Copenhagen Interpretation of Quantum Mechanics

First published Fri May 3, 2002; substantive revision Thu Jan 24, 2008

As the theory of the atom, quantum mechanics is perhaps the most successful theory in the history of science. It enables physicists, chemists, and technicians to calculate and predict the outcome of a vast number of experiments and to create new and advanced technology based on the insight into the behavior of atomic objects. But it is also a theory that challenges our imagination. It seems to violate some fundamental principles of classical physics, principles that eventually have become a part of western common sense since the rise of the modern worldview in the Renaissance. So the aim of any metaphysical interpretation of quantum mechanics is to account for these violations.

The Copenhagen interpretation was the first general attempt to understand the world of atoms as this is represented by quantum mechanics. The founding father was mainly the Danish physicist Niels Bohr, but also Werner Heisenberg, Max Born and other physicists made important contributions to the overall understanding of the atomic world that is associated with the name of the capital of Denmark.

In fact Bohr and Heisenberg never totally agreed on how to understand the mathematical formalism of quantum mechanics, and none of them ever used the term “the Copenhagen interpretation” as a joint name for their ideas. In fact, Bohr once distanced himself from what he considered to be Heisenberg's more subjective interpretation (APHK, p.51). The term is rather a label introduced by people opposing Bohr's idea of complementarity, to identify what they saw as the common features behind the Bohr-Heisenberg interpretation as it emerged in the late 1920s. Today the Copenhagen interpretation is mostly regarded as synonymous with indeterminism, Bohr's correspondence principle, Born's statistical interpretation of the wave function, and Bohr's complementarity interpretation of certain atomic phenomena.


1. The Background

In 1900 Max Planck discovered that the radiation spectrum of black bodies occurs only with discrete energies separated by the value hv where v is the frequency and h is a new constant, the so-called Planck constant. According to classical physics the intensity of this continuous radiation would grow unlimitedly with growing frequencies, resulting in what was called the ultraviolet catastrophe. But Planck's suggestion was that if black bodies only exchange energy with the radiation field in a proportion equal to hv that problem would disappear. The fact that the absorption and the emission of energy is discontinuous is in conflict with the principles of classical physics. A few years later Albert Einstein used this discovery in his explanation of the photoelectric effect. He suggested that light waves were quantized, and that the amount of energy which each quantum of light could deliver to the electrons of the cathode, was exactly hv. The next step came in 1911 when Ernest Rutherford performed some experiments shooting alpha particles into a gold foil. Based on these results he could set up a model of the atom in which the atom consisted of a heavy nucleus with a positive charge surrounded by negatively charged electrons like a small solar system. Also this model was in conflict with the laws of classical physics. According to classical mechanics and electrodynamics one might expect that the electrons orbiting around a positively charged nucleus would continuously emit radiation so that the nucleus would quickly swallow the electrons.

At this point Niels Bohr entered the scene and soon became the leading physicist on atoms. In 1913 Bohr, visiting Rutherford in Manchester, put forward a mathematical model of the atom which provided the first theoretical support for Rutherford's model and could explain the emission spectrum of the hydrogen atom (the Balmer series). The theory was based on two postulates:

  1. An atomic system is only stable in a certain set of states, called stationary states, each state being associated with a discrete energy, and every change of energy corresponds to a complete transition from one state to another.
  2. The possibility for the atom to absorb and emit radiation is determined by a law according to which the energy of the radiation is given by the energy difference between two stationary states being equal to hv.

Some features of Bohr's semi-classical model were indeed very strange compared to the principles of classical physics. It introduced an element of discontinuity and indeterminism foreign to classical mechanics:

  1. Apparently not every point in space was accessible to an electron moving around a hydrogen nucleus. An electron moved in classical orbits, but during its transition from one orbit to another it was at no definite place between these orbits. Thus, an electron could only be in its ground state (the orbit of lowest energy) or an excited state (if an impact of another particle had forced it to leave its ground state.)
  2. It was impossible to predict when the transition would take place and how it would take place. Moreover, there were no external (or internal) causes that determined the “jump” back again. Any excited electron might in principle move spontaneously to either a lower state or down to the ground state.
  3. Rutherford pointed out that if, as Bohr did, one postulates that the frequency of light v, which an electron emits in a transition, depends on the difference between the initial energy level and the final energy level, it appears as if the electron must “know” to what final energy level it is heading in order to emit light with the right frequency.
  4. Einstein made another strange observation. He was curious to know in which direction the photon decided to move off from the electron.

