Theories of Tort Law

First published Mon Sep 22, 2003; substantive revision Thu Aug 26, 2010

Tort is a branch of private law. The other main branches are contract, property, and restitution (sometimes known as unjust enrichment).

Section 1 offers a brief overview of tort law and tort theory. Section 2 discusses economic analysis, which is the historically dominant tort theory and the primary foil for philosophical perspectives on tort law. Section 3 discusses the most influential non-economic tort theories, theories that emphasize such normative concepts as justice, rights, and duties.

1. Overview of Tort Law and Tort Theory

1.1 Tort Law: Basic Features

A tort suit enables the victim of some injury to make her problem someone else's problem. Unlike a criminal case, which is initiated and managed by the state, a tort suit is prosecuted by the victim or the victim's survivors. Moreover, a successful tort suit results not in a sentence of punishment but in a judgment of liability. Such a judgment normally requires the defendant to compensate the plaintiff financially. In principle, an award of compensatory damages shifts all of the plaintiff's legally cognizable costs to the defendant. (It is controversial whether tort really lives up to this principle in practice; see Ross 1970.) On rare occasions, a plaintiff may also be awarded punitive damages, defined as damages in excess of compensatory relief. In other cases, a plaintiff may obtain an injunction: a court order preventing the defendant from injuring her or from invading one of her property rights (perhaps harmlessly).

The law does not recognize just any injury as the basis of a claim in tort. If you beat me in tennis or in competition for the affections of another, I may well be injured. Yet I have no claim in tort to repair my bruised ego or broken heart. Since you lack a legal duty not to beat me in tennis or in competition for the affections of another, you do not act tortiously when you succeed at my expense.

Tort distinguishes between two general classes of duties: (i) duties not to injure ‘full stop’ and (ii) duties not to injure negligently, recklessly, or intentionally. When you engage in an activity the law regards as extremely hazardous (e.g., blasting with dynamite), you are subject to a duty of the first sort — a duty not to injure ‘full stop.’ When you engage in an activity of ordinary riskiness (e.g., driving), you are subject to a duty of the second sort — a duty not to injure negligently, recklessly, or intentionally. Your conduct is governed by strict liability when it flouts a duty not to injure ‘full stop.’ Your conduct is governed by fault liability when it flouts a duty not to injure negligently, recklessly, or intentionally.

1.2 The Difference between Strict Liability and Fault Liability

Strict liability. Suppose I make a mess on my property and present you with the bill for cleaning it up. Absent some prior agreement, this would seem rather odd. It is my mess, after all, not yours. Now suppose that instead of making a mess on my property and presenting you with the bill, I simply move the mess to your property and walk away, claiming that the mess is your problem. If it was inappropriate of me to present you with the bill for the mess I made on my property, it hardly seems that I have improved matters by placing my mess on your property. I have a duty to clean up my messes and the existence of this duty does not appear to depend on how hard I have tried not to make a mess in the first place. This is the underlying intuition expressed by the rule of strict liability.

Fault liability. Unless we stay home all day, we are each bound to make the occasional mess in another's life. This being so, it would be unreasonable of me to demand that you never make any kind of mess in my life. What I can reasonably demand is that you take my interests into account and moderate your behavior accordingly. In particular, I can reasonably demand that you take precautions not to injure me — that you avoid being careless with respect to my interests and, all the more so, that you not injure me intentionally. This is the underlying intuition expressed by the rule of fault liability.

People sometimes misunderstand the nature of fault liability because they equate strict liability in tort with strict liability in the criminal law. Strict liability in the criminal law is a form of responsibility without culpability. If you are strictly liable for a criminal offense, you are punishable for the offense even if your conduct is not morally blameworthy. The standard way to express this is to say that strict liability in criminal law is not defeasible by excuse. If we conceived similarly of strict liability in tort, we would then understand fault liability, incorrectly, as liability that is defeasible by excuse, in other words, as liability (only) for one's culpable conduct. But you can be at fault in tort even if you are morally faultless, that is, even if your conduct is not morally blameworthy. Under a regime of fault liability, you are liable for injuries you cause while failing to comport yourself as a reasonable person of ordinary prudence. It won't get you off the hook that you are not a reasonable person of ordinary prudence. Nor will it matter that your failure to comport yourself as a reasonable person of ordinary prudence is a failure for which you are utterly blameless. Fault liability is simply not defeasible by excuse.

