Collapse Theories

First published Thu Mar 7, 2002; substantive revision Tue Feb 16, 2016

Quantum mechanics, with its revolutionary implications, has posed innumerable problems to philosophers of science. In particular, it has suggested reconsidering basic concepts such as the existence of a world that is, at least to some extent, independent of the observer, the possibility of getting reliable and objective knowledge about it, and the possibility of taking (under appropriate circumstances) certain properties to be objectively possessed by physical systems. It has also raised many others questions which are well known to those involved in the debate on the interpretation of this pillar of modern science. One can argue that most of the problems are not only due to the intrinsic revolutionary nature of the phenomena which have led to the development of the theory. They are also related to the fact that, in its standard formulation and interpretation, quantum mechanics is a theory which is excellent (in fact it has met with a success unprecedented in the history of science) in telling us everything about what we observe, but it meets with serious difficulties in telling us what is. We are making here specific reference to the central problem of the theory, usually referred to as the measurement problem, or, with a more appropriate term, as the macro-objectification problem. It is just one of the many attempts to overcome the difficulties posed by this problem that has led to the development of Collapse Theories, i.e., to the Dynamical Reduction Program (DRP). As we shall see, this approach consists in accepting that the dynamical equation of the standard theory should be modified by the addition of stochastic and nonlinear terms. The nice fact is that the resulting theory is capable, on the basis of a single dynamics which is assumed to govern all natural processes, to account at the same time for all well-established facts about microscopic systems as described by the standard theory as well as for the so-called postulate of wave packet reduction (WPR). As is well known, such a postulate is assumed in the standard scheme just in order to guarantee that measurements have outcomes but, as we shall discuss below, it meets with insurmountable difficulties if one takes the measurement itself to be a process governed by the linear laws of the theory. Finally, the collapse theories account in a completely satisfactory way for the classical behavior of macroscopic systems.

Two specifications are necessary in order to make clear from the beginning what are the limitations and the merits of the program. The only satisfactory explicit models of this type (which are essentially variations and refinements of the one proposed in Ghirardi, Rimini, and Weber (1986), and usually referred to as the GRW theory) are phenomenological attempts to solve a foundational problem. At present, they involve phenomenological parameters which, if the theory is taken seriously, acquire the status of new constants of nature. Moreover, the problem of building satisfactory relativistic generalizations of these models which seemed extremely difficult up to few years ago, has seen some significant improvements. More important, such improvements have elucidated some crucial points and have made clear that there is no reason of principle preventing to reach this goal.

In spite of their phenomenological character, we think that Collapse Theories have a remarkable relevance, since they have made clear that there are new ways to overcome the difficulties of the formalism, to close the circle in the precise sense defined by Abner Shimony (1989), which until a few years ago were considered impracticable, and which, on the contrary, have been shown to be perfectly viable. Moreover, they have allowed a clear identification of the formal features which should characterize any unified theory of micro and macro processes. Last but not least, Collapse theories qualify themselves as rival theories of quantum mechanics and one can easily identify some of their physical implications which, in principle, would allow crucial tests discriminating between the two. To get really stringent indications from such tests requires experiments involving technological techniques which have been developed only very recently. Actually, it is just due to remarkable improvements in dealing with mesoscopic systems and to important practical steps forward, that some specific bounds have already been obtained for the parameters characterizing the theories under investigation, and, more important, precise families of physical processes in which a violation of the linear nature of the standard formalism might emerge have been clearly identified and are the subject of systematic investigations which might lead, in the end, to relevant discoveries.

1. General Considerations

As stated already, a very natural question which all scientists who are concerned about the meaning and the value of science have to face, is whether one can develop a coherent worldview that can accommodate our knowledge concerning natural phenomena as it is embodied in our best theories. Such a program meets serious difficulties with quantum mechanics, essentially because of two formal aspects of the theory which are common to all of its versions, from the original nonrelativistic formulations of the 1920s, to the quantum field theories of recent years: the linear nature of the state space and of the evolution equation, i.e., the validity of the superposition principle and the related phenomenon of entanglement, which, in Schrödinger’s words:

is not one but the characteristic trait of quantum mechanics, the one that enforces its entire departure from classical lines of thought (Schrödinger, 1935, p. 807).

These two formal features have embarrassing consequences, since they imply

  • objective chance in natural processes, i.e., the nonepistemic nature of quantum probabilities;
  • objective indefiniteness of physical properties both at the micro and macro level;
  • objective entanglement between spatially separated and non-interacting constituents of a composite system, entailing a sort of holism and a precise kind of nonlocality.

For the sake of generality, we shall first of all present a very concise sketch of ‘the rules of the quantum game’.

2. The Formalism: A Concise Sketch

Let us recall the axiomatic structure of quantum theory:

  1. States of physical systems are associated with normalized vectors in a Hilbert space, a complex, infinite-dimensional, complete and separable linear vector space equipped with a scalar product. Linearity implies that the superposition principle holds: if \(\ket{f}\) is a state and \(\ket{g}\) is a state, then (for \(a\) and \(b\) arbitrary complex numbers) also

    \[ \ket{K} = a\ket{f} + b\ket{g} \]

    is a state. Moreover, the state evolution is linear, i.e., it preserves superpositions: if \(\ket{f,t}\) and \(\ket{g,t}\) are the states obtained by evolving the states \(\ket{f,0}\) and \(\ket{g,0}\), respectively, from the initial time \(t=0\) to the time \(t\), then \(a\ket{f,t} + b\ket{g,t}\) is the state obtained by the evolution of \(a\ket{f,0} + b\ket{g,0}\). Finally, the completeness assumption is made, i.e., that the knowledge of its statevector represents, in principle, the most accurate information one can have about the state of an individual physical system.

  2. The observable quantities are represented by self-adjoint operators \(B\) on the Hilbert space. The associated eigenvalue equations \(B\ket{b_k} = b_k \ket{b_k}\) and the corresponding eigenmanifolds (the linear manifolds spanned by the eigenvectors associated to a given eigenvalue, also called eigenspaces) play a basic role for the predictive content of the theory. In fact:

    1. The eigenvalues \(b_k\) of an operator \(B\) represent the only possible outcomes in a measurement of the corresponding observable.
    2. The square of the norm (i.e., the length) of the projection of the normalized vector (i.e., of length 1) describing the state of the system onto the eigenmanifold associated to a given eigenvalue gives the probability of obtaining the corresponding eigenvalue as the outcome of the measurement. In particular, it is useful to recall that when one is interested in the probability of finding a particle at a given place, one has to resort to the so-called configuration space representation of the statevector. In such a case the statevector becomes a square-integrable function of the position variables of the particles of the system, whose modulus squared yields the probability density for the outcomes of position measurements.

We stress that, according to the above scheme, quantum mechanics makes only conditional probabilistic predictions (conditional on the measurement being actually performed) for the outcomes of prospective (and in general incompatible) measurement processes. Only if a state belongs already before the act of measurement to an eigenmanifold of the observable which is going to be measured, can one predict the outcome with certainty. In all other cases—if the completeness assumption is made—one has objective nonepistemic probabilities for different outcomes.

The orthodox position gives a very simple answer to the question: what determines the outcome when different outcomes are possible? Nothing—the theory is complete and, as a consequence, it is illegitimate to raise any question about possessed properties referring to observables for which different outcomes have non-vanishing probabilities of being obtained. Correspondingly, the referent of the theory are the results of measurement procedures. These are to be described in classical terms and involve in general mutually exclusive physical conditions.

As regards the legitimacy of attributing properties to physical systems, one could say that quantum mechanics warns us against requiring too many properties to be actually possessed by physical systems. However—with Einstein—one can adopt as a sufficient condition for the existence of an objective individual property that one be able (without in any way disturbing the system) to predict with certainty the outcome of a measurement. This implies that, whenever the overall statevector factorizes into the product of a state of the Hilbert space of the physical system \(S\) and of the rest of the world, \(S\) does possess some properties (actually a complete set of properties, i.e., those associated to appropriate maximal sets of commuting observables).

Before concluding this section we must add some comments about the measurement process. Quantum theory was created to deal with microscopic phenomena. In order to obtain information about them one must be able to establish strict correlations between the states of the microscopic systems and the states of objects we can perceive. Within the formalism, this is described by considering appropriate micro-macro interactions. The fact that when the measurement is completed one can make statements about the outcome is accounted for by the already mentioned WPR postulate (Dirac 1948): a measurement always causes a system to jump in an eigenstate of the observed quantity. Correspondingly, also the statevector of the apparatus ‘jumps’ into the manifold associated to the recorded outcome.

3. The Macro-Objectification Problem

In this section we shall clarify why the formalism we have just presented gives rise to the measurement or macro-objectification problem. To this purpose we shall, first of all, discuss the standard oversimplified argument based on the so-called von Neumann ideal measurement scheme.

Let us begin by recalling the basic points of the standard argument:

Suppose that a microsystem \(S\), just before the measurement of an observable \(B\), is in the eigenstate \(\ket{b_j}\) of the corresponding operator. The apparatus (a macrosystem) used to gain information about \(B\) is initially assumed to be in a precise macroscopic state, its ready state, corresponding to a definite macro property—e.g., its pointer points at 0 on a scale. Since the apparatus \(A\) is made of elementary particles, atoms and so on, it must be described by quantum mechanics, which will associate to it the state vector \(\ket{A_0}\). One then assumes that there is an appropriate system-apparatus interaction lasting for a finite time, such that when the initial apparatus state is triggered by the state \(\ket{b_j}\) it ends up in a final configuration \(\ket{A_j}\), which is macroscopically distinguishable from the initial one and from the other configurations \(\ket{A_k}\) in which it would end up if triggered by a different eigenstate \(\ket{b_k}\). Moreover, one assumes that the system is left in its initial state. In brief, one assumes that one can dispose things in such a way that the system-apparatus interaction can be described as:

\[\begin{align} \tag{1} \textit{(initial state)}{:}\ & \ket{b_k} \ket{A_0} \\ \textit{(final state)}{:}\ & \ket{b_k} \ket{A_k} \end{align}\]

Equation (1) and the hypothesis that the superposition principle governs all natural processes tell us that, if the initial state of the microsystem is a linear superposition of different eigenstates (for simplicity we will consider only two of them), one has:

\[\begin{align} \tag{2} \textit{(initial state)}{:}\ & (a\ket{b_k} + b\ket{b_j})\ket{A_0 } \\ \textit{(final state)}{:}\ & (a\ket{b_k} \ket{A_k} + b\ket{b_j} \ket{A_j}). \end{align}\]

Some remarks about this are in order:

  • The scheme is highly idealized, both because it takes for granted that one can prepare the apparatus in a precise state, which is impossible since we cannot have control over all its degrees of freedom, and because it assumes that the apparatus registers the outcome without altering the state of the measured system. However, as we shall discuss below, these assumptions are by no means essential to derive the embarrassing conclusion we have to face, i.e., that the final state is a linear superposition of two states corresponding to two macroscopically different states of the apparatus. Since we know that the + representing linear superpositions cannot be replaced by the logical alternative either … or, the measurement problem arises: what meaning can one attach to a state of affairs in which two macroscopically and perceptively different states occur simultaneously?
  • As already mentioned, the standard solution to this problem is given by the WPR postulate: in a measurement process reduction occurs: the final state is not the one appearing in the second line of equation (2) but, since macro-objectification takes place, it is
\[ \begin{align} \tag{3} \text{either } &\ket{b_k} \ket{A_k} \text{ with probability } \lvert a\rvert^2 \\ \text{or } &\ket{b_j} \ket{A_j} \text{ with probability } \lvert b\rvert^2. \end{align}\]

Nowadays, there is a general consensus that this solution is absolutely unacceptable for two basic reasons:

  1. It corresponds to assuming that the linear nature of the theory is broken at a certain level. Thus, quantum theory is unable to explain how it can happen that the apparata behave as required by the WPR postulate (which is one of the axioms of the theory).
  2. Even if one were to accept that quantum mechanics has a limited field of applicability, so that it does not account for all natural processes and, in particular, it breaks down at the macrolevel, it is clear that the theory does not contain any precise criterion for identifying the borderline between micro and macro, linear and nonlinear, deterministic and stochastic, reversible and irreversible. To use J.S. Bell’s words, there is nothing in the theory fixing such a borderline and the split between the two above types of processes is fundamentally shifty. As a matter of fact, if one looks at the historical debate on this problem, one can easily see that it is precisely by continuously resorting to this ambiguity about the split that adherents of the Copenhagen orthodoxy or easy solvers (Bell 1990) of the measurement problem have rejected the criticism of the heretics (Gottfried 2000). For instance, Bohr succeeded in rejecting Einstein’s criticisms at the Solvay Conferences by stressing that some macroscopic parts of the apparatus had to be treated fully quantum mechanically; von Neumann and Wigner displaced the split by locating it between the physical and the conscious (but what is a conscious being?), and so on. Also other proposed solutions to the problem, notably certain versions of many-worlds interpretations, suffer from analogous ambiguities.

