himself by creating both a contingent future and a human faculty of acting in accordance with universal necessity (or of not acting at all), this amounts to a sort of freedom, since we can decide whether or not to attune our practical activities to the Intellect which reflects the order of reality (Ramberti, 80–81). It has to be said that Pomponazzi does not entirely succeed in producing a coherent system which reconciles the demands of deterministic naturalism (in which all human faculties are necessitated by the interaction of physical causes) with the ethical requirement that human beings should strive to overcome naturally determined constraints by the pursuit of virtue.

In his later university courses on Aristotle's biological works (1521–24), Pomponazzi continued to grapple with the same problems. When commenting on the Aristotelian statement that the nature of the blood affects the temperament of animals (De partibus animalium, II. 4, 651a12–13), he first recounts the Stoic position that the variety of temperaments and behaviors is exclusively determined by organic factors and contributes to the overall beauty of the universe. He then presents the opposing Peripatetic position that the nature of the blood predisposes, but does not determine, character and temperament: “a person who has an irascible temperament, but becomes gentle through the exercise of virtue, has greater merit than one who is naturally gentle; for virtue consists in facing difficulties, and God gave us the will to overcome our nature” (Pomponazzi 2004, II/13).

5. The shortcomings of philosophy

Ideological interpretations of Pomponazzi (§ 6, “Influence”) have led to a misguided view of him as a forerunner of modern currents of thought, a sort of empiricist avant la lettre, whose explanations remain entirely within natural boundaries. To be sure, one is struck by passages in his lectures from 1522–23 on book II of the Meteorologica, where he challenges Aristotle's a priori demonstrations of the uninhabitability of the Southern hemisphere, citing recent geographical information about inhabited settlements in that part of the world and stating that “if we do not know about the things that are on earth and can be seen by us, how are we to know about the heavens? Thus, only fools believe that they can demonstrate such matters. Aristotle said many things, but experience moves in the opposite direction.” On the basis of such statements, Bruno Nardi concluded that “Pomponazzi, who started as an Aristotelian and Averroist, faced with the widening of experience in every field of human knowledge, soon asked the question whose answer produced the renewal of modern science” (Nardi 1971, 52).

But even this does not entitle us to speak of naturalism and empiricism in Pomponazzi. Looking closely at the most characteristic themes in his work (for instance, the epistemological, and hence ontological, unity of the individual, or the freedom of the human will, which enables the wise man to overcome natural constraints by means of virtue), it is clear that both his naturalism and empiricism need to be seen against the background of the divine government of the world. Pomponazzi, in fact, swings between two different models. The first model, which can be described as “static,” is the Aristotelian framework of a universe divided into levels of being, structured around different perfections and governed by a chain of causes leading ultimately to the Unmoved Mover. The second model, which can be described as “dynamic,” is a Platonic and Hermetic one, which not only sees man as the nexus mundi, the vital link between the realm of animals and that of God and divine entities, but also points toward ways by which we can climb up the ladder of being and become God-like. Pomponazzi often identifies this self-divinization with the intellectual activity of the philosopher, who is able to participate in the true wisdom which is proper to God and the Intelligences (for a fuller discussion, see Bianchi 2003, 63–99).

In some passages in the treatises and lecture courses dating from the final period of his life, however, Pomponazzi presents a less exalted picture of philosophical activity, stressing that all human conclusions are merely provisional, conjectural, and equal in degree of probability. In one of his last courses he states unequivocally that the greatest shortcoming of philosophy is “uncertainty; for philosophy would be beautiful, if it were as certain as mathematics; metaphysics and natural philosophy are conjectural (coniecturales) and on almost any subject one may find different opinions, so that it is like playing with toys” (from his unpublished course on De generatione et corruptione, 1521–22; see Perfetti 2004, lxvii). This awareness of the shortcomings of philosophy undermined the possibility of building up a systematic body of knowledge and increasingly led Pomponazzi to conceive of philosophy as an analytical task, entailing a critical sifting of received opinions in order to find the weakest link. He was prepared to accept that human knowledge was limited precisely because he compared it to God's absolute knowledge, in which there was no room for either uncertainty or contingency (though the latter was, at least in part, suspended in the second part of On Fate). This is the source of the skeptical (or perhaps “Socratic”) tone clearly evident in his final lecture courses, where Pomponazzi often declares that, given the lack of certainties, he will teach his students to doubt, since doubting is already knowing (see Graiff 1979; Perfetti 1999a, b, 2000, 2004).

