The term “privacy” is used frequently in ordinary language as well as in philosophical, political and legal discussions, yet there is no single definition or analysis or meaning of the term. The concept of privacy has broad historical roots in sociological and anthropological discussions about how extensively it is valued and preserved in various cultures. Moreover, the concept has historical origins in well known philosophical discussions, most notably Aristotle's distinction between the public sphere of political activity and the private sphere associated with family and domestic life. Yet historical use of the term is not uniform, and there remains confusion over the meaning, value and scope of the concept of privacy.
Early treatises on privacy appeared with the development of privacy protection in American law from the 1890's onward, and privacy protection was justified largely on moral grounds. This literature helps distinguish descriptive accounts of privacy, describing what is in fact protected as private, from normative accounts of privacy defending its value and the extent to which it should be protected. In these discussions some treat privacy as an interest with moral value, while others refer to it as a moral or legal right that ought to be protected by society or the law. Clearly one can be insensitive to another's privacy interests without violating any right to privacy, if there is one.
There are several skeptical and critical accounts of privacy. According to one well known argument there is no right to privacy and there is nothing special about privacy, because any interest protected as private can be equally well explained and protected by other interests or rights, most notably rights to property and bodily security (Thomson, 1975). Other critiques argue that privacy interests are not distinctive because the personal interests they protect are economically inefficient (Posner, 1981) or that they are not grounded in any adequate legal doctrine (Bork, 1990). Finally, there is the feminist critique of privacy, that granting special status to privacy is detrimental to women and others because it is used as a shield to dominate and control them, silence them, and cover up abuse (MacKinnon, 1989).
Nevertheless, most theorists take the view that privacy is a meaningful and valuable concept. Philosophical debates concerning definitions of privacy became prominent in the second half of the twentieth century, and are deeply affected by the development of privacy protection in the law. Some defend privacy as focusing on control over information about oneself (Parent, 1983), while others defend it as a broader concept required for human dignity (Bloustein, 1964), or crucial for intimacy (Gerstein, 1978; Inness, 1992). Other commentators defend privacy as necessary for the development of varied and meaningful interpersonal relationships (Fried, 1970, Rachels, 1975), or as the value that accords us the ability to control the access others have to us (Gavison, 1980; Allen, 1988; Moore, 2003), or as a set of norms necessary not only to control access but also to enhance personal expression and choice (Schoeman, 1992), or some combination of these (DeCew, 1997). Discussion of the concept is complicated by the fact that privacy appears to be something we value to provide a sphere within which we can be free from interference by others, and yet it also appears to function negatively, as the cloak under which one can hide domination, degradation, or physical harm to women and others.
This essay will discuss all of these topics, namely, (1) the historical roots of the concept of privacy, including the development of privacy protection in tort and constitutional law, and the philosophical responses that privacy is merely reducible to other interests or is a coherent concept with fundamental value, (2) the critiques of privacy as a right, (3) the wide array of philosophical definitions or defenses of privacy as a concept, providing alternative views on the meaning and value of privacy (and whether or not it is culturally relative), as well as (4) the challenges to privacy posed in an age of technological advance. Overall, most writers defend the value of privacy protection despite the difficulties inherent in its definition and its potential use to shield abuse. A contemporary collection of essays on privacy provides strong evidence to support this point (Paul et al., 2000). The contributing authors examine various aspects of the right to privacy and its role in moral philosophy, legal theory, and public policy. They also address justifications and foundational arguments for privacy rights.
- 1. History
- 2. Critiques of Privacy
- 3. Views on the Meaning and Value of Privacy
- 4. Privacy and Technology
- Academic Tools
- Other Internet Resources
- Related Entries
Aristotle's distinction between the public sphere of politics and political activity, the polis, and the private or domestic sphere of the family, the oikos, as two distinct spheres of life, is a classic reference to a private domain. The public/private distinction is also sometimes taken to refer to the appropriate realm of governmental authority as opposed to the realm reserved for self-regulation, along the lines described by John Stuart Mill in his essay, On Liberty. Furthermore, the distinction arises again in Locke's discussion of property in his Second Treatise on Government. In the state of nature all the world's bounty is held in common and is in that sense public. But one possesses oneself and one's own body, and one can also acquire property by mixing one's labor with it, and in these cases it is one's private property. Margaret Mead and other anthropologists have demonstrated the ways various cultures protect privacy through concealment, seclusion or by restricting access to secret ceremonies (Mead, 1949). Alan Westin (1967) has surveyed studies of animals demonstrating that a desire for privacy is not restricted to humans. However, what is termed private in these multiple contexts varies. Privacy can refer to a sphere separate from government, a domain inappropriate for governmental interference, forbidden views and knowledge, solitude, or restricted access, to list just a few.
More systematic written discussion of the concept of privacy is often said to begin with the famous essay by Samuel Warren and Louis Brandeis titled “The Right to Privacy” (Warren and Brandeis, 1890). Citing “political, social, and economic changes” and a recognition of “the right to be let alone” they argued that existing law afforded a way to protect the privacy of the individual, and they sought to explain the nature and extent of that protection. Focusing in large part on the press and publicity allowed by recent inventions such as photography and newspapers, but referring as well to violations in other contexts, they emphasized the invasion of privacy brought about by public dissemination of details relating to a person's private life. Warren and Brandeis felt a variety of existing cases could be protected under a more general right to privacy which would protect the extent to which one's thoughts, sentiments, and emotions could be shared with others. Urging that they were not attempting to protect the items produced, or intellectual property, but rather the peace of mind attained with such protection, they said the right to privacy was based on a principle of “inviolate personality” which was part of a general right of immunity of the person, “the right to one's personality” (Warren and Brandeis 1890, 195, 215). The privacy principle, they believed, was already part of common law and the protection of one's home as one's castle, but new technology made it important to explicitly and separately recognize this protection under the name of privacy. They suggested that limitations of the right could be determined by analogy with the law of slander and libel, and would not prevent publication of information about public officials running for office, for example. Warren and Brandeis thus laid the foundation for a concept of privacy that has come to be known as control over information about oneself.