Between 1913 and 1925 Bohr, Arnold Sommerfeld and others were able to improve Bohr's model, and together with the introduction of spin and Wolfgang Pauli's exclusion principle it gave a reasonably good description of the basic chemical elements. The model ran into problems, nonetheless, when one tried to apply it to spectra other than that of hydrogen. So there was a general feeling among all leading physicists that Bohr's model had to be replaced by a more radical theory. In 1925 Werner Heisenberg, at that time Bohr's assistant in Copenhagen, laid down the basic principles of a complete quantum mechanics. In his new matrix theory he replaced classical commuting variables with non-commuting ones. The following year, Erwin Schrödinger gave a simpler formulation of the theory in which he introduced a second-order differential equation for a wave function. He himself attempted a largely classical interpretation of the wave function. However, already the same year Max Born proposed a consistent statistical interpretation in which the square of the absolute value of this wave function expresses a probability amplitude for the outcome of a measurement.

2. Classical Physics

Bohr saw quantum mechanics as a generalization of classical physics although it violates some of the basic ontological principles on which classical physics rests. These principles are:

  • The principle of space and time, i.e., physical objects (systems) exist separately in space and time in such a way that they are localizable and countable, and physical processes (the evolution of systems) take place in space and time;
  • The principle of causality, i.e., every event has a cause;
  • The principle of determination, i.e., every later state of a system is uniquely determined by any earlier state;
  • The principle of continuity, i.e., all processes exhibiting a difference between the initial and the final state have to go through every intervening state; and finally
  • The principle of the conservation of energy, i.e., the energy of a closed system can be transformed into various forms but is never gained, lost or destroyed.

Due to these principles it is possible within, say, classical mechanics, to define a state of a system at any later time with respect to a state at any earlier time. So whenever we know the initial state consisting of the system's position and momentum, and know all external forces acting on it, we also know what will be its later states. The knowledge of the initial state is usually acquired by observing the state properties of the system at the time selected as the initial moment. Furthermore, the observation of a system does not affect its later behavior or, if observation somehow should influence this behavior, it is always possible to incorporate the effect into the prediction of the system's later state. Thus, in classical physics we can always draw a sharp distinction between the state of the measuring instrument being used on a system and the state of the physical system itself. It means that the physical description of the system is objective because the definition of any later state is not dependent on measuring conditions or other observational conditions.

Much of Kant's philosophy can be seen as an attempt to provide satisfactory philosophical grounds for the objective basis of Newton's mechanics against Humean scepticism. Kant showed that classical mechanics is in accordance with the transcendental conditions for objective knowledge. Kant's philosophy undoubtedly influenced Bohr in various ways as many scholars in recent years have noticed (Hooker 1972; Folse 1985; Honnor 1987; Faye 1991; Kaiser 1992; and Chevalley 1994). Bohr was definitely neither a subjectivist nor a positivist philosopher, as Karl Popper (1967) and Mario Bunge (1967) have claimed. He explicitly rejected the idea that the experimental outcome is due to the observer. As he said: “It is certainly not possible for the observer to influence the events which may appear under the conditions he has arranged” (APHK, p.51). Not unlike Kant, Bohr thought that we could have objective knowledge only in case we can distinguish between the experiential subject and the experienced object. It is a precondition for the knowledge of a phenomenon as being something distinct from the sensorial subject, that we can refer to it as an object without involving the subject's experience of the object. In order to separate the object from the subject itself, the experiential subject must be able to distinguish between the form and the content of his or her experiences. This is possible only if the subject uses causal and spatial-temporal concepts for describing the sensorial content, placing phenomena in causal connection in space and time, since it is the causal space-time description of our perceptions that constitutes the criterion of reality for them. Bohr therefore believed that what gives us the possibility of talking about an object and an objectively existing reality is the application of those necessary concepts, and that the physical equivalents of “space,” “time,” “causation,” and “continuity” were the concepts “position,” “time,” “momentum,” and “energy,” which he referred to as the classical concepts. He also believed that the above basic concepts exist already as preconditions of unambiguous and meaningful communication, built in as rules of our ordinary language. So, in Bohr's opinion the conditions for an objective description of nature given by the concepts of classical physics were merely a refinement of the preconditions of human knowledge.

3. The Correspondence Rule

The guiding principle behind Bohr's and later Heisenberg's work in the development of a consistent theory of atoms was the correspondence rule. The full rule states that a transition between stationary states is allowed if, and only if, there is a corresponding harmonic component in the classical motion (CW Vol. 3, p. 479). Bohr furthermore realized that according to his theory of the hydrogen atom, the frequencies of radiation due to the electron's transition between stationary states with high quantum numbers, i.e. states far from the ground state, coincide approximately with the results of classical electrodynamics. Hence in the search for a theory of quantum mechanics it became a methodological requirement to Bohr that any further theory of the atom should predict values in domains of high quantum numbers that should be a close approximation to the values of classical physics. The correspondence rule was a heuristic principle meant to make sure that in areas where the influence of Planck's constant could be neglected the numerical values predicted by such a theory should be the same as if they were predicted by classical radiation theory.

