Arthur Prior

First published Mon Oct 7, 1996; substantive revision Sat Aug 18, 2007

Arthur Prior (1914-1969) undertook pioneering work in intensional logic at a time when modality and intensional concepts in general were under attack. He invented tense logic and was principal theoretician of the movement to apply modal syntax to the formalisation of a wide variety of phenomena. Prior and Carew Meredith devised a version of the possible worlds semantics several years before Kripke published his first paper on the topic. An iconoclast and a resourceful innovator, Prior inspired many to undertake work in intensional logic.

Much of Prior's work consisted of the tireless exploration of a labyrinth of axiomatic calculi. Yet for him the point of a logical calculus was always that it had a subject matter, be it time, obligation, agency, or even biology, and a concern for philosophical problems never lay far below his theorems. It was the extra-symbolic world that mattered to Prior, not the formal results per se. He wrote:

Philosophy, including Logic, is not primarily about language, but about the real world. … Formalism, i.e. the theory that Logic is just about symbols and not things, is false. Nevertheless, it is important to “formalise” as much as we can, i.e. to state truths about things in a rigorous language with a known and explicit structure. (1996a: 45)

1. Work on Tense Logic

Prior's most significant achievement was the invention and development of tense logic. Tense logic involves two new modal operators, ‘It will be the case that’ and ‘It has been the case that’. Prior used his tense logic to articulate theories about the structure and metaphysics of time, and to mount a robust defence of freewill and indeterminism. Tense logic is now also employed for the manipulation of time-dependent data and has numerous applications in computing, including database management, program verification, and commonsense reasoning in Artificial Intelligence.

1.1 Origins of Tense Logic

Prior's earliest mention of a logic of time-distinctions is to be found in the penultimate chapter of his unpublished manuscript The Craft of Formal Logic (completed in 1951). Following von Wright in ‘Deontic Logic’ (1951b) he remarks that there are other groups of modal predicates to be set alongside the ordinary or ‘alethic’ modes of necessity and possibility. Prior refers to these non-alethic modalities as ‘quasi-modals’. After noting that Peter of Spain classified adverbial distinctions of time as modes he says (p. 750):

That there should be a modal logic of time-distinctions has been suggested in our own day by Professor Findlay.

Findlay's paper ‘Time: A Treatment of Some Puzzles’ had appeared in the Australasian Journal of Psychology and Philosophy in 1941. Prior became aware of it as a result of its appearance in Flew's 1951 collection Essays on Logic and Language, which arrived in New Zealand just as Prior was writing the final chapters of The Craft. The suggestion Prior refers to is barely more than a passing comment: “[O]ur conventions with regard to tenses are so well worked out that we have practically the materials in them for a formal calculus”, wrote Findlay. He continued in a footnote:

The calculus of tenses should have been included in the modern development of modal logics. It includes such obvious propositions as that
x present ↔ (x present) present;

x future ↔ (x future) present ↔ (x present) future;

also such comparatively recondite propositions as that

(x).(x past) future; i.e., all events, past, present and future, will be past.

In 1949 Prior had learned (from Geach's review of Julius Weinberg's Nicolaus of Autricourt: A Study in 14th Century Thought) that for the scholastics, an expression like ‘Socrates is sitting down’—an example discussed by Aristotle—is complete, in the sense of being assertible as it is, and is true at certain times, false at others. (Prior had been brought up on the view, which is widespread even today, that such an expression is incomplete until a time-reference is supplied, and hence that—despite the seeming naturalness of doing so—one cannot regard the expression as changing its truth-value with the passage of time.) It was a crucial discovery for Prior and the idea that tensed propositions are liable to be true at one time and false at another became central to his philosophy. In a summary of his views, composed nearly two decades later, he wrote:

Certainly there are unchanging truths, but there are changing truths also, and it is a pity if logic ignores these, and leaves it … to comparatively informal ‘dialecticians’ to study the more ‘dynamic’ aspects of reality. (Prior 1996a: 46)

Geach's review sent Prior back to the ancient sources, and he found Aristotle describing some propositions about the future—propositions concerning events that are not determined at the time of utterance—as being neither true nor false when they are uttered, on the ground that there is, at that time, as yet no definite fact with which they accord or conflict. Prior endorsed Aristotle's argument, in ch. 9 of De Interpretatione, for believing in such events: if the future were determined, ‘there would be no need to deliberate or take trouble, on the supposition that if we should adopt a certain course, a certain result would follow, while, if we did not, the result would not follow’. Prior, once a Barthian Calvinist but now on the side of indeterminism and freewill, went on to develop profound technical analyses of the idea that the future is open, a branching tree of possibilities.

Prior desired to formalise the ancient insight that propositions can change in truth value with the passage of time. He soon realised that off-the-shelf modal syntax could be adapted to do this. It was simply a matter of taking seriously an idea that he had discussed in The Craft of Formal Logic: tense is a species of modality, to be set alongside the ordinary (‘alethic’) modes of necessity and possibility. His first explorations of this calculus of tenses appeared in his article ‘Diodoran Modalities’ (completed by early 1954), where he wrote:

I here propose to do something a little different, namely to employ the ordinary propositional variables ‘p’, ‘q’, ‘r’ etc., for ‘propositions’ in the Diodoran sense [i.e. propositions which ‘may be true at one time and false at another’] and to use certain operators which take such propositions as arguments, and which form functions taking such propositions as values. I shall use ‘Fp’ for ‘It will be the case that p’. (1955b: 205.)

In 1953 Prior had read of the work of the Megarian logician Diodorus Chronos in Benson Mates' book Stoic Logic. Prior later wrote of Diodorus that he ‘seems to have been an ancient Greek W.V. Quine, who regarded the Aristotelian logic of possibility and necessity with some scepticism, but offered nevertheless some “harmless” senses that might be attached to modal words' (1967a: 16). Diodorus defined the possible as what is or will be true: according to Diodorus, what actually happens is all that can happen. Prior found this deterministic definition uncongenial and set himself the task of locating a fallacy in the argument that Diodorus used to support it, the so-called Master Argument:

The aim of the Master Argument, as I conceive it, was to refute the Aristotelian view that while it is now beyond the power of men or gods to affect the past, there are alternative futures between which choice is possible. Against this, Diodorus held that the possible is simply what either is or will be true. (Prior 1962a: 138; see also 1967a: 33.)

Consideration of the Master Argument brought together three of Prior's great interests: indeterminism, modal logic, and the logic of time. In the course of his reflections on the argument, Findlay's footnote pushed its way to the front of his mind. His wife Mary remembers ‘his waking me one night, coming and sitting on my bed, and reading a footnote from John Findlay's article on time, and saying he thought one could make a formalised tense logic’.

Prior's earliest calculus of tenses (set out in ‘Diodoran Modalities’) was the system produced by adding the following axioms, rules, and definition, to the ordinary propositional calculus. (1) F(pq) ≡ (Fp) ∨ (Fq). (2) FFpFp. (3) If pq is provable in the calculus (or is an axiom) then FpFq follows. (4) If p is provable in the calculus (or is an axiom) then Gp follows; where Gp, the future perpetual form ‘It will always be the case that p’, is defined as -F-p. There was clearly more work to be done on this calculus—for one thing there was no mention of the past—and Prior duly set about expanding the calculus. He worked fast, and in August 1954 he unveiled a system of far greater sophistication, in his Presidential Address to the second New Zealand Congress of Philosophy (held in Wellington).