Although the first cases after the publication of their paper did not recognize a privacy right, soon the public and both state and federal courts were endorsing and expanding the right to privacy. In an attempt to systematize and more clearly describe and define the new right of privacy being upheld in tort law, William Prosser wrote in 1960 that what had emerged were four different interests in privacy. Not claiming to be providing an exact definition, and admitting that there had been confusion and inconsistencies in the development of privacy protection in the law, Prosser nevertheless described the four “rather definite” privacy rights as follows:
- Intrusion upon a person's seclusion or solitude, or into his private affairs.
- Public disclosure of embarrassing private facts about an individual.
- Publicity placing one in a false light in the public eye.
- Appropriation of one's likeness for the advantage of another (Prosser 1960, 389).
Prosser noted that the intrusion in the first privacy right had expanded beyond physical intrusion, and pointed out that Warren and Brandeis had been concerned primarily with the second privacy right. Nevertheless, Prosser felt that both real abuses and public demand had led to general acceptance of these four types of privacy invasions. On his view, answers to three main questions were at the time as yet unclear: i) whether appearance in public implied forfeiture of privacy, ii) whether facts part of a “public record” could still be private, and iii) whether a significant lapse of time affected the privacy of revelations. Note that Warren and Brandeis were writing their normative views about what they felt should be protected under the rubric of privacy, whereas Prosser was describing what courts had in fact protected in the 70 years following publication of the Warren and Brandeis paper. Thus it is not surprising that their descriptions of privacy differ. Because the Supreme Court has been explicit in ruling that privacy is a central reason for Fourth Amendment protection, privacy as control over information about oneself has come to be viewed by many as also including protection against unwarranted searches, eavesdropping, surveillance, and appropriation and misuses of one's communications. Thomas Nagel (2002) gives a more contemporary discussion of privacy, concealment, publicity and exposure.
Despite the well-established protection of tort privacy to control information about oneself in the courts, and the almost universal acceptance of the value of informational privacy by philosophers and the populace, Abraham L. Newman (2008) and others have persuasively argued that the United States (US), and multiple countries in Asia, has developed a limited system of privacy protection that focuses on self-regulation within industry and government so that personal information is often readily available. In contrast, the European Union (EU) and others have adopted an alternative vision highlighting consumer protection and individual privacy against the economic interests of firms and public officials. This latter model developed from comprehensive rules about data privacy enacted in the EU's Data Protection Directive in 1995, now adopted in some form by all 27 EU nations. European-style privacy protection regulations have spread rapidly across the industrial world, with the United States as a major exception, and have transformed and led the global privacy debate, while the US has relied on a more laissez-faire mentality about protection of personal information and a patchwork of privacy guidelines. This patchwork includes privacy regulations on student records, video rentals, the Children's Online Privacy Protection Act (COPPA, 2000), the Health Insurance Portability and Accountability Act (HIPPA, 2006) and more.
The European Union empowered individual privacy commissioners or group agencies that had technical expertise, were given governmental authority, and were able to form political coalitions to lobby successfully for enhanced individual privacy protection, requiring that personal information not be collected or used for purposes other than those initially intended without individual consent, and so on. This contrasts sharply with the American approach allowing entities such as insurance companies and employers ample access to personal information not covered by the separate privacy guidelines, given a lack of governmental support for more comprehensive privacy legislation and a more fragmented political system. The US has generally stood behind efficiency arguments that business and government need unfettered access to personal data to guarantee economic growth and national security, whereas the EU has sent a coherent signal that privacy has critical value in a robust information society because citizens will only participate in an online environment if they feel their privacy is guaranteed against ubiquitous business and government surveillance.
In 1965 a quite different right to privacy, independent of informational privacy and the Fourth Amendment, was recognized explicitly by the Supreme Court. It is now commonly called the constitutional right to privacy. The right was first announced in the Griswold v. Connecticut (381 U.S. 479) case, which overturned convictions of the Director of Planned Parenthood and a doctor at Yale Medical School for dispersing contraceptive related information, instruction, and medical advice to married persons. The constitutional right to privacy was described by Justice William O. Douglas as protecting a zone of privacy covering the social institution of marriage and the sexual relations of married persons. Despite controversy over Douglas' opinion, the constitutional privacy right was soon cited to overturn a ban against interracial marriage, to allow individuals to possess obscene matter in their own homes, and to allow distribution of contraceptive devices to individuals, both married and single. The most famous application of this right to privacy was as one justification of abortion rights defended in 1973 in Roe v. Wade (410 U.S. 113) and subsequent decisions on abortion. While Douglas vaguely called it a “penumbral” right “emanating” from the Constitution, and the Court has been unable to clearly define the right, it has generally been viewed as a right protecting one's individual interest in independence in making certain important and personal decisions about one's family, life and lifestyle. Which personal decisions have been protected by this privacy right has varied depending on the makeup of the Court. In 1986 in Bowers v. Hardwick (478 U.S. 186) privacy was not held to cover a ban on anti-sodomy laws in Georgia, despite the intimate sexual relations involved.
Criticism of the constitutional right to privacy has continued, particularly in the popular press, Roe v. Wade may be in jeopardy, and many viewed the Bowers decision as evidence of the demise of the constitutional right to privacy. Yet in 2003 in Lawrence v. Texas (538 U.S. 918), the Supreme Court ruled 5–4 that a Texas statute making it a crime for two people of the same sex to engage in certain intimate behavior violated the guarantee of equal protection and vital interests in liberty and privacy protected by the due process clause of the Constitution, thus overruling Bowers v. Hardwick. Jean L. Cohen (2002) gives a theoretical defense of this inclusive view of the constitutional right to privacy. She defends a constructivist approach to privacy rights and intimacy, arguing that privacy rights protect personal autonomy and that a constitutionally protected right to privacy is indispensable for a modern conception of reason and her interpretation of autonomy.
