# Quantum Entanglement and Information

*First published Mon Aug 13, 2001; substantive revision Thu Aug 26, 2010*

Quantum entanglement is a physical resource, like energy, associated with the peculiar nonclassical correlations that are possible between separated quantum systems. Entanglement can be measured, transformed, and purified. A pair of quantum systems in an entangled state can be used as a quantum information channel to perform computational and cryptographic tasks that are impossible for classical systems. The general study of the information-processing capabilities of quantum systems is the subject of quantum information theory.

## 1. Quantum Entanglement

In 1935 and 1936, Schrödinger published a two-part article in the
*Proceedings of the Cambridge Philosophical Society* in which
he discussed and extended a remarkable argument by Einstein, Podolsky,
and Rosen. The Einstein-Podolsky-Rosen (EPR) argument was, in many
ways, the culmination of Einstein's critique of the orthodox
Copenhagen interpretation of quantum mechanics, and was designed to
show that the theory is incomplete. (See
The Einstein-Podolsky-Rosen Argument in Quantum Theory
and
Copenhagen Interpretation of Quantum Mechanics.)
In classical mechanics the state of a system is essentially a list of
the system's properties — more precisely, it is the
specification of a set of parameters from which the list of properties
can be reconstructed: the positions and momenta of all the particles
comprising the system (or similar parameters in the case of
fields). The dynamics of the theory specifies how properties change in
terms of a law of evolution for the state. Pauli characterized this
mode of description of physical systems as a ‘detached
observer’ idealization. See Pauli's letter to Born in *The
Born-Einstein Letters* (Born, 1992; p. 218). On the Copenhagen
interpretation, such a description is not possible for quantum
systems. Instead, the quantum state of a system should be understood
as a catalogue of what an observer has done to the system and what has
been observed, and the import of the state then lies in the
probabilities that can be inferred (in terms of the theory) for the
outcomes of possible future observations on the system. Einstein
rejected this view and proposed a series of arguments to show that the
quantum state is simply an incomplete characterization of the
system. The missing parameters are sometimes referred to as
‘hidden parameters’ or ‘hidden variables’
(although Einstein did not use this terminology, presumably because he
did not want to endorse any particular ‘hidden variable’
theory).

It should not be supposed that Einstein's definition of a complete theory included the requirement that it be deterministic. Rather, he required certain conditions of separability and locality for composite systems consisting of separated component systems: each component system separately should be characterized by its own properties (even if these properties manifest themselves stochastically), and it should be impossible to alter the properties of a distant system instantaneously (or the probabilities of these properties) by acting on a local system. In later analyses — notably in Bell's extension of the EPR argument — it became apparent that these conditions, suitably formulated as probability constraints, are equivalent to the requirement that statistical correlations between separated systems should be reducible to probability distributions over common causes (deterministic or stochastic) in the sense of Reichenbach. (See Bell's Theorem and Reichenbach's Common Cause Principle.)

In the original EPR article, two particles are prepared from a source in a certain quantum state and then move apart. There are ‘matching’ correlations between both the positions of the two particles and their momenta: a measurement of either position or momentum on a particular particle will allow the prediction, with certainty, of the outcome of a position measurement or momentum measurement, respectively, on the other particle. These measurements are mutually exclusive: either a position measurement can be performed, or a momentum measurement, but not both simultaneously. Either correlation can be observed, but the subsequent measurement of momentum, say, after establishing a position correlation, will no longer yield any correlation in the momenta of the two particles. It is as if the position measurement disturbs the correlation between the momentum values. The puzzle is that the assumption of the completeness of the quantum state of the particle pair is inconsistent with the assignment of labels to the particles separately that could be associated with appropriately correlated values for the outcomes of position and momentum measurements. These labels would be the common causes of the correlations, and would provide an explanation of the correlations in terms of the initial correlations between the properties of the two systems at their source. EPR concluded that the quantum state was incomplete.

Here is how Schrödinger put the puzzle in the first part of his two-part article (Schrödinger, 1935; p. 559):

Yet since I can predicteitherx_{1}orp_{1}without interfering with the system No. 1 and since system No. 1, like a scholar in an examination, cannot possibly know which of the two questions I am going to ask first: it so seems that our scholar is prepared to give the right answer to thefirstquestion he is asked,anyhow. Therefore he must know both answers; which is an amazing knowledge; quite irrespective of the fact that after having given his first answer our scholar is invariably so disconcerted or tired out, that all the following answers are ‘wrong.’