Strict liability is not defeasible by excuse, either. Under neither regime does your liability for a loss depend on your degree of culpability. What distinguishes the two regimes is this: you can avoid fault liability if you comport yourself as a reasonable person of ordinary prudence — in other words, if you act reasonably or justifiably — whereas you remain subject to strict liability even if you act impeccably. Thus, fault liability alone can be undermined by justification.

Some find it helpful to distinguish between strict liability and fault liability in terms of the content of the underlying legal duty. In the case of blasting — an activity traditionally governed by strict liability — the blaster has a duty not-to-injure-by-blasting. In the case of driving — an activity traditionally governed by fault liability — the driver has a duty not-to-injure-by-driving-faultily. No matter how much care he takes, the blaster fails to discharge his duty whenever he injures someone. In contrast, the driver fails to discharge his duty only when he injures someone negligently, recklessly, or intentionally.

Only if we first get clear on the content of a legal duty can we determine an activity's true cost. Suppose a rancher's cows trample a farmer's corn, causing the farmer a financial loss. To what activity should we ascribe this cost? Is it a cost of ranching or a cost of farming? We cannot answer this question just by determining whether crop damage is something that ranching causes. We must first determine whether the rancher owes the farmer a duty. If the rancher has a duty to prevent his cows from trampling the farmer's corn, then the resultant damage is a cost of ranching. But if the rancher has no such duty — if it is the farmer's responsibility to protect his corn crop, say, by building a fence — then, other things being equal, the resultant damage is not a cost of ranching but a cost of farming.

1.3 Theoretical Perspectives on Tort Law

1.3.1 Analytical and Normative

Analytical theories seek to interpret and explain tort law. More specifically, they aim (i) to identify the concepts that figure centrally in tort's substantive norms and structural features (the latter being the procedures and mechanisms by which the institution of tort law enforces its substantive norms) and (ii) to explain how tort's substantive norms and structural features are related. Key substantive norms include the rules of strict liability and fault liability. Key structural features include the fact that tort suits are brought by the victim rather than by the state and the fact that such suits are ‘bilateral’: victims (plaintiffs) sue their putative injurers instead of drawing on a common pool of resources, as in New Zealand (a unique outlier).

Normative theories seek to justify or reform tort law. Justificatory theories aim to provide tort with a normative grounding, often by defending the values tort embodies or the goals it aims to achieve. Reformist theories seek to improve tort law, say, by recommending changes that would bring the institution closer in line with its core values or would help it do a better job of achieving its goals.

The distinction between analytical and normative theories is not exclusive. On the contrary, few analytical theories are altogether devoid of normative elements and no normative theory is ever devoid of analytical elements. Analytical theories frequently invoke concepts that are fundamentally normative, since such theories (following Dworkin) often seek to portray tort's substantive norms and structural features in their ‘best lights.’ All the more so, normative theories are always at least partly analytical, since such theories must either provide or presuppose some account of the institution they seek to justify or reform.

1.3.2 Instrumental and Non-Instrumental

Along another axis, we can distinguish between theories of tort based on whether they are instrumental or non-instrumental. (This distinction cuts across the distinction between the analytical and the normative.) Instrumental theories regard tort's essential features as explicable in terms of an overarching purpose, typically, the remediation of some social problem, such as the problem of allocating the costs of life's misfortunes. These theories do not always agree on the specific principles that govern (or ought to govern) the allocation of costs. This is in part because they disagree about the further purposes that tort serves (or ought to serve) in allocating costs. Some theorists believe that tort aims (or ought to aim) at allocating costs efficiently. Others believe that tort aims (or ought to aim) at allocating costs fairly. Both sorts of theorist treat tort instrumentally, as a tool for solving a social problem. In contrast, non-instrumental theorists do not see tort primarily as responding to a social problem. They believe that tort is better understood as a way of giving expression to certain moral or political principles.