One way of understanding the growing literature on privacy is to view it as divided into two main categories, which we may call reductionism and coherentism. Reductionists are generally critical of privacy, while coherentists defend the coherent fundamental value of privacy interests. Ferdinand Schoeman (1984) introduced somewhat different terminology which makes it easier to understand this distinction. According to Schoeman, a number of authors have believed
…there is something fundamental, integrated, and distinctive about the concerns traditionally grouped together under the rubric of “privacy issues.” In opposing this position, some have argued that the cases labeled “privacy issues” are diverse and disparate, and hence are only nominally or superficially connected. Others have argued that when privacy claims are to be defended morally, the justifications must allude ultimately to principles which can be characterized quite independently of any concern with privacy. Consequently, the argument continues, there is nothing morally distinctive about privacy. I shall refer to the position that there is something common to most of the privacy claims as the “coherence thesis.” The position that privacy claims are to be defended morally by principles that are distinctive to privacy I shall label the “distinctiveness thesis.”
Theorists who deny both the coherence thesis and the distinctiveness thesis argue that in each category of privacy claims there are diverse values at stake of the sort common to many other social issues and that these values exhaust privacy claims. The thrust of this complex position is that we could do quite well if we eliminated all talk of privacy and simply defended our concerns in terms of standard moral and legal categories (Schoeman 1984, 5).
These latter theorists, who reject both Schoeman's coherence thesis and distinctiveness thesis, may be referred to as reductionists, for they view what are called privacy concerns as analyzable or reducible to claims of other sorts, such as infliction of emotional distress or property interests. They deny that there is anything useful in considering privacy as a separate concept. They conclude, then, that there is nothing coherent, distinctive or illuminating about privacy interests.
On the other side, more theorists have argued that there is something fundamental and distinctive and coherent about the various claims that have been called privacy interests. On this view, privacy has value as a coherent and fundamental concept, and most individuals recognize it as a useful concept as well. Those who endorse this view may be called coherentists. Nevertheless, it is important to recognize that coherentists have quite diverse, and sometimes overlapping, views on what it is that is distinctive about privacy and what links diverse privacy claims.
Probably the most famous reductionist view of privacy is one from Judith Jarvis Thomson (1975). Noting that there is little agreement on what privacy is, Thomson examines a number of cases that have been thought to be violations of the right to privacy. On closer inspection, however, Thomson believes all those cases can be adequately and equally well explained in terms of violations of property rights or rights over the person, such as a right not to be listened to. Ultimately the right to privacy, on Thomson's view, is merely a cluster of rights. Those rights in the cluster are always overlapped by, and can be fully explained by, property rights or rights to bodily security. The right to privacy, on her view, is “derivative” in the sense that there is no need to find what is common in the cluster of privacy rights. Privacy is derivative in its importance and justification, according to Thomson, as any privacy violation is better understood as the violation of a more basic right. Numerous commentators provide strong arguments against Thomson's critique (Scanlon, 1975; Inness, 1992).
Richard Posner (1981) also presents a critical account of privacy, arguing that the kinds of interests protected under privacy are not distinctive. Moreover, his account is unique because he argues that privacy is protected in ways that are economically inefficient. With respect to information, on Posner's view privacy should only be protected when access to the information would reduce its value (e.g. allowing students access to their letters of recommendation make those letters less reliable and thus less valuable, and hence they should remain confidential or private). Focusing on privacy as control over information about oneself, Posner argues that concealment or selective disclosure of information is usually to mislead or manipulate others, or for private economic gain, and thus protection of individual privacy is less defensible than others have thought because it does not maximize wealth. In sum, Posner defends organizational or corporate privacy as more important than personal privacy, because the former is likely to enhance the economy.
Another strong critic of privacy is Robert Bork (1990), whose criticism is aimed at the constitutional right to privacy established by the Supreme Court in 1965. Bork views the Griswold v. Connecticut decision as an attempt by the Supreme Court to take a side on a social and cultural issue, and as an example of bad constitutional law. Bork's attack is focused on Justice William O. Douglas and his majority opinion in Griswold. Bork's major point is that Douglas did not derive the right to privacy from some pre-existing right or from natural law, but merely created a new right to privacy with no foundation in the Constitution or Bill of Rights. Bork is correct that the word “privacy” never appears in those documents. Douglas had argued, however, that the right to privacy could be seen to be based on guarantees from the First, Third, Fourth, Fifth, and Ninth Amendments. Taken together, the protections afforded by these Amendments showed that a basic zone of privacy was protected for citizens, and that it covered their ability to make personal decisions about their home and family life. In contrast, Bork argues i) that none of the Amendments cited covered the case before the Court, ii) that the Supreme Court never articulated or clarified what the right to privacy was or how far it extended, and he charges iii) that the privacy right merely protected what a majority of justices personally wanted it to cover. In sum, he accuses Douglas and the Court majority of inventing a new right, and thus overstepping their bounds as judges by making new law, not interpreting the law. Bork's views continue to be defended by others, in politics and in the popular press.
Theorists including William Parent (1983) and Judith Thomson (1975) argue that the constitutional right to privacy is not really a privacy right, but is more aptly described as a right to liberty. Other commentators believe, to the contrary, that even if Douglas' opinion is flawed in its defense, using vague language about a penumbral privacy right emanating from the Constitution and its Amendments, there is nevertheless a historically and conceptually coherent notion of privacy, distinct from liberty, carved out by the constitutional privacy cases (Inness, 1992; Schoeman, 1992; Johnson, 1994; DeCew, 1997).
In response to Bork's complaint that constitutional privacy protection is not at all about privacy but only concerns liberty or autonomy, it has been successfully argued that while we have multiple individual liberties such as freedom of expression, many do not seem to be about anything particularly personal or related to the types of concerns we might be willing and able to see as privacy issues. If so, then liberty is a broader concept than privacy and privacy issues and claims are a subset of claims to liberty. In support of this view, philosophical and legal commentators have urged that privacy protects liberty, and that privacy protection gains for us the freedom to define ourselves and our relations to others (Allen, 2011; DeCew, 1997; Reiman, 1976, 2004; Schoeman, 1984, 1992).
A moving account supporting this view—understanding privacy as a necessary and an indispensable condition for freedom—comes from literature, here a quotation from Milan Kundera.