It is not our task to review here the various attempts to solve the above difficulties. One can find many exhaustive treatments of this problem in the literature. On the contrary, we would like to discuss how the macro-objectification problem is indeed a consequence of very general, in fact unavoidable, assumptions on the nature of measurements, and not specifically of the assumptions of von Neumann’s model. This was established in a series of theorems of increasing generality, notably the ones by Fine (1970), d’Espagnat (1971), Shimony (1974), Brown (1986) and Busch and Shimony (1996). Possibly the most general and direct proof is given by Bassi and Ghirardi (2000), whose results we briefly summarize. The assumptions of the theorem are:

  1. that a microsystem can be prepared in two different eigenstates of an observable (such as, e.g., the spin component along the z-axis) and in a superposition of two such states;
  2. that one has a sufficiently reliable way of ‘measuring’ such an observable, meaning that when the measurement is triggered by each of the two above eigenstates, the process leads in the vast majority of cases to macroscopically and perceptually different situations of the universe. This requirement allows for cases in which the experimenter does not have perfect control of the apparatus, the apparatus is entangled with the rest of the universe, the apparatus makes mistakes, or the measured system is altered or even destroyed in the measurement process;
  3. that all natural processes obey the linear laws of the theory.

From these very general assumptions one can show that, repeating the measurement on systems prepared in the superposition of the two given eigenstates, in the great majority of cases one ends up in a superposition of macroscopically and perceptually different situations of the whole universe. If one wishes to have an acceptable final situation, one mirroring the fact that we have definite perceptions, one is arguably compelled to break the linearity of the theory at an appropriate stage.

4. The Birth of Collapse Theories

The debate on the macro-objectification problem continued for many years after the early days of quantum mechanics. In the early 1950s an important step was taken by D. Bohm who presented (Bohm 1952) a mathematically precise deterministic completion of quantum mechanics (see the entry on Bohmian Mechanics). In the area of Collapse Theories, one should mention the contribution by Bohm and Bub (1966), which was based on the interaction of the statevector with Wiener-Siegel hidden variables. But let us come to Collapse Theories in the sense currently attached to this expression.

Various investigations during the 1970s can be considered as preliminary steps for the subsequent developments. In the years 1970 we were seriously concerned with quantum decay processes and in particular with the possibility of deriving, within a quantum context, the exponential decay law. For an exhaustive review of our approach see (Fonda, Ghirardi, and Rimini 1978). Some features of this approach are extremely relevant for the DRP. Let us list them:

  • One deals with individual physical systems;
  • The statevector is supposed to undergo random processes at random times, inducing sudden changes driving it either within the linear manifold of the unstable state or within the one of the decay products;
  • To make the treatment quite general (the apparatus does not know which kind of unstable system it is testing) one is led to identify the random processes with localization processes of the relative coordinates of the decay fragments. Such an assumption, combined with the peculiar resonant dynamics characterizing an unstable system, yields, completely in general, the desired result. The ‘relative position basis’ is the preferred basis of this theory;
  • Analogous ideas have been applied to measurement processes;
  • The final equation for the evolution at the ensemble level is of the quantum dynamical semigroup type and has a structure extremely similar to the final one of the GRW theory.

Obviously, in these papers the reduction processes which are involved were not assumed to be ‘spontaneous and fundamental’ natural processes, but due to system-environment interactions. Accordingly, these attempts did not represent original proposals for solving the macro-objectification problem but they have paved the way for the elaboration of the GRW theory.

Almost in the same years, P. Pearle (1976, 1979), and subsequently N. Gisin (1984) and others, had entertained the idea of accounting for the reduction process in terms of a stochastic differential equation. These authors were really looking for a new dynamical equation and for a solution to the macro-objectification problem. Unfortunately, they were unable to give any precise suggestion about how to identify the states to which the dynamical equation should lead. Indeed, these states were assumed to depend on the particular measurement process one was considering. Without a clear indication on this point there was no way to identify a mechanism whose effect could be negligible for microsystems but extremely relevant for all the macroscopic ones. N. Gisin gave subsequently an interesting (though not uncontroversial) argument (Gisin 1989) that nonlinear modifications of the standard equation without stochasticity are unacceptable since they imply the possibility of sending superluminal signals. Soon afterwards, G. C. Ghirardi and R. Grassi proved that stochastic modifications without nonlinearity can at most induce ensemble and not individual reductions, i.e., they do not guarantee that the state vector of each individual physical system is driven in a manifold corresponding to definite properties.

5. The Original Collapse Model

As already mentioned, the Collapse Theory we are going to describe amounts to accepting a modification of the standard evolution law of the theory such that microprocesses and macroprocesses are governed by a single dynamics. Such a dynamics must imply that the micro-macro interaction in a measurement process leads to WPR. Bearing this in mind, recall that the characteristic feature distinguishing quantum evolution from WPR is that, while Schrödinger’s equation is linear and deterministic (at the wave function level), WPR is nonlinear and stochastic. It is then natural to consider, as was suggested for the first time in the above quoted papers by P. Pearle, the possibility of nonlinear and stochastic modifications of the standard Schrödinger dynamics. However, the initial attempts to implement this idea were unsatisfactory for various reasons. The first, which we have already discussed, concerns the choice of the preferred basis: if one wants to have a universal mechanism leading to reductions, to which linear manifolds should the reduction mechanism drive the statevector? Or, equivalently, which of the (generally) incompatible ‘potentialities’ of the standard theory should we choose to make actual? The second, referred to as the trigger problem by Pearle (1989), is the problem of how the reduction mechanism can become more and more effective in going from the micro to the macro domain. The solution to this problem constitutes the central feature of the Collapse Theories of the GRW type. To discuss these points, let us briefly review the first consistent Collapse model to appear in the literature.

Within such a model, originally referred to as QMSL (Quantum Mechanics with Spontaneous Localizations), the problem of the choice of the preferred basis is solved by noting that the most embarrassing superpositions, at the macroscopic level, are those involving different spatial locations of macroscopic objects. Actually, as Einstein has stressed, this is a crucial point which has to be faced by anybody aiming to take a macro-objective position about natural phenomena: ‘A macro-body must always have a quasi-sharply defined position in the objective description of reality’ (Born, 1971, p. 223). Accordingly, QMSL considers the possibility of spontaneous processes, which are assumed to occur instantaneously and at the microscopic level, which tend to suppress the linear superpositions of differently localized states. The required trigger mechanism must then follow consistently.

The key assumption of QMSL is the following: each elementary constituent of any physical system is subjected, at random times, to random and spontaneous localization processes (which we will call hittings) around appropriate positions. To have a precise mathematical model one has to be very specific about the above assumptions; in particular one has to make explicit HOW the process works, i.e., which modifications of the wave function are induced by the localizations, WHERE it occurs, i.e., what determines the occurrence of a localization at a certain position rather than at another one, and finally WHEN, i.e., at what times, it occurs. The answers to these questions are as follows.

Let us consider a system of \(N\) distinguishable particles and let us denote by \(F(\boldsymbol{q}_1, \boldsymbol{q}_2 , \ldots ,\boldsymbol{q}_N )\) the coordinate representation (wave function) of the state vector (we disregard spin variables since hittings are assumed not to act on them).

  1. The answer to the question HOW is then: if a hitting occurs for the \(i\)-th particle at point \(\boldsymbol{x}\), the wave function is instantaneously multiplied by a Gaussian function (appropriately normalized) \[ G(\boldsymbol{q}_i, \boldsymbol{x}) = K \exp[-\{1/(2d^2)\}(\boldsymbol{q}_i -\boldsymbol{x})^2], \]

    where \(d\) represents the localization accuracy. Let us denote as

    \[ L_i (\boldsymbol{q}_1, \boldsymbol{q}_2, \ldots, \boldsymbol{q}_N ; \boldsymbol{x}) = F(\boldsymbol{q}_1, \boldsymbol{q}_2, \ldots, \boldsymbol{q}_N) G(\boldsymbol{q}_i, \boldsymbol{x}) \]

    the wave function immediately after the localization, as yet unnormalized.

  2. As concerns the specification of WHERE the localization occurs, it is assumed that the probability density \(P(\boldsymbol{x})\) of its taking place at the point \(\boldsymbol{x}\) is given by the square of the norm of the state \(L_i\) (the length, or to be more precise, the integral of the modulus squared of the function \(L_i\) over the \(3N\)-dimensional space). This implies that hittings occur with higher probability at those places where, in the standard quantum description, there is a higher probability of finding the particle. Note that the above prescription introduces nonlinear and stochastic elements in the dynamics. The constant \(K\) appearing in the expression of \(G(\boldsymbol{q}_i, \boldsymbol{x})\) is chosen in such a way that the integral of \(P(\boldsymbol{x})\) over the whole space equals 1.
  3. Finally, the question WHEN is answered by assuming that the hittings occur at randomly distributed times, according to a Poisson distribution, with mean frequency \(f\).

It is straightforward to convince oneself that the hitting process leads, when it occurs, to the suppression of the linear superpositions of states in which the same particle is well localized at different positions separated by a distance greater than \(d\). As a simple example we can consider a single particle whose wavefunction is different from zero only in two small and far apart regions \(h\) and \(t\). Suppose that a localization occurs around \(h\); the state after the hitting is then appreciably different from zero only in a region around \(h\) itself. A completely analogous argument holds for the case in which the hitting takes place around \(t\). As concerns points which are far from both \(h\) and \(t\), one easily sees that the probability density for such hittings , according to the multiplication rule determining \(L_i\), turns out to be practically zero, and moreover, that if such a hitting were to occur, after the wave function is normalized, the wave function of the system would remain almost unchanged.

We can now discuss the most important feature of the theory, i.e., the Trigger Mechanism. To understand the way in which the spontaneous localization mechanism is enhanced by increasing the number of particles which are in far apart spatial regions (as compared to \(d)\), one can consider, for simplicity, the superposition \(\ket{S}\), with equal weights, of two macroscopic pointer states \(\ket{H}\) and \(\ket{T}\), corresponding to two different pointer positions \(H\) and \(T\), respectively. Taking into account that the pointer is ‘almost rigid’ and contains a macroscopic number \(N\) of microscopic constituents, the state can be written, in obvious notation, as:

\[\tag{4} \ket{S} = [\ket{1 \near h_1} \ldots \ket{N \near h_N} + \ket{1 \near t_1} \ldots \ket{N \near t_N}], \]

where \(h_i\) is near \(H\), and \(t_i\) is near \(T\). The states appearing in first term on the right-hand side of equation (4) have coordinate representations which are different from zero only when their arguments \((1,\ldots ,N)\) are all near \(H\), while those of the second term are different from zero only when they are all near \(T\). It is now evident that if any of the particles (say, the \(i\)-th particle) undergoes a hitting process, e.g., near the point \(h_i\), the multiplication prescription leads practically to the suppression of the second term in (4). Thus any spontaneous localization of any of the constituents amounts to a localization of the pointer. The hitting frequency is therefore effectively amplified proportionally to the number of constituents. Notice that, for simplicity, the argument makes reference to an almost rigid body, i.e., to one for which all particles are around \(H\) in one of the states of the superposition and around \(T\) in the other. It should however be obvious that what really matters in amplifying the reductions is the number of particles which are in different positions in the two states appearing in the superposition itself.