What Schrödinger showed was that if two particles are prepared in a quantum state such that there is a matching correlation between two ‘canonically conjugate’ dynamical quantities — quantities like position and momentum whose values suffice to specify all the properties of a classical system — then there are infinitely many dynamical quantities of the two particles for which there exist similar matching correlations: every function of the canonically conjugate pair of the first particle matches with the same function of the canonically conjugate pair of the second particle. Thus (Schrödinger, p. 559) system No. 1 ‘does not only know these two answers but a vast number of others, and that with no mnemotechnical help whatsoever, at least with none that we know of.’

Schrödinger coined the term ‘entanglement’ to describe this peculiar connection between quantum systems (Schrödinger, 1935; p. 555):

When two systems, of which we know the states by their respective representatives, enter into temporary physical interaction due to known forces between them, and when after a time of mutual influence the systems separate again, then they can no longer be described in the same way as before, viz. by endowing each of them with a representative of its own. I would not call thatonebut ratherthecharacteristic trait of quantum mechanics, the one that enforces its entire departure from classical lines of thought. By the interaction the two representatives [the quantum states] have become entangled.

He added (Schrödinger, 1935; p. 555):

Another way of expressing the peculiar situation is: the best possible knowledge of awholedoes not necessarily include the best possible knowledge of all itsparts,even though they may be entirely separate and therefore virtually capable of being ‘best possibly known,’ i.e., of possessing, each of them, a representative of its own. The lack of knowledge is by no means due to the interaction being insufficiently known — at least not in the way that it could possibly be known more completely — it is due to the interaction itself.Attention has recently been called to the obvious but very disconcerting fact that even though we restrict the disentangling measurements to

onesystem, the representative obtained for theothersystem is by no means independent of the particular choice of observations which we select for that purpose and which by the way areentirelyarbitrary. It is rather discomforting that the theory should allow a system to be steered or piloted into one or the other type of state at the experimenter's mercy in spite of his having no access to it.

In the second part of the paper, Schrödinger showed that, in general, a sophisticated experimenter can, by a suitable choice of operations carried out on one system, ‘steer’ the second system into any chosen mixture of quantum states. That is, the second system cannot be steered into any particular quantum state at the whim of the experimenter, but the experimenter can constrain the quantum state into which the second system evolves to lie in any chosen set of states, with a probability distribution fixed by the entangled state. He found this conclusion sufficiently unsettling to suggest that the entanglement between two separating systems would persist only for distances small enough that the time taken by light to travel from one system to the other could be neglected, compared with the characteristic time periods associated with other changes in the composite system. He speculated that for longer distances each of the two systems might in fact be in a state associated with a certain mixture, determined by the precise form of the entangled state.

Most physicists attributed the puzzling features of entangled quantum
states to Einstein's inappropriate ‘detached observer’
view of physical theory, and regarded Bohr's reply to the EPR argument
(Bohr, 1935) as vindicating the Copenhagen interpretation. This was
unfortunate, because the study of entanglement was ignored for thirty
years until John Bell's reconsideration and extension of the EPR
argument (Bell, 1964). Bell looked at entanglement in simpler systems
than the EPR case: matching correlations between two-valued dynamical
quantities, such as polarization or spin, of two separated systems in
an entangled state. What Bell showed was that the statistical
correlations between the measurement outcomes of suitably chosen
*different* quantities on the two systems are inconsistent with
an inequality derivable from Einstein's separability and locality
assumptions — in effect from the assumption that the
correlations have a common cause.

Bell's investigation generated an ongoing debate on the foundations of
quantum mechanics. One important feature of this debate was
confirmation that entanglement can persist over long distances(see
Aspect *et al*.), thus falsifying Schrödinger's
supposition of the spontaneous decay of entanglement as two entangled
particles separate. But it was not until the 1980s that physicists,
computer scientists, and cryptographers began to regard the non-local
correlations of entangled quantum states as a new kind of
non-classical resource that could be exploited, rather than an
embarrassment to be explained away. For further discussion of
entanglement as a physical resource, including measuring entanglement,
and the manipulation and purification of entanglement by local
operations, see “The Joy of Entanglement” by Popescu and
Rohrlich in Lo, Popescu, and Spiller 1998, or Nielsen and Chuang
2000.