Prior's expanded calculus contained two additional axioms concerning futurity, GpFp and FpFFp. There was also a simplification: instead of following his previous practice and defining G as -F-, Prior took G as undefined and defined F as -G-; this enabled him to replace the somewhat unwieldy axiom (1) by the more elegant G(pq) → (GpGq). This calculus of ‘pure futurity’ he transformed into a calculus of ‘pure pastness’ by replacing F throughout the axioms, rules, and definition, by the past tense operator P (‘It has been the case that’), and replacing G by the past perpetual operator H (‘It has always been the case that’). Like ordinary modal logic, both these ‘pure’ calculi are monomodal; that is, each contains only one undefined modal operator. Prior wanted a ‘full tense calculus', containing the two undefined operators G and H, together with the operators F and P defined in terms of them (such a calculus is known as a bimodal logic). To obtain the full calculus it was not enough simply to bundle together the two ‘pure’ systems, for the two tense operators would then remain independent of one another. Some interactive axioms, ‘laws which relate to the interaction of pastness and futurity’, were also required. Prior chose pGPp and pHFp.

What are the justifications for his axioms and rules? In ‘Diodoran Modalities’, Prior was content to describe FFpFp as ‘obvious enough’, but by the time of the Wellington Congress his thinking had moved forward considerably. He set out what he called the ‘l-calculus’ (he was later to prefer the term ‘U-calculus’). ‘l’ is the relation ‘is later than’ (relating dates). In the l-calculus, the propositions of the tense calculus are treated as expressing properties of dates. ‘lxz & px’ (where p might be ‘Socrates is sitting down’, for example) is read ‘x is later than z and p at x’; x and z are dates. Using the (arbitrary) date z to represent the time of utterance, Fp is equated with ∃x(lxz & px) (’p at some time later than z’), and Pp with ∃x(lzx & px) (‘p at some time earlier than z’). Gp and Hp are equated with the universal quantifications ∀x(lxzpx) and ∀x(lzxpx), respectively. Prior showed that if various assumptions are made concerning the relation l, the axioms of the tense calculus can be proved in the l-calculus. (Two years later, he and Meredith used essentially the same strategy in creating the possible worlds semantics for ordinary modal logic.)

Prior discovered that FFpFp and its image PPpPp follow from the assumption lxy → (lyzlxz)—a way of stating that the relation l is transitive. FpFFp and its image PpPPp follow given the assumption lxz → ∃y(lxy & lyz), stating that ‘between any two dates there is another date’ (a condition sometimes said to express time's density). GpFp follows given ∃xlxz, stating that ‘there is a date later than any given date’, i.e., that there is no last moment of time. HpPp requires ∃xlzx, stating that there is no first moment of time. Prior showed furthermore that no assumptions at all are needed for the derivation of the two interactive axioms pGPp and pHFp, nor for the axioms G(pq) → (GpGq) and H(pq) → (HpHq). In the case of these formulae, the ordinary machinery of truth-functional and quantifier logic suffices for their proof; and Prior showed that the same is true of the two rules of the tense calculus. This part, therefore, of Prior's calculus of tenses is purely logical, whereas others of the axioms—those stating that l is transitive, that time is dense, and that there is no first or last moment of time—express physical properties of time. In later work Prior considered further calculi, in which these particular ‘physical’ axioms are replaced by others, for example axioms stating that time has a first moment, or is linear (a ‘straight line’), or is non-linear, with the present always standing at a junction of a number of branches, any of which might become the actual future.

Which is metaphysically basic, the tense calculus or the l-calculus? Prior issued a warning against regarding the above interpretation of the tense calculus within the l-calculus as ‘a metaphysical explanation of what we mean by is, has been and will be’: the l-calculus, he said, is not ‘metaphysically fundamental’. His reason is that ‘F(Socrates is sitting down)’ means ‘It is now the case that it will be the case that Socrates is sitting down’, whereas there is no genuine way of representing the indexical ‘now’ in the l-calculus (the date variable z is not an indexical, any more than ‘25 December 2006’ is an indexical). Prior continued: ‘If there is to be any “interpretation” of our calculi in the metaphysical sense, it will probably need to be the other way round; that is, the l-calculus should be exhibited as a logical construction out of the PF-calculus rather than vice versa.’ This idea of the primacy of the tense calculus over the l-calculus (or, as he later put it, of McTaggart's A-series over the B-series) became a central and distinctive tenet of his philosophy. Prior took a similar metaphysical position with respect to ordinary modal logic, arguing that the language of possible worlds is to be interpreted in terms of a language with modal operators and not, as is popularly held, vice versa. These issues form the theme of his final book Worlds, Times and Selves.

As for the Master Argument, in a matchless piece of philosophical reconstruction (in ‘Diodoran Modalities’) Prior expresses the conclusion of the argument, that what neither is nor will be true is not possible, as (-p & -Fp) → -p and derives it in his calculus from Diodorus' premisses, Pp--Pp and -q → (□(pq) → -p), together with two ‘broad assumptions about time, likely to have been taken for granted both by Diodorus and by his main opponents’: pHFp and (-p & -Fp) → P-Fp. So the Master Argument is indeed valid. The fallacy, Prior tells us, lies with the second ‘broad assumption’, (-p & -Fp) → P-Fp (which says: when anything neither is nor will be the case, it has been the case that it will not be the case). This, Prior tells us, is not true if p refers to a future contingency (and thus has the truth value ½ or ‘indeterminate’). Where p is indeterminate both Fp and -Fp are indeterminate, so the consequent of the disputed formula, P-Fp, is false. -p must also be indeterminate (for if the negation of p were determinate p could not be indeterminate). Thus the antecedent of the disputed formula, -p & -Fp, is indeterminate, since both its conjuncts are indeterminate. According to the Łukasiewicz truth-table, an indicative conditional with a false consequent and an indeterminate antecedent is not true but indeterminate:

1 ½ 0
1 1 ½ 0
½ 1 1 ½
0 1 1 1

Thus Prior is able to ‘deny that propositions of the form [( -p & -Fp) → P-Fp] are in all cases true’. The Master Argument for determinism continued to exercise Prior for the rest of his life, and some of the most useful and mathematically most interesting parts of his work were inspired by his thoughts on it. To choose just one example, from computer science, the calculi that Prior developed in response to the idea that the Master Argument is defeated if time is conceived as branching into the future have become useful for describing and verifying the behaviour of concurrent and distributed processing systems.

1.2 Tense Logic Comes of Age

The text of Prior's Wellington address was not published until 1958 (in the journal Franciscan Studies, under the title ‘The Syntax of Time-Distinctions’). It was Prior's 1956 John Locke lectures at Oxford and the ensuing book Time and Modality (published in 1957) that brought Prior's discoveries in tense and modal logic before a wider audience. A number of logicians—notably Thomas, Geach, Lemmon, Meredith and Kripke—took an immediate interest in Priorean modal logic, in particular his Diodoran system and his system Q, a multivalued logic admitting the existence of contingent beings. Less immediate attention was paid to his tense logic. The bibliography of the subject in Prior's 1968 volume Papers on Time and Tense reveals that up until 1965 the only publications in the field were either by Prior himself or were reviews of his work (chiefly of Time and Modality). Yet a momentum was slowly gathering.

At a colloquium on modal and many-valued logics held in Helsinki in 1962 Hintikka proposed a tense-logical construal of his possible worlds semantics, maintaining that ‘if we do not want to tie our logic to old-fashioned physics, we are undoubtedly wiser if we … no longer require that the alternativeness relation (in this case it could perhaps be more appropriately termed “futurity relation”) effect a linear ordering’ (1963: 76). (Prior had happily tied his 1954 l-relation to ‘old-fashioned physics’. He made it clear that he did not think much of the view of time embodied in twentieth century physics (1996b: 49-51).) A pupil of von Wright, Hintikka had been stimulated by the latter's proposals for the wide application of modal logic (see the next section) and had come to appreciate the possibility of applying modal notions to the study of the logic of time before he read of Prior's sophisticated work in Time and Modality (which he reviewed in 1958). Hintikka was perhaps the first to stress the importance of a semantical approach to the tenses. During the early 1960s Hintikka travelled regularly between Helsinki and California and his ideas on tense influenced a number of logicians working in California, in particular Dana Scott.