Under these premises we can now proceed to choose the parameters \(d\) and \(f\) of the theory, i.e., the localization accuracy and the mean localization frequency. The argument just given allows one to understand how one can choose the parameters in such a way that the quantum predictions for microscopic systems remain fully valid while the embarrassing macroscopic superpositions in measurement-like situations are suppressed in very short times. Accordingly, as a consequence of the unified dynamics governing all physical processes, individual macroscopic objects acquire definite macroscopic properties. The choice suggested in the GRW-model is:

\[\begin{align} \tag{5} f &= 10^{-16} \text{ s}^{-1} \\ d &= 10^{-5} \text{ cm} \end{align}\]

It follows that a microscopic system undergoes a localization, on average, every hundred million years, while a macroscopic one undergoes a localization every \(10^{-7}\) seconds. With reference to the challenging version of the macro-objectification problem presented by Schrödinger with the famous example of his cat, J.S. Bell comments (1987, p.44): [within QMSL] the cat is not both dead and alive for more than a split second. Besides the extremely low frequency of the hittings for microscopic systems, also the fact that the localization width is large compared to the dimensions of atoms (so that even when a localization occurs it does very little violence to the internal economy of an atom) plays an important role in guaranteeing that no violation of well-tested quantum mechanical predictions is implied by the modified dynamics.

Some remarks are appropriate. QMSL, being precisely formulated, allows to locate precisely the ‘split’ between micro and macro, reversible and irreversible, quantum and classical. The transition between the two types of ‘regimes’ is governed by the number of particles which are well localized at positions further apart than \(10^{-5}\) cm in the two states whose coherence is going to be dynamically suppressed. In principle, the model is testable against quantum mechanics. However, for the above choice of the values of the parameters, its predictions do not contradict any already established fact about microsystems and macrosystems.

Concerning the choice of the parameters of the model, it has to be stressed that, as it is obvious, the just mentioned quantum to classical transition region depends crucially on their values. The situation concerning the two parameters is rather different; in fact \(d\) cannot be made smaller than \(10^{-5}\) cm without inducing unacceptable effects on the internal dynamics, e.g., of solids, and it cannot be made much larger if one wants macrosystems to end up being rather accurately localized. On the contrary, an appreciable variation of \(f\) turns out to be possible. With reference to this point we would like to mention that Adler (2003) has suggested to change its value by a factor of the order of \(10^9\). The reasons for this derive from pretending that the latent image formation in photography occurs immediately after a grain of the emulsion has been excited, and that when a human eye is hit by few photons (the perceptual threshold being very low) reduction takes place in the rods of the eye. As we will discuss in what follows, if one takes the original GRW value for \(f\), reduction cannot occur in the rods (because a relatively small number of molecules—less than \(10^5\)—are affected), but only during the transmission along the nervous signal within the brain, a process which involves the displacement of a number of ions of the order of \(10^{12}\).

It is interesting to remark that the drastic change suggested by Adler (2003) has physical implications which have already been experimentally falsified, see Curceanu et al. 2015, Bassi et al. 2010, Vinante et al. 2015 (Other Internet Resources), and Toros & Bassi 2016 (Other Internet Ressources).

6. The Continuous Spontaneous Localization Model (CSL)

The model just presented (QMSL) has a serious drawback: it does not allow to deal with systems containing identical constituents because it does not respect the symmetry or antisymmetry requirements for such particles. A quite natural idea to overcome this difficulty would be that of relating the hitting process not to the individual particles but to the particle number density averaged over an appropriate volume. This can be done by introducing a new phenomenological parameter in the theory which however can be eliminated by an appropriate limiting procedure (see below).

Another way to overcome this problem derives from injecting the physically appropriate principles of the GRW model within the original approach of P. Pearle. This line of thought has led to a quite elegant formulation of a dynamical reduction model, usually referred to as CSL (Pearle 1989; Ghirardi, Pearle, and Rimini 1990) in which the discontinuous jumps which characterize QMSL are replaced by a continuous stochastic evolution in the Hilbert space (a sort of Brownian motion of the statevector).

We will not enter into the rather technical details of this interesting development of the original GRW proposal, since the basic ideas and physical implications are precisely the same as those of the original formulation. Actually, one could argue that the above idea of tackling the problem of identical particles by considering the average particle number within an appropriate volume is correct. In fact it has been proved (Ghirardi, Pearle, and Rimini 1990) that for any CSL dynamics there is a hitting dynamics which, from a physical point of view, is ‘as close to it as one wants’. Instead of entering into the details of the CSL formalism, it is useful, for the discussion below, to analyze a simplified version of it.

7. A Simplified Version of CSL

With the aim of understanding the physical implications of the CSL model, such as the rate of suppression of coherence, we make now some simplifying assumptions. First, we assume that we are dealing with only one kind of particles (e.g., the nucleons), secondly, we disregard the standard Schrödinger term in the evolution and, finally, we divide the whole space in cells of volume \(d^3\). We denote by \(\ket{n_1, n_2 ,\ldots}\) a Fock state in which there are \(n_i\) particles in cell \(i\), and we consider a superposition of two states \(\ket{n_1, n_2 , \ldots}\) and \(\ket{m_1, m_2 , \ldots}\) which differ in the occupation numbers of the various cells of the universe. With these assumptions it is quite easy to prove that the rate of suppression of the coherence between the two states (so that the final state is one of the two and not their superposition) is governed by the quantity:

\[\tag{6} \exp\{-f [(n_1 - m_1)^2 + (n_2 - m_2)^2 +\ldots]t\}, \]

all cells of the universe appearing in the sum within the square brackets in the exponent. Apart from differences relating to the identity of the constituents, the overall physics is quite similar to that implied by QMSL.

Equation 6 offers the opportunity of discussing the possibility of relating the suppression of coherence to gravitational effects. In fact, with reference to this equation we notice that the worst case scenario (from the point of view of the time necessary to suppress coherence) is the one corresponding to the superposition of two states for which the occupation numbers of the individual cells differ only by one unit. Indeed, in this case the amplifying effect of taking the square of the differences disappears. Let us then raise the question: how many nucleons (at worst) should occupy different cells, in order for the given superposition to be dynamically suppressed within the time which characterizes human perceptual processes? Since such a time is of the order of \(10^{-2}\) sec and \(f = 10^{-16}\) sec\(^{-1}\), the number of displaced nucleons must be of the order of \(10^{18}\), which corresponds, to a remarkable accuracy, to a Planck mass. This figure seems to point in the same direction as Penrose’s attempts to relate reduction mechanisms to quantum gravitational effects (Penrose 1989).

Obviously, the model theory we are discussing implies various further physical effects which deserve to be discussed since they might allow a test of the theory with respect to standard quantum mechanics. For review, see (Bassi and Ghirardi 2003; Adler 2007, Bassi et al. 2013). We briefly list the most promising type of experiments which in the future might allow such a crucial test.

  1. Effects in superconducting devices. A detailed analysis has been presented in (Ghirardi and Rimini 1990). As shown there and as follows from estimates about possible effects for superconducting devices (Rae 1990; Gallis and Fleming 1990; Rimini 1995), and for the excitation of atoms (Squires 1991), it turns out not to be possible, with present technology, to perform clear-cut experiments allowing to discriminate the model from standard quantum mechanics.
  2. Loss of coherence in diffraction experiments with macromolecules. The group of Arndt and Zeilinger in Vienna has performed several diffraction experiments involving macromolecules.The most well known include C\(_{60}\), (720 nucleons) (Arndt et al. 1999), C\(_{70}\), (840 nucleons) (Hackermueller et al. 2004) and C\(_{30}\)H\(_{12}\)F\(_{30}\)N\(_2\)O\(_4\), (1030 nucleons) (Gerlich et al. 2007). These experiments aim at testing the validity of the superposition principle towards the macroscopic scale. The challenge is very exciting and near-future technology will probably allow to perform experiments with systems containing up to \(10 ^6\) nucleons and, accordingly, they will represent those imposing most severe limitations to the parameters of Collapse theories.
  3. Loss of coherence in opto-mechanical interferometers. Recently, an interesting proposal of testing the superposition principle by resorting to an experimental set-up involving a (mesoscopic) mirror has been advanced (Marshall et al. 2003). This stimulating proposal has led a group of scientists directly interested in Collapse Theories (Bassi et al. 2005) to check whether the proposed experiment might be a crucial one for testing dynamical reduction models versus quantum mechanics. The problem is extremely subtle because the extension of the oscillations of the mirror is much smaller than the localization accuracy of GRW, so that the localizations processes become almost ineffective. However, quite recently a detailed reconsideration of the physics of such systems has been performed and it has allowed to draw the relevant conclusion that the proposal by Adler (2007) of changing the frequency of the GRW theory of a factor like the one he has considered is untenable.
  4. Spontaneous X-ray emission from Germanium. Collapse models not only forbid macroscopic superpositions to be stable, they share several other features which are forbidden by the standard theory. One of these is the spontaneous emission of radiation from otherwise stable systems, like atoms. While the standard theory predicts that such systems—if not excited—do not emit radiation, collapse models allow for radiation to be produced. The emission rate has been computed both for free charged particles (Fu 1997) and for hydrogenic atoms (Adler et al. 2007). The theoretical predictions were compatible with current experimental data (Fu 1997). At any rate, the importance of such experiments lies in the fact that—so far—they provide the strongest upper bounds on the collapse parameters (Adler et al. 2007). But this is not the whole story: very recently Curceanu et al, 2015, following this line of research, have been able to prove experimentally that the proposal by Adler (2007) of a drastic change of the frequency of the localizations with respect to those of the original GRW paper is definitely incompatible with the experimental data.
  5. In the recent years, another line of research has been proposed, one which makes direct reference to the way, which we will discuss in Section 10, in which collapse models account for the psycho-physical correspondence. The suggested approach might lead to completely new and fundamentally different practical tests of Collapse theories. The basic facts concerning the proposal deserve to be mentioned. In almost all physical situations we have analyzed, the appreciable dynamical changes of the system (tipically, the spreading of the center-of-mass position of a macroscopic object) take a time (years) which is enormously longer than the one between two localizations \((10^{-7}\) sec). On the contrary, as we will discuss below, in the case of conscious perceptions, the collapse time of two brain states in a superposition and the time which is necessary for the emergence of a definite perception, are quite similar, and this has some (small but significant) implications concerning the probabilities of the outcomes. This point has been analyzed in detail and explicitly evaluated by resorting to a simple model of a quantum system subjected to reduction processes(Ghirardi et al, 2014). The idea is to consider a spin 1/2 particle whose spin rotates around the \(x\)-axis with a frequency of about one hundreth of the one of the random measurements ascertaining whether its spin is UP or DOWN with respect to the \(z\)-axis. It turns out that for a superposition with amplitudes \(a\) and \(b\) of the two eigenstates of S\(_z\), the probability of the two supervening perceptions associated to the two outcomes will differ of about 1% from those predicted by quantum mechanics, i.e. \(\lvert a\rvert^2\) and \(\lvert b\rvert^2\), respectively.

    The test would be quite interesting also for the general meaning of collapse theories because it will give some practical evidence concerning the fact that, in the case in which a superposition of two microscopic different states which are able to trigger two precise (and different) perceptions, the brain actually collapses the wavefunction yielding only one perception, an clear-cut indication that the standard theory cannot run the whole process.

Summarizing, we stress that, due to recent technological improvements, experiments in which one might test the deviations from Standard Quantum Theory implied by Collapse Models, seems to have become more feasible. Actually, lot of work has been done and it is still going on in this direction. The subject is developing rapidly and important papers have appeared and interesting experimental work has been and it is being performed. For a detailed technical analysis and for a precise specification of the limits for the parameters \(d\) and \(f\) which have been derived, we refer the reader to the papers by Bassi et al. (2013), Donadi et al. (2013 a,b), Baharami et al. (2014), Großardt et al. (2015, Other Internet Resources), Vinante et al. (2015).