## 2. Exploiting Entanglement: Quantum Teleportation

Consider again Schrödinger's realization that an entangled state
could be used to steer a distant particle into one of a set of states,
with a certain probability. In fact, this possibility of ‘remote
steering’ is even more dramatic than Schrödinger
demonstrated. Suppose Alice and Bob share an entangled state of the
sort considered by Bell, say two photons in an entangled state of
polarization. That is, Alice has in her possession one of the
entangled photons, and Bob the other. Suppose that Alice has an
additional photon in an unknown state of polarization |u>, where
the notation ‘| >’ denotes a quantum state. It
is possible for Alice to perform an operation on the two photons in
her possession that will transform Bob's photon into one of four
states, depending on the four possible (random) outcomes of Alice's
operation: either the state |*u*>, or a state that is
related to |*u*> in a definite way. Alice's operation
entangles the two photons in her possession, and disentangles Bob's
photon, steering it into a state |*u**>. After Alice
communicates the outcome of her operation to Bob, Bob knows either
that |*u**> = |*u*>, or how to transform
|*u**> to |*u*> by a local operation. This
phenomenon is known as ‘quantum teleportation.’

What is extraordinary about this phenomenon is that Alice and Bob have
managed to use their shared entangled state as a quantum communication
channel to destroy the state |*u*> of a photon in Alice's
part of the universe and recreate it in Bob's part of the universe.
Since the state of a photon requires specifying a direction in space
(essentially the value of an angle that can vary continuously),
without a shared entangled state Alice would have to convey an
infinite amount of classical information to Bob for Bob to be able to
reconstruct the state |*u*> precisely. To see why this is
so, consider that the decimal expansion of an angle variable
represented by a real number is represented by a potentially infinite
sequence of digits between 0 and 9. The binary expansion is
represented by a potentially infinite sequence of 0's and 1's. Ever
since Shannon formalized the notion of classical information, the
amount of classical information associated with a binary alternative
(represented as 0 or 1), where each alternative has equal probability,
is measured as one binary digit or ‘bit’. So to specify
the value of an arbitrary angle variable requires an infinite number
of bits. To specify the outcome of Alice's operation, which has four
possible outcomes with equal probabilities, requires two bits of
classical information. Remarkably, Bob can reconstruct the state
|*u*> on the basis of just two bits of classical information
communicated by Alice, apparently by exploiting the entangled state as
a quantum communication channel to transfer the remaining
information. For further discussion of quantum teleportation, see
Nielsen and Chuang 2000, or Richard Josza's article “Quantum
Information and its Properties” in Lo, Popescu, and Spiller
1998.

## 3. Quantum Information

Formally, the amount of classical information we gain, on average, when we learn the value of a random variable (or, equivalently, the amount of uncertainty in the value of a random variable before we learn its value) is represented by a quantity called the Shannon entropy, measured in bits (Shannon and Weaver, 1949). A random variable is defined by a probability distribution over a set of values. In the case of a binary random variable, with equal probability for each of the two possibilities, the Shannon entropy is 1 bit, representing maximal uncertainty. For all other probabilities — intuitively, representing some information about which alternative is more likely — the Shannon entropy is less than 1. For the case of maximal knowledge or zero uncertainty about the alternatives, where the probabilities are 0 and 1, the Shannon entropy is zero. (Note that the term ‘bit’ is used to refer to the basic unit of classical information in terms of Shannon entropy, and to an elementary two-state classical system considered as representing the possible outputs of an elementary classical information source.)

Since information is always embodied in the state of a physical system, we can also think of the Shannon entropy as quantifying the physical resources required to store classical information. Suppose Alice wishes to communicate some classical information to Bob over a classical communication channel such as a telephone line, say an email message. A relevant question concerns the extent to which the message can be compressed without loss of information, so that Bob can reconstruct the original message accurately from the compressed version. According to Shannon's source coding theorem or noiseless coding theorem (assuming a noiseless telephone line with no loss of information), the minimal physical resource required to represent the message (effectively, a lower bound on the possibility of compression) is given by the Shannon entropy of the source.

What happens if we use the quantum states of physical systems to store information, rather than classical states? It turns out that quantum information is radically different from classical information. The unit of quantum information is the ‘qubit’, representing the amount of quantum information that can be stored in the state of the simplest quantum system, for example, the polarization state of a photon. The term is due to Schumacher (1995), who proved a quantum analogue of Shannon's noiseless coding theorem. (By analogy with the term ‘bit,’ the term ‘qubit’ refers to the basic unit of quantum information in terms of the von Neumann entropy, and to an elementary two-state quantum system considered as representing the possible outputs of an elementary quantum information source.) As we have seen, an arbitrarily large amount of classical information can be encoded in a qubit. This information can be processed and communicated but, because of the peculiarities of quantum measurement, at most one bit can be accessed! According to a theorem by Holevo, the accessible information in a probability distribution over a set of alternative qubit states is limited by the von Neumann entropy, which is equal to the Shannon entropy only when the states are orthogonal in the space of quantum states, and is otherwise less than the Shannon entropy.