Also in 1962, Scott gave a lecture on tense logic in Amsterdam. Among his audience was Hans Kamp, then an undergraduate. Scott's work on tense logic was one aspect of his study of the semantics of natural language, which he pursued in close collaboration with Richard Montague. Scott was aware of Prior's work, and was also influenced in his understanding of tense by Reichenbach, who had been a powerful figure at UCLA until his death in 1953. (Prior himself was critical of Reichenbach's analysis of the tenses, and described it as having been ‘in some ways a hindrance rather than a help to the construction of a logic of tenses’ (Prior 1967a: 13, Reichenbach 1948).) Scott's tense logic was rather different in style from Prior's. Scott established the completeness and decidability of various axiomatic tense logics. He also showed that the temporal predicate logic of the reals is non-axiomatisable. His work in tense logic is cited widely but remains unpublished. (Prior learned of Scott's work in a letter from Lemmon dated January 1964. Lemmon had left Oxford in 1963 for Claremont, near Los Angeles. Scott was then at Stanford.)

In 1965 Prior visited California for several months, as Flint Professor of Philosophy at UCLA. For the first time Prior found himself among a group of enthusiasts for tense logic. Shortly after the visit ended he was to write: ‘I suppose that California is the most logically mature place in the world, and now that the logic of tenses is pursued so widely and so vigorously there, its raw pioneering days can be considered over’ (1967a: vi). When Prior arrived at UCLA Nino Cocchiarella was just completing a Ph.D. thesis on quantified modal and tense logic under Montague's supervision (‘Tense and Modal Logic: A Study in the Topology of Temporal Reference’). Cocchiarella's interest in the philosophy of time had initially been aroused by Reichenbach's work on space and time but it was his acquaintance with Prior's Time and Modality that swept him into tense-logical research. (Only later did he learn of Scott's work.) Prior's visit coincided with Hans Kamp's arrival at UCLA as a graduate student. Kamp attended Prior's lectures on tense logic in his first semester and became deeply interested in the subject. These lectures led more or less directly to the topic of Kamp's Ph.D. thesis, written under Montague's supervision and entitled ‘On Tense Logic and the Theory of Order’ (1968). In Kamp's work the development of tense logic achieved a new level of formal sophistication. Segerberg, too, had just arrived in California, to study under Scott at Stanford. (Segerberg had become interested in tense logic in Finland in 1964 at a series of summer seminars given by von Wright, who was independently pursuing a tense logic that had arisen from his study of the logic of action and which was later shown to be equivalent to a system Prior had discussed in Time and Modality (Prior 1957: 23-4; see von Wright 1965 and Segerberg 1967, 1989).) In December of 1965 Scott delivered his famous talk to the Hume Society at Stanford entitled ‘The Logic of Tenses’. A multilith of Scott's handwritten notes for this talk has been circulating ever since among tense logicians. Four days later Prior himself addressed the Society, again on tense logic. It was in this fecund atmosphere that Prior completed the manuscript of his book Past, Present and Future, which remains to this day one of the most important references in the field.

The years 1965-7 saw the publication of work in tense logic by Åqvist, Bull, Clifford, Cocchiarella, Garson, Geach, Hamblin, Luce, Makinson, Rescher, Segerberg, von Wright—and, of course, Prior. In a little over a decade Prior's invention had become an internationally pursued branch of logic.

Prior always had a firm belief that his tense logic would one day find useful application in other disciplines (possibly in mathematical physics, he thought). When the outside demand for tense logic did come, it was from computer science. An early and influential application was by Pnuelli, who employed tense logic in formal reasoning about the behaviour of concurrent programs (Pnuelli 1977). (A concurrent program is one that governs the behaviour of a number of interacting processors running in parallel.) Pnuelli is sometimes mistakenly credited with having originated tense logic but in fact he first learned of it from the classic 1971 volume Temporal Logic by Rescher and Urquhart (Øhrstrøm and Hasle 1995: 344). This volume is dedicated to Prior and is an elegant introduction to his work.

Prior would not have been completely surprised to learn how useful tense logic is proving to be in computer science. He himself took little interest in computing beyond including material on elementary boolean circuit theory in his undergraduate lectures, but a number of the logicians with whom he was in touch were more deeply involved (Dov Gabbay and Dana Scott, for instance). Through others Prior knew something of the potential. He wrote ‘There are practical gains to be had from this study too, for example in the representation of time-delay in computer circuits’ (1996a: 46). In Past, Present and Future he remarked concerning logics of discrete time that their usefulness ‘does not depend on any serious metaphysical assumption that time is discrete; they are applicable in limited fields of discourse in which we are concerned only with what happens next in a sequence of discrete states, e.g. in the workings of a digital computer’ (1967a: 67). Other logics from the group that he and von Wright pioneered are also finding computational applications, for example epistemic logic in Artificial Intelligence and knowledge-base engineering, and the logic of action in programming theory. It is pleasant to reflect that two major forces in the genesis of these software technologies were Prior's love of ancient and medieval logic and his concern to make conceptual room for freedom of the human will.

2. Work on Modal Logic

Prior's own interest in modal logic arose chiefly from his study of the ancients. His earliest written piece on modal logic, the penultimate chapter of his manuscript The Craft of Formal Logic is largely historical in nature, with discussions of Aristotle, Peter of Spain, John Wallis, the Port Royal Logic, Isaac Watts' Logick, Hume and Mill on natural necessity, de Morgan, Whately, Aldrich. One of his conclusions, significant for his later work, is that ‘[t]here is everything to be said … for the … view that we may not only use devices developed in the study of quantity to throw light on modality, but also vice versa’ (p.747). One of the most distinctive features of his mature philosophy was the view that quantification over possible worlds and instants is to be interpreted in terms of modality and tense, which constitute primitive notions—a view which he held in tandem with the belief that the study of such quantifications could usefully illuminate the study of modality and tense (as in his own U-calculi, described below).

Early in 1951 Prior read von Wright's article ‘Deontic Logic’, and the penultimate chapter of The Craft contains a cameo discussion of this topic. Prior's reading of von Wright reinforced in his mind an idea that he had come across in Peter of Spain, Isaac Watts, and the Port Royal Logic, an idea that was to be of considerable importance for his own future work. What von Wright calls the ‘alethic’ modes—necessity, possibility, impossibility and contingency—are members of an extended group of concepts that includes the epistemic modes (‘it is known that’, ‘it is not known to be false that’, etc.), the doxastic modes (such as ‘it is believed that’), and the deontic modes (which include ‘it is permitted that’ and ‘it is obligatory that’). In The Craft Prior also lists Watts' ‘it is written that’ and ‘it is said that’, noting that ‘one could think of innumerable others' (p.749). Later von Wright was to draw attention to what may be called the agentive modes: ‘the agent brings it about that’, ‘the agent makes it true that’, and the like (von Wright 1963). Prior introduces the collective term ‘quasi-modals’ for the non-alethic modes (p.749) and remarks, accurately, that ‘there is a hint of a large field here’ (p.752). He was later to refer to his own tense operators as quasi-modal operators (1968: 138). By the time he wrote Formal Logic he was advocating the study of ‘the general modal form “It is — that p” … as a distinct propositional form’, observing that ‘this field has not been much cultivated’ (1955a: 218). Between them Prior and von Wright pioneered the now much investigated field of general intensional logic, in which the syntax, and latterly the semantics, developed for the study of the alethic modalities is used in the analysis of a wide range of quasi-modal concepts. Von Wright's deontic logic and Prior's tense logic were the first major successes in this field.