8. Some remarks about Collapse Theories

A. Pais famously recalls in his biography of Einstein:

We often discussed his notions on objective reality. I recall that during one walk Einstein suddenly stopped, turned to me and asked whether I really believed that the moon exists only when I look at it (Pais 1982, p. 5).

In the context of Einstein’s remarks in Albert Einstein, Philosopher-Scientist (Schilpp 1949), we can regard this reference to the moon as an extreme example of ‘a fact that belongs entirely within the sphere of macroscopic concepts’, as is also a mark on a strip of paper that is used to register the outcome of a decay experiment, so that

as a consequence, there is hardly likely to be anyone who would be inclined to consider seriously […] that the existence of the location is essentially dependent upon the carrying out of an observation made on the registration strip. For, in the macroscopic sphere it simply is considered certain that one must adhere to the program of a realistic description in space and time; whereas in the sphere of microscopic situations one is more readily inclined to give up, or at least to modify, this program (p. 671).


the ‘macroscopic’ and the ‘microscopic’ are so inter-related that it appears impracticable to give up this program in the ‘microscopic’ alone (p. 674).

One might speculate that Einstein would not have taken the DRP seriously, given that it is a fundamentally indeterministic program. On the other hand, the DRP allows precisely for this middle ground, between giving up a ‘classical description in space and time’ altogether (the moon is not there when nobody looks), and requiring that it be applicable also at the microscopic level (as within some kind of ‘hidden variables’ theory). It would seem that the pursuit of ‘realism’ for Einstein was more a program that had been very successful rather than an a priori commitment, and that in principle he would have accepted attempts requiring a radical change in our classical conceptions concerning microsystems, provided they would nevertheless allow to take a macrorealist position matching our definite perceptions at this scale.

In the DRP, we can say of an electron in an EPR-Bohm situation that ‘when nobody looks’, it has no definite spin in any direction , and in particular that when it is in a superposition of two states localised far away from each other, it cannot be thought to be at a definite place (see, however, the remarks in Section 11). In the macrorealm, however, objects do have definite positions and are generally describable in classical terms. That is, in spite of the fact that the DRP program is not adding ‘hidden variables’ to the theory, it implies that the moon is definitely there even if no sentient being has ever looked at it. In the words of J. S. Bell, the DRP

allows electrons (in general microsystems) to enjoy the cloudiness of waves, while allowing tables and chairs, and ourselves, and black marks on photographs, to be rather definitely in one place rather than another, and to be described in classical terms (Bell 1986, p. 364).

Such a program, as we have seen, is implemented by assuming only the existence of wave functions, and by proposing a unified dynamics that governs both microscopic processes and ‘measurements’. As regards the latter, no vague definitions are needed. The new dynamical equations govern the unfolding of any physical process, and the macroscopic ambiguities that would arise from the linear evolution are theoretically possible, but only of momentary duration, of no practical importance and no source of embarrassment.

We have not yet analyzed the implications about locality, but since in the DRP program no hidden variables are introduced, the situation can be no worse than in ordinary quantum mechanics: ‘by adding mathematical precision to the jumps in the wave function’, the GRW theory ‘simply makes precise the action at a distance of ordinary quantum mechanics’ (Bell 1987, p. 46). Indeed, a detailed investigation of the locality properties of the theory becomes possible as shown by Bell himself (Bell 1987, p. 47). Moreover, as it will become clear when we will discuss the interpretation of the theory in terms of mass density, the QMSL and CSL theories lead in a natural way to account for a behaviour of macroscopic objects corresponding to our definite perceptions about them, the main objective of Einstein’s requirements.

The achievements of the DRP which are relevant for the debate about the foundations of quantum mechanics can also be concisely summarized in the words of H.P. Stapp:

The collapse mechanisms so far proposed could, on the one hand, be viewed as ad hoc mutilations designed to force ontology to kneel to prejudice. On the other hand, these proposals show that one can certainly erect a coherent quantum ontology that generally conforms to ordinary ideas at the macroscopic level (Stapp 1989, p. 157).

9. Relativistic Dynamical Reduction Models

As soon as the GRW proposal appeared and attracted the attention of J.S. Bell it also stimulated him to look at it from the point of view of relativity theory. As he stated subsequently (Bell 1989a):

When I saw this theory first, I thought that I could blow it out of the water, by showing that it was grossly in violation of Lorentz invariance. That’s connected with the problem of ‘quantum entanglement’, the EPR paradox.

Actually, he had already investigated this point by studying the effect on the theory of a transformation mimicking a nonrelativistic approximation of a Lorentz transformation and he arrived (Bell 1987) at a surprising conclusion:

… the model is as Lorentz invariant as it could be in its nonrelativistic version. It takes away the ground of my fear that any exact formulation of quantum mechanics must conflict with fundamental Lorentz invariance.

What Bell had actually proved by resorting to a two-times formulation of the Schrödinger equation is that the model violates locality by violating outcome independence and not, as deterministic hidden variable theories do, parameter independence.

Indeed, with reference to this point we recall that, as is well known, (Suppes and Zanotti 1976; van Fraassen 1982; Jarrett 1984; Shimony 1983; see also the entry on Bell’s Theorem), Bell’s locality assumption is equivalent to the conjunction of two other assumptions, viz., in Shimony’s terminology, parameter independence and outcome independence. In view of the experimental violation of Bell’s inequality, one has to give up either or both of these assumptions. The above splitting of the locality requirement into two logically independent conditions is particularly useful in discussing the different status of CSL and deterministic hidden variable theories with respect to relativistic requirements. Actually, as proved by Jarrett himself, when parameter independence is violated, if one had access to the variables which specify completely the state of individual physical systems, one could send faster-than-light signals from one wing of the apparatus to the other. Moreover, in Ghirardi and Grassi (1996) it has been proved that it is impossible to build a genuinely relativistically invariant theory which, in its nonrelativistic limit, exhibits parameter dependence. Here we use the term genuinely invariant to denote a theory for which there is no (hidden) preferred reference frame. On the other hand, if locality is violated only by the occurrence of outcome dependence then faster-than-light signaling cannot be achieved (Eberhard 1978; Ghirardi, Rimini, and Weber 1980). Few years after the just mentioned proof by Bell, it has been shown in complete generality (Ghirardi, Grassi, Butterfield, and Fleming 1993) that the GRW and CSL theories, just as standard quantum mechanics, exhibit only outcome dependence. This is to some extent encouraging and shows that there are no reasons of principle making unviable the project of building a relativistically invariant DRM.

Let us be more specific about this crucial problem. P. Pearle was the first to propose (Pearle 1990) a relativistic generalization of CSL to a quantum field theory describing a fermion field coupled to a meson scalar field enriched with the introduction of stochastic and nonlinear terms. A quite detailed discussion of this proposal was presented in (Ghirardi et al. 1990a) where it was shown that the theory enjoys of all properties which are necessary in order to meet the relativistic constraints. Pearle’s approach requires the precise formulation of the idea of stochastic Lorentz invariance. The proposal can be summarized in the following terms:

One considers a fermion field coupled to a meson field and puts forward the idea of inducing localizations for the fermions through their coupling to the mesons and a stochastic dynamical reduction mechanism acting on the meson variables. In practice, one considers Heisenberg evolution equations for the coupled fields and a Tomonaga-Schwinger CSL-type evolution equation with a skew-hermitian coupling to a c-number stochastic potential for the state vector. This approach has been systematically investigated by Ghirardi, Grassi, and Pearle (1990), to which we refer the reader for a detailed discussion. Here we limit ourselves to stressing that, under certain approximations, one obtains in the non-relativistic limit a CSL-type equation inducing spatial localization. However, due to the white noise nature of the stochastic potential, novel renormalization problems arise: the increase per unit time and per unit volume of the energy of the meson field is infinite due to the fact that infinitely many mesons are created. This point has also been lucidly discussed by Bell (1989b) in the talk he delivered at Trieste on the occasion of the 25th anniversary of the International Centre for Theoretical Physics. This talk appeared under the title The Trieste Lecture of John Stewart Bell. For these reasons one cannot consider this as a satisfactory example of a relativistic reduction model.

In the years following the just mentioned attempts there has been a flourishing of researches aimed at getting the desired result. Let us briefly comment about them. As already mentioned, the source of the divergences is the assumption of point interactions between the quantum field operators in the dynamical equation for the statevector, or, equivalently, the white character of the stochastic noise. Having this aspect in mind P. Pearle (1989), L. Diosi (1990) and A. Bassi and G.C. Ghirardi (2002) reconsidered the problem from the beginning by investigating nonrelativistic theories with nonwhite Gaussian noises. The problem turns out to be very difficult from the mathematical point of view, but steps forward have been made. In recent years, a precise formulation of the nonwhite generalization (Bassi and Ferialdi 2009) of the so-called QMUPL model, which represents a simplified version of GRW and CSL, has been proposed. Moreover, a perturbative approach for the CSL model has been worked out (Adler and Bassi 2007, 2008). Further work is necessary. This line of thought is very interesting at the nonrelativistic level; however, it is not yet clear whether it will lead to a real step forward in the development of relativistic theories of spontaneous collapse.

In the same spirit, Nicrosini and Rimini (Nicrosini 2003) tried to smear out the point interactions without success because, in their approach, a preferred reference frame had to be chosen in order to circumvent the nonintegrability of the Tomonaga-Schwinger equation

Also other interesting and different approaches have been suggested. Among them we mention the one by Dove and Squires (Dove 1996) based on discrete rather than continuous stochastic processes and those by Dawker and Herbauts (Dawker 2004a) and Dawker and Henson (Dawker 2004b) formulated on a discrete space-time.

Before going on we consider it important to call attention to the fact that precisely in the same years similar attempts to get a relativistic generalization of the other existing ‘exact’ theory, i.e., Bohmian Mechanics, were going on and that they too have encountered some difficulties. Relevant steps are represented by a paper (Dürr 1999) resorting to a preferred spacetime slicing, by the investigations of Goldstein and Tumulka (Goldstein 2003) and by other scientists (Berndl et. al 1996). However, we must recognize that no one of these attempts has led to a fully satisfactory solution of the problem of having a theory without observers, like Bohmian mechanics, which is perfectly satisfactory from the relativistic point of view, precisely due to the fact that they are not genuinely Lorentz invariant in the sense we have made precise before. Mention should be made also of the attempt by Dewdney and Horton (Dewdney 2001) to build a relativistically invariant model based on particle trajectories.

Let us come back to the relativistic DRP. Some important changes have occurred quite recently. Tumulka (2006a) succeeded in proposing a relativistic version of the GRW theory for N non-interacting distinguishable particles, based on the consideration of a multi-time wavefunction whose evolution is governed by Dirac like equations and adopts as its Primitive Ontology (see the next section) the one which attaches a primary role to the space and time points at which spontaneous localizations occur, as originally suggested by Bell (1987). To my knowledge this represents the first proposal of a relativistic dynamical reduction mechanism which satisfies all relativistic requirements. In particular it is divergence free and foliation independent. However it can deal only with systems containing a fixed number of noninteracting fermions.

At this point explicit mention should be made of the most recent steps which concern our problem. D. Bedingham (2011) following strictly the original proposal by Pearle (1990) of a quantum field theory inducing reductions based on a Tomonaga-Schwinger equation, has worked out an analogous model which, however, overcomes the difficulties of the original model. In fact, Bedingham has circumvented the crucial problems deriving from point interactions by (paying the price of) introducing, besides the fields characterizing the Quantum Field Theories he is interested in, an auxiliary relativistic field that amounts to a smearing of the interactions whilst preserving Lorentz invariance and frame independence. Adopting this point of view and taking advantage also of the proposal by Ghirardi (2000) concerning the appropriate way to define objective properties at any space-time point \(x\), he has been able to work out a fully satisfactory and consistent relativistic scheme for quantum field theories in which reduction processes may occur.

