Notes to Propositions

1. Throughout this entry, I use ‘object of belief’ simply to refer to what is believed, rather than to the entity or entities the belief is intuitively about. So, for instance, when I believe that Ford pardoned Nixon my belief is about Ford and Nixon but not about the proposition that Ford pardoned Nixon. This proposition, rather, is what I believe. This usage for ‘object of belief’ does not fit well with that of the Husserlian tradition, but it is, to my knowledge, the standard contemporary usage, and I adopt it here.

2. For an illuminating account of these matters, see Kretzmann (1970).

3. Here we should note that that-clauses may occur in a variety of linguistic contexts, not limited to attitude- and truth-ascriptions. They may be grammatical subjects (e.g., ‘That Knowles lost the election is surprising’), complements to verbs (e.g., as in ‘The barometer indicated that it is going to rain’), complements to adjectives (‘I am happy that it is going to rain’), and complements to nouns (‘The possibility that it will rain should be borne in mind’). Whether that-clauses have the same semantic function in all these contexts is a matter of ongoing debate among propositionalists. (See Parsons (1993), Moffett (2003) for discussion.)

4. That is to say, they are neither nouns themselves nor phrases headed by a noun. The word ‘that’ in ‘that snow is white’ is not a noun which is modified by the words following, but rather a complementizer, like ‘whether’.

5. Standardly, defenders of the Relational Analysis take that-clauses to be syntactic units and take the attitude verbs to designate two place relations. However, strictly speaking, the analysis leaves open the possibility that that-clauses designate propositions by virtue of the combined workings of the complementizer ‘that’ and the sentence immediately following it. A case in point is the propositionalist version of Donald Davidson's )(1968) paratactic theory of indirect speech reports. On Davidson's theory, ‘Galileo said that the earth moves’ amounts to ‘Galileo said that. The earth moves’. Here ‘the earth moves’ functions as a separate displayed and nonassertoric utterance, and so does not combine with ‘that’ to form a syntactic unit. On the propositionalist version of this theory, ‘that’ refers not to the displayed utterance, but to the proposition designated by that utterance (Rumfitt (1993, p. 449). On such a view, through the combined workings of the ‘that’ and ‘the earth moves’, a proposition is designated.

In an attempt to defend the theory of direct reference, Shier (1996) argues that that-clauses do not provide relata for the belief relation but nonetheless designate propositions. For Shier, ‘S believes that snow is white’ is true iff S believes a proposition that is a finer grained version of the proposition referred to by ‘that snow is white’. The proposition that snow is white isn't itself what is said to be believed. Shier's modification of the Relational View can be considered as more or less friendly amendment. Propositions are still relata of the belief relation. It's only that the that-clause doesn't supply the relatum itself. Kent Bach (1997) holds that a belief report is true iff the subject believes a certain thing that requires the truth of the proposition contributed by the that-clause. Bach's modifications are perhaps less friendly, if only because he is unwilling to call these “certain things” believed propositions. For more on these issues, see the entry on propositional attitude reports. Certain sorts of substitution failures provide a second important reason to modify or reject the Relational View. This issue is discussed at length in Section 3.3.

6. For discussion of the Metaphysics 101 argument, or arguments like it, see Cartwright (1962), Soames (1999, ch. 1), and Salmon and Soames (1988, introduction). Soames stresses the role of propositions as truth-bearers, and Salmon and Soames the role of contents of sentences.

7. Which syntactic properties of complements trigger an object reading seems to vary with the verb. Some verbs that exhibit the Objectivization Effect retain the content reading with select nominalizations:

I maintain/know/remember/recognize/hold(?) the truth of what he said.

Others, however, are much stingier, e.g., ‘find’, ‘gather’, ‘bet’, ‘judge’.

8. Schiffer's theory is closely related to Mark Balaguer's (1998) “Full-Blooded Platonism”. See also Restall 2001.

9. One argument against propositions, made in Schiffer's earlier work (Schiffer 1987), is that they must be structured complexes and yet there seem to be no appropriate entities to serve as their components.

10. The notion of free generation should be familiar to students of logic. The set of well-formed formulas of propositional logic are freely generated from the set of atoms (i.e., atomic sentences) by the basic logic operations. What this means, more carefully, is that, (i), the set of wffs is generated from the atomics by these operations (i.e., the set of wffs is the smallest set which contains all of the sets of wffs which contain the atoms and are closed on the operations), (ii), each of the operations is one-to-one on the set, and (iii), their ranges are pairwise disjoint on the set.

11. Terence Parsons (1993, 453–7) warns about drawing inferences about facts from considerations about the context ‘__ is a fact’. That context is not a factive context, because it is not the case that it, as well as its internal negation, presuppose the truth of the corresponding sentence. “That p is not a fact” differs in this way from the factive “That p is not surprising.” Facts are designated by that-clauses in factive contexts, but not by that-clauses in the context ‘__ is a fact.’

12. Some expressivists (Horwich 1993, Stoljar 1993, have argued that, even if the commitment to moral propositions is shallow, it can help them address the well-known embedding problem. See moral cognitivism vs non-cognitivism for more discussion.

Copyright © 2012 by
Matthew McGrath <>

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