Prior was convinced that no satisfactory metalinguistic analysis can be given of sentences having the general modal form ‘It is — that p’. In Formal Logic he wrote: ‘It is quite plain, for example, that I am not talking about the sentence “Socrates is dead” when I say “I wish that Socrates were dead”’ (1955a: 219). In Time and Modality he reiterates the point, now in connection with the tenses: ‘“Professor Carnap will be flying to the moon” … is quite obviously a statement about Professor Carnap, and quite obviously not a statement about the statement “Professor Carnap is flying to the moon”’ (1957: 8). What, then, is the semantic value of an expression replacing p in a sentence of the general modal form ‘It is — that p’? Certainly not a truth value, as is the case with the standard extensional propositional calculus, for substituting a different expression with the same truth value into the sentence of the form ‘It is — that p’ may alter the truth value of the latter sentence. Prior's answer—and in a sense it amounts to a rejection of the question—is that modal functions take propositions as arguments, but propositions are logical constructions. All sentences containing the word ‘proposition’—including such sentences as ‘A modal operator expresses a function from propositions to truth values’—mean no more and no less than sentences which contain neither this word nor an equivalent. In essence, Prior's view is that there are intensional contexts but no intensions. For the last six years of his life Prior worked on a book that was to give systematic expression to his views on propositions. The incomplete manuscript, which Prior had entitled Objects of Thought, was published posthumously in 1971.

Of the four technical papers that marked the explosive beginning of Prior's career as a formal logician in 1952, two concern modal logic. ‘Modality De Dicto and Modality De Re’ is a discussion of this distinction as it appears in Aristotle, Ockham, and Peter of Spain, together with a comparison of these earlier views with those of von Wright in An Essay on Modal Logic. ‘In What Sense is Modal Logic Many-Valued?’ proposes an interpretation of Łukasiewicz's four-valued matrices for modal logic. This paper marked the beginning of Prior's study of Łukasiewicz's work on modality. Thereafter he read Łukasiewicz widely—even material in Polish, of which he said ‘the symbols are so illuminating that the fact that the text is incomprehensible doesn't much matter’. In the Preface to Time and Modality he wrote: ‘[W]hile I differed radically from the late Professor Łukasiewicz on the subject of modal logic, my debt to him will be obvious on almost every page’.

Prior's detailed contributions to the development of modal logic are legion. At least one aspect of his work has not received the recognition it deserves. Prior and his collaborator Carew Meredith invented crucial elements of the possible worlds semantics for propositional modal logic several years ahead of Kripke, including the all-important binary relation which opens the way to modelling systems of different strengths. (Meredith was a lecturer in mathematics at Trinity College, Dublin, whose interest in logic was stimulated by the arrival of Łukasiewicz in Dublin shortly after the war.)

The invention is foreshadowed in the penultimate chapter of The Craft.

For the similarity in behaviour between signs of modality and signs of quantity, various explanations may be offered. It may be, for example, that signs of modality are just ordinary quantifiers operating upon a peculiar subject-matter, namely possible states of affairs … It would not be quite accurate to describe theories of this sort as ‘reducing modality to quantity’. They do reduce modal distinctions to distinctions of quantity, but the variables to which the quantifiers are attached retain something modal in their signification — they signify ‘possibilities’, ‘chances’, ‘possible states of affairs’, ‘possible combinations of truth-values’, or the like. (pp. 736-7.)

As sources for this idea Prior cites John Wallis (a seventeenth century logician) and the account of logically necessary and logically impossible propositions given by Wittgenstein in the Tractatus (p.737). Interestingly, he mentions Carnap only in a footnote: “Professor Carnap has a similar definition of logical necessity in terms of what he calls ‘state-descriptions’” (ibid). Prior does not refer to, and presumably had not at that time read, Carnap's 1946 paper ‘Modalities and Quantification’, which attempted a semantics for quantified S5 in terms of state-descriptions. (A state-description is a class of sentences satisfying certain conditions. Each state-description represents a possible state of affairs.) Carnap too cites the Tractatus account of modal propositions as his inspiration (1946: 47). Prior goes on to defend his account of modality as quantification over possible states of affairs against various alternatives, for example the Andersonian account, according to which ‘Every table here is necessarily brown’ means ‘There is a property which every table here in fact possesses, and of which it is true that everything that possesses it is in fact brown’. (John Anderson, Professor at the University of Sydney, was a leading figure in the development of philosophy in Australasia.)

In 1956 Prior wrote up his and Meredith's formal work on what he later described (1962a: 140) as the ‘logic of world-accessibility’, in a paper entitled ‘Interpretations of Different Modal Logics in the “Property Calculus”’ (Meredith and Prior 1956, first published in Copeland 1996). It carries the attribution ‘C.A.M., August 1956; recorded and expanded A.N.P.’. Prior circulated the paper in mimeograph form. He mentions it in Past, Present and Future (1967: 42-5) and in his 1962 articles ‘Possible Worlds’ and ‘Tense-Logic and the Continuity of Time’. This paper is one of the earliest to employ a binary relation between possible states of affairs in order to discriminate between S5 and weaker systems. (Carnap's 1946 paper concerned only S5 and contained no such relation.)

The property calculus is essentially a variation of Prior's 1954 l-calculus described above. In the l-calculus tense-modal propositions are treated as predicates expressing properties of dates, and quantification theory is supplemented with various special axioms for a binary relation ‘l’ taking dates as arguments. In the modal version of the calculus, sentences of modal logic are treated as if they express properties of certain objects a, b, c, etc. Objects are related by a binary relation U. (Prior and Meredith supply no account of what a formula of form ‘Uab’ might express.) The following definitions of necessity □ and possibility ◊ are given. ‘pa’ indicates that object a has the property expressed by the sentence p. (Following Łukasiewicz, Prior and Meredith themselves used ‘L’ in place of ‘□’ and ‘M’ in place of ‘◊’.)

(□p)a = ∀x(Uaxpx)

(◊p)a = ∃x(Uax & px).

The calculus consists of ordinary quantification theory supplemented by these definitions, together with certain axioms governing the relation U, and the following clauses:

(-p)a = -(pa)

(pq)a = (pa) → (qa).

It is implied that a proposition p is to be called a theorem of the calculus if and only if pa is provable for an arbitrarily chosen object a.

Axioms for U are selected from a list containing (amongst others):

1. Uaa (U is reflexive)

2. Uab → (UbcUac) (U is transitive)

3. UabUba (U is symmetrical).

(Axiom 2 is also present in the l-calculus.) Prior and Meredith establish that the distribution principle □(pq) → (□p → □q) is a theorem in the absence of any special axioms for U; that □pp is a theorem if axiom 1 is imposed; that axiom 2 gives the S4 principle □p → □□p; and that 2 together with 3 give the S5 principle ◊□p → □p. (Their approach is proof-theoretic in its basic orientation and they offer no completeness results.) In 1962a and 1962b Prior extends the approach to systems between S4 and S5 and systems independent of S4 between T and S5.

As previously remarked, the idea that the variables of quantification of the calculus should range over possible states of affairs or possible worlds is present in The Craft. In 1960, following a suggestion by Geach, Prior began thinking of U as a relation of accessibility between worlds. Prior tells us that Geach cashed out the notion of ‘reaching’ one world from another in terms of ‘some dimension-jumping vehicle dreamed up by science fiction’ (1962b: 36; see also 1962a: 140). (Geach referred to the whole business as ‘Trans World Airlines’.) With this interpretation of U to hand, the property calculus can be viewed as treating (□p)a — or ‘Necessarily-p in world a’ — as short for ‘p is true in all worlds accessible from a’. Lemmon, in a draft of material intended for his and Dana Scott's projected book ‘Intensional Logic’, mistakenly credits Geach with the idea that the binary relation ‘may be intuitively thought of as a relation between possible worlds’. In a letter to Scott, written after Lemmon's death in 1966, Prior remarked: “What Geach contributed was not the interpretation of [U] as a relation between worlds (God knows when that started), but the interpretation of [U] as a relation of accessibility”. When Prior says “God knows when that started” he is presumably referring to the idea that the ‘objects’ of the calculus be regarded as possible worlds. Prior was right to think that the history of this idea is a tangled one. Priority is often assigned to Leibniz, but scholars have now traced the idea back to Duns Scotus and William of Ockham (Knuuttila 1993).