It has also to be mentioned that, taking once more advantage of the ideas of the paper by Ghirardi (2000), various of the just quoted authors (see Bedingham et al. 2013), have been able to prove that it is possible to work out a relativistic generalization of Collapse models when their primitive ontology is taken to be the one given by the mass density interpretation for the nonrelativistic case we will present in what follows.

In view of these results and taking into account the interesting investigations concerning relativistic Bohmian-like theories,the conclusions that Tumulka has drawn concerning the status of attempts to account for the macro-objectification process from a relativistic perspective are well-founded:

A somewhat surprising feature of the present situation is that we seem to arrive at the following alternative: Bohmian mechanics shows that one can explain quantum mechanics, exactly and completely, if one is willing to pay with using a preferred slicing of spacetime; our model suggests that one should be able to avoid a preferred slicing of spacetime if one is willing to pay with a certain deviation from quantum mechanics,

a conclusion that he has rephrased and reinforced in (Tumulka 2006c):

Thus, with the presently available models we have the alternative: either the conventional understanding of relativity is not right, or quantum mechanics is not exact.

Very recently, a thorough and illuminating discussion of the important approach by Tumulka has been presented by Tim Maudlin (2011) in the third revised edition of his book Quantum Non-Locality and Relativity. Tumulka’s position is perfectly consistent with the present ideas concerning the attempts to transform relativistic standard quantum mechanics into an ‘exact’ theory in the sense which has been made precise by J. Bell. Since the only unified, mathematically precise and formally consistent formulations of the quantum description of natural processes are Bohmian mechanics and GRW-like theories, if one chooses the first alternative one has to accept the existence of a preferred reference frame, while in the second case one is not led to such a drastic change of position with respect to relativistic concepts but must accept that the ensuing theory disagrees with the predictions of quantum mechanics and acquires the status of a rival theory with respect to it.

In spite of the fact that the situation is, to some extent, still open and requires further investigations, it has to be recognized that the efforts which have been spent on such a program have made possible a better understanding of some crucial points and have thrown light on some important conceptual issues. First, they have led to a completely general and rigorous formulation of the concept of stochastic invariance. Second, they have prompted a critical reconsideration, based on the discussion of smeared observables with compact support, of the problem of locality at the individual level. This analysis has brought out the necessity of reconsidering the criteria for the attribution of objective local properties to physical systems. In specific situations, one cannot attribute any local property to a microsystem: any attempt to do so gives rise to ambiguities. However, in the case of macroscopic systems, the impossibility of attributing to them local properties (or, equivalently, the ambiguity associated to such properties) lasts only for time intervals of the order of those necessary for the dynamical reduction to take place. Moreover, no objective property corresponding to a local observable, even for microsystems, can emerge as a consequence of a measurement-like event occurring in a space-like separated region: such properties emerge only in the future light cone of the considered macroscopic event. Finally, recent investigations (Ghirardi and Grassi 1996; Ghirardi 2000) have shown that the very formal structure of the theory is such that it does not allow, even conceptually, to establish cause-effect relations between space-like events.

The conclusion of this section, is that the question of whether a relativistic dynamical reduction program can find a satisfactory formulation seems to admit a positive answer.

A last comment. Recently, a paper by Conway and Kochen (Conway 2006, 2006b), which has raised a lot of interest, has been published. A few words about it are in order, to clarify possible misunderstandings. The first and most important aim of the paper is the derivation of what the authors have called The Free Will Theorem, putting forward the provocative idea that if human beings are free to make their choices about the measurements they will perform on one of a pair of far-away entangled particles, then one must admit that also the elementary particles involved in the experiment have free will. One might make several comments on this statement. For what concerns us here the relevant fact is that the authors claim that their theorem implies, as a byproduct, the impossibility of elaborating a relativistically invariant dynamical reduction model. A lively debate has arisen. At the end, Goldstein et al (Goldstein 2010) have made clear why the argument of Conway and Kochen is not pertinent. We may conclude that nothing in principle forbids a perfectly satisfactory relativistic generalization of the GRW theory, and, actually, as repeatedly stressed, there are many elements which indicate that this is actually feasible.

10. Collapse Theories and Definite Perceptions

Some authors (Albert and Vaidman 1989; Albert 1990, 1992) have raised an interesting objection concerning the emergence of definite perceptions within Collapse Theories. The objection is based on the fact that one can easily imagine situations leading to definite perceptions, that nevertheless do not involve the displacement of a large number of particles up to the stage of the perception itself. These cases would then constitute actual measurement situations which cannot be described by the GRW theory, contrary to what happens for the idealized (according to the authors) situations considered in many presentations of it, i.e., those involving the displacement of some sort of pointer. To be more specific, the above papers consider a ‘measurement-like’ process whose output is the emission of a burst of few photons triggered by the position in which a particle hits a screen. This can easily be devised by considering, e.g., a Stern-Gerlach set-up in which a spin 1/2 microsystem, according to the value of its spin component hits a fluorescent screen in different places and excites a small number of atoms which subsequently decay, emitting a small number of photons. The argument goes as follows: if one triggers the apparatus with a superposition of two spin states, since only a few atoms are excited, since the excitations involve displacements which are smaller than the characteristic localization distance of GRW, since GRW does not induce reductions on photon states and, finally, since the photon states immediately overlap, there is no way for the spontaneous localization mechanism to become effective in suppressing the ensuing superposition of the states ‘photons emerging from point \(A\) of the screen’ and ‘photons emerging from point \(B\) of the screen’. On the other hand, since the visual perception threshold is quite low (about 6-7 photons), there is no doubt that the naked eye of a human observer is sufficient to detect whether the luminous spot on the screen is at \(A\) or at \(B\). The conclusion follows: in the case under consideration no dynamical reduction can take place and as a consequence no measurement is over, no outcome is definite, up to the moment in which a conscious observer perceives the spot.

Aicardi et al. (1991) have presented a detailed answer to this criticism. The crucial points of the argument are the following: it is agreed that in the case considered the superposition persists for long times (actually the superposition must persist, since, the system under consideration being microscopic, one could perform interference experiments which everybody would expect to confirm quantum mechanics). However, to deal in the appropriate and correct way with such a criticism, one has to consider all the systems which enter into play (electron, screen, photons and brain) and the universal dynamics governing all relevant physical processes. A simple estimate of the number of ions which are involved in the transmission of the nervous signal up to the higher virtual cortex makes perfectly plausible that, in the process, a sufficient number of particles are displaced by a sufficient spatial amount to satisfy the conditions under which, according to the GRW theory, the suppression of the superposition of the two nervous signals will take place within the time scale of perception.

To avoid misunderstandings, this analysis by no means amounts to attributing a special role to the conscious observer or to perception. The observer’s brain is the only system present in the set-up in which a superposition of two states involving different locations of a large number of particles occurs. As such it is the only place where the reduction can and actually must take place according to the theory. It is extremely important to stress that if in place of the eye of a human being one puts in front of the photon beams a spark chamber or a device leading to the displacement of a macroscopic pointer, or producing ink spots on a computer output, reduction will equally take place. In the given example, the human nervous system is simply a physical system, a specific assembly of particles, which performs the same function as one of these devices, if no other such device interacts with the photons before the human observer does. It follows that it is incorrect and seriously misleading to claim that the GRW theory requires a conscious observer in order that measurements have a definite outcome.

A further remark may be appropriate. The above analysis could be taken by the reader as indicating a very naive and oversimplified attitude towards the deep problem of the mind-brain correspondence. There is no claim and no presumption that GRW allows a physicalist explanation of conscious perception. It is only pointed out that, for what we know about the purely physical aspects of the process, one can state that before the nervous pulses reach the higher visual cortex, the conditions guaranteeing the suppression of one of the two signals are verified. In brief, a consistent use of the dynamical reduction mechanism in the above situation accounts for the definiteness of the conscious perception, even in the extremely peculiar situation devised by Albert and Vaidman.

11. The Interpretation of the Theory and its Primitive Ontologies

As stressed in the opening sentences of this contribution, the most serious problem of standard quantum mechanics lies in its being extremely successful in telling us about what we observe, but being basically silent on what is. This specific feature is closely related to the probabilistic interpretation of the statevector, combined with the completeness assumption of the theory. Notice that what is under discussion is the probabilistic interpretation, not the probabilistic character, of the theory. Also collapse theories have a fundamentally stochastic character, but, due to their most specific feature, i.e., that of driving the statevector of any individual physical system into appropriate and physically meaningful manifolds, they allow for a different interpretation. One could even say (if one wants to avoid that they too, as the standard theory, speak only of what we find) that they require a different interpretation, one that accounts for our perceptions at the appropriate, i.e., macroscopic, level.

We must admit that this opinion is not universally shared. According to various authors, the ‘rules of the game’ embodied in the precise formulation of the GRW and CSL theories represent all there is to say about them. However, this cannot be the whole story: stricter and more precise requirements than the purely formal ones must be imposed for a theory to be taken seriously as a fundamental description of natural processes (an opinion shared by J. Bell). This request of going beyond the purely formal aspects of a theoretical scheme has been denoted as (the necessity of specifying) the Primitive Ontology (PO) of the theory in an extremely interesting recent paper (Allori et al. 2008). The fundamental requisite of the PO is that it should make absolutely precise what the theory is fundamentally about.

This is not a new problem; as already mentioned it has been raised by J. Bell since his first presentation of the GRW theory. Let me summarize the terms of the debate. Given that the wavefunction of a many-particle system lives in a (high-dimensional) configuration space, which is not endowed with a direct physical meaning connected to our experience of the world around us, Bell wanted to identify the ‘local beables’ of the theory, the quantities on which one could base a description of the perceived reality in ordinary three-dimensional space. In the specific context of QMSL, he (Bell 1987 p. 45) suggested that the ‘GRW jumps’, which we called ‘hittings’, could play this role. In fact they occur at precise times in precise positions of the three-dimensional space. As suggested in (Allori et al. 2008) we will denote this position concerning the PO of the GRW theory as the ‘flashes ontology.’

However, later, Bell himself suggested that the most natural interpretation of the wavefunction in the context of a collapse theory would be that it describes the ‘density […] of stuff’ in the 3N-dimensional configuration space (Bell 1990, p. 30), the natural mathematical framework for describing a system of \(N\) particles. Allori et al. (2008) appropriately have pointed out that this position amounts to avoiding commitment about the PO ontology of the theory and, consequently, to leaving vague the precise and meaningful connections it permits to be established between the mathematical description of the unfolding of physical processes and our perception of them.

The interpretation which, in the opinion of the present writer, is most appropriate for collapse theories, has been proposed in (Ghirardi, Grassi and Benatti 1995) and has been referred in Allori et al. 2008 as ‘the mass density ontology’. Let us briefly describe it.

First of all, various investigations (Pearle and Squires 1994) had made clear that QMSL and CSL needed a modification, i.e., the characteristic localization frequency of the elementary constituents of matter had to be made proportional to the mass characterizing the particle under consideration. In particular, the original frequency for the hitting processes \(f = 10^{-16}\) sec\(^{-1}\) is the one characterizing the nucleons, while, e.g., electrons would suffer hittings with a frequency reduced by about 2000 times. Unfortunately we have no space to discuss here the physical reasons which make this choice appropriate; we refer the reader to the above paper, as well as to the recent detailed analysis by Peruzzi and Rimini (2000). With this modification, what the nonlinear dynamics strives to make ‘objectively definite’ is the mass distribution in the whole universe. Second, a deep critical reconsideration (Ghirardi, Grassi, and Benatti 1995) has made evident how the concept of ‘distance’ that characterizes the Hilbert space is inappropriate in accounting for the similarity or difference between macroscopic situations. Just to give a convincing example, consider three states \(\ket{h} , \ket{h^*}\) and \(\ket{t}\) of a macrosystem (let us say a massive macroscopic bulk of matter), the first corresponding to its being located here, the second to its having the same location but one of its atoms (or molecules) being in a state orthogonal to the corresponding state in \(\ket{h}\), and the third having exactly the same internal state of the first but being differently located (there). Then, despite the fact that the first two states are indistinguishable from each other at the macrolevel, while the first and the third correspond to completely different and directly perceivable situations, the Hilbert space distance between \(\ket{h}\) and \(\ket{h^*}\), is equal to that between \(\ket{h}\) and \(\ket{t}\).