But one day in 1970 or 1971, with the intent to discredit Prochazka, the police began to broadcast these conversations [with Professor Vaclav Cerny, with whom he liked to drink and talk] as a radio serial. For the police it was an audacious, unprecedented act. And, surprisingly: it nearly succeeded; instantly Prochazka was discredited: because in private, a person says all sorts of things, slurs friends, uses coarse language, acts silly, tells dirty jokes, repeats himself, makes a companion laugh by shocking him with outrageous talk, floats heretical ideas he'd never admit in public, and so forth. Of course, we all act like Prochazka, in private we bad-mouth our friends and use coarse language; that we act different in private than in public is everyone's most conspicuous experience, it is the very ground of the life of the individual; curiously, this obvious fact remains unconscious, unacknowledged, forever obscured by lyrical dreams of the transparent glass house, it is rarely understood to be the value one must defend beyond all others. Thus only gradually did people realize (though their rage was all the greater) that the real scandal was not Prochazka's daring talk but the rape of his life; they realized (as if by electric shock) that private and public are two essentially different worlds and that respect for that difference is the indispensable condition, the sine qua non, for a man to live free; that the curtain separating these two worlds is not to be tampered with, and that curtain-rippers are criminals. And because the curtain-rippers were serving a hated regime, they were unanimously held to be particularly contemptible criminals. (Kundera, 1984, 261)
It is not difficult to see the analogies between Kundera's scenario and electronic surveillance and street cameras common in society today. There is more detailed evidence that privacy and liberty are distinct concepts, that liberty is a broader notion, and that privacy is essential for protecting liberty. We have many forms of liberty that do not appear to have anything to do with what we might value as private and inappropriate for government intervention for personal reasons. The right to travel from state to state without a passport, for example, seems to be a freedom far different from freedom to make decisions about personal and intimate concerns about one's body – such as contraception use, abortion choice, sterilization (Buck v. Bell, 274 U.S. 200, 1927) and vasectomies (Skinner v, Oklahoma 316 U.S. 535, 1942, striking down a statute mandating sterilizations for those who commit three felonies). It is clear that the U.S. Supreme Court has recognized this by saying that the constitutional privacy cases are about a second interest in privacy, namely an “individual interest in making certain kinds of important decisions” (Whalen v. Roe, 429 U.S. 589, 1977).
There is no single version of the feminist critique of privacy, yet it can be said in general that many feminists worry about the darker side of privacy, and the use of privacy as a shield to cover up domination, degradation and abuse of women and others. If distinguishing public and private realms leaves the private domain free from any scrutiny, then these feminists such as Catharine MacKinnon (1989) are correct that privacy can be dangerous for women when it is used to cover up repression and physical harm to them by perpetuating the subjection of women in the domestic sphere and encouraging nonintervention by the state. Jean Bethke Elshtain (1981, 1995) and others suggest that it appears feminists such as MacKinnon are for this reason rejecting the public/private split, and are, moreover, recommending that feminists and others jettison or abandon privacy altogether. But, Elshtain points out, this alternative seems too extreme.
A more reasonable view, according to Anita Allen (1988), is to recognize that while privacy can be a shield for abuse, it is unacceptable to reject privacy completely based on harm done in private. A total rejection of privacy makes everything public, and leaves the domestic sphere open to complete scrutiny and intrusion by the state. Yet women surely have an interest in privacy that can protect them from state imposed sterilization programs or government imposed drug tests for pregnant women mandating results sent to police, for instance, and that can provide reasonable regulations such as granting rights against marital rape. Thus collapsing the public/private dichotomy into a single public realm is inadequate. What puzzles feminists is how to make sense of an important and valuable notion of privacy that provides them a realm free from scrutiny and intervention by the state, without reverting to the traditional public/private dichotomy that has in the past relegated women to the private and domestic sphere where they are victims of abuse and subjection. The challenge is to find a way for the state to take very seriously the domestic abuse that used to be allowed in the name of privacy, while also preventing the state from insinuating itself into all the most intimate parts of women's lives. This means drawing new boundaries for justified state intervention and thus understanding the public/private distinction in new ways.
Narrow views of privacy focusing on control over information about oneself that were defended by Warren and Brandeis and by William Prosser are also endorsed by more recent commentators including Fried (1970) and Parent (1983). In addition, Alan Westin describes privacy as the ability to determine for ourselves when, how, and to what extent information about us is communicated to others (Westin, 1967). Perhaps the best example of a contemporary defense of this view is put forth by William Parent. Parent explains that he proposes to defend a view of privacy that is consistent with ordinary language and does not overlap or confuse the basic meanings of other fundamental terms. He defines privacy as the condition of not having undocumented personal information known or possessed by others. Parent stresses that he is defining the condition of privacy, as a moral value for people who prize individuality and freedom, and not a moral or legal right to privacy. Personal information is characterized by Parent as factual (otherwise it would be covered by libel, slander or defamation), and these are facts that most persons choose not to reveal about themselves, such as facts about health, salary, weight, sexual orientation, etc. Personal information is documented, on Parent's view, only when it belongs to the public record, that is, in newspapers, court records, or other public documents. Thus, once information becomes part of a public record, there is no privacy invasion in future releases of the information, even years later or to a wide audience, nor does snooping or surveillance intrude on privacy if no undocumented information is gained. In cases where no new information is acquired, Parent views the intrusion as irrelevant to privacy, and better understood as an abridgment of anonymity, trespass, or harassment. Furthermore, what has been described above as the constitutional right to privacy, is viewed by Parent as better understood as an interest in liberty, not privacy. In sum, there is a loss of privacy on Parent's view, only when others acquire undocumented personal information about an individual. DeCew (1997) gives a detailed critique of Parent's position.
In an article written mainly as a defense of Warren and Brandeis' paper and as a response to William Prosser, Edward J. Bloustein (1964) argues that there is a common thread in the diverse legal cases protecting privacy. According to Bloustein, Warren and Brandeis failed to give a positive description of privacy, however they were correct that there was a single value connecting the privacy interests, a value they called “inviolate personality.” On Bloustein's view it is possible to give a general theory of individual privacy that reconciles its divergent strands, and “inviolate personality” is the social value protected by privacy. It defines one's essence as a human being and it includes individual dignity and integrity, personal autonomy and independence. Respect for these values is what grounds and unifies the concept of privacy. Discussing each of Prosser's four types of privacy rights in turn, Bloustein defends the view that each of these privacy rights is important because it protects against intrusions demeaning to personality and against affronts to human dignity. Using this analysis, Bloustein explicitly links the privacy rights in tort law described by Prosser with privacy protection under the Fourth Amendment. He urges that both leave an individual open to scrutiny in a way that leaves one's autonomy and sense of oneself as a person vulnerable, violating one's human dignity and moral personality. The common conceptual thread linking diverse privacy cases prohibiting dissemination of confidential information, eavesdropping, surveillance, and wiretapping, to name a few, is the value of protection against injury to individual freedom and human dignity. Invasion of privacy is best understood, in sum, as affront to human dignity. Although Bloustein admits the terms are somewhat vague, he defends this analysis as conceptually coherent and illuminating.