The Bohr-Sommerfeld core model of the atomic structure came into trouble in the beginning of the 1920s due to the fact that it couldn't handle an increasing number of spectroscopic phenomena. In 1924 Wolfgang Pauli introduced a new degree of freedom according to which two electrons with the same known quantum numbers could not be in the same state. A year later, in 1925, Ralph Kronig, Georg Uhlenbeck and Samuel Goudsmit explained this new degree of freedom by introducing the non-classical concept of electron spin. It has been suggested, however, that Pauli's proposal meant a lethal blow not only to the Bohr-Sommerfeld model, but also to the correspondence principle because “how to reconcile the classical periodic motions presupposed by the correspondence principle with the classically non-describable Zweideutigkeit of the electron's angular momentum?” (Massimi 2005, p.73)

Although the exclusion rule and the introduction of spin broke with the attempt to explain the structure of the basic elements along the lines of the correspondence argument (as Pauli pointed out in a letter to Bohr) Bohr continued to think of it as an important methodological principle in the attempt to establish a coherent quantum theory. In fact, he repeatedly expressed the opinion that Heisenberg's matrix mechanics came to light under the guidance of this very principle. In his Faraday Lectures from 1932, for instance, Bohr emphasizes: “A fundamental step towards the establishing of a proper quantum mechanics was taken in 1925 by Heisenberg who showed how to replace the ordinary kinematical concepts, in the spirit of the correspondence argument, by symbols referring to the elementary processes and the probability of their occurrence.” (CC, p.48) Bohr acknowledged, however, that the correspondence argument failed too in those cases where particular non-classical concepts have to be introduced into the description of atoms. But he still thought that the correspondence argument was indispensable for both structural and semantic reasons in constructing a proper quantum theory as a generalised theory from classical mechanics.

Indeed spin is a quantum property of the electrons which cannot be understood as a classical angular momentum. Needless to say, Bohr fully understood that. But he didn't think that this discovery ruled out the use of the correspondence rule as guidance to finding a satisfactory quantum theory. A lengthy quotation from Bohr's paper “The Causality Problem in Atomic Physics” (1938) gives evidence for this:

Indeed, as adequate as the quantum postulates are in the phenomenological description of the atomic reactions, as indispensable are the basic concepts of mechanics and electrodynamics for the specification of atomic structures and for the definition of fundamental properties of the agencies with which they react. Far from being a temporary compromise in this dilemma, the recourse to essentially statistical considerations is our only conceivable means of arriving at a generalization of the customary way of description sufficiently wide to account for the features of individuality expressed by the quantum postulates and reducing to classical theory in the limiting case where all actions involved in the analysis of the phenomena are large compared with a single quantum. In the search for the formulation of such a generalization, our only guide has just been the so called correspondence argument, which gives expression for the exigency of upholding the use of classical concepts to the largest possible extent compatible with the quantum postulates. (CC, p.96)

This shows that, according to Bohr, quantum mechanics, as formulated by Heisenberg, was a rational generalization of classical mechanics when the quantum of action and the spin property were taken into account.

The correspondence rule was an important methodological principle. In the beginning it had a clear technical meaning for Bohr. It is obvious, however, that it makes no sense to compare the numerical values of the theory of atoms with those of classical physics unless the meaning of the physical terms in both theories is commensurable. The correspondence rule was based on the epistemological idea that classical concepts were indispensable for our understanding of physical reality, and it is only when classical phenomena and quantum phenomena are described in terms of the same classical concepts that we can compare different physical experiences. It was this broader sense of the correspondence rule that Bohr often had in mind later on. He directly mentioned the relationship between the use of classical concepts and the correspondence principle in 1934 when he wrote in the Introduction to Atomic Theory and the Description of Nature:

[T]he necessity of making an extensive use … of the classical concepts, upon which depends ultimately the interpretation of all experience, gave rise to the formulation of the so-called correspondence principle which expresses our endeavours to utilize all the classical concepts by giving them a suitable quantum-theoretical re-interpretation (ATDN, p. 8)

Bohr's practical methodology stands therefore in direct opposition to Thomas Kuhn and Paul Feyerabend's historical view that succeeding theories, like classical mechanics and quantum mechanics, are incommensurable. In contrast to their philosophical claims of meaning gaps and partial lack of rationality in the choice between incommensurable theories, Bohr believed not just retrospectively that quantum mechanics was a natural generalization of classical physics, but he and Heisenberg followed in practice the requirements of the correspondence rule. Thus, in the mind of Bohr, the meaning of the classical concepts did not change but their application was restricted. This was the lesson of complementarity.