While classical information can be copied or cloned, the quantum ‘no cloning’ theorem (Dieks, 1982; Wootters and Zurek, 1982) asserts the impossibility of cloning an unknown quantum state. To see why, consider how we might construct a classical copying device. A NOT gate is a device that takes a bit as input and produces as output either a 1 if the input is 0, or a 0 if the input is 1. In other words, a NOT gate is a 1-bit gate that flips the input bit. A controlled-NOT gate, or CNOT gate, takes two bits as inputs, a control bit and a target bit, and flips the target bit if and only if the control bit is 1, while reproducing the control bit. (So there are two inputs, the control and target, and two outputs: the control, and either the target or the flipped target, depending on the value of the control.) A CNOT gate functions as a copying device for the control bit if the target bit is set to 0, because the output of the target bit is then a copy of the control bit (i.e., the input 00 produces output 00, and the input 10 produces output 11). Insofar as we can think of a measurement as simply a copying operation, a CNOT gate is the paradigm of a classical measuring device. (Imagine Alice equipped with such a device, with input and output control and target wires, measuring the properties of an unknown classical world. The input control wire is a probe for the presence of absence of a property, represented by a 1 or a 0. The target wire functions as the pointer, which is initially set to 0. The output of the target is a 1 or a 0, depending on the presence or absence of the property.)

Suppose we attempt to use our CNOT gate to copy an unknown qubit
state. Since we are now proposing to regard the CNOT gate as a device
for processing quantum states, the evolution from input states to
output states must be effected by a physical quantum
transformation. Now quantum transformations are linear on the linear
state space of qubits. Linearity of the state space means that for
any two qubit states — call them |0> and |1> — that
are orthogonal in the space of qubit states, there are qubit states
that are represented by linear superpositions or sums of |0> and
|1>, with certain coefficients. Such superpositions — e.g., a
superposition with coefficients c_{0}, c_{1}
represented symbolically as c_{0}|0> + c_{1}|1>
— are non-orthogonal to |0> and to |1>. Linearity of the
transformation means that any transformation must take a qubit state
represented by the sum of two orthogonal qubits to a new qubit state
that is the sum of the transformed orthogonal qubits. If the CNOT gate
succeeds in copying two orthogonal qubits, it cannot succeed in
copying a linear superposition of these qubits. Since the gate
functions linearly, it must instead produce a state that is a linear
superposition of the outputs obtained for the two orthogonal
qubits. That is to say, the output of the gate will be represented by
a quantum state that is a sum of two terms, where the first term
represents the output of the control and target for the first
orthogonal qubit, and the second term represents the output of the
control and target for the second orthogonal qubit. This could be
expressed as c_{0}|0>|0> +
c_{1}|1>|1>. This is an entangled state and not the
output that would be required by a successful copying operation, where
the control and target each outputs the superposed qubit, expressed as
(c_{0}|0> + c_{1}|1>)(c_{0}|0> +
c_{1}|1>).

## 4. Quantum Cryptography

Linearity prevents the possibility of cloning or measuring an unknown quantum state. Similarly, it can be shown that if Alice sends Bob one of two nonorthogonal qubits, Bob can obtain information about which of these qubits was sent only at the expense of disturbing the state. In general, for quantum information there is no information gain without disturbance. The impossibility of copying an unknown quantum state, or a state that is known to belong to a set of nonorthogonal states with a certain probability, and the existence of a trade-off relation between information gain and state disturbance, is the basis of the application of quantum information to cryptography. There are quantum protocols involving the exchange of classical and quantum information that Alice and Bob can exploit to share a secret random key, which they can then use to communicate privately. (See Lo's article “Quantum Cryptology” in Lo, Popescu, and Spiller, 1998.) Any attempt by an eavesdropper, Eve, to monitor the communication between Alice and Bob will be detectable, in principle, because Eve cannot gain any quantum information without some disturbance to the quantum communication channel. Moreover, the ‘no cloning’ theorem prohibits Eve from copying the quantum communications and processing them off-line, so to speak, after she monitors the classical communication between Alice and Bob.

While the difference between classical and quantum information can be exploited to achieve successful key distribution, there are other cryptographic protocols that are thwarted by quantum entanglement. Bit commitment is a key cryptographic protocol that can be used as a subroutine in a variety of important cryptographic tasks. In a bit commitment protocol, Alice supplies an encoded bit to Bob. The information available in the encoding should be insufficient for Bob to ascertain the value of the bit, but sufficient, together with further information supplied by Alice at a subsequent stage when she is supposed to reveal the value of the bit, for Bob to be convinced that the protocol does not allow Alice to cheat by encoding the bit in a way that leaves her free to reveal either 0 or 1 at will.