It seems that the binary relation first made its appearance in a 1951 article by Jonsson and Tarski, ‘Boolean Algebras with Operators’. In their Theorem 3.14 they establish that every closure algebra is isomorphic to an algebraic system formed by a set and a reflexive and transitive relation between its elements; their Theorem 3.5 considers also a symmetry condition. In hindsight these theorems (which explicitly concern boolean algebras, of course) can be viewed as in effect a treatment of all the basic modal axioms and corresponding properties of the accessibility relation. Concerning this article Saul Kripke remarked (in Copeland 1996: 13):

Had they known they were doing modal logic, they would have had the completeness problem for many of the modal propositional systems wrapped up, and some powerful theorems. Mathematically they did this, but it was presented as algebra with no mention of semantics, modal logic, or possible worlds, let alone quantifiers. When I presented my paper at the conference in Finland in 1962, I emphasized the importance of this paper. Tarski was present, and said that he was unable to see any connection with what I was doing!

During the next eight years the binary relation was reinvented by a number of logicians. Prior, in his address to a conference in Wellington in 1954, seems to have been the first to use the binary relation in an explicitly tense-modal context. Other landmarks were an address by Montague to a conference held at UCLA in 1955, Prior and Meredith's property calculus of 1956, lectures by Smiley in Cambridge in1957 (Smiley pursued an algebraic approach), Kanger (1957), Hintikka (1957, 1961) and Kripke (1959a, 1959b, 1963). Kripke was familiar with Kanger's work involving the binary relation at the time he obtained his own results. Kanger himself had read the 1951 paper by Jonsson and Tarski and he describes his results as similar to theirs (Kanger 1957: 39). Copeland (2002) gives a detailed history of possible worlds semantics.

2.1 Prior and Kripke

Kripke first became interested in modal logic in 1956, as a result of reading Prior's paper ‘Modality and Quantification in S5’ (Prior 1956a). Kripke was at this time still at high school, working on logic in almost complete isolation in Omaha, Nebraska. In 1958 he read Time and Modality and was impressed by the parallel Prior drew between tense and the alethic modalities. At almost exactly the same time Prior was reading Kripke's first paper, ‘A Completeness Theorem in Modal Logic’ (Kripke 1959a), in his capacity as referee for The Journal of Symbolic Logic. In this paper Kripke stated and proved a completeness theorem for an extension of S5 with quantifiers and identity; the binary relation made no appearance. His first publication to mention the binary relation—which he interpreted as a relation of relative possibility between worlds—was written in 1962 and appeared in 1963 (Kripke 1963); the paper contained completeness proofs for propositional M, S4, B, and S5. Kripke reported (in correspondence with Copeland) that the idea of the binary relation occurred to him much earlier than 1962, in fact shortly after his paper on S5 was first submitted in the spring of 1958. Certainly by the late summer of that year Kripke had a completeness result for S4. On 3 September 1958 he wrote to Prior, mentioning his work on semantical completeness theorems for quantified extensions of S4 (with and without the Barcan formula (Marcus 1946, 1962)). In the letter, Kripke gives a branching-time matrix, characteristic for S4. This is essentially a tense-logical interpretation of the reflexivity + transitivity semantics for S4:

in an indetermined system, we perhaps should not regard time as a linear series, as you have done. Given the present moment, there are several possibilities for what the next moment may be like — and for each possible next moment, there are several possibilities for the moment after that. Thus the situation takes the form, not of a linear sequence, but of a 'tree'.

Kripke suspects that it was his reading of Time and Modality which first interested him in the problem of treating variable domains (a constant domain was assumed in ‘A Completeness Theorem in Modal Logic’). Kripke worked on Prior's suggestion—formalised in Prior's system Q—that variable domains might lead to truth-value gaps even at the level of propositional logic, although Kripke did not pursue this approach in his published material. Kripke thinks it probable that Prior's work on many-valued matrices in Time and Modality gave him the idea of converting possible worlds models into many-valued matrices, an approach he followed in his 1963 paper ‘Semantical Analysis of Modal Logic I: Normal Modal Propositional Calculi’.

3. Prior's Life

In 1932, at the age of 17, Arthur Prior left his home town, sleepy Masterton in the North Island of New Zealand, and enrolled at the University of Otago. The son of a doctor, Prior's initial intention was to study medicine. He was soon beckoned away by philosophy, in which he gained a B.A. in 1935. It was John Findlay, then Professor of Philosophy at Otago, who introduced Prior to logic. A contemporary of Gilbert Ryle and William Kneale, Findlay himself had studied at Graz and at Oxford; his influential book Meinong's Theory of Objects was published during Prior's second year at Otago. Under Findlay's direction Prior cut his teeth on W.E. Johnson's classic text Logic and studied the 18th century British moralists. It was Findlay who first interested Prior in the history of logic. In 1949 Prior wrote of him ‘I owe to his teaching, directly or indirectly, almost all that I know of either Logic or Ethics’ (1949: xi) and he was later generously to describe Findlay as ‘the founding father of modern tense-logic’ (1967a: 1).

Prior's M.A. thesis, in which he criticised subjectivist and formalist approaches to logic, was awarded only a second by the external examiner. Fortunately Findlay knew a budding logician when he saw one and secured Prior an assistant lectureship at Otago. During 1937 Prior gave courses on logic, ethics, and probability theory. In December of that year his first published paper in philosophy—arguing that a nation is a logical construction out of individuals—appeared in the Australasian Journal of Psychology and Philosophy. (Prior's earlier writings in theology are discussed in (Grimshaw 2002).)

At this point Prior temporarily abandoned his academic career and spent three bohemian years wandering in Britain and Europe. He returned to New Zealand at the end of 1940, and on emerging from the air force in 1945 he applied for a vacant lectureship at Canterbury University College in Christchurch. By now he had a further three articles in the Australasian Journal of Psychology and Philosophy (‘Can Religion be Discussed?’, ‘The Meaning of Good’ and ‘The Subject of Ethics’) and with a strong recommendation from Findlay Prior got the job. He started work in February 1946. (The vacancy Prior filled was created by the departure from New Zealand of Karl Popper. Prior and Popper were never colleagues. Apart from Prior's attendance at some of Popper's Workers' Educational Association lectures in 1943 there was no contact between the two men.)

At Canterbury Prior was thrown entirely on his own resources, being as he put it ‘the only philosopher about the place’. He bore the responsibility for providing a broad and balanced philosophy curriculum, yet his own formal education in philosophy had stopped short nine years previously. Prior's one recourse in the face of isolation was to read, and read he did. In logic he began by returning to W.E. Johnson. Next came J.N. Keynes's Studies and Exercises in Formal Logic and then (in his own phrase) he got stuck into Principia Mathematica. He learned a lot about the history of the subject from Peirce, whom he found ‘unexpectedly magnificent’. An important discovery, in 1950, was Bochenski's Précis de Logique Mathematique. Prior was fascinated by the ‘very neat symbolic notation’ due to Łukasiewicz, and before long he turned his back completely on the more usual Peano-Russell notation. Bochenski was later to describe Prior as even more of a ‘CCCC-logician’ than he was himself. (In Łukasiewicz's parenthesis-free notation Cpq is written for ‘If p then q’.) Łukasiewicz's own Aristotle's Syllogistic and Tarski's Introduction to Logic soon followed. By now the logic bug had well and truly bitten. Prior saw from the work of the Poles that formal precision is possible in philosophy and this delighted him. The upshot of Prior's reading for the curriculum was that his students learned Aristotelian and medieval logic, using Polish notation and with Bochenski's Precis de Logique Mathematique as a text. ‘Despite the language difficulty, I have found this a first-class textbook to accompany lectures to New Zealand students’, he declared (1952c: 35).