Instrumental theorists typically identify tort's central concepts as accidents, costs, and allocation. Non-instrumental theorists typically identify tort's central concepts as rights, wrongs, and redress.

2. Theories of Tort Law: Economic Analysis

Rather than surveying the range of economic theories, this entry focuses in depth on what is arguably the dominant strain of economic analysis: optimal deterrence theory. Proponents of this approach, like economic analysts more generally, see tort liability primarily as a mode of allocating the costs of accidents. Their principal claim is that tort should be understood as aiming to minimize the sum of the costs of accidents and the costs of avoiding them. Since shifting costs is itself costly, economic analysis begins with the following question: when is it worth incurring costs in order to shift costs?

2.1 The Economic Interpretation of Fault Liability

Taking the relevant social problem to be the problem of costly accidents, economic analysts deem the paradigmatic tort to be that of negligence. The law holds a person to be negligent when she imposes an unreasonable risk of injury on another. Imposing an unreasonable risk of injury is in turn a matter of failing to take precautions that a reasonable person would take. But which precautions would a reasonable person take?

Economists offer the following answer: a precaution is reasonable when it is rational; a precaution is rational when it is cost-justified; and a precaution is cost-justified when the cost of the precaution is less than the expected injury (the latter being the cost of the anticipated injury discounted by the probability of the injury's occurrence). Imagine that you are engaged in an activity that carries a benefit of $100 and an expected injury of $90. Now suppose that the only way to prevent the injury is to stop the activity. Other things being equal, you would be irrational to forego a benefit of $100 in order to avoid a cost of $90. Foregoing the benefit would not be a cost-justified precaution. Now imagine that things are the other way around: the benefit is $90 and the expected injury is $100. Under these circumstances, foregoing the benefit would be a cost-justified precaution. You would be irrational not to forego the benefit.

As economists see things, the same standard of rationality applies when the benefit and the injury befall two separate parties. If I can spare you some injury by taking precautions less costly than your expected injury, my failure to take such precautions is irrational, hence, negligent. By the same token, if I can spare you some injury only by taking precautions costlier than your expected injury, my failure to take these precautions is not irrational, hence, not negligent; if you get hurt, the loss will rightly remain with you.

The rule of fault liability has much to recommend it from an economic point of view. In particular, it induces all rational persons — injurers and victims alike — to take all and only cost-justified precautions. If all potential injurers behave rationally, losses will always lie where they fall: with victims. Rational victims will therefore approach all accidents assuming that they will have to bear the costs. But then they, too, will take all and only cost-justified precautions. So the rule of fault liability is economically efficient: it produces an optimal level of risk-taking.

2.2 The Economic Interpretation of Strict Liability

If fault liability is efficient, what are we to make of strict liability? Can it be efficient as well? Since someone facing strict liability will bear the costs of his conduct whether or not he is at fault, one might think that a potential defendant under a regime of strict liability will have no incentive to invest in precautions. This is wrong. Suppose that I am strictly liable for some costs that I impose on you — costs of $100. Suppose further that by taking $90 worth of precautions I can reduce to zero the probability of my imposing these costs on you. What is it rational for me to do? The answer is obvious. It is rational for me to invest in $90 worth of precautions. So even under a regime of strict liability, potential defendants have an incentive to take precautions.

Indeed, under a regime of strict liability, potential defendants have an incentive to take all cost-justified precautions — just as they do under fault liability. In a crucial respect, the plight of the defendant (injurer) under strict liability is identical to that of the plaintiff (victim) under fault liability. If we assume that the injurer is rational, we can infer that under fault liability he will take precautions that will free him of the burden of liability. As a result, any loss his conduct causes will lie where it falls: with the victim. This means that we can characterize the victim as herself facing a sort of strict liability, namely, strict liability for losses not caused by another's fault. The victim cannot shift these losses to the injurer because the injurer has insulated himself from liability by taking cost-justified precautions. So the rational victim will ask herself the following question: which is lower — the cost of taking precautions or the expected cost of incurring an injury? She will take precautions when (and only when) taking precautions is cheaper than remaining vulnerable to injury. The upshot is that strict liability and fault liability encourage the exact same degree of precaution-taking. They both induce rational persons to take all and only cost-justified precautions. If efficiency requires that individuals take all and only cost-justified precautions, then strict and fault liability can both be efficient.