4. Complementarity

After Heisenberg had managed to formulate a consistent quantum mechanics in 1925, both he and Bohr began their struggle to find a coherent interpretation for the mathematical formalism. Heisenberg and Bohr followed somewhat different approaches. Where Heisenberg looked to the formalism and developed his famous uncertainty principle or indeterminacy relation, Bohr chose to analyze concrete experimental arrangements, especially the double-slit experiment. In a way Bohr merely regarded Heisenberg's relation as an expression of his general notion that our understanding of atomic phenomena builds on complementary descriptions. At Como in 1927 he presented for the first time his ideas according to which certain different descriptions are said to be complementary.

Bohr pointed to two sets of descriptions which he took to be complementary. On the one hand, there are those that attribute either kinematic or dynamic properties to the atom; that is, “space-time descriptions” are complementary to “claims of causality”, where Bohr interpreted the causal claims in physics in terms of the conservation of energy and momentum. On the other hand, there are those descriptions that ascribe either wave or particle properties to a single object. How these two kinds of complementary sets of descriptions are related is something Bohr never indicated (Murdoch 1987). Even among people, like Rosenfeld and Pais, who claimed to speak on behalf of Bohr, there is no agreement. The fact is that the description of light as either particles or waves was already a classical dilemma, which not even Einstein's definition of a photon really solved since the momentum of the photon as a particle depends on the frequency of the light as a wave. Furthermore, Bohr eventually realized that the attribution of kinematic and dynamic properties to an object is complementary because the ascription of both of these conjugate variables rests on mutually exclusive experiments. The attribution of particle and wave properties to an object may, however, occur in a single experiment; for instance, in the double-slit experiment where the interference pattern consists of single dots. So within less than ten years after his Como lecture Bohr tacitly abandoned “wave-particle complementarity” in favor of the exclusivity of “kinematic-dynamic complementarity” (Held 1994).

It was clear to Bohr that any interpretation of the atomic world had to take into account an important empirical fact. The discovery of the quantization of action meant that quantum mechanics could not fulfill the above principles of classical physics. Every time we measure, say, an electron's position the apparatus and the electron interact in an uncontrollable way, so that we are unable to measure the electron's momentum at the same time. Until the mid-1930s when Einstein, Podolsky and Rosen published their famous thought-experiment with the intention of showing that quantum mechanics was incomplete, Bohr spoke as if the measurement apparatus disturbed the electron. This paper had a significant influence on Bohr's line of thought. Apparently, Bohr realized that speaking of disturbance seemed to indicate—as some of his opponents may have understood him—that atomic objects were classical particles with definite inherent kinematic and dynamic properties. After the EPR paper he stated quite clearly: “the whole situation in atomic physics deprives of all meaning such inherent attributes as the idealization of classical physics would ascribe to such objects.”

Also after the EPR paper Bohr spoke about Heisenberg's “indeterminacy relation” as indicating the ontological consequences of his claim that kinematic and dynamic variables are ill-defined unless they refer to an experimental outcome. Earlier he had often called it Heisenberg's “uncertainty relation”, as if it were a question of a merely epistemological limitation. Furthermore, Bohr no longer mentioned descriptions as being complementary, but rather phenomena or information. He introduced the definition of a “phenomenon” as requiring a complete description of the entire experimental arrangement, and he took a phenomenon to be a measurement of the values of either kinematic or dynamic properties.

Bohr's more mature view, i.e., his view after the EPR paper, on complementarity and the interpretation of quantum mechanics may be summarized in the following points:

  1. The interpretation of a physical theory has to rely on an experimental practice.
  2. The experimental practice presupposes a certain pre-scientific practice of description, which establishes the norm for experimental measurement apparatus, and consequently what counts as scientific experience.
  3. Our pre-scientific practice of understanding our environment is an adaptation to the sense experience of separation, orientation, identification and reidentification over time of physical objects.
  4. This pre-scientific experience is grasped in terms of common categories like thing's position and change of position, duration and change of duration, and the relation of cause and effect, terms and principles that are now parts of our common language.
  5. These common categories yield the preconditions for objective knowledge, and any description of nature has to use these concepts to be objective.
  6. The concepts of classical physics are merely exact specifications of the above categories.
  7. The classical concepts—and not classical physics itself—are therefore necessary in any description of physical experience in order to understand what we are doing and to be able to communicate our results to others, in particular in the description of quantum phenomena as they present themselves in experiments;
  8. Planck's empirical discovery of the quantization of action requires a revision of the foundation for the use of classical concepts, because they are not all applicable at the same time. Their use is well defined only if they apply to experimental interactions in which the quantization of action can be regarded as negligible.
  9. In experimental cases where the quantization of action plays a significant role, the application of a classical concept does not refer to independent properties of the object; rather the ascription of either kinematic or dynamic properties to the object as it exists independently of a specific experimental interaction is ill-defined.
  10. The quantization of action demands a limitation of the use of classical concepts so that these concepts apply only to a phenomenon, which Bohr understood as the macroscopic manifestation of a measurement on the object, i.e. the uncontrollable interaction between the object and the apparatus.
  11. The quantum mechanical description of the object differs from the classical description of the measuring apparatus, and this requires that the object and the measuring device should be separated in the description, but the line of separation is not the one between macroscopic instruments and microscopic objects. It has been argued in detail (Howard 1994) that Bohr pointed out that parts of the measuring device may sometimes be treated as parts of the object in the quantum mechanical description.
  12. The quantum mechanical formalism does not provide physicists with a ‘pictorial’ representation: the ψ-function does not, as Schrödinger had hoped, represent a new kind of reality. Instead, as Born suggested, the square of the absolute value of the ψ-function expresses a probability amplitude for the outcome of a measurement. Due to the fact that the wave equation involves an imaginary quantity this equation can have only a symbolic character, but the formalism may be used to predict the outcome of a measurement that establishes the conditions under which concepts like position, momentum, time and energy apply to the phenomena.
  13. The ascription of these classical concepts to the phenomena of measurements rely on the experimental context of the phenomena, so that the entire setup provides us with the defining conditions for the application of kinematic and dynamic concepts in the domain of quantum physics.
  14. Such phenomena are complementary in the sense that their manifestations depend on mutually exclusive measurements, but that the information gained through these various experiments exhausts all possible objective knowledge of the object.