An exuberant, playful man of seemingly inexhaustible vitality, Prior made an excellent teacher. He had no trace of pomposity or pretension. His students appreciated the friendly welcome they would receive at his home, not to mention his relaxed attitude toward the administrative paraphernalia of roll-taking and the like. In those days Canterbury University College was a formal, stuffy place and Prior was a breath of fresh air for his students. In a milieu where jacket and tie were the norm even in a sweltering New Zealand summer, Prior would lecture in baggy khaki shorts and roman sandles. His student Jim Wilson recalls the friendly informality of Prior's first-year classes:

The strained precision of clock time was alien to him, so he was usually late for his own lectures (or anyone else's for that matter—he was very egalitarian about it). But he almost always turned up eventually, thinning hair blown vertical by his dash on his bike when he remembered the time. He would pull cycle clips off his trousers and plonk an ancient shopping bag on the desk in front of him. Out of this bag would come … a cabbage, a bunch of carrots, a loaf of bread, a bottle of milk … until, always at the bottom, he would find the book he was looking for. Back into the bag went the rest of the goodies, then he would look up at us, apologise for being late if he was more than usually so, and ask: ‘Now where were we last time?’ Someone in the front row would consult her or his notes—Arthur couldn't as he never had any—and would say ‘You were just dealing with such and such’. ‘Ah yes, thank you’ Arthur would respond, and forthwith launch into an extempore exposition which followed on perfectly from the previous session and was beautifully structured and clear even though he was just thinking along with us. And of course we could stop him and ask for clarification or elaboration at any time, without in the slightest affecting the overall structure and direction of his thoughts.

Soon after his discovery of Précis de Logique Mathematique Prior wrote to Bochenski in Fribourg and then, a little later, to Łukasiewicz in Dublin. He was excited to receive replies. ‘We are, all of us, very isolated, being few and scattered’, wrote Bochenski. ‘It is a real pleasure to hear that a Colleague so far away is interested in the same problems you are working at and that he finds one's little writings may be of some use.’ Thus began Prior's voluminous correspondence with logicians the world over. There were other ways, too, in which his isolation lessened. In 1951 he met and became friends with John Mackie and Jack Smart, at a conference in Sydney. This was Prior's first experience of being among a large gathering of philosophers and Mary Prior describes the conference as his ‘entry into a wider world’. In the same year George Hughes was appointed to the Victoria University of Wellington. Prior and Hughes had to make the most of their all-too-infrequent meetings, sometimes talking until the birds woke. Prior was fortunate in having a number of excellent students during these early years, among them Jonathan Bennett, Ronald Butler and (a little later) Robert Bull. For Prior they were oases in the desert. In 1952 he gained an assistant lecturer, Sandy Anderson. The following year philosophy became a department in its own right and Prior was made Professor.

1949 saw the publication of Prior's first book, a slim but potent volume entitled Logic and the Basis of Ethics. It was published by the Clarendon Press and soon became prominent in Oxford. Austin liked it and Ryle approved of ‘Prior's complete lack of mugwumpery’. In the Introduction Prior explains that by the ‘logic of ethics’ he means ‘not a special kind of logic, nor a special branch of logic, but an application of it’, and the book is a vigorous examination of the arguments of each side in the naturalism/anti-naturalism debate.

Logic and the Basis of Ethics contains no symbolism, and Prior's phrase ‘the logic of ethics’ is little more than a battle cry. The few technical concepts that are introduced all pertain to syllogistic logic. It was not until 1952 that Prior began publishing papers in symbolic logic—four of them, suddenly, in the same year. At the unusually late age of 38 Prior had become a formal logician. He wrote these papers while completing the manuscript of what was intended to be his second book, The Craft of Formal Logic. (The manuscript of The Craft of Formal Logic is deposited in the Bodleian Library, Oxford.) This began life in 1949 as a Dictionary of Formal Logic, but at the advice of the Clarendon Press Prior soon switched to a more orthodox format. His logical interests veered sharply while he was writing The Craft. To sixteen chapters on the logic of categoricals, hypotheticals, terms and relations are added, almost as an afterthought, one on modal logic and one on the axiomatic method. Prior finished the manuscript in December 1951 and sent it to the Clarendon Press; fourteen months later they wrote agreeing to publish the book if Prior would both shorten it and give greater emphasis to modern logic. He undertook to make the changes but ended up writing a completely different book. This was finally published in 1955 with the title Formal Logic; it ran into a second edition in 1962. Some parts of The Craft not absorbed into the later work were published posthumously under the title The Doctrine of Propositions and Terms.

Steeped in Polish notation and the axiomatic method, Formal Logic typifies Prior's mature work. It teaches, enthusiastically yet without fuss, that there was life—fascinating life—before the here and now of logic. What Prior once wrote admiringly of Łukasiewicz is no less true of Prior himself: ‘having done very distinguished work as a mathematical logician in the modern style, [he] is at the same time interested in the history of his subject … and contrives both to use modern techniques to bring out more clearly what the ancients were driving at, and to learn from the ancients useful logical devices which the moderns have in general forgotten’ (1952c: 37).

After Findlay, Łukasiewicz was the greatest single influence on Prior's development as a logician. Prior's 1952 review article ‘Łukasiewicz's Symbolic Logic’ is one of the first papers in which he makes extensive use of symbolism. (He discusses Łukasiewicz's book Aristotle's Syllogistic From the Standpoint of Modern Formal Logic (published in 1951) and two articles, ‘The Shortest Axiom of the Implicational Calculus of Propositions’ and ‘On Variable Functions of Propositional Arguments’.) Prior seems to have first learned of Łukasiewicz's work through Bochenski's writings (Bochenski was a pupil of Łukasiewicz). Łukasiewicz had devised an axiomatic treatment of Aristotle's reduction of the imperfect syllogistic moods to those of the first figure, which Prior encountered in Bochenski's Précis de Logique Mathematique (published in 1949). This enchanted Prior. He was taking his students through the derivations as early as 1951, and he summarises Łukasiewicz's system in the final chapter of The Craft. Throughout this chapter he makes extensive use of Łukasiewicz's symbolic notation. It was Łukasiewicz's axiomatic treatment of traditional logic that fully brought home to Prior the power of modern symbolic methods. Moreover it was probably his reading of Łukasiewicz that made clear to him the fundamental importance of propositional logic. ‘It seems that Aristotle did not suspect the existence of another system of logic besides his theory of the syllogism’, Łukasiewicz had written, ‘[y]et he uses intuitively the laws of propositional logic …’ (1951: 49). (Łukasiewicz's axiomatisation of the syllogistic incorporates his own three-axiom formalisation of propositional logic (1951: 80).) In his review Prior quotes approvingly Łukasiewicz's assertion that ‘the logic of the Stoics, the inventors of the ancient form of the propositional calculus, was much more important than all the syllogisms of Aristotle’ (1951: 131). In The Craft propositional logic is barely mentioned until the final chapter, whereas Formal Logic begins with a thorough introduction to the subject. On page 3 of Formal Logic Prior states that the logic of propositions is ‘basic, and the rest of logic built upon it’. Prior's interest in economical bases for propositional and pure implicational logics, initially aroused by his study of Peirce, was stimulated by Łukasiewicz's article ‘The Shortest Axiom of the Implicational Calculus of Propositions’ and the opening chapters of Formal Logic draw heavily on Łukasiewicz's work in this area.