A more common view has been to argue that privacy and intimacy are deeply related. On one account, privacy is valuable because intimacy would be impossible without it (Fried, 1970; Gerety 1977; Gerstein, 1978; Cohen, 2002). Fried, for example, defines privacy narrowly as control over information about oneself. He extends this definition, however, arguing that privacy has intrinsic value, and is necessarily related to and fundamental for one's development as an individual with a moral and social personality able to form intimate relationships involving respect, love, friendship and trust. Privacy is valuable because it allows one control over information about oneself, which allows one to maintain varying degrees of intimacy. Indeed, love, friendship and trust are only possible if persons enjoy privacy and accord it to each other. Privacy is essential for such relationships on Fried's view, and this helps explain why a threat to privacy is a threat to our very integrity as persons. By characterizing privacy as a necessary context for love, friendship and trust, Fried is basing his account on a moral conception of persons and their personalities, on a Kantian notion of the person with basic rights and the need to define and pursue one's own values free from the impingement of others. Privacy allows one the freedom to define one's relations with others and to define oneself. In this way, privacy is also closely connected with respect and self respect.
Gerstein (1978) argues as well that privacy is necessary for intimacy, and intimacy in communication and interpersonal relationships is required for us to fully experience our lives. Intimacy without intrusion or observation is required for us to have experiences with spontaneity and without shame. Shoeman (1984) endorses these views and stresses that privacy provides a way to control intimate information about oneself and that has many other benefits, not only for relationships with others, but also for the development of one's personality and inner self. Julie Inness (1992) has identified intimacy as the defining feature of intrusions properly called privacy invasions. Inness argues that intimacy is based not on behavior, but on motivation. Inness believes that intimate information or activity is that which draws its meaning from love, liking, or care. It is privacy that protects one's ability to retain intimate information and activity so that one can fulfill one's needs of loving and caring.
A number of commentators defend views of privacy that link closely with accounts stressing privacy as required for intimacy, emphasizing not just intimacy but also more generally the importance of developing diverse interpersonal relationships with others. Rachels (1975) acknowledges there is no single answer to the question why privacy is important to us, because it can be necessary to protect one's assets or interests, or to protect one from embarrassment, or to protect one against the deleterious consequences of information leaks, to name just a few. Nevertheless, he explicitly criticizes Thomson's reductionist view, and urges that privacy is a distinctive right. He basically defends the view that privacy is necessary to maintain a variety of social relationships, not just intimate ones. Privacy accords us the ability to control who knows what about us and who has access to us, and thereby allows us to vary our behavior with different people so that we may maintain and control our various social relationships, many of which will not be intimate. An intriguing part of Rachels' analysis of privacy is that it emphasizes ways in which privacy is not merely limited to control over information. Our ability to control both information and access to us allows us to control our relationships with others. Hence privacy is also connected to our behavior and activities.
Another group of theorists characterize privacy in terms of access. Some commentators describe privacy as exclusive access of a person to a realm of his or her own, and Sissela Bok (1982) argues that privacy protects us from unwanted access by others — either physical access or personal information or attention. Ruth Gavison (1980) defends this more expansive view of privacy in greater detail, arguing that interests in privacy are related to concerns over accessibility to others, that is, what others know about us, the extent to which they have physical access to us, and the extent to which we are the subject of the attention of others. Thus the concept of privacy is best understood as a concern for limited accessibility and one has perfect privacy when one is completely inaccessible to others. Privacy can be gained in three independent but interrelated ways: through secrecy, when no one has information about one, through anonymity, when no one pays attention to one, and through solitude, when no one has physical access to one. Gavison's view is that the concept of privacy is this complex of concepts all part of the notion of accessibility. Furthermore, the concept is also coherent because of the related functions privacy has, namely “the promotion of liberty, autonomy, selfhood, human relations, and furthering the existence of a free society” (Gavison 1980, 347).
Carefully reviewing these various views, Anita Allen (1988) also characterizes privacy as denoting a degree of inaccessibility of persons, their mental states, and information about them to the senses and surveillance of others. She views seclusion, solitude, secrecy, confidentiality, and anonymity as forms of privacy. She also urges that privacy is required by the liberal ideals of personhood, and the participation of citizens as equals. While her view appears to be similar to Gavison's, Allen suggests her restricted access view is broader than Gavison's. This is in part because Allen emphasizes that in public and private women experience privacy losses that are unique to their gender. Noting that privacy is neither a presumptive moral evil nor an unquestionable moral good, Allen nevertheless defends more extensive privacy protection for women in morality and the law. Using examples such as sexual harassment, victim anonymity in rape cases, and reproductive freedom, Allen emphasizes the moral significance of extending privacy protection for women. In some ways her account can be viewed as one reply to the feminist critique of privacy, allowing that privacy can be a shield for abuse, but can also be so valuable for women that privacy protection should be enhanced, not diminished.
Most recently, Adam Moore (2003), building on the views of Gavison, Allen and others, offers a “control over access” account of privacy. According to Moore, privacy is a culturally and species relative right to a level of control over access to bodies or places and information. While defending the view that privacy is relative to species and culture, Moore argues that privacy is objectively valuable — human beings that do not obtain a certain level of control over access will suffer in various ways. Moore claims that privacy, like education, health, and maintaining social relationships, is an essential part of human flourishing or well-being.