To illustrate the idea, suppose Alice claims the ability to predict
advances or declines in the stock market on a daily basis. To
substantiate her claim without revealing valuable information (perhaps
to a potential employer, Bob) she suggests the following
demonstration: She proposes to record her prediction, before the
market opens, by writing a 0 (for ‘decline’) or a 1 (for
‘advance’) on a piece of paper, which she will lock in a
safe. The safe will be handed to Bob, but Alice will keep the key. At
the end of the day's trading, she will announce the bit she chose and
prove that she in fact made the commitment at the earlier time by
handing Bob the key. Of course, the key-and-safe protocol is not
provably secure from cheating by Bob, because there is no principle of
classical physics that that prevents Bob from opening the safe and
closing it again without leaving any trace. The question is whether
there exists a quantum analogue of this procedure that is
unconditionally secure: provably secure by the laws of physics against
cheating by either Alice or Bob. Bob can cheat if he can obtain
*some* information about Alice's commitment before she reveals
it (which would give him an advantage in repetitions of the protocol
with Alice). Alice can cheat if she can delay actually making a
commitment until the final stage when she is required to reveal her
commitment, or if she can change her commitment at the final stage
with a very low probability of detection.

It turns out that unconditionally secure two-party bit commitment, based solely on the principles of quantum or classical mechanics (without exploiting special relativistic signalling constraints, or principles of general relativity or thermodynamics) is impossible. See Mayers 1997, Lo and Chau 1997 and Lo's article “Quantum Cryptology” in Lo, Popescu, and Spiller 1998 for further discussion. Note that Kent (1999) has shown that one can implement a secure classical bit commitment protocol by exploiting relativistic signalling constraints in a timed sequence of communications between verifiably separated sites for both Alice and Bob.) Roughly, the impossibility arises because at any step in the protocol where either Alice or Bob is required to make a determinate choice (perform a measurement on a particle in the quantum channel, choose randomly and perhaps conditionally between a set of alternative actions to be implemented on the particle in the quantum channel, etc.), the choice can delayed by entangling one or more ‘ancilla’ particles with the channel particle in an appropriate way. By suitable operations on the ancillas, the channel particle can be ‘steered’ so that this cheating strategy is undetectable. In effect, if Bob can obtain no information about the bit in the safe, then entanglement will allow Alice to ‘steer’ the bit to either 0 or 1 at will.

## 5. Quantum Computation

Quantum information can be processed, but the accessibility of this
information is limited by the Holevo bound (mentioned in Section
3). David Deutsch (1985) first showed how to exploit quantum
entanglement to perform a computational task that is impossible for a
classical computer. Suppose we have a black box or oracle that evaluates a
function *f*. The arguments of *f* (inputs) are either 0
or 1. The values (outputs) of *f* (which are also 0 or 1) are
either the same for both arguments (in which case *f* is
constant), or different for the two arguments (in which case
*f* is said to be ‘balanced’). We are interested in
determining whether *f* is constant or balanced. Now,
classically, the only way to do this is to run the black box or query the oracle twice,
for both arguments 0 and 1, and to pass the values (outputs of
*f*) to a circuit that determines whether they are the same
(for ‘constant’) or different (for
‘balanced’). Deutsch showed that if we use quantum states
and quantum gates to store and process information, then we can
determine whether *f* is constant or balanced in one evaluation
of the function *f*. The trick is to design the circuit (the
sequence of gates) to produce the answer to a *global* question
about the function (‘constant’ or ‘balanced’)
in an output qubit register that can then be read out or measured.

Consider again the quantum CNOT gate, with two orthogonal qubits |0> and |1> as possible inputs for the control, and |0> as the input for the target. One can think of the input control and output target qubits, respectively, as the argument and associated value of a function. This CNOT function associates the value 0 with the argument 0 and the value 1 with the argument 1. For a linear superposition of the orthogonal qubits with equal coefficients as input to the control, represented as |0> + |1> (ignoring the coefficients, for simplity), and the qubit |0> as the input to the target, the output is the entangled state |0>|0> + |1>|1>, a linear superposition in which the first term represents the argument 0 and associated value (0) of the CNOT function, and the second term represents the argument 1 and associated value (1) of the CNOT function. The entangled state represents all possible arguments and corresponding values of the function as a linear superposition, but this information is not accessible. What can be shown to be accessible, by a suitable choice of quantum gates, is information about whether or not the function has certain global properties. This information is obtainable without reading out the evaluation of any individual arguments and values. (Indeed, accessing information in the entangled state about a global property of the function will typically require losing access to all information about individual arguments and values.)