In 1954 Gilbert Ryle visited New Zealand. He brought Prior an invitation to visit Oxford and deliver the John Locke lectures. Prior arranged a twelve month leave of absence from Canterbury and arrived in Oxford at the beginning of 1956. Rather quickly a small group began to form around him: Ivo Thomas, John Lemmon, Peter Geach. (These meetings with Prior were Lemmon's first introduction to modal logic.) Hughes summarises the news of him that was arriving back home: ‘this wild colonial boy just hit Oxford and started to gather around him the main people [interested in] logic, and he started to organise a lot of parties, almost, for the serious doing of logic’. Prior kitted out his tiny rented flat with a toyshop blackboard and held open house. On Mondays during Hilary and Trinity terms Prior lectured on modal logic, his great passion, and on tense logic, his great invention. The lectures were published the following year, under the title Time and Modality.

In the summer break following the John Locke lectures Prior organised a Logic Colloquium in Oxford. In Britain in the 1950s logic was deeply out of fashion and its practitioners were isolated and somewhat demoralised. As Prior wrote shortly after the Colloquium, ‘There are logicians in England and Ireland; but it must be admitted that they are somewhat scattered, and so far as I could gather they had never had any general get-together’ (1956b: 186). Prior's Colloquium brought together Lemmon, Thomas, Geach, M. Kneale, W.C. Kneale, Lewy, Smiley, Bennett, Lejewski, M.W. Dick, Faris, Nidditch, Carew Meredith, David Meredith, and others. It was all a huge success, and the Colloquium became a regular fixture. Through his John Locke lectures, the Colloquium, and his numerous visits around the country, Prior helped to revitalise British logic. The group he left behind saw similarities between themselves and the close-knit group of researchers that existed in Warsaw before 1939.

Prior's heart may have been heavy as he journeyed back to New Zealand. After twelve months of logical companionship on a grand scale, life at Canterbury must have seemed a bleak prospect. He was seething with enthusiasm for logic and threw himself once more into a massive correspondence, but it could no longer satisfy him. Prior pined. When the offer arrived of a newly established second chair at the University of Manchester he snatched it up. Prior left New Zealand in December 1958.

He was at Manchester for seven years. In 1966 Anthony Kenny recommended him for a fellowship at Balliol. The move would mean a drop in both status and salary, not to mention an increase in teaching, but Prior did not hesitate. His sabbatical in Oxford had been one of his happiest years. ‘This is the good life’, he told George Hughes once he was settled in at Balliol. He felt he simply belonged. Prior soon built up a reputation for being one of the best teachers in Oxford—though his students were sometimes surprised to be given eighteenth century moralists to read instead of books by the currently fashionable.

Just before his departure from Manchester Prior told Tom Richards, a visiting New Zealander, that he was going to Oxford with a mission. Prior's own work was an exemplary fusion of philosophy and logic, and he went to Oxford with the intention of interesting the mathematical logicians in philosophy and the philosophers in mathematical logic. The time was right; and Prior spared no energy in preaching his message:

[F]ormal logic and general philosophy have more to bring to one another than is sometimes supposed. I do not mean by saying this to underrate the work of those who have explored the properties of symbolic calculi without any concern as to what they might be used to mean … Nor do I mean to underrate what recent philosophers have done in the way of exploring the obstinate and intricate ‘logic’ embedded in common discourse, even when they have not derived or sought to derive anything like a calculus from it … But these activities are, or can be, related to one another very much as theory and observation are in the physical sciences; and I must confess to a hankering after well-constructed theories which much contemporary philosophy fails to satisfy. (1957: vii.)

Prior did not live to enjoy the entente cordiale between philosophy and logic that he helped usher in. His health began to let him down during his second year at Balliol. He was found to have both angina pectoris and polymyalgic rheumatism. During the autumn of 1969 the rheumatism grew steadily worse. He was at this time on sabbatical at the University of Oslo. The pain left him with no zest for work. He dutifully gave his weekly seminars and spent the remainder of his time brooding savagely on how painful it was to do such elementary things as put on a coat. His hosts made him an appointment with a rheumatologist, who prescribed cortisone. In a letter written a few days later, and a few days before his heart failed, Prior described himself as one of the miracles of modern medicine. ‘I've been sleeping well … running up and down stairs … I can stand on one leg and put a sock on the other (first time for months) … they've got me cured now and I'm fine.’


Works by Prior

  • 1937. ‘The Nation and the Individual’. Australasian Journal of Psychology and Philosophy, vol.15, pp.294-8.
  • 1942. ‘Can Religion be Discussed?’. Australasian Journal of Psychology and Philosophy, vol.20, pp.141-51.
  • 1944. ‘The Meaning of Good’. Australasian Journal of Psychology and Philosophy, vol.22, pp.170-4.
  • 1945. ‘The Subject of Ethics’. Australasian Journal of Psychology and Philosophy, vol.23, pp.78-84.
  • 1949. Logic and the Basis of Ethics. Oxford: Clarendon Press.
  • 1951. ‘The Ethical Copula’. Australasian Journal of Philosophy, vol.29, pp.137-54.
  • 1952a. ‘Modality De Dicto and Modality De Re’. Theoria, vol.18, pp.174-80.
  • 1952b. ‘In What Sense is Modal Logic Many-Valued?’. Analysis, vol.12, pp.138-43.
  • 1952c. ‘Łukasiewicz's Symbolic Logic’. Australasian Journal of Philosophy, vol.30, pp.121-30.
  • 1953. ‘Three-Valued Logic and Future Contingents’. Philosophical Quarterly, vol.3, pp.317-26.
  • 1955a. Formal Logic. Oxford: Clarendon Press.
  • 1955b. ‘Diodoran Modalities’. Philosophical Quarterly, vol.5, pp.205-13.
  • 1956a. ‘Modality and Quantification in S5’. The Journal of Symbolic Logic, vol.21, pp.60-62.
  • 1956b. ‘Logicians at play; or Syll, Simp and Hilbert’. Australasian Journal of Philosophy, vol.34, pp.182-92.
  • 1957. Time and Modality. Oxford: Oxford University Press.
  • 1958a. ‘The Syntax of Time-Distinctions’. Franciscan Studies, vol.18, pp.105-120.
  • 1962a. ‘Tense Logic and the Continuity of Time’. Studia Logica, vol.13, pp.133-48.
  • 1962b. ‘Possible Worlds’. Philosophical Quarterly, vol.12, pp.36-43.
  • 1962c. ‘Logic in England Today’, typescript. Translated into Polish as ‘Wspólczesna logika w Anglii’. Ruch Filozoficzny, vol. 21, pp.251-6.
  • 1967a. Past, Present and Future. Oxford: Clarendon Press.
  • 1967b. ‘Logic, Modal’. In Edwards, P. (ed.) 1967. The Encyclopedia of Philosophy. New York: Macmillan.
  • 1968. Papers on Time and Tense. Oxford: Clarendon Press.
  • 1971. Objects of Thought. Oxford: Clarendon Press. (Edited by Geach, P.T., Kenny, A.J.P.)
  • 1976a. The Doctrine of Propositions and Terms. London: Duckworth. (Edited by Geach, P.T., Kenny, A.J.P.)
  • 1976b. Papers in Logic and Ethics. London: Duckworth. (Edited by Geach, P.T., Kenny, A.J.P.)
  • 1977.Worlds, Times and Selves. London: Duckworth. (Edited by Fine, K.)
  • 1996a. ‘A Statement of Temporal Realism’. In Copeland, B.J. (ed.) 1996. Logic and Reality: Essays on the Legacy of Arthur Prior. Oxford: Clarendon Press.
  • 1996b. ‘Some Free Thinking about Time’. In Copeland, B.J. (ed.) 1996. Logic and Reality: Essays on the Legacy of Arthur Prior. Oxford: Clarendon Press.
  • 2003. Papers on Time and Tense. Second expanded edition, edited by Braüner, T., Copeland, B.J., Hasle, P. and Øhrstrøm, P. Oxford: Oxford University Press.