There is a further issue that has generated disagreement, even among those theorists who believe privacy is a coherent concept. The question is whether or not the constitutional right to privacy, and the constitutional privacy cases described involving personal decisions about lifestyle and family including birth control, interracial marriage, viewing pornography at home, abortion, and so on, delineate a genuine category of privacy issues, or merely raise questions about liberty of some sort. Parent (1983) explicitly excludes concerns about one's ability to make certain important personal decisions about one's family and lifestyle as genuine privacy issues, saying the constitutional right to privacy cases focus solely on liberty. Among the others who take this view are Henkin (1974), Thomson (1975), Gavison (1980), and Bork (1990). Allen (1988) defines privacy in terms of access and excludes from her definition protection of individual autonomous choice from governmental interference, which she terms a form of liberty. Yet she refers to this latter protection as “decisional privacy” and says determining its category is purely a definitional point and one of labels. Ultimately she believes interference with decisions involving procreation and sexuality raise the same moral concerns as other privacy intrusions, offending the values of personhood. The Supreme Court now claims (Whalen v. Roe, 429 U.S. 589, 1977) that there are two different dimensions to privacy: both control over information about oneself and control over one's ability to make certain important types of decisions.
Following this sort of reasoning, a number of theorists defend the view that privacy has broad scope, inclusive of the multiple types of privacy issues described by the Court, even though there is no simple definition of privacy. Most of these theorists explore the links between the types of privacy interests and the similarity of reasons for valuing each. Some stress that privacy is necessary for one to develop a concept of self as a purposeful, self determining agent. Privacy enables control over personal information as well as control over our bodies and personal choices for our concept of self (Kupfer, 1987). Some emphasize the importance of intimacy for all privacy issues, noting the need for privacy to protect intimate information about oneself, access to oneself, as well as intimate relationships and decisions about one's actions (Inness, 1992). Some focus on the importance of privacy norms that allow one to restrict others' access to them as well as privacy norms that enable and enhance personal expression and the development of relationships. Privacy provides protection against overreaching social control by others through their access to information or their control over decision making (Schoeman, 1992). Some defend a “control over access” account of privacy that includes control over access to bodies as part of the concept of privacy along with access to places and information (Moore, 2003). Others suggest that privacy is best understood as a cluster concept covering interests in i) control over information about oneself, ii) control over access to oneself, both physical and mental, and iii) control over one's ability to make important decisions about family and lifestyle in order to be self expressive and to develop varied relationships (DeCew, 1997). These three interests are related because in each of the three contexts threats of information leaks, threats of control over our bodies, and threats to our power to make our own choices about our lifestyles and activities all make us vulnerable and fearful that we are being scrutinized, pressured or taken advantage of by others. Privacy has moral value because it shields us in all three contexts by providing certain freedom and independence — freedom from scrutiny, prejudice, pressure to conform, exploitation, and the judgment of others.
Yet it has been difficult for philosophers to provide clear guidelines on the positive side of understanding just what privacy protects and why it is important. There has been consensus that the significance of privacy is almost always justified for the individual interests it protects: personal information, personal spaces, and personal choices, protection of freedom and autonomy in a liberal democratic society. (Allen, 2011; Moore, 2010; Reiman 2004; Roessler, 2005). Schoeman (1992) eloquently defended the importance of privacy for protection of self-expression and social freedom. More recent literature has extended this view and has focused on the value of privacy not merely for the individual interests it protects, but also for its irreducibly social value. Concerns over the accessibility and retention of electronic communications and the expansion of camera surveillance have led commentators to focus attention on loss of individual privacy as well as privacy protection with respect to the state and society (Reiman, 2004; Solove, 2008; Nissenbaum, 2010).
Priscilla Regan writes, for example, “I argue that privacy is not only of value to the individual, but also to society in general…..Privacy is a common value in that all individuals value some degree of privacy and have some common perceptions about privacy. Privacy is also a public value in that it has value not just to the individual as an individual or to all individuals in common but also to the democratic political system. Privacy is rapidly becoming a collective value in that technology and market forces are making it hard for any one person to have privacy without all persons having a similar minimum level of privacy” (Regan, 1995, 213). According to Daniel Solove, “By understanding privacy as shaped by the norms of society, we can better see why privacy should not be understood solely as an individual right…. Instead, privacy protects the individual because of the benefits it confers on society.” Moreover, “the value of privacy should be understood in terms of its contribution to society” (Solove, 2008, 98, 171fn.). Solove believes privacy fosters and encourages the moral autonomy of citizens, a central requirement of governance in a democracy. One way of understanding these comments, that privacy not only has intrinsic and extrinsic value to individuals but also has instrumental value to society, is to recognize that these views develop from the earlier philosophical writings (Fried 1970; Rachels, 1975; Schoeman; 1984, 1992) on the value of privacy in that it heightens respect for individual autonomy in decision-making for self-development and individual integrity and human dignity, but also enhances the value of privacy in various social roles and relationships that contribute to a functioning society. According to this contemporary scholarship, privacy norms help regulate social relationships such as intimate relations, family relationships, professional relationships including those between a physician and a patient, a lawyer or accountant and a client, a teacher and a student, and so on. Thus privacy enhances social interaction on a variety of levels. According to Solove, a society without respect for privacy for oneself and others becomes a “suffocating society” (Solove 2008; see also Kundera, 1984).
Schoeman (1984) points out that the question of whether or not privacy is culturally relative can be interpreted in two ways. One question is whether privacy is deemed valuable to all peoples or whether its value is relative to cultural differences. A second question is whether or not there are any aspects of life that are inherently private and not just conventionally so. Most writers have come to agree that while almost all cultures appear to value privacy, cultures differ in their ways of seeking and obtaining privacy, and probably do differ in the level they value privacy (Westin, 1967; Rachels, 1975). Allen (1988) and Moore (2003) are especially sensitive to the ways obligations from different cultures affect perceptions of privacy. There has been far less agreement on the second question. Some argue that matters relating to one's innermost self are inherently private, but characterizing this realm more succinctly and less vaguely has remained an elusive task. Thus it may well be that one of the difficulties in defining the realm of the private is that privacy is a notion that is strongly culturally relative, contingent on such factors as economics as well as technology available in a given cultural domain.