The situation is analogous for Deutsch's function *f*. Here the
output of *f* can be represented as either |0>|0> +
|1>|0> or >|0>|1> + |1>|1> (in the
‘constant’ case), or |0>|0> + |1>|1> or
|0>|1> + |1>|0> (in the ‘balanced’ case). The
two entangled states in the ‘constant’ case are orthogonal
in the 4-dimensional two-qubit state space and span a plane. Call this
the ‘constant’ plane. Similarly, the two entangled states
in the ‘balanced’ case span a plane, the
‘balanced’ plane. These planes are orthogonal in the
4-dimensional state space, except for an overlap: a line, representing
a (non-entangled) two-qubit state. It is therefore possible to design
a measurement to distinguish the two global properties of *f*,
‘constant’ or ‘balanced,’ with a certain
probability (actually, 1/2) of failure, when the measurement yields an
outcome corresponding to the overlap state, which is common to the two
cases. Nevertheless, only one query of the function is required when
the measurement succeeds in identifying the global property. With a
judicious choice of quantum gates, it is even possible to design a
quantum circuit that always succeeds in distinguishing the two cases
in one run.

Deutsch's example shows how quantum information, and quantum
entanglement, can be exploited to compute a global property of a
function in one step that would take two steps classically. While
Deutsch's problem is rather trivial, there now exist several quantum
algorithms with interesting applications, notably Shor's factorization
algorithm for factoring large composite integers in polynomial time
(with direct application to ‘public key’ cryptography, a
widely used classical cryptographic scheme) and Grover's database
search algorithm. Shor's algorithm achieves an exponential speed-up
over *any known* classical algorithm. For algorithms that are
allowed access to oracles (whose internal structure is not
considered), the speed-up can be shown to be exponential
over *any* classical algorithm in some cases, e.g., Simon's
algorithm. See Nielsen and Chuang 2000, Barenco's article
“Quantum Computation: An Introduction” in Lo, Popescu, and
Spiller 1998, Bub 2006 (Section 6), as well as the entry on
quantum computing.

Note that there is currently no proof that a quantum algorithm can
solve an NP-complete problem in polynomial time (the factorization
problem is not NP-complete), so the efficiency of quantum computers
relative to classical computers *might* turn out to be
illusory. If there is indeed a speed-up, it would seem to be due to
the phenomenon of entanglement. The amount of information required to
describe a general entangled state of
*n* qubits grows exponentially with *n*. The state space
(Hilbert space) has 2^{n} dimensions, so a general
entangled state is a superposition of 2^{n}
*n*-qubit states. In classical mechanics there are no entangled
states: a general *n*-bit composite system can be described
with just *n* times the amount of information required to
describe a single bit system. So the classical simulation of a quantum
process would involve an exponential increase in the classical
informational resource required to represent the quantum state, as the
number of qubits that become entangled in the evolution grows
linearly, and there would be a corresponding exponential slowdown in
calculating the evolution, compared to the actual quantum computation
performed naturally by the system. Nevertheless, there is no consensus
in the literature as to what exactly explains the apparent
speed-up. For a discussion, see Bub 2007, 2010.

## 6. Interpretative Remarks

Deutsch (1997) has argued that the exponential speed-up in quantum computation, and in general the way a quantum system processes information, can only be properly understood within the framework of Everett's ‘many-worlds’ interpretation (see Everett's Relative-State Formulation of Quantum Mechanics and Many-Worlds Intepretation of Quantum Mechanics). The idea, roughly, is that an entangled state of the sort that arises in the quantum computation of a function, which represents a linear superposition over all possible arguments and corresponding values of the function, should be understood as something like a massively parallel classical computation, for all possible values of a function, in parallel worlds. For an insightful critique of this idea of ‘quantum parallelism’ as explanatory, see Steane 2003.

An alternative view, not much discussed in the literature in this connection, is the quantum logical approach, which emphasizes the non-Boolean structure of properties of quantum systems. (The properties of a classical system form a Boolean algebra, essentially the abstract characterization of a set-theoretic structure. This is reflected in the Boolean character of classical logic, and the Boolean gates in a classical computer.) From this perspective, the picture is entirely different. Rather than ‘computing all values of a function at once,’ a quantum algorithm achieves an exponential speed-up over a classical algorithm by avoiding the computation of any values of the function at all. A crucial difference between quantum and classical information is the possibility of selecting an exclusive disjunction, representing a global property of a function, among alternative possible disjunctions — for example, the ‘constant’ disjunction asserting that the value of the function (for both arguments) is either 0 or 1, or the ‘balanced’ disjunction asserting that the value of the function (for both arguments) is either the same as the argument or different from the argument — without determining the truth values of the disjuncts. Classically, an exclusive disjunction is true if and only if one of the disjuncts is true. This is is redundant information in a quantum computation but essential information classically: an exclusive classical disjunction is true if and only if one of the disjuncts is true. In effect, Deutsch's quantum circuit achieves its speed-up by exploiting the non-Boolean structure of quantum properties to efficiently distinguish between two disjunctive properties, without determining the truth values of the relevant disjuncts (representing the association of individual arguments with corresponding function values). The point of the procedure is to avoid the evaluation of the function in the determination of the global property, in the sense of producing a value in the range of the function for a value in its domain, and it is this feature — impossible in the Boolean logic of classical computation — that leads to the speed-up relative to classical algorithms. For some recent work by Giuntini and others on logics associated with quantum gates, see under ‘quantum computational logics’ in the Other Internet Resources. (For quantum logic not specifically in relation to quantum computation, see the entry on quantum logic and quantum probability).