Bohr thought of the atom as real. Atoms are neither heuristic nor logical constructions. A couple of times he emphasized this directly using arguments from experiments in a very similar way to Ian Hacking and Nancy Cartwright much later. What he did not believe was that the quantum mechanical formalism was true in the sense that it gave us a literal (‘pictorial’) rather than a symbolic representation of the quantum world. It makes much sense to characterize Bohr in modern terms as an entity realist who opposes theory realism (Folse 1987). It is because of the imaginary quantities in quantum mechanics (where the commutation rule for canonically conjugate variable, p and q, introduces Planck's constant into the formalism by pqqp = ih/2π) that quantum mechanics does not give us a ‘pictorial’ representation of the world. Neither does the theory of relativity, Bohr argued, provide us with a literal representation, since the velocity of light is introduced with a factor of i in the definition of the fourth coordinate in a four-dimensional manifold (CC, p. 86 and p. 105). Instead these theories can only be used symbolically to predict observations under well-defined conditions. Thus Bohr was an antirealist or an instrumentalist when it comes to theories.

In general, Bohr considered the demands of complementarity in quantum mechanics to be logically on a par with the requirements of relativity in the theory of relativity. He believed that both theories were a result of novel aspects of the observation problem, namely the fact that observation in physics is context-dependent. This again is due to the existence of a maximum velocity of propagation of all actions in the domain of relativity and a minimum of any action in the domain of quantum mechanics. And it is because of these universal limits that it is impossible in the theory of relativity to make an unambiguous separation between time and space without reference to the observer (the context) and impossible in quantum mechanics to make a sharp distinction between the behavior of the object and its interaction with the means of observation (CC, p. 105).

In emphasizing the necessity of classical concepts for the description of the quantum phenomena, Bohr was influenced by Kant or neo-Kantianism. But he was a naturalized or a pragmatized Kantian. The classical concepts are merely explications of common concepts that are already a result of our adaptation to the world. These concepts and the conditions of their application determine the conditions for objective knowledge. The discovery of the quantization of action has revealed to us, however, that we cannot apply these concepts to quantum objects as we did in classical physics. Now kinematic and dynamic properties (represented by conjugate variables) can be meaningfully ascribed to the object only in relation to some actual experimental results, whereas classical physics attributes such properties to the object regardless of whether we actually observe them or not. In other words, Bohr denied that classical concepts could be used to attribute properties to a physical world in-itself behind the phenomena, i.e. properties different from those being observed. In contrast, classical physics rests on an idealization, he said, in the sense that it assumes that the physical world has these properties in-itself, i.e. as inherent properties, independent of their actual observation.

Complementarity is first and foremost a semantic and epistemological reading of quantum mechanics that carries certain ontological implications. Bohr's view was, to phrase it in a modern philosophical jargon, that the truth conditions of sentences ascribing a certain kinematic or dynamic value to an atomic object are dependent on the apparatus involved, in such a way that these truth conditions have to include reference to the experimental setup as well as the actual outcome of the experiment. This claim is called Bohr's indefinability thesis (Murdoch 1987; Faye 1991). Hence, those physicists who accuse this interpretation of operating with a mysterious collapse of the wave function during measurements haven't got it right. Bohr accepted the Born statistical interpretation because he believed that the ψ-function has only a symbolic meaning and does not represent anything real. It makes sense to talk about a collapse of the wave function only if, as Bohr put it, the ψ-function can be given a pictorial representation, something he strongly denied.