When the localization frequency is related to the mass of the constituents, then, in completely generality (i.e., even when one is dealing with a body which is not almost rigid, such as a gas or a cloud), the mechanism leading to the suppression of the superpositions of macroscopically different states is fundamentally governed by the the integral of the squared differences of the mass densities associated to the two superposed states. Actually, in the original paper the mass density at a point was identified with its average over the characteristic volume of the theory, i.e., \(10^{-15}\) cm\(^3\) around that point. It is however easy to convince oneself that there is no need to do so and that the mass density at any point, directly identified by the statevector (see below), is the appropriate quantity on which to base an appropriate ontology. Accordingly, we take the following attitude: what the theory is about, what is real ‘out there’ at a given space point \(\boldsymbol{x}\), is just a field, i.e., a variable \(m(\mathbf{x},t)\) given by the expectation value of the mass density operator \(M(\boldsymbol{x})\) at \(\boldsymbol{x}\) obtained by multiplying the mass of any kind of particle times the number density operator for the considered type of particle and summing over all possible types of particles which can be present:

\[\begin{align} \tag{7} m(\boldsymbol{x},t) &= \langle F,t \mid M(\boldsymbol{x}) \mid F,t \rangle; \\ M(\boldsymbol{x}) &= {\sum}_{(k)} m_{(k)}a^*_{(k)}(\boldsymbol{x})a_{(k)}(\boldsymbol{x}). \end{align}\]

Here \(\ket{F,t}\) is the statevector characterizing the system at the given time, and \(a^*_{(k)}(\boldsymbol{x})\) and \(a_{(k)}(\boldsymbol{x})\) are the creation and annihilation operators for a particle of type \(k\) at point \(\boldsymbol{x}\). It is obvious that within standard quantum mechanics such a function cannot be endowed with any objective physical meaning due to the occurrence of linear superpositions which give rise to values that do not correspond to what we find in a measurement process or what we perceive. In the case of GRW or CSL theories, if one considers only the states allowed by the dynamics one can give a description of the world in terms of \(m(\boldsymbol{x},t)\), i.e., one recovers a physically meaningful account of physical reality in the usual 3-dimensional space and time. To illustrate this crucial point we consider, first of all, the embarrassing situation of a macroscopic object in the superposition of two differently located position states. We have then simply to recall that in a collapse model relating reductions to mass density differences, the dynamics suppresses in extremely short times the embarrassing superpositions of such states to recover the mass distribution corresponding to our perceptions. Let us come now to a microsystem and let us consider the equal weight superposition of two states \(\ket{h}\) and \(\ket{t}\) describing a microscopic particle in two different locations. Such a state gives rise to a mass distribution corresponding to 1/2 of the mass of the particle in the two considered space regions. This seems, at first sight, to contradict what is revealed by any measurement process. But in such a case we know that the theory implies that the dynamics running all natural processes within GRW ensures that whenever one tries to locate the particle he will always find it in a definite position, e.g., one and only one of the Geiger counters which might be triggered by the passage of the proton will fire, just because a superposition of ‘a counter which has fired’ and ‘one which has not fired’ is dynamically forbidden.

This analysis shows that one can consider at all levels (the micro and the macroscopic ones) the field \(m(\mathbf{x},t)\) as accounting for ‘what is out there’, as originally suggested by Schrödinger with his realistic interpretation of the square of the wave function of a particle as representing the ‘fuzzy’ character of the mass (or charge) of the particle. Obviously, within standard quantum mechanics such a position cannot be maintained because ‘wavepackets diffuse, and with the passage of time become infinitely extended … but however far the wavefunction has extended, the reaction of a detector … remains spotty’, as appropriately remarked in (Bell 1990). As we hope to have made clear, the picture is radically different when one takes into account the new dynamics which succeeds perfectly in reconciling the spread and sharp features of the wavefunction and of the detection process, respectively.

It is also extremely important to stress that, by resorting to the quantity (7) one can define an appropriate ‘distance’ between two states as the integral over the whole 3-dimensional space of the square of the difference of \(m(\boldsymbol{x},t)\) for the two given states, a quantity which turns out to be perfectly appropriate to ground the concept of macroscopically similar or distinguishable Hilbert space states. In turn, this distance can be used as a basis to define a sensible psychophysical correspondence within the theory.

12. The Problem of the Tails of the Wave Function

In recent years, there has been a lively debate around a problem which has its origin, according to some of the authors which have raised it, in the fact that even though the localization process which corresponds to multiplying the wave function times a Gaussian and thus lead to wave functions strongly peaked around the position of the hitting, they allow nevertheless the final wavefuntion to be different from zero over the whole of space. The first criticism of this kind was raised by A. Shimony (1990) and can be summarized by his sentence,

one should not tolerate tails in wave functions which are so broad that their different parts can be discriminated by the senses, even if very low probability amplitude is assigned to them.

After a localization of a macroscopic system, typically the pointer of the apparatus, its centre of mass will be associated to a wave function which is different from zero over the whole space. If one adopts the probabilistic interpretation of the standard theory, this means that even when the measurement process is over, there is a nonzero (even though extremely small) probability of finding its pointer in an arbitrary position, instead of the one corresponding to the registered outcome. This is taken as unacceptable, as indicating that the DRP does not actually overcome the macro-objectification problem.

Let us state immediately that the (alleged) problem arises entirely from keeping the standard interpretation of the wave function unchanged, in particular assuming that its modulus squared gives the probability density of the position variable. However, as we have discussed in the previous section, there are much more serious reasons of principle which require to abandon the probabilistic interpretation and replace it either with the ‘flash ontology’, or with the ‘ mass density ontology’ which we have discussed above.

Before entering into a detailed discussion of this subtle point we need to focus better the problem. We cannot avoid making two remarks. Suppose one adopts, for the moment, the conventional quantum position. We agree that, within such a framework, the fact that wave functions never have strictly compact spatial support can be considered puzzling. However this is an unavoidable problem arising directly from the mathematical features (spreading of wave functions) and from the probabilistic interpretation of the theory, and not at all a problem peculiar to the dynamical reduction models. Indeed, the fact that, e.g., the wave function of the center of mass of a pointer or of a table has not a compact support has never been taken to be a problem for standard quantum mechanics. When, e.g., the center of mass of a table is extremely well peaked around a given point in space, it has always been accepted that it describes a table located at a certain position, and that this corresponds in some way to our perception of it. It is obviously true that, for the given wave function, the quantum rules entail that if a measurement were performed the table could be found (with an extremely small probability) to be kilometers far away, but this is not the measurement or the macro-objectification problem of the standard theory. The latter concerns a completely different situation, i.e., that in which one is confronted with a superposition with comparable weights of two macroscopically separated wave functions, both of which possess tails (i.e., have non-compact support) but are appreciably different from zero only in far-away narrow intervals. This is the really embarrassing situation which conventional quantum mechanics is unable to make understandable. To which perception of the position of the pointer (of the table) does this wave function correspond?

The implications for this problem of the adoption of the QMSL theory should be obvious. Within GRW, the superposition of two states which, when considered individually, are assumed to lead to different and definite perceptions of macroscopic locations, are dynamically forbidden. If some process tends to produce such superpositions, then the reducing dynamics induces the localization of the centre of mass (the associated wave function being appreciably different from zero only in a narrow and precise interval). Correspondingly, the possibility arises of attributing to the system the property of being in a definite place and thus of accounting for our definite perception of it. Summarizing, we stress once more that the criticism about the tails as well as the requirement that the appearance of macroscopically extended (even though extremely small) tails be strictly forbidden is exclusively motivated by uncritically committing oneself to the probabilistic interpretation of the theory, even for what concerns the psycho-physical correspondence: when this position is taken, states assigning non-exactly vanishing probabilities to different outcomes of position measurements should correspond to ambiguous perceptions about these positions. Since neither within the standard formalism nor within the framework of dynamical reduction models a wave function can have compact support, taking such a position leads to conclude that it is just the linear character of the Hilbert space description of physical systems which has to be given up.

It ought to be stressed that there is nothing in the GRW theory which forbids or makes problematic to assume that the localization function has compact support, but it also has to be noted that following this line would be totally useless: since the evolution equation contains the kinetic energy term, any function, even if it has compact support at a given time, will instantaneously spread acquiring a tail extending over the whole of space. If one sticks to the probabilistic interpretation and one accepts the completeness of the description of the states of physical systems in terms of the wave function, the tail problem cannot be avoided.

The solution to the tails problem can only derive from abandoning completely the probabilistic interpretation and from adopting a more physical and realistic interpretation relating ‘what is out there’ to, e.g., the mass density distribution over the whole universe. In this connection, the following example will be instructive. Take a massive sphere of normal density and mass of about 1 kg. Classically, the mass of this body would be totally concentrated within the radius of the sphere, call it \(r\). In QMSL, after the extremely short time interval in which the collapse dynamics leads to a ‘regime’ situation, and if one considers a sphere with radius \(r + 10^{-5}\) cm, the integral of the mass density over the rest of space turns out to be an incredibly small fraction (of the order of 1 over 10 to the power \(10^{15})\) of the mass of a single proton. In such conditions, it seems quite legitimate to claim that the macroscopic body is localised within the sphere.

However, also this quite reasonable conclusion has been questioned and it has been claimed (Lewis 1997), that the very existence of the tails implies that the enumeration principle (i.e., the fact that the claim ‘particle 1 is within this box & particle 2 is within this box & … & particle \(n\) is within this box & no other particle is within this box’ implies the claim ‘there are \(n\) particles within this box’) does not hold, if one takes seriously the mass density interpretation of collapse theories. This paper has given rise to a long debate which would be inappropriate to reproduce here.

We conclude this brief analysis by stressing once more that, in the opinion of the present writer, all the disagreements and the misunderstandings concerning this problem have their origin in the fact that the idea that the probabilistic interpretation of the wave function must be abandoned has not been fully accepted by the authors who find some difficulties in the proposed mass density interpretation of the Collapse Theories. For a recent reconsideration of the problem we refer the reader to the paper by Lewis (2003).

13. The Status of Collapse Models and Recent Positions about them

We recall that, as stated in Section 3, the macro-objectification problem has been at the centre of the most lively and most challenging debate originated by the quantum view of natural processes. According to the majority of those who adhere to the orthodox position such a problem does not deserve a particular attention: classical concepts are a logical prerequisite for the very formulation of quantum mechanics and, consequently, the measurement process itself, the dividing line between the quantum and the classical world, cannot and must not be investigated, but simply accepted. This position has been lucidly summarized by J. Bell himself (1981):

Making a virtue of necessity and influenced by positivistic and instrumentalist philosophies, many came to hold not only that it is difficult to find a coherent picture but that it is wrong to look for one—if not actually immoral then certainly unprofessional

The situation has seen many changes in the course of time, and the necessity of making a clear distinction between what is quantum and what is classical has given rise to many proposals for ‘easy solutions’ to the problem which are based on the possibility, for all practical purposes (FAPP), of locating the splitting between these two faces of reality at different levels.

Then came Bohmian mechanics, a theory which has made clear, in a lucid and perfectly consistent way, that there is no reason of principle requiring a dichotomic description of the world. A universal dynamical principle runs all physical processes and even though ‘it completely agrees with standard quantum predictions’ it implies wave-packet reduction in micro-macro interactions and the classical behaviour of classical objects.

As we have mentioned, the other consistent proposal, at the nonrelativistic level, of a conceptually satisfactory solution of the macro-objectification problem is represented by the Collapse Theories which are the subject of these pages. Contrary to bohmian mechanics, they are rival theory of quantum mechanics, since they make different predictions (even though quite difficult to put into evidence) concerning various physical processes.