Some researchers in quantum information and quantum computation have argued for an information-theoretic interpretation of quantum mechanics. In his review article on quantum computation, Andrew Steane (1998, p. 119) makes the following remark:

Historically, much of fundamental physics has been concerned with discovering the fundamental particles of nature and the equations which describe their motions and interactions. It now appears that a different programme may be equally important: to discover the ways that nature allows, and prevents,informationto be expressed and manipulated, rather than particles to move.

Steane concludes his review with the following radical proposal (1998, p. 171):

To conclude with, I would like to propose a more wide-ranging theoretical task: to arrive at a set of principles like energy and momentum conservation, but which apply to information, and from which much of quantum mechanics could be derived. Two tests of such ideas would be whether the EPR-Bell correlations thus became transparent, and whether they rendered obvious the proper use of terms such as ‘measurement’ and ‘knowledge’.

In line with this proposal, Clifton, Bub, and Halvorson 2003 showed that one can derive the basic kinematic features of a quantum description of physical systems from three fundamental information-theoretic constraints:

- ‘no signaling,’ i.e., no information should be available in the marginal probabilities of measurement outcomes in one region about alternative choices made by an agent in a separated region
- the impossibility of perfectly broadcasting the information contained in an unknown physical state (which, for pure states, amounts to ‘no cloning’)
- the impossibility of communicating information so as to implement a bit commitment protocol with unconditional security

The analysis is carried out in an algebraic framework (C*-algebras) which allows a mathematically abstract characterization of a physical theory including, as special cases, all classical mechanical theories of both wave and particle varieties, and all variations on quantum theory, including quantum field theories (plus any hybrids of these theories, such as theories with superselection rules). Within this framework, the three information-theoretic constraints are shown to jointly entail three physical conditions that are taken as definitive of what it means to be a quantum theory in the most general sense, specifically that:

- the algebras of observables pertaining to distinct physical
systems commute (a condition usually called microcausality
or
*kinematic independence*) - any individual system's algebra of observables is
*noncommutative* - the physical world is
*nonlocal*, in that spacelike separated systems can occupy entangled states that persist as the systems separate

As pointed out by Barnum, Dahlsten, Leifer, and Toner 2008, in spite
of the apparent generality of the Clifton-Bub-Halvorson theorem,
C*-algebraic theories in finite dimensions are essentially classical
theories or quantum theories with superselection rules. Barnum *et
al*. considered a framework of generalized probabilistic theories
broad enough to include not only quantum and classical mechanics, but
also a wide variety of other ‘superquantum’ theories that
can serve as foils, and they proved similar results in this framework;
specifically, they showed that for any nonclassical ‘no
signaling’ theory that does not permit entanglement between
systems, there is a bit-commitment protocol that is exponentially
secure in the number of systems involved. See Barrett 2007 and Barnum,
Barrett, Leifer, and Wilce 2007 and Barnum, Barrett, Leifer, and Wilce
2006 and 2008 (Other Internet Resources). Other researchers have
considered the problem of what constraints in the class of ‘no
signaling’ theories would characterize quantum theories. See
Brassard 2005, van Dam 2005 (Other Internet Resources), Skrzypczyk,
Brunner, and Popescu 2009 (Other Internet Resources), Pawlowski *et
al*. 2009, Allcock *et al*. 2009, Navascues and Wunderlich
2009) for interesting results along these lines. For the relation
between the generalized probabilistic theory approach of Barnum *et
al*. and the category-theoretic approach of Coecke
*et al*, see Barnum and Wilce 2008a and 2008b (Other Internet
Resources). See Brukner and Zeilinger 2002 for a different
information-theoretic approach to quantum mechanics, and Fuchs 2002
(Other Internet Resources) for a radically Bayesian
information-theoretic perspective. For an insightful analysis and
critique of the Brukner-Zeilinger position, see Timpson 2003.