The earliest arguments by Warren and Brandeis for explicit recognition of privacy protection in law were in large part motivated by expanding communication technology such as the development of widely distributed newspapers and multiply printed reproductions of photographs. Similarly Fourth Amendment protection against search and seizure was extended later in the twentieth century to cover telephone wiretaps and electronic surveillance. It is clear that many people still view privacy is a valuable interest and realize it is now threatened more than ever by technological advances. There are massive databases and Internet records of information about individual financial and credit history, medical records, purchases and telephone calls, for example, and most people do not know what information is stored about them or who has access to it. The ability for others to access and link the databases, with few controls on how they use, share, or exploit the information, makes individual control over information about oneself more difficult than ever before.
There are numerous other cases of the clash between privacy and technology. Consider the following new technologies. Caller ID, originally designed to protect people from unwanted calls from harassers, telemarketers, etc., involves privacy concerns for both the caller and the called. There is widespread mandatory and random drug testing of employees and others, and the Supreme Court has said policies requiring all middle and high school students to consent to drug testing in order to participate in extracurricular activities does not violate the Fourth Amendment, although the Court has disallowed mandatory drug tests on pregnant women for use by police. It had seemed that heat sensors aimed at and through walls to detect such things as growing marijuana would be acceptable. However in 2001 in Kyllo v. U.S. (533 U.S. 27), another close 5–4 decision, the Court decided that thermal imaging devices that reveal information previously unknowable without a warrant does constitute a violation of privacy rights and the Fourth Amendment. Surveillance photos are commonly taken of those using Fast Lane, resulting in tickets mailed to speeding offenders, and similar photos are now taken at red lights in San Diego and elsewhere, leading to surprise tickets. Face scanning in Tampa, at casinos, and at large sporting events such as the Super Bowl, matches those photos with database records of felons, resulting in the capture of multiple offenders on the loose but also posing privacy issues for other innocents photographed without their knowledge. Some rental car drivers are now tracked by Global Positioning System (GPS) satellites, enabling car rental companies, not police, to levy stiff fines for speeding. Immigration officials in Australia are considering proposals to tag asylum seekers with electronic trackers before sending them into the community to await hearings. The media has recently uncovered an FBI Web surveillance system called Carnivore, that appears to sample the communications of as many Internet users as it chooses, not just suspects. Echelon is a covert global satellite network said to have the ability to intercept all phone, fax, and e-mail messages in the world, and may have up to 20 international listening posts. Airline passengers will soon be able to go through customs with a two second biometric scan that confirms identity by mapping the iris of the eye, and U.S. airlines are considering using “smart cards” which will identify passengers by their fingerprints. There is a proliferation of biometric identification using faces, eyes, fingerprints, and other body parts for identifying specific individuals, and the technology for matching the information with other databases is advancing quickly. Anton Alterman (2003) discusses various privacy and ethical issues arising from expanding use of biometric identification. For more on some of the other issues noted above, see other articles in Ethics and Information Technology 5, 3 (2003).
For some cases in the clash between privacy and advancing technologies, it is possible to make a compelling argument for overriding the privacy intrusions. Drug and alcohol tests for airline pilots on the job seem completely justifiable in the name of public safety, for example. With the development of new and more sophisticated technology, however, recent work on privacy is examining the ways in which respect for privacy can be balanced with justifiable uses of emerging technology (Agre and Rotenberg, 1997; Austin, 2003; Brin, 1998; Etzioni, 1999, and Ethics and Information Technology, 6, 1, 2004). Daniel Solove (2006) takes seriously the criticism that privacy suffers from an embarrassment of meanings and the concern that new technologies have given rise to a panoply of new privacy harms. He then endeavors to guide the law toward a more coherent understanding of privacy, by developing a taxonomy to identify a wide range of privacy problems comprehensively and completely. Moore argues that privacy claims should carry more weight when in conflict with other social values and interests. For example, he defends the view that employee agreements that undermine employee privacy should be viewed with suspicion, and he argues that laws and legislation prohibiting the genetic modification of humans will unjustifiably trample individual privacy rights (Moore, 2000). He also defends the view that free speech and expression should not be viewed as more important thean privacy (Moore, 1998). Clearly, in the wake of the terrorist attacks on September 11, 2001, the literature on privacy increasingly focuses on how to balance privacy concerns with the need for public safety in an age of terrorism. Moore (2000) argues that views which trade privacy for security typically strike the wrong balance and in many cases undermine both (Moore, 2000). Etzioni and Marsh (2003) provide a varied collection of essays on balancing rights and public safety after 9/11, highlighting views about where the government will need to expand its authority in fighting the war against terrorism, and where it risks overreaching its authority. Revisions to the U.S. Patriot Act and the extent to which President G.W. Bush has exercised his powers to engage in surreptitious electronic surveillance without court-issued warrants in violation of the Foreign Intelligence Surveillance Act (FISA) will lead to further debates on the importance of privacy protection versus governmental power post 9/11. Although the government needs strong powers to protect its citizens, the executive branch also need to provide a strong voice on behalf of civil liberties and individual rights, including privacy.
- Agre, P. and Rotenberg, M., (eds.), 1997, Technology and Privacy: The New Landscape, Cambridge: MIT Press
- Allen, A., 1988, Uneasy Access: Privacy for Women in a Free Society, Totowa, N.J.: Rowman and Littlefield
- –––, 1999. “Coercing Privacy,” William and Mary Law Review 40, 723–57. [Published under last name Allen-Castelitto]
- –––, 2011, Unpopular Privacy: What Must We Hide?, Oxford: Oxford University Press
- Alterman, A., 2003, “‘A Piece of Yourself’: Ethical Issues in Biometric Identification”, Ethics and Information Technology, 5 (3): 139–150
- Austin, L., 2003, “Privacy and the Question of Technology”, Law and Philosophy, 22 (2): 119–166
- Bloustein, E., 1964, “Privacy as an Aspect of Human Dignity: An Answer to Dean Prosser”, New York University Law Review, 39: 962–1007
- Bok, S., 1982, Secrets: On the Ethics of Concealment and Revelation, New York: Pantheon
- Bork, R., 1990, The Tempting of America: The Political Seduction of the Law, New York: Simon and Schuster
- Brin, David, 1998, The Transparent Society: Will Technology Force Us to Choose Between Privacy and Freedom?, Reading, MA: Addison-Wesley
- Cohen, J., 2002, Regulating Intimacy: A New Legal Paradigm, Princeton: Princeton University Press
- Cohen, J. L., 1992, “Redescribing Privacy: Identity, Difference and the Abortion Controversy,” Columbia Journal of Gender and Law 3, 43–117.