Indeed, Bohr, Heisenberg, and many other physicists considered complementarity to be the only rational interpretation of the quantum world. They thought that it gave us the understanding of atomic phenomena in accordance with the conditions for any physical description and the possible objective knowledge of the world. Bohr believed that atoms are real, but it remains a much debated point in recent literature what sort of reality he believed them to have, whether or not they are something beyond and different from what they are observed to be. Henry Folse argues that Bohr must operate with a distinction between a phenomenal and a transcendental object. The reason is that this is the only way it makes sense to talk about the physical disturbance of the atomic object by the measuring instrument as Bohr did for a while (Folse 1985, 1994). But Jan Faye has replied that Bohr gave up the disturbance metaphor in connection with his discussion of the EPR thought-experiment because he realized that it was misleading. Moreover, there is no further evidence in Bohr's writings indicating that Bohr would attribute intrinsic and measurement-independent state properties to atomic objects (though quite unintelligible and inaccessible to us) in addition to the classical ones being manifested in measurement (Faye 1991).

5. Misunderstandings of complementarity

Complementarity has been commonly misunderstood in several ways, some of which shall be outlined in this section. First of all, earlier generations of philosophers and scientists have often accused Bohr's interpretation of being positivistic or subjectivistic. Today philosophers have almost reached a consensus that it is neither. There are, as many have noticed, both typically realist as well as antirealist elements involved in it, and it has affinities with Kant or neo-Kantianism. The influence of Kant or Kantian thinking on Bohr's philosophy seems to have several sources. Some have pointed to the tradition from Hermann von Helmholtz (Chevalley 1991, 1994; Brock 2003); others have considered the Danish philosopher Harald Høffding to be the missing link to Kantianism (Faye 1991).

But because Bohr's view on complementarity has wrongly been associated with positivism and subjectivism, much confusion still seems to stick to the Copenhagen interpretation. Don Howard (2004) argues, however, that what is commonly known as the Copenhagen interpretation of quantum mechanics, regarded as representing a unitary Copenhagen point of view, differs significantly from Bohr's complementarity interpretation. He holds that "the Copenhagen interpretation is an invention of the mid-1950s, for which Heisenberg is chiefly responsible, [and that] various other physicists and philosophers, including Bohm, Feyerabend, Hanson, and Popper, hav[e] further promoted the invention in the service of their own philosophical agendas." (p. 669)

Most recently, Mara Beller (1999) argued that Bohr's statements are intelligible only if we presume that he was a radical operationalist or a simple-minded positivist. In fact, complementarity was established as the orthodox interpretation of quantum mechanics in the 1930s and therefore often regarded as a consequence of a positivistic outlook. During the 1930s Bohr was also in touch with some of the leading neopositivists or logical empiricists such as Otto Neurath, Philip Frank, and the Danish philosopher Jørgen Jørgensen. Although their anti-metaphysical approach to science may have had some influence on Bohr (especially around 1935 during his final discussion with Einstein about the completeness of quantum mechanics), one must recall that Bohr always saw complementarity as a necessary response to the indeterministic description of quantum mechanics due to the quantum of action. The quantum of action was an empirical discovery, not a consequence of a certain epistemological theory, and Bohr thought that indeterminism was the price to pay to avoid paradoxes. Never did Bohr appeal to a verificationist theory of meaning; nor did he claim classical concepts to be operationally defined. But it cannot be denied that some of the logical empiricists rightly or wrongly found support for their own philosophy in Bohr's interpretation and that Bohr sometimes confirmed them in their impressions (Faye 2008).

Second, many physicists and philosophers see the reduction of the wave function as an important part of the Copenhagen interpretation. But Bohr never talked about the collapse of the wave packet. Nor did it make sense for him to do so because this would mean that one must understand the wave function as referring to something physically real. Bohr spoke of the mathematical formalism of quantum mechanics, including the state vector or the wave function, as a symbolic representation. Bohr associated the use of a pictorial representation with what can be visualized in space and time. Quantum systems are not vizualizable because their states cannot be tracked down in space and time as classical systems'. The reason is, according to Bohr, that a quantum system has no definite kinematical or dynamical state prior to any measurement. Also the fact that the mathematical formulation of quantum states consists of imaginary numbers tells us that the state vector is not susceptible to a pictorial interpretation (CC, p. 144). Thus, the state vector is symbolic. Here “symbolic” means that the state vector's representational function should not be taken literally but be considered a tool for the calculation of probabilities of observables.

Third, Bohr flatly denied the ontological thesis that the subject has any direct impact on the outcome of a measurement. Hence, when he occasionally mentioned the subjective character of quantum phenomena and the difficulties of distinguishing the object from the subject in quantum mechanics, he did not think of it as a problem confined to the observation of atoms alone. For instance, he stated that already "the theory of relativity reminds us of the subjective character of all physical phenomena" (ATDN, p. 116). Rather, by referring to the subjective character of quantum phenomena he was expressing the epistemological thesis that all observations in physics are in fact context-dependent. There exists, according to Bohr, no view from nowhere in virtue of which quantum objects can be described.