This skeptical tone (mainly used to refute positions held by earlier thinkers) shaped Pomponazzi's philosophy of nature in his final years. For instance, in his exposition of Aristotle's De partibus animalium (1521–23: see Pomponazzi 2004), there are no factual verifications or descriptions based on eyewitness accounts (indeed, he often reveals himself to be ignorant of the biological determination of a species or of morphological and anatomical details, even when discussing well-known animals). Instead, he comes across as an acute commentator, highly skilled at using the instruments of logical, conceptual and semantic analysis to test the internal consistency of Aristotelian scientific doctrines. Pomponazzi, therefore, was not an empiricist and cannot be associated with the new conception of a philosopher which would be formulated in the seventeenth century. It may well be the case that he asked, or rather was aware of, the questions whose answers were to provoke the rise of modern science (as Nardi claimed); but he by no means resolved them. He remained anchored to a disputational form of rationalism, without attempting to ally conceptual analysis to a controlled and systematic use of experience.

6. Influence

Pomponazzi's thought and reputation were extremely influential in the centuries after his death. Even before it was printed, his treatise On incantations circulated widely in manuscript among philosophers, physicians and early modern naturalists (see Zanier 1975). Due to his mortalist theory of the soul, 17th-century “free thinkers” regarded Pomponazzi as one of their own, portraying him as an atheist (see Kristeller 1968; Paganini 1985). Enlightenment thinkers of the 18th century pushed to extremes his distinction between natural reason and faith, while 19th-century positivists, such as Ernest Renan and Roberto Ardigò, saw in Pomponazzi a forerunner of their own beliefs and a champion of naturalism and empiricism.


Primary Sources

  • Nifo, Agostino, 2009, De immortalitate humanae animae: libellus adversum Petrum Pomponatium MantuanumL’immortalità dell'anima: contro Pomponazzi, ed. José Manuel García Valverde, transl. Francesco Paolo Raimondi, Milan: Nino Aragno, 2009 [Latin text with French translation and Italian introduction]
  • Pomponazzi, P., 1516, Tractatus de immortalitate animae: Abhandlung über die Unsterblichkeit der Seele, ed. by B. Mojsisch, Hamburg: Felix Meiner, 1990, [Latin text, German translation and commentary]; On the Immortality of the Soul, English trans. W.H. Hay II, in E. Cassirer, P.O. Kristeller and J.H. Randall, Jr. (eds.), The Renaissance Philosophy of Man, Chicago, IL: University of Chicago Press, 1948.
  • –––, 1525, Tractatus acutissimi, utillimi et mere peripatetici, Venice (anast. reprint Casarano: Eurocart, 1995) [contains De intensione et remissione formarum (ed. pr. Bologna 1514), De reactione (1515), De modo agendi primarum qualitatum, De immortalitate animae, Apologia (1518), Defensorium (1519), De nutritione et augmentatione (1521)].
  • –––, 1563, Dubitationes in IV Meteorologicorum, Venice.
  • –––, 1567, De naturalium effectuum causis sive de incantationibus, Hildesheim-New York: Olms, 1970 [facsimile reprint taken from his Opera, Basle 1567 ed. by G. Grataroli].
  • –––, 1957, Libri quinque de fato, de libero arbitrio et de praedestinatione, ed. by R. Lemay, Lugano: Thesaurus Mundi.
  • –––, 1966–70, Corsi inediti dell'insegnamento padovano, ed. by A. Poppi, 2 vols., Padua: Antenore (vol. I: Super libello de substantia orbis [1507 course on Averroes' De substantia orbis]. vol. II: Quaestiones physicae et animasticae decem: [from his 1503–1504 course on the De anima]. Tractatus de maximo et minimo. Quaestio de minimis, Quaestio de motu gravium et levium [from his course on the Physica, 1499–1500]).
  • –––, 1989, Utrum anima sit mortalis vel immortalis, ed. by W. van Dooren, Nouvelles de la République des Lettres, 1–2, 71–135 [from a course on De anima, c. 1513].
  • –––, 2004, Expositio super primo et secundo De partibus animalium, ed. by S. Perfetti, Florence: Olschki.
  • –––, 2004, Libri quinque de fato, de libero arbitrio et de praedestinatione; Il fato, il libero arbitrio e la predestinazione, ed. R. Lemay and transl. V. Perrone Compagni, 2 vols., Turin: Nino Aragno [Latin text with Italian translation and notes].
  • –––, 2011, De incantationibus, ed. V. Perrone Compagni with the assistance of L. Regnicoli, Florence, Olschki [Latin text of De naturalium effectuum causis sive de incantationibus].