- DeCew, J., 1997, In Pursuit of Privacy: Law, Ethics, and the Rise of Technology, Ithaca: Cornell University Press
- Elshtain, J., 1981, Public Man, Private Woman: Women in Social and Political Thought, Princeton: Princeton University Press
- –––, 1995, Democracy on Trial, New York: Basic Books
- Etzioni, A., 1999, The Limits of Privacy, New York: Basic Books
- ––– and Marsh, J., 2003, Rights vs. Public Safety after 9/11, Lanham, MD: Rowman & Littlefield
- Foley, E. P., 2006, Liberty for All: Reclaiming Individual Privacy in a New Era of Public Morality. New Haven: Yale University Press.
- Fried, C., 1970, An Anatomy of Values, Cambridge: Harvard University Press
- Gavison, R., 1980, “Privacy and the Limits of Law”, Yale Law Journal, 89: 421–71
- Gerety, T., 1977, “Redefining Privacy”, Harvard Civil Rights-Civil Liberties Law Review, 12: 233-96
- Gerstein, R., 1978, “Intimacy and Privacy”, Ethics, 89: 76–81
- Henkin, L., 1974, “Privacy and Autonomy”, Columbia Law Review, 74: 1410–33
- Inness, J., 1992, Privacy, Intimacy and Isolation, Oxford: Oxford University Press
- Johnson, J., 1994, “Constitutional Privacy”, Law and Philosophy, 13: 161–193
- Kupfer, J., 1987, “Privacy, Autonomy and Self-Concept”, American Philosophical Quarterly, 24: 81–89
- Kundera, M., 1984, The Unbearable Lightness of Being, New York: Harper Collins
- MacKinnon, C., 1989, Toward a Feminist Theory of the State, Cambridge: Harvard University Press
- Mead, M., 1949, Coming of Age in Samoa, New York: New American Library
- Moore, A., 1998, “Intangible Property: Privacy, Power, and Information Control”, American Philosophical Quarterly 35: 365–378
- –––, 2000, “Employee Monitoring & Computer Technology: Evaluative Surveillance v. Privacy”, Business Ethics Quarterly, 10: 697–709
- –––, 2003, “Privacy: Its Meaning and Value” American Philosophical Quarterly, 40: 215–227
- –––, 2010, Privacy Rights: Moral and Legal Foundations. University Park, PA: Penn State University Press
- Nagel, T., 2002, Concealment and Exposure: And Other Essays, Oxford: Oxford University Press
- Newman, A., 2008,Protectors of Privacy: Regulating Personal Data in the Global Economy, Ithaca and London: Cornell University Press
- Nissenbaum, H., 2010, Privacy in Context: Technology, Policy, and the Integrity of Social Life, Palo Alto, CA: Stanford University Press
- Okin, S. M., 1989, Justice, Gender and the Family. New York: Basic Books.
- Parent, W., 1983, “Privacy, Morality and the Law”, Philosophy and Public Affairs, 12: 269–88
- Pateman, C., 1989, “Feminist Critiques of the Public/Private Dichotomy,” The Disorder of Women: Democracy, Feminism, and Political Theory, Stanford: Stanford University Press.
- Paul, J., Miller, F., and Paul, E., (eds.), 2000, The Right of Privacy, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press
- Pennock, J. and Chapman, J., (eds.), 1971, Privacy, NOMOS XIII, New York: Atherton Press
- Posner, R., 1981, The Economics of Justice, Cambridge: Harvard University Press
- Prosser, W., 1955, Handbook of the Law of Torts, 2nd ed., St. Paul: West
- Prosser, W., 1960, “Privacy”, California Law Review, 48: 383–423.
- Rachels, J., 1975, “Why Privacy is Important”, Philosophy and Public Affairs, 4: 323–33
- Regan, P., 1995, Legislating Privacy, Chapel Hill, NC: University of North Carolina Press.
- Reiman, J., 2004, “Driving to the Panopticon: A Philosophical Exploration of the Risks to Privacy Posed by the Information Technology of the Future,” in Roessler, Beate, ed. Privacies: Philosophical Evaluations, Stanford: Stanford University Press
- –––, 1976, “Privacy, Intimacy, and Personhood,” Philosophy & Public Affairs, 6: 26–44
- Roessler, B., 2005, The Value of Privacy, Cambridge, MA: Polity Press
- Scanlon, T., 1975, “Thomson on Privacy”, Philosophy and Public Affairs, 4: 315–322
- Schoeman, F., (ed.), 1984, Philosophical Dimensions of Privacy: An Anthology, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press
- –––, 1992, Privacy and Social Freedom, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press
- Solove, D., 2006, “A Taxonomy of Privacy”, University of Pennsylvania Law Review, 154: 477–564
- –––, 2008, Understanding Privacy, Cambridge, MA: Harvard University Press.
- Thomson, J., 1975, “The Right to Privacy”, Philosophy and Public Affairs, 4: 295–314
- Turkington, R., Trubow, G., and Allen, A., (eds.), 1992, Privacy: Cases and Materials, Texas: John Marshall
- Westin, A., 1967, Privacy and Freedom, New York: Atheneum
- Warren, S. and Brandeis, L., 1890, “The Right to Privacy,” Harvard Law Review, 4: 193–220.
How to cite this entry. Preview the PDF version of this entry at the Friends of the SEP Society. Look up this entry topic at the Indiana Philosophy Ontology Project (InPhO). Enhanced bibliography for this entry at PhilPapers, with links to its database.
- Machan, Tibor, “The Right to Private Property”, in The Internet Encyclopedia of Philosophy, J. Fieser (University of Tennessee/Martin), editor.
- Online Guide to Privacy Resources, (Electronic Privacy Information Center, Marc Rotenberg, ed.)
autonomy: in moral and political philosophy | feminist (interventions): philosophy of law | legal philosophy | legal rights | liberty: positive and negative | rights | rights: human | tort law, theories of