If both rules can be efficient, why might we prefer one to the other? One reason is that strict liability and fault liability have different distributional consequences. A rule of strict liability makes the costs of the defendant's conduct higher than a rule of fault liability would. A rule of fault liability makes the costs of the plaintiff's conduct higher than a rule of strict liability would. So if we have an independent reason to privilege the plaintiff's activity over the defendant's (or vice versa) — maybe we want less of the first activity to occur or we feel that people should have to pay a steeper price for engaging in it — then we have an independent reason to prefer strict liability to fault liability (or vice versa).

2.3 Objections to Economic Analysis

There is no doubt that economic analysis offers valuable insight into tort law's capacity to increase overall safety and reduce the costs of misfortune or bad luck. For all its insight, however, economic analysis is vulnerable to difficult objections. These objections speak both to tort's substantive norms and to its structural features.

2.3.1 Substance

Many theorists believe that economic analysis offers a questionable interpretation of the legal duty to behave reasonably. In characterizing negligence as the failure to take cost-justified precautions, economic analysis identifies reasonable risk-taking with rational risk taking. Economic analysis effectively invites us to determine what risks it would be acceptable for a potential defendant to take on the assumption that he owns both the resultant benefits and the resultant injuries. This way of articulating the fault standard treats an activity's costs and benefits as being of the same importance regardless of where they fall. But what I owe you may not be the same as what I owe myself.

Besides offering a questionable interpretation of the legal duty to behave reasonably, economic analysis arguably fails to make good sense of the concept of legal duty more generally. The norms of tort law impose duties not to injure. There are two questions we can ask about these duties: What do they require of us? And to whom do we owe them? Tort consequently distinguishes between a duty's content and its scope. This is a distinction much emphasized by Judge Cardozo in Palsgraf v. Long Island Rail Road, the most famous American tort case. In Cardozo's view, I have a duty to guard against injuring those who fall within the ambit of foreseeable risk associated with my conduct. Others might be injured by what I do, and what I do might be lamentable or mischievous, but those who fall outside the ambit of foreseeable risk have no claim against me in tort. This is not because I do not act badly or carelessly toward them. Ex hypothesi, I do. Nor is it because my careless behavior does not injure them. Ex hypothesi, it does. They have no claim against me because I have no legal duty to take their interests into account. The only individuals who can have a claim against me in tort are those to whom I have a legal duty. The problem for economic analysis is that the duty restriction on liability is arguably incompatible with the goal of inducing individuals to take appropriate precautions. In order for injurers to have an incentive to take appropriate precautions, each must face the costs of his activity in full. But the duty requirement allows injurers to displace at least some of these costs on their victims. Economic analysts have responded to this problem alternately by (i) offering an efficiency rationale for the foreseeability limitation and (ii) arguing that the duty requirement is an imperfection in tort law.

2.3.2 Structure

Economic analysis cares about the relationship between a particular injurer and victim only to the extent that the nature of this relationship provides evidence of the ability of either party to reduce accident costs. As far as economic analysis is concerned, there is no intrinsic reason why a victim should sue the person who injured him. Nor is there any intrinsic reason why a plaintiff should argue in court that the defendant wronged him, rather than that the defendant was in a better position to reduce overall costs.

The most basic relationship in our actual institution of tort law is the relationship between an injurer and his victim — not the relationship between each litigant, taken separately, and the goal of minimizing the sum of the costs of accidents and the costs of avoiding them. If the victim of another's mischief brings an action in tort, he brings it against the person he believes has injured him, not against the person best situated to reduce overall costs.