Let us now analyze other recent critical positions concerning the two just mentioned approaches (in what follows I will take advantage of the nice analysis of a paper which I have been asked to referee and of which I do not know the author). Various physicists have criticized Bohm approach on the basis that, being empirically indistinguishable from quantum mechanics, such an approach is an example of ‘bad science’ or of ‘a degenerate research program’. Useless to say, I do not consider such criticisms as appropriate; the conceptual advantages and the internal consistency of the approach render it an extremely appealing theoretical scheme (incidentally, one should not forget that it has been just the critical investigations on such a theory which have led Bell to derive his famous and conceptually extremely relevant inequality). On the contrary, I am fully convinced that to consider as acceptable a theory like the standard one, which is incapable of accounting for the way in which it assumes the measurement apparatuses to work, and to deal with them introduces a postulate which plainly contradicts the other assumption of the theory, is not a scientifically tenable position.

This being the situation, one would think that theories like the GRW model would be exempt from an analogous charge, since they actually are (in principle) empirically different from the standard theory. For instance they disagree from such a theory since they forbid the occurrence of macroscopic massive entangled states. In spite of this, they have been the object of an analogous attack by the adherents to the ‘new orthodoxy’ (Bub 1997; Joos et al. 1996; Zurek, 1993) pointing out that environmental induced decoherence shows that, FAPP, collapse theories are simply phenomenological accounts of the reduced state to which one has to resort since one has no control of the degrees of freedom of the environment. When one takes such a position, one is claiming that, essentially, GRW cannot be taken as a fundamental description of nature, mainly because it suffers from the limitation of being empirically indistinguishable from the standard theory, provided such a theory is correctly applied taking into account the actual physical situation. Also in this case, and even at the level at which such an analysis is performed, the practical indistinguishability from the standard approach should not be regarded as a sufficient reason to not take seriously collapse models. In fact, there are many very well known and compelling reasons (see, e.g., Bassi and Ghirardi 2000; Adler 2003) to prefer a logically consistent unified theory to one which makes sense only due to the alleged practical impossibility of detecting the superpositions of macroscopically distinguishable states. At any rate, in principle, such theories can be tested against the standard one and it seems that such a challenge is already under investigation. .

But this is not the whole story. Another criticism, aimed to ‘deny’ the potential interest of collapse theories makes reference to the fact that within any such theory the ensuing dynamics for the statistical operator can be considered as the reduced dynamics deriving from a unitary (and, consequently, essentially a standard quantum) dynamics for the states of an enlarged Hilbert space of a composite quantum system \(S+E\) involving, besides the physical system \(S\) of interest, an ancilla \(E\) whose degrees of freedom are completely unaccessible: due to the quantum dynamical semigroup nature of the evolution equation for the statistical operator, any GRW-like model can always be seen as a phenomenological model deriving from a standard quantum evolution on a larger Hilbert space. In this way, the unitary deterministic evolution characterizing quantum mechanics would be fully restored.

Apart from the obvious remark that such a critical attitude completely fails to grasp—and indeed, purposefully ignores—the most important feature of collapse theories, i.e., of dealing with individual quantum systems and not with statistical ensembles and of yielding a perfectly satisfactory description, matching our perceptions concerning individual macroscopic systems, invoking an unaccessible ancilla to account for the nonlinear and stochastic character of GRW-type theories is once more a purely verbal way of avoiding facing the real puzzling aspects of the quantum description of macroscopic systems. This is not the only negative aspect of such a position; any attempt considering legitimate to introduce unaccessible entities in the theory, when one takes into consideration that there are infinitely possible and inequivalent ways of doing this, amounts really to embarking oneself in a ‘degenerate research program’.

Other reasons for ignoring the dynamical reduction program have been put forward recently by the community of scientists involved in the interesting and exciting field of quantum information. We will not spend too much time in analyzing and discussing the new position about the foundational issues which have motivated the elaboration of collapse theories. The crucial fact is that, from this perspective, one takes the theory not to be about something real ‘occurring out there’ in a real word, but simply about information. This point is made extremely explicit in a recent paper (Zeilinger 2005):

information is the most basic notion of quantum mechanics, and it is information about possible measurement results that is represented in the quantum state. Measurement results are nothing more than states of the classical apparatus used by the experimentalist. The quantum system then is nothing other than the consistently constructed referent of the information represented in the quantum state.

It is clear that if one takes such a position almost all motivations to be worried by the measurement problem disappear, and with them the reasons to work out what Bell has denoted as ‘an exact version of quantum mechanics’. The most appropriate reply to this type of criticisms is to recall that J. Bell (1990) has included ‘information’ among the words which must have no place in a formulation with any pretension to physical precision. In particular he has stressed that one cannot even mention information unless one has given a precise answer to the two following questions: Whose information? and Information about what?

A much more serious attitude is to call attention, as many serious authors do, to the fact that since collapse theories represent rival theories with respect to standard quantum mechanics they lead to the identification of experimental situations which would allow, in principle, crucial tests to discriminate between the two. As we have discussed above, presently, fully discriminating tests seem not to be completely out of reach.

14. Summary

We hope to have succeeded in giving a clear picture of the ideas, the implications, the achievements and the problems of the DRP. We conclude by stressing once more our position with respect to the Collapse Theories. Their interest derives entirely from the fact that they have given some hints about a possible way out from the difficulties characterizing standard quantum mechanics, by proving that explicit and precise models can be worked out which agree with all known predictions of the theory and nevertheless allow, on the basis of a universal dynamics governing all natural processes, to overcome in a mathematically clean and precise way the basic problems of the standard theory. In particular, the Collapse Models show how one can work out a theory that makes perfectly legitimate to take a macrorealistic position about natural processes, without contradicting any of the experimentally tested predictions of standard quantum mechanics. Finally, they might give precise hints about where to look in order to put into evidence, experimentally, possible violations of the superposition principle.