Fourth, although Bohr had spoken about "disturbing the phenomena by observation," in some of his earliest papers on complementarity, he never had in mind the observer-induced collapse of the wave packet. Later he always talked about the interaction between the object and the measurement apparatus which was taken to be completely objective. Thus, Schrödinger's Cat did not pose any riddle to Bohr. The cat would be dead or alive long before we open the box to find out. What Bohr claimed was, however, that the state of the object and the state of the instrument are dynamically inseparable during the interaction. Moreover, the atomic object does not posses any state separate from the one it manifests at the end of the interaction because the measuring instrument establishes the necessary conditions under which it makes sense to use the state concept.

It was the same analysis that Bohr applied in answering the challenge of the EPR-paper. Bohr's reply was that we cannot separate the dynamical and kinematical properties of a joint system of two particles until we actually have made a measurement and thereby set the experimental conditions for the ascription of a certain state value (CC, p. 80). Bohr's way of addressing the puzzle was to point out that individual states of a pair of coupled particles cannot be considered in isolation, in the same way as the state of the object and the state of the instrument are dynamically inseparable during measurements. Thus, based on our knowledge of a particular state value of the auxiliary body A, being an atomic object or an instrument, we may then infer the state value of the object B with which A once interacted (Faye 1991, pp. 182-183). It therefore makes sense when Howard (2004, p.671) holds that Bohr considered the post-measurement joint state of the object and the measuring apparatus to be entangled as in any other quantum interaction involving an entangled pair.

Finally, when Bohr insisted on the use of classical concepts for understanding quantum phenomena, he did not believe, as it is sometimes suggested, that macroscopic objects or the measuring apparatus always have to be described in terms of the dynamical laws of classical physics. The use of the classical concepts is necessary, according to Bohr, because by these we have learned to communicate to others about our physical experience. The classical concepts are merely a refinement of everyday concepts of position and action in space and time. However, the use of the classical concepts is not the same in quantum mecahnics as in classical physics. Bohr was well aware of the fact that, on pains of inconsistency, the classical concepts must be given “a suitable quantum-theoretical re-interpretation,” before they could be employed to describe quantum phenomena (ATDN, p. 8).

6. The Divergent Views

The Copenhagen interpretation is not a homogenous view. This is still not generally recognized. Both James Cushing (1994) and Mara Beller (1999) take for granted the existence of a unitary Copenhagen interpretation in their social and institutional explanation of the once total dominance of the Copenhagen orthodoxy; a view they personally find unconvincing and outdated partly because they read Bohr's view on quantum mechanics through Heisenberg's exposition. But historians and philosophers of science have gradually realized that Bohr's and Heisenberg's pictures of complementarity on the surface may appear similar but beneath the surface diverge significantly. Don Howard (2004, p. 680) goes as far as concluding that "until Heisenberg coined the term in 1955, there was no unitary Copenhagen interpretation of quantum mechanics." The term apparently occurs for the first time in Heisenberg (1955). In addition, Howard also argues that it was Heisenberg's exposition of complementarity, and not Bohr's, with its emphasis on a privileged role for the observer and observer-induced wave packet collapse that became identical with that interpretation. Says he: "Whatever Heisenberg's motivation, his invention of a unitary Copenhagen view on interpretation, at the center of which was his own, distinctively subjectivist view of the role of the observer, quickly found an audience." (p. 677) This audience included people like Bohm, Feyerabend, Hanson, and Popper who used Heisenberg's presentation of complementarity as the target for their criticism of the ortodox view.

Following up on Don Howard's research, Kristian Camilleri (2006, 2007) points to the fact that complementarity was originally thought by Bohr (in his Como-paper) to exist between the space-time description and the causal description of the stationary states of atoms — and not between different experimental outcomes of the free electron. So the formulation of complementarity was restricted to the concept of stationary states because only there does the system have a well-defined energy state independent of any measurement. This observation deserves general recognition. But when Bohr rather soon thereafter began analysing the double slit experiment in his discussion with Einstein (1930), he had to extend his interpretation to cover the electron in interaction with the measuring apparatus.

Camilleri then shows how Heisenberg's view of complementarity, in spite of Heisenberg's own testimony, radically differs from Bohr's. As Heisenberg understood complementarity between the space-time description and causal description, it holds between the classical description of experimental phenomena and the description of the state of the system in terms of the wave function. A quotation from Heisenberg (1958, p. 50) shows how much he misunderstood Bohr in spite of their previously close working relationship.