We will learn the most from economic analysis if we view it as a reformist, normative theory, a theory that asks questions of the following sort: What substantive liability rules have the greatest impact on reducing the incidence of accidents at the lowest cost? What procedural rules at a trial will induce those with relevant information to reveal it? What substantive and procedural rules will lead to optimal investments in safety? These are the questions of a reformer less interested in the actual state of tort law than in how tort law can be improved. Economic analysis is less convincing if its aim is to illuminate the law from the perspective of a judge or a litigant.

3. Theories of Tort Law: Justice, Rights, and Duties

3.1 Corrective Justice

Corrective justice theory — the most influential non-economic perspective on tort law — understands tort law as embodying a system of first- and second-order duties. Duties of the first order are duties not to injure. These duties establish norms of conduct. (Some theorists believe that corrective justice has nothing to say about the character of these norms; others think that it helps define their scope and content.) Duties of the second order are duties of repair. These duties arise upon the breach of first-order duties. That second-order duties so arise follows from the principle of corrective justice, which says that an individual has a duty to repair the wrongful losses that his conduct causes. For a loss to be wrongful in the relevant sense, it need not be one for which the wrongdoer is morally to blame. It need only be a loss incident to the violation of the victim's right not to be injured — a right correlative to the wrongdoer's first-order duty not to injure.

We can bring out what is distinctive about the corrective justice approach to tort law by contrasting it with various alternatives.

3.1.1 Corrective Justice versus Economic Analysis

From the standpoint of economic analysis, all legal liabilities are but costs of one sort or another, there being no normative differences between such things as licensing fees, tort liability, and taxes. In contrast, corrective justice theory maintains that tort liability is not simply a mechanism for shifting costs. A licensing fee imposes a cost, as does a tax, but we would not say that in levying fees or taxes we are holding people responsible. For this reason, corrective justice theory insists that different legal liabilities are not simply interchangeable cost-shifting implements in the reformer's tool box.

3.1.2 Corrective Justice versus Retributive Justice

Many theorists believe that a principle of retributive justice — say, that the blameworthy deserve to suffer — does a good job of interpreting and justifying criminal law. Yet most theorists think that such a principle does a rather poor job of interpreting and justifying tort law (except, perhaps, for the part of tort law concerned with punitive damages). First, the concept of responsibility at play in tort law is that of ‘outcome responsibility,’ not moral responsibility. Tort asks whether a given loss is something that the defendant in some sense owns. It does not ask whether the defendant's action is something for which he is morally to blame. Second, the duty of repair in tort is in essence a debt of repayment. Like other debts of repayment, it can be paid by third parties — and not just when the creditor (the plaintiff) has authorized repayment. By contrast, ‘debts’ incurred as a result of criminal mischief can never be paid by third parties. You cannot serve my prison sentence. Third, a person cannot guard against liability to criminal sanction by purchasing insurance. Yet it is common to purchase insurance to guard against the burdens of tort liability. Indeed, in some areas of life (e.g., driving), purchasing third-party insurance is mandatory.

3.1.3 Corrective Justice versus Distributive Justice

Some theorists are skeptical of the idea that corrective justice is really an independent principle of justice. Their concern is twofold: considerations that make corrective justice seem like a genuine principle of justice also seem to undermine its independence from distributive justice (justice in the distribution of resources); at the same time, considerations that support the principle's independence from distributive justice also seem to undermine its status as a genuine principle of justice. This twofold concern stems from the fact that corrective justice requires the reversal of wrongful changes to an initial distribution of resources. If, on the one hand, some initial distribution of resources is just, then corrective justice seemingly does no more than require that we return individuals to the position to which they are entitled merely as a matter of distributive justice. This suggests that corrective justice is but distributive justice from an ex post perspective rather than an independent principle of justice. If, on the other hand, an initial distribution of resources is unjust, then corrective justice seemingly requires that we sustain, enforce, or entrench what is ex hypothesi an injustice. This suggests that corrective justice is not really a matter of justice at all: independent, yes; a genuine principle of justice, no.