  • Adler, S., 2003, “Why Decoherence has not Solved the Measurement Problem: A Response to P. W. Anderson”, Stud.Hist.Philos.Mod.Phys., 34: 135.
  • Adler, S., 2007, “Lower and Upper Bounds on CSL Parameters from Latent Image Formation and IGM Heating”, Journal of Physics, A40: 2935.
  • Adler, S. and Bassi, A., 2007, “Collapse models with non-white noises” Journal of Physics, A41: 395308.
  • –––, 2008, “Collapse models with non-white noises II”, Journal of Physics, A40: 15083.
  • Adler, S. and Ramazanoglu, F.M., 2007, “Photon emission rate from atomic systems in the CSL model”, Journal of Physics, A40: 13395.
  • Aicardi, F., Borsellino, A., Ghirardi, G.C., and Grassi, R., 1991, “Dynamic models for state-vector reduction—Do they ensure that measurements have outcomes?”, Foundations of Physics Letters, 4: 109.
  • Albert, D.Z., 1990, “On the Collapse of the Wave Function”, in Sixty-Two Years of Uncertainty, A. Miller (ed.), Plenum, New York.
  • –––, 1992, Quantum Mechanics and Experience, Harvard University Press, Cambridge, Mass.
  • Albert, D.Z. and Vaidman, L., 1989, “On a proposed postulate of state reduction”, Physics Letters, A139: 1.
  • Allori, V., Goldstein, S., Tumulka, R., and Zanghi, N., 2008, “On the Common Structure of Bohmian Mechanics and the Ghirardi-Rimini-Weber Theory”, British Journal for the Philosophy of Science, 59: 353–389.
  • Arndt, M, Nairz, O., Vos-Adreae, J., van der Zouw, G. and Zeilinger, A., 1999, “Wave-particle duality of C60 molecules”, Nature, 401: 680.
  • Bahrami, M., Donadi, S., Ferialdi, L., Bassi, A., Curceanu, C., Di Domenico, A., Hiesmayr, B.C., 2014, “Are collapse models testable with quantum oscillating systems? The case of neutrinos, kaons, chiral molecules”, Nature: Scientific Reports, 3: 1952.
  • Bassi, A. and Ferialdi, L., 2009, “Non-Markovian quantum trajectories: An exact result”, Physical Review Letters, 103: 050403.
  • –––, 2009, “Non-Markovian dynamics for a free quantum particle subject to spontaneous collapse in space: general solution and main properties”, Physical Review, A 80: 012116.
  • Bassi, A., D.-A. Deckert, and Ferialdi, L., 2010, “Breaking quantum linearity: constraints from human perception and cosmological implications ”, Europhysics Letters, 92: 5006.
  • Bassi, A. and Ghirardi G.C., 2000, “A general argument against the universal validity of the superposition principle”, Physics Letters, A 275: 373.
  • –––, 2001, “Counting marbles: Reply to Clifton and Monton”, British Journal for the Philosophy of Science, 52: 125.
  • –––, 2002, “Dynamical reduction models with general Gaussian noises”, Physical Review A, 65: 042114.
  • –––, 2003, “Dynamical Reduction Models”, Physics Reports, 379: 257.
  • Bassi, A., Ippoliti, E. and Adler, S., 2005, “Relativistic Reduction Dynamics”, Foundations of Physics, 41: 686.
  • Bassi, A., Lochan, K., Satin, S., Singh, T.P., and Ulbricht, H., 2013, “Models of Wave-function Collapse, Underlying Theories, and Experimental Tests”, Review of Modern Physics, 85: 47141.
  • Bedingham, D., 2011, “Towards Quantum Superpositions of a Mirror: an Exact Open Systems Analysis”, Journal of Physics, A38: 2715.
  • Bedingham, D., Duerr, D., Ghirardi, G.C., Goldstein, S., Tumulka, R. and Zanghi, N. 2014, “Matter Density and Relativistic Models of Wave Function Collapse”, Journal of Statistical Physics, 154: 623.
  • Bell, J.S., 1981, “Bertlmann’s socks and the nature of reality”, Journal de Physique, Colloque C2, suppl. au numero 3, Tome 42: 41.
  • –––, 1986, “Six possible worlds of quantum mechanics”, in Proceedings of the Nobel Symposium 65: Possible Worlds in Arts and Sciences, de Gruyter, New York.
  • –––, 1987, “Are there quantum jumps?”, in Schrödinger—Centenary Celebration of a Polymath, C.W. Kilmister (ed.), Cambridge University Press, Cambridge.
  • –––, 1989a, “Towards an Exact Quantum mechanics”, in Themes in Contemporary Physics II, S. Deser, R.J. Finkelstein (eds.), World Scientific, Singapore.
  • –––, 1989b, “The Trieste Lecture of John Stuart Bell”, Journal of Physics, A40: 2919.
  • –––, 1990, “Against ‘measurement’”, in Sixty-Two Years of Uncertainty, A. Miller (ed.), Plenum, New York.
  • Berndl, K., Duerr, D., Goldstein, S., Zanghi, N., 1996 , “Nonlocality, Lorentz Invariance, and Bohmian Quantum Theory”, Physical Review , A53: 2062.
  • Bohm, D., 1952, “A suggested interpretation of the quantum theory in terms of hidden variables. I & II.” Physical Review, 85: 166, ibid., 85: 180.
  • Bohm, D. and Bub, J., 1966, “A proposed solution of the measurement problem in quantum mechanics by a hidden variable theory”, Reviews of Modern Physics, 38: 453.
  • Born, M., 1971, The Born-Einstein Letters, Walter and Co., New York.
  • Brown, H.R., 1986, “The insolubility proof of the quantum measurement problem”, Foundations of Physics, 16: 857.
  • Bub, J., 1997, “Interpreting the Quantum World”, Cambridge University Press, Cambridge.
  • Busch, P. and Shimony, A., 1996, “Insolubility of the quantum measurement problem for unsharp observables”, Studies in History and Philosophy of Modern Physics, 27B: 397.
  • Clifton, R. and Monton, B., 1999a, “Losing your marbles in wavefunction collapse theories”, British Journal for the Philosophy of Science, 50: 697.
  • –––, 1999b, “Counting marbles with ‘accessible’ mass density: A reply to Bassi and Ghirardi”, British Journal for the Philosophy of Science, 51: 155.
  • Conway, J. and Kochen, S., 2006, “The Free Will Theorem”, to appear in Foundations of Physics . Also quant-phys 0604079 .
  • –––, 2006b, “On Adler’s Conway Kochen Twin Argument”, quant-phys 0610147 to appear on Foundations of Physics .
  • –––, 2007, “Reply to Comments of Bassi, Ghirardi and Tumulka on the Free Will Theorem”, quant-phys 0701016 to appear on Foundations of Physics.
  • Curceanu, C., Hiesmayr, B.C., and Piscicchia, K., 2015, “X-rays help to unfuzzy the concept of measurement”, Journal of Advances in Physics, 4: 263.
  • Dawker, F. and Herbauts, I., 2004a, “Simulating Causal Collapse Models”, Classical and Quantum Gravity, 21: 2936.
  • –––, 2004b, “A Spontaneous Collapse Model on a Lattice”, Journal of Statistical Physics, 115: 1394.
  • Dowker F. and Henson J., 2004, “Spontaneous collapse models on a lattice”, Journal of Statistical Physics, 115: 1327.
  • d’Espagnat, B., 1971, “Conceptual Foundations of Quantum Mechanics”, Reading, MA: W.A. Benjamin, .
  • Dirac, P.A.M., 1948, Quantum Mechanics, Oxford: Clarendon Press.
  • Dewdney, C. and Horton, G., 2001, “A non-local, Lorentz-invariant, hidden-variable interpretation of relativistic quantum mechanics based on particle trajectories”, Journal of Physics A, 34: 9871.
  • Diosi, L., 1990, “Relativistic theory for continuous measurement of quantum fields”, Physical Review A, 42: 5086.
  • Donadi, S., Bassi, A., Curceanu, C., Di Domenico, A. and Hiesmayr, H., 2013a, “Are Collapse Models Testable via Flavor Oscillations? ” Foundations of Physics, 43: 1066.
  • Donadi, S., Bassi, A., Curceanu, C., Ferialdi, L., 2013b, “The effect of spontaneous collapses on neutrino oscillations” Foundations of Physics, 43: 1066.
  • Dove, C. and Squires, E.J., 1995 “Symmetric Versions of Explicit Wavefunctions Collapse Models”, Foundations of Physics A, 25: 1267.
  • Dürr, D., Goldstein, S., Münch-Berndl, K., Zanghi, N., 1999, “Hypersurface Bohm—Dirac models”, Physical Review, A60: 2729.
  • Eberhard, P., 1978, “Bell’s theorem and different concepts of locality”, Nuovo Cimento, 46B: 392.
  • Fine, A., 1970, “Insolubility of the quantum measurement problem”, Physical Review, D2: 2783.
  • Fonda, L., Ghirardi, G.C., and Rimini A., 1978, “Decay theory of unstable quantum systems”, Reports on Progress in Physics, 41: 587.
  • Fu, Q., 1997, “Spontaneous radiation of free electrons in a nonrelativistic collapse model”, Physical Review, A56: 1806.
  • Gallis, M.R. and Fleming, G.N., 1990, “Environmental and spontaneous localization”, Physical Review, A42: 38.
  • Gerlich, S., Hackermüller, L., Hornberger, K., Stibor, A., Ulbricht, H., Gring, M., Goldfarb, F., Savas, T., Müri, M., Mayor, M and Arndt, M., 2007, “A Kapitza-Dirac-Talbot-Lau interferometer for highly polarizable molecules”, Nature Physics, 3: 711.
  • Ghirardi, G.C., 2000, “Local measurements of nonlocal observables and the relativistic reduction process”, Foundations of Physics, 30: 1337.
  • –––, 2007, “Some reflections inspired by my research activity in quantum mechanics”, Journal of Physics A, 40: 2891.
  • Ghirardi, G.C. and Grassi, R., 1996, “Bohm’s Theory versus Dynamical Reduction”, in Bohmian Mechanics and Quantum Theory: an Appraisal, J. Cushing et al. (eds), Kluwer, Dordrecht.
  • Ghirardi, G.C., Grassi, R., and Benatti, F., 1995, “Describing the macroscopic world—Closing the circle within the dynamical reduction program”, Foundations of Physics, 25: 5.
  • Ghirardi, G.C., Grassi, R., Butterfield, J., and Fleming, G.N., 1993, “Parameter dependence and outcome dependence in dynamic models for state-vector reduction”, Foundations of Physics, 23: 341.
  • Ghirardi, G.C., Grassi, R., and Pearle, P., 1990, “Relativistic dynamic reduction models—General framework and examples”, Foundations of Physics, 20: 1271.
  • Ghirardi, G.C., Pearle, P., and Rimini, A., 1990, “Markov-processes in Hilbert-space and continuous spontaneous localization of systems of identical particles”, Physical Review, A42: 78.
  • Ghirardi, G.C. and Rimini, A., 1990, “Old and New Ideas in the Theory of Quantum Measurement”, in Sixty-Two Years of Uncertainty, A. Miller (ed.), Plenum, New York .
  • Ghirardi, G.C., Rimini, A., and Weber, T., 1980, “A general argument against superluminal transmission through the quantum-mechanical measurement process”, Lettere al Nuovo Cimento, 27: 293.
  • –––, 1986, “Unified dynamics for microscopic and macroscopic systems”, Physical Review, D34: 470.
  • Ghirardi, G.C. and Romano, R., 2014, “Collapse Models and Perceptual Processes”, Journal of Physics: Conference Series, 504: 012022.
  • Gisin, N., 1984, “Quantum measurements and stochastic processes”, Physical Review Letters, 52: 1657, and “Reply”, ibid., 53: 1776.
  • –––, 1989, “Stochastic quantum dynamics and relativity”, Helvetica Physica Acta, 62: 363.
  • Goldstein, S. and Tumulka, R., 2003, “Opposite arrows of time can reconcile relativity and nonlocality”, Classical and Quantum Gravity, 20: 557.
  • Goldstein, S., Tausk, D.V., Tumulka, R., and Zanghi, N., 2010, “What does the Free Will Theorem Actually Prove?”, Notice of the American Mathematical Society, 57: 1451.
  • Gottfried, K., 2000, “Does Quantum Mechanics Carry the Seeds of its own Destruction?”, in Quantum Reflections, D. Amati et al. (eds), Cambridge University Press, Cambridge.
  • Hackermüller, L., Hornberger, K., Brexger, B., Zeilinger, A. and Arndt, M., 2004, “Decoherence of matter waves by thermal emission of radiation”, Nature, 427: 711.
  • Jarrett, J.P., 1984, “On the physical significance of the locality conditions in the Bell arguments”, Nous, 18: 569.
  • Joos, E., Zeh, H.D., Kiefer, C., Giulini, D., Kupsch, J., and Stamatescu, I.-O., 1996, “Decoherence and the Appearance of a Classical World”, Springer, Berlin.
  • Lewis, P., 1997, “Quantum mechanics, orthogonality and counting”, British Journal for the Philosophy of Science, 48: 313.
  • –––, 2003, “Four strategies for dealing with the counting anomaly in spontaneous collapse theories of quantum mechanics”, International Studies in the Philosophy of Science, 17: 137.
  • Marshall, W., Simon, C., Penrose, G. and Bouwmeester, D., 2003, “Towards quantum superpositions of a mirror”, Physical Review Letters, 91: 130401.
  • Maudlin, T., 2011, Quantum Non-Locality and Relativity Wiley-Blackwell.
  • Nicrosini, O. and Rimini, A., 2003, “Relativistic spontaneous localization: a proposal”, Foundations of Physics, 33: 1061.
  • Pais, A., 1982, Subtle is the Lord, Oxford University Press, Oxford.
  • Pearle, P., 1976, “Reduction of statevector by a nonlinear Schrödinger equation”, Physical Review, D13: 857.
  • –––, 1979, “Toward explaining why events occur”, International Journal of Theoretical Physics, 18: 489 .
  • –––, 1989, “Combining stochastic dynamical state-vector reduction with spontaneous localization”, Physical Review, A39: 2277.
  • –––, 1990, “Toward a Relativistic Theory of Statevector Reduction”, in Sixty-Two Years of Uncertainty, A. Miller (ed.), Plenum, New York.
  • –––, 1999, “Collapse Models”, in Open Systems and measurement in Relativistic Quantum Theory, H.P. Breuer and F. Petruccione (eds.), Springer, Berlin.
  • –––, 1999b, “Relativistic Collapse Model With Tachyonic Features”, Physical Review, A59: 80.
  • Pearle, P. and Squires, E., 1994, “Bound-state excitation, nucleon decay experiments, and models of wave-function collapse”, Physical Review Letters, 73: 1.
  • Penrose, R., 1989, The Emperor’s New Mind, Oxford University Press, Oxford.
  • Peruzzi, G. and Rimini, A., 2000, “Compoundation invariance and Bohmian mechanics”, Foundations of Physics, 30: 1445.
  • Rae, A.I.M., 1990, “Can GRW theory be tested by experiments on SQUIDs?”, Journal of Physics, A23: 57.
  • Rimini, A., 1995, “Spontaneous Localization and Superconductivity”, in Advances in Quantum Phenomena, E. Beltrametti et al. (eds.), Plenum, New York.
  • Schrödinger, E., 1935, “Die gegenwärtige Situation in der Quantenmechanik”, Naturwissenschaften, 23: 807.
  • Schilpp, P.A. (ed.), 1949, Albert Einstein: Philosopher-Scientist, Tudor, New York.
  • Shimony, A., 1974, “Approximate measurement in quantum-mechanics. 2”, Physical Review, D9: 2321.
  • –––, 1983, “Controllable and uncontrollable non-locality”, in Proceedings of the International Symposium on the Foundations of Quantum Mechanics, S. Kamefuchi et al. (eds), Physical Society of Japan, Tokyo.
  • –––, 1989, “Search for a worldview which can accommodate our knowledge of microphysics”, in Philosophical Consequences of Quantum Theory, J.T. Cushing and E. McMullin (eds), University of Notre Dame Press, Notre Dame, Indiana.
  • –––, 1990, “Desiderata for modified quantum dynamics”, in PSA 1990, Volume 2, A. Fine, M. Forbes and L. Wessels (eds), Philosophy of Science Association, East Lansing, Michigan.
  • Squires, E., 1991, “Wave-function collapse and ultraviolet photons”, Physics Letters, A 158: 431.
  • Stapp, H.P., 1989, “Quantum nonlocality and the description of nature”, in Philosophical Consequences of Quantum Theory, J.T. Cushing and E. McMullin (eds), University of Notre Dame Press, Notre Dame, Indiana.
  • Suppes, P. and Zanotti, M., 1976, “On the determinism of hidden variables theories with strict correlation and conditional statistical independence of observables”, in Logic and Probability in Quantum Mechanics, P. Suppes (ed.), Reidel, Dordrecht.
  • Tumulka, R., 2006a, “A Relativistic Version of the Ghirardi-Rimini-Weber Model”, Journal of Statistical Physics, 125: 821.
  • –––, 2006b, “On Spontaneous Wave Function Collapse and Quantum Field Theory”, Proceedings of the Royal Society, London, A462: 1897.
  • –––, 2006c, “Collapse and Relativity”, in Quantum Mechanics: Are there Quantum Jumps? and On the Present Status of Quantum Mechanics, A. Bassi, D. Dürr, T. Weber and N. Zanghi (eds), AIP Conference Proceedings 844, American Institute of Physics
  • –––, 2007, “Comment on The Free Will Theorem, to appear in Foundations of Physics. Also quant-phys 0611283 .
  • van Fraassen, B., 1982, “The Charybdis of Realism: Epistemological Implications of Bell’s Inequality”, Synthese, 52: 25.
  • Zeinlinger, A., 2005, “The message of the quantum”, Nature, 438: 743.
  • Zurek, W.H., 1993, “Decoherence—A reply to comments”, Physics Today, 46: 81.

Other Internet Resources

Copyright © 2016 by
Giancarlo Ghirardi <>

Open access to the SEP is made possible by a world-wide funding initiative.
Please Read How You Can Help Keep the Encyclopedia Free