Bohr uses the concept of ‘complementarity’ at several places in the interpretation of quantum theory … The space-time description of the atomic events is complementary to their deterministic description. The probability function obeys an equation of motion as did the co-ordinates in Newtonian mechanics; its change in the course of time is completely determined by the quantum mechanical equation; it does not allow a description in space and time but breaks the determined continuity of the probability function by changing our knowledge of the system.

So where Bohr identified the causal description with the conservation of energy, Heisenberg saw it as the deterministic evolution of Schrödinger's ψ-function. In other words, Heisenberg, in contrast to Bohr, believed that the wave equation gave a causal, albeit probabilistic description of the free electron in configuration space. It also explains why so many philosophers and physicists have identified the Copenhagen interpretation with the mysterious collapse of the wave packet. The transition from a causal description in terms of the evolution of the ψ-function to a classical space-time description is characterized by the discontinuous change that occurs by the act of measurement. According to Heisenberg, these two modes of description are complementary.

In a very recent study Ravi Gomatam (2007) agrees with Howard's exposition in arguing that Bohr's interpretation of complementarity and the textbook Copenhagen interpretation (i.e. wave-particle duality and wave packet collapse) are incompatible.

7. New Perspectives

After the 1950s a number of alternative interpretations to Bohr's complementarity were articulated and they all found their proponents among physicists and philosophers of science. The Copenhagen interpretation started to lose ground to other interpretations such as Bohm's interpretation, the many worlds interpretation, the modal interpretation and the decoherence interpretation, which have been more in vogue the last couple of decades. But parallel with the growing awareness of the essential differences between Bohr's and Heisenberg's understanding of quantum mechanics several philosophers of science have revitalised Bohr's view on complementarity. Around the millennium a new recognition of the Copenhagen interpretation has emerged.

Rob Clifton and Hans Halvorson (1999, 2002) argue that Bohm's interpretation of quantum mechanics can be seen as the special case of Bohr's complementarity interpretation if it is assumed that all measurements ultimately reduce to positions measurement. Originally Jeffrey Bub and Clifton were able to demonstrate (given some idealized conditions) that Bohr's complementarity and Bohm's mechanics fall under their uniqueness theorem for no-collapse interpretations. Clifton and Halvorson improve this result by showing that Bohr's idea of position and momentum complementarity can be expressed in terms of inequivalent representations in the C*-algebraic formalism of quantum mechanics. It turns out that either position or momentum are dynamically significant, but it is not permissible to assume that position and momentum are both dynamically significant in any single context. From these assumptions they deduced Bohm' mechanics by adding the metaphysical postulate that position measurement is always dynamically significant, but this metaphysical restriction requires, as they emphasize, that positions have a dubious priviledged ontological status. Rather, Clifton and Halvorson (1999) and Halvorson (2004) believe that complementarity may give us a realist interpretation of quantum field theory.

Another insight into Bohr's view of complementarity is due to Michael Dickson (2001, 2002). By using the contemporary theory of reference frames in quantum theory, he proves that Bohr's reponse to the EPR thought-experiment was in fact the correct one. Moreover, he also maintains that Bohr's discussions of spin, a property much less frame dependent than position and momentum, were very different from his discussions of the latter, and based on these differences he offers a Bohrian account of Bell's theorem and its significance.

A re-assessment of Bohr's philosophy of quantum mechanics is made by Whitaker (2004) on the basis of Clifton and Halvorson's and Dickson's works and in the light of quantum information theory. Besides these attempts to apply Bohr's notion of complementarity to the contemporary discussions of the interpretation of quantum mehanics and quantum field theory there is an ongoing attempt to understand Bohr's idea of symbolic representation (Tanona, 2004a, 2004b) and his notion of complementarity with respect to trends in philosophy and general epistemology (Plotnitsky, 1994, and Katsumori, 2005).

Bibliography

References to Work by Bohr

CW Bohr, N. (1972-2006), Collected Works, Vol. 1-12, Amsterdam: Elsevier.
ATDN Bohr, N. (1934/1987), Atomic Theory and the Description of Nature, reprinted as The Philosophical Writings of Niels Bohr, Vol. I, Woodbridge: Ox Bow Press.
APHK Bohr, N. (1958/1987), Essays 1932-1957 on Atomic Physics and Human Knowledge, reprinted as The Philosophical Writings of Niels Bohr, Vol. II, Woodbridge: Ox Bow Press.
Essays Bohr, N. (1963/1987), Essays 1958-1962 on Atomic Physics and Human Knowledge, reprinted as The Philosophical Writings of Niels Bohr, Vol. III, Woodbridge: Ox Bow Press.
CC Bohr, N. (1998), Causality and Complementarity, supplementary papers edited by Jan Faye and Henry Folse as The Philosophical Writings of Niels Bohr, Vol. IV, Woodbridge: Ox Bow Press.

Other References

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