First Response: Corrective Justice as Transactional Justice. Some theorists respond by suggesting that we understand corrective justice as a kind of transactional justice. These theorists identify the domain of distributive justice with the initial distribution of holdings and take corrective justice to be concerned exclusively with norms of transfer, norms that govern whether departures from an initial distribution are legitimate. Whatever the underlying pattern of holdings, we can distinguish legitimate modes of transfer from illegitimate modes. If agreement or gift moves resources from one person to another, then the mode of transfer is legitimate. Never mind whether the resultant allocation of resources is unequal or unfair: that is a concern of distributive, not transactional, justice. If fraud or force moves resources from one person to another, then the mode of transfer is illegitimate. Even if an illegitimate transfer gives rise to an equitable distribution, the transaction is unjust and must therefore be annulled.

Second Response: Justice versus Legitimacy. Other theorists respond by distinguishing between a distribution's justness and its legitimacy. These theorists allow that a legitimate distribution of resources may fall short of being a fully just distribution. But they insist that a (merely) legitimate distribution can suffice to generate duties of repair.

3.2 Civil Recourse Theory

Civil recourse theory agrees with corrective justice theory that tort's normative structure involves a variety of first-order duties, duties that establish norms of conduct. Yet civil recourse theory takes a very different view of the legal consequence of a first-order duty's breach. Whereas corrective justice theory holds that such a breach saddles the would-be defendant with a second-order duty — in particular, a duty of repair — civil recourse theory holds that no such second-order duty results directly from the breach. Rather, the breach of a first-order duty endows the victim with a right of action: a legal power to seek redress from her injurer. That this power so arises follows from what proponents regard as a deeply embedded legal principle — the principle of civil recourse — which says that one who has been wronged is legally entitled to an avenue of recourse against the perpetrator.

Civil recourse theory has substantial explanatory power. Perhaps most obvious, it explains why tort suits have a bilateral structure — why the victim of a tortious wrong seeks redress from the wrongdoer herself instead of drawing on a common pool of resources. It also explains why tort suits are privately prosecuted — why the state does not act of its own accord to impose liability on those who breach first-order duties. According to civil recourse theory, the breach of a first-order duty gives rise not to a legal duty but to a legal power, a power the victim can choose not to exercise.

Furthermore, civil recourse theory accommodates a number of tort's central substantive features, features that arguably elude corrective justice theory. Prominent among these are (i) the fact that tort offers a variety of different remedies, only some of which are designed to restore the plaintiff's antecedent holdings, and (ii) the fact that the defendant incurs a legal duty to pay damages only upon a lawsuit's successful conclusion (either by settlement or by the final judgment of a court), rather than immediately upon the breach of a first-order duty. It remains unresolved whether corrective justice theory has the resources to explain these two substantive features.

Despite its explanatory power, civil recourse theory is vulnerable to a potentially serious objection — or else it seems to leave tort law vulnerable to such an objection. Because civil recourse theory offers little guidance as to what sort of redress is appropriate, the theory depicts tort law primarily as an institution that enables one person to harm another with the aid of the state's coercive power. Tort law may well be such an institution, of course. But if it is, it may be deeply flawed — indeed, it may be unjust. This problem can be posed in the form of a dilemma. Either the principle of civil recourse is grounded in a principle of justice or it is not. If the principle of civil recourse is grounded in a principle of justice, then civil recourse theory threatens to collapse into a kind of a justice-based theory. If the principle of civil recourse is not so grounded, then the principle apparently does no more than license one party to inflict an evil on another. If that is what the principle does, we might reasonably wonder whether it can justify or even make coherent sense of an entire body of law.

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Other Internet Resources

  • Tort Law & Unjust Enrichment, links to relevant articles from the Encyclopedia of Law and Economics, supported by the Economic Institute/CIAV of Utrecht University and the Department of General Jurisprudence and History of Law, University of Ghent.
  • TortsProf Blog, edited by Professor William G. Childs, Western New England School of Law; Professor Sheila B. Scheuerman, Charleston School of Law; Professor Christopher J. Robinette, Widener University School of Law.

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Jules Coleman <jules.coleman@nyu.edu>
Gabriel Mendlow <mendlow@umich.edu>

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