Further partial transcriptions of unpublished reportationes can be found in Kristeller 1955–56, Nardi 1965, Graiff 1979.

Selected Studies

  • Bakker, P.J.J.M. 2007, “Agostino Nifo, Pietro Pomponazzi, and Marcantonio Genua on the Nature and Place of the Science of the Soul,” in P.J.J.M. Bakker & J.M.M.H. Thijssen (eds.), Mind, Cognition and Representation: The Tradition of Commentaries on Aristotle’s De anima, Aldershot: Ashgate, 151–78.
  • Bertozzi M. 1996, “Il fatale ritmo della storia. La teoria delle grandi congiunzioni astrali tra XV e XVI secolo,” I Castelli di Yale, 1, 29–49.
  • Bianchi, L. 2003, “Pomponazzi politicamente corretto? La disuguaglianza fra gli uomini nel Tractatus de immortalitate animae,” in his Studi sull'aristotelismo del Rinascimento, Padua: Il Poligrafo, 63–99.
  • Biard, J. and Gontier, T. (eds.) 2009, Pietro Pomponazzi entre traditions et innovations / Amsterdam: B. R. Grüner.
  • Casini, L. 2007, “The Renaissance Debate on the Immortality of the Soul: Pietro Pomponazzi and the Plurality of Substantial Forms,” in  P.J.J.M. Bakker & J.M.M.H. Thijssen (eds.), Mind, Cognition and Representation: The Tradition of Commentaries on Aristotle’s De anima, Aldershot: Ashgate, 127–50.
  • Di Napoli, G. 1973, “Libertà e fato in Pietro Pomponazzi,” in his Studi sul Rinascimento, Naples: Giannini, 85–159.
  • Douglas, A.H. 1910, The Philosophy and Psychology of Pietro Pomponazzi, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press [facsimile reprint Hildesheim: Olms, 1962].
  • Fiorentino F. 1868, Pietro Pomponazzi. Studi storici su la scuola bolognese e padovana del secolo XVI, con molti documenti inediti, Florence: Le Monnier.
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  • ––– 1999b, “Docebo vos dubitare. Il commento inedito di Pietro Pomponazzi al De partibus animalium (Bologna 1521–24),” Documenti e Studi sulla Tradizione Filosofica Medievale, 10, 439–66.
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  • –––  2006, “Latino grosso e sottigliezze scolastiche. Problemi di traduzione dei testi di Pietro Pomponazzi,” in M. L. Baldi and B. Faes de Mottoni (eds.), Edizioni e traduzioni di testi filosofici. Esperienze di lavoro e riflessioni. Atti del Convegno, Milano (9–10 novembre 2004), Milan, Franco Angeli, 85–109.
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  • ––– 2007, “Circe, la ‘virtus loci’, il determinismo nel De incantationibus di Pomponazzi,” Annali del Dipartimento di Filosofia. Università di Firenze, 12, 5–32.
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  • ––– 1973, “Pietro Pomponazzi and the Scholastic Doctrine of Free Will,” Rivista Critica di Storia della Filosofia, 28, 3–27.
  • ––– 1975, “Pietro Pomponazzi,” in Dictionary of Scientific Biography, New York: Charles Scribner's Sons, XI: 71–74.
  • ––– 1986, Pietro Pomponazzi, Radical Philosopher of the Renaissance, Padua: Antenore.
  • ––– 1999, “Pietro Pomponazzi's Attack on Religion and the Problem of De fato,” in F. Niewöhner, Olaf Pluta (eds.). Atheismus im Mittelalter und in der Renaissance, Wiesbaden: Harrassowitz, 1999, 145–172.
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  • ––– 1988, “Fate, Fortune, Providence and Human Freedom,” in C. B. Schmitt, Q. Skinner, E. Kessler, J. Kraye (eds.), The Cambridge History of Renaissance Philosophy, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 641–667.
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  • ––– 2001, “Pietro Pomponazzi's De immortalitate and his Clandestine De incantationibus: Aristotelianism, Eclecticism or Libertinism?” Bochumer Philosophisches Jahrbuch für Antike und Mittelalter, 6, 87–115.
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  • ––– 1992, “La biologia teoretica nell'ultima fase del pensiero pomponazziano,” in D. Facca and G. Zanier (eds.), Filosofia, filologia, biologia. Itinerari dell'aristotelismo cinquecentesco, Rome: Edizioni dell'Ateneo, 105–130.

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