  • Bayart, A. 1958. ‘Correction de la Logique Modale du Premier et du Second Ordre S5’ ['Soundness of First and Second Order S5 Modal Logic’]. Logique et Analyse, vol. 1, pp. 28-44.
  • Bayart, A. 1959. ‘Quasi-Adéquation de la Logique Modale du Second Ordre S5 et Adéquation de la Logique Modale du Premier Ordre S5’ ['Quasi-Completeness of Second-Order S5 Modal Logic and Completeness of First-Order S5 Modal Logic’]. Logique et Analyse, vol. 2, pp. 99-121.
  • Bochenski, I.M. 1948. Precis de Logique Mathematique. Bussum, Pays-Bas: Kroonder.
  • Carnap, R. 1946. ‘Modalities and Quantification’. The Journal of Symbolic Logic, vol. 11, pp.33-64.
  • Copeland, B.J. (ed.) 1996. Logic and Reality: Essays on the Legacy of Arthur Prior. Oxford: Clarendon Press.
  • Copeland, B.J. 2002. ‘The Genesis of Possible Worlds Semantics’. Journal of Philosophical Logic, vol.31, pp. 99-137.
  • Cresswell, M., Crossley, J.N. (eds), 1989. ‘Prior Postscript’. Unpublished. (An edited transcript of a panel discussion concerning Prior held at the 1981 Annual Conference of the Australasian Association for Logic.)
  • Findlay, J.N. 1933. Meinong's Theory of Objects. Oxford: Clarendon Press.
  • Findlay, J.N. 1941.‘Time: A Treatment of Some Puzzles’. Australasian Journal of Psychology and Philosophy, vol.19, pp.216-35.
  • Flew, A. (ed.) 1951. Essays on Logic and Language. Oxford: Blackwell.
  • Geach, P. 1970. ‘Arthur Prior: A Personal Impression’. Theoria, vol. 36, pp.186-8.
  • Grimshaw, M. 2002. ‘The Prior Prior: Neglected Early Writings of Arthur N. Prior’. Heythrop Journal, vol. 43, pp. 480-95.
  • Hilbert, D., Ackermann, W. 1928. Grundzüge der Theoretischen Logik [Principles of Mathematical Logic]. Berlin: Julius Springer.
  • Hintikka K.J.J. 1958. ‘Review of Time and Modality’. Philosophical Review, vol. 67, pp.401-4.
  • Hintikka, K.J.J. 1957. Quantifiers in Deontic Logic. Societas Scientiarum Fennica, Commentationes Humanarum Litterarum, vol. XXIII:4, Helsinki.
  • Hintikka, K.J.J. 1961. ‘Modality and Quantification’. Theoria, vol. 27, pp.119-28.
  • Hughes, G.E. 1971. ‘Arthur Prior (1914-1969)’. Australasian Journal of Philosophy, vol. 49, pp.241-3.
  • Johnson, W.E. 1921-24. Logic. Vols 1-3. Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.
  • Jónsson, B., Tarski, A. 1951. ‘Boolean Algebras With Operators, Part I’. American Journal of Mathematics, vol. 73, pp. 891-939.
  • Jónsson, B., Tarski, A. 1952. ‘Boolean Algebras With Operators, Part II’. American Journal of Mathematics, vol. 74, pp. 127-162.
  • Jordan, A.A. 1945. The Development of Mathematical Logic and of Logical Positivism in Poland between the Two Wars. Oxford: Oxford University Press.
  • Kanger, S. 1957. Provability in Logic. Stockholm: Almqvist and Wiksell.
  • Kenny, A. 1970. ‘Arthur Norman Prior’. Proceedings of the British Academy, vol. LVI, pp.321-349.
  • Keynes, J.N. 1906. Studies and Exercises in Formal Logic. London: Macmillan.
  • Kripke, S.A. 1959a. ‘A Completeness Theorem in Modal Logic’. The Journal of Symbolic Logic, vol. 24, pp.1-14.
  • Kripke, S.A. 1959b. ‘Semantical Analysis of Modal Logic’. (Abstract) The Journal of Symbolic Logic, vol. 24, pp.323-4.
  • Kripke, S.A. 1963. ‘Semantical Analysis of Modal Logic I: Normal Modal Propositional Calculi’. Zeitschr. f. math. Logik und Grundlagen d. Math., vol. 9, pp.67-96.
  • Lewis, C.I., Langford, C.H. 1932. Symbolic Logic. London: Century.
  • Łukasiewicz, J. 1920. ‘On Three-Valued Logic’. Ruch Filozoficzny, vol. 5, pp.170-1. English translation in Borkowski, L. (ed.) 1970. Jan Łukasiewicz: Selected Works. Amsterdam: North Holland.
  • Łukasiewicz, J. 1948. ‘The Shortest Axiom of the Implicational Calculus of Propositions’. Proceedings of the Royal Irish Academy, vol. 52, pp.25-33.
  • Łukasiewicz, J. 1951. Aristotle's Syllogistic From the Standpoint of Modern Formal Logic. Oxford: Clarendon Press.
  • Marcus, R. C. Barcan 1946. ‘A Functional Calculus of First Order Based on Strict Implication’. Journal of Symbolic Logic, vol. 11, pp.1-16.
  • Marcus, R. C. Barcan 1962. ‘Interpreting Quantification’. Inquiry, vol. 5, pp.252-9.
  • Mates, B. 1953. Stoic Logic. Berkeley: University of California Press.
  • Meredith, C.A., Prior, A.N. 1956. ‘Interpretations of Different Modal Logics in the “Property Calculus”’. In Copeland, B.J. (ed.) 1996. Logic and Reality: Essays on the Legacy of Arthur Prior. Oxford: Clarendon Press.
  • Meredith, C.A., Prior, A.N. 1965. ‘Modal Logic With Functorial Variables and a Contingent Constant’. Notre Dame Journal of Formal Logic, vol. 6, pp.99-109.
  • Meredith, D. 1977. ‘In Memoriam: Carew Arthur Meredith (1904-1976)’. Notre Dame Journal of Formal Logic, vol. 18, pp.513-16.
  • Øhrstrøm, P., Hasle, P. 1993. ‘A.N. Prior's Rediscovery of Tense Logic’. Erkenntnis, vol. 39, pp.23-50.
  • Øhrstrøm, P., Hasle, P. 1995. Temporal Logic: From Ancient Ideas to Artificial Intelligence. Dordrecht: Kluwer.
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My sources for this essay—other than Prior's papers and correspondence, which are held in the Bodleian Library, Oxford, and his published work—are: conversations and/or correspondence with: Jonathan Bennett, Colin Brown, Robert Bull, Nino Cocchiarella, Vincent Denard, John Faris, Dov Gabbay, Peter Geach, Jaakko Hintikka, George Hughes, Hans Kamp, Saul Kripke, Peter Øhrstrøm, Mary Prior, Stephen Read, Dana Scott, Krister Segerberg, Jack Smart, Richard Sylvan, Jim Thornton, Jim Wilson, Georg Henrik von Wright; Kenny (1970); Cresswell and Crossley (1989) (which is an unpublished edited transcript of a panel discussion concerning Prior held at the 1981 Annual Conference of the Australasian Association for Logic in Wellington; the participants were Robert Bull, Martin Bunder, Max Cresswell, John Crossley, Charles Hamblin, George Hughes, John Kalman, David Lewis, Michael McRobbie, Wilf Malcolm, Ken Pledger, Tom Richards, Krister Segerberg and Pavel Tichy); Hughes (1971); Thomas (1968, 1971); Geach (1970); Meredith (1977); and the Annual Calendars of Canterbury University College. A number of people commented helpfully on earlier versions of this material: Colin Brown, Per Hasle, George Hughes, Saul Kripke, David Lewis, Peter Øhrstrøm, Diane Proudfoot, Stephen Read, Krister Segerberg, Miriam Solomon, and Bob Stoothoff.

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B. Jack Copeland <>

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