## Bibliography

- Allcock, J., Brunner, N., Pawlowski, M., Scarani, V. (2009)
“Recovering Part of the Quantum Boundary from Information
Causality,”
*Physical Review A*, 80: 040103; arXiv e-print quant-ph/0906.3464. - Aspect, A., Grangier, P., Roger, G. (1982) “Experimental Tests of
Bell's Inequalities Using Time-Varying Analyzers,”
*Physical Review Letters*, 49: 1804–1807. - Barnum, H. (2003) “Quantum Information Processing, Operational
Quantum Logic, Convexity, and the Foundations of Physics,”
*Studies in the History and Philosophy of Modern Physics*, 34: 343–379; arXiv e-print quant-ph/0304159. - Barnum, H., Barrett, J., Leifer, M., and Wilce, A. (2007) “A
Generalized No-Broadcasting Theorem,”
*Physical Review Letters*, 99:240501; arXiv e-print quant-ph/0707.0620. - Barnum, H., Dahlsten, O., Leifer, M., and Toner, B. (2008)
“Nonclassicality Without Entanglement Enables Bit
Committment,”
*Proceedings of the IEEE Information Theory Workshop (ITW 2008), Porto, May 5–9, 2008*, Joao Barros and Steven W. McLauglin (eds.); arXiv e-print quant-ph/0803.1264. - Barrett, J. (2007) “Information Processing in Generalized
Probabilistic Theories,”
*Physical Review A*, 75:032304; arXiv e-print quant-ph/0508211. - Bell, J.S. (1964) “On the Einstein-Podolsky-Rosen Paradox”
*Physics*, 1: 195–200. - Bennett, C.H., DiVicenzo, B.D. (2000) “Quantum Information and
Computation,”
*Nature*, 404: 247–255. - Bohr, N. (1935) “Can Quantum-Mechanical Description of Physical
Reality be Considered Complete?,”
*Physical Review*m 38: 696–702. - Born, M. (ed.)(1992)
*The Born-Einstein Letters*, Dordrecht: Reidel. - Brassard, G. (2005) “Is Information the Key?,”
*Nature Physics*, 1: 2–4 . - Brukner, C., Zeilinger, A. (2002) “Information and Fundamental
Elements of the Structure of Quantum Theory,”
*Festschrift for C. F. von Weizsaecker on the Occasion of his 90th Birthday*, arXiv e-print quant-ph/0212084. - Bub, J. (2006) “Quantum Information and Computation,” in John
Earman and Jeremy Butterfield (eds.),
*Philosophy of Physics (Handbook of Philosophy of Science)*, Amsterdam: North Holland, pp. 555–660; arXiv e-print quant-ph/0512125. - Bub, J. (2007)“Quantum Computation from a Quantum Logical
Perspective,”
*Quantum Information and Computation*, 7: 281–296. - Bub, J. (2008) “Quantum Computation and Pseudotelepathic
Games,”
*Philosophy of Science*, 75 458–472. - Bub, J. (2010) “Quantum Computation: Where Does the Speed-Up Come
from?,” in A. Bokulich and G. Jaeger (eds.),
*Philosophy of Quantum Information and Entanglement*, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, pp. 231–246. - Bub, J. (2010) “Quantum Probabilities: An Information-Theoretic
Interpretation,” in Hartmann and C. Beisbart (eds.),
*Probabilities in Physics*, Oxford: Oxford University Press. - Clifton, R., Bub, J., Halvorson, H. (2003) “Characterizing
Quantum Theory in Terms of Information-Theoretic Constraints”
*Foundations of Physics*, 33: 1561–1591. - Deutsch, D. (1985) “Quantum Theory, the Church-Turing Principle
and the Universal Quantum Computer,”
*Proceedings of the Royal Society (London)*, A400: 97–117. - Deutsch, D. (1997)
*The Fabric of Reality*, London: Penguin. - Dieks, D. (1982) “Communication by EPR Devices,”
*Physics Leters A*, 92: 271–272. - Einstein, A., Podolsky, B., Rosen, N. (1935) “Can
Quantum-Mechanical Description of Physical Reality be Considered
Complete?,”
*Physical Review*, 47: 777–780. - Everett, H. (1957) “'Relative State' Formulation of Quantum
Mechanics,”
*Reviews of Modern Physics*, 29: 454–462. - Feynman, R. (1996)
*Feynman Lectures on Computation*, edited by J.G. Hey and R.W. Allen, Reading, MA: Addison-Wesley Publishing Company. - Fuchs, C.A. (2001) “Quantum Foundations in the Light of Quantum
Information,” in
*Proceedings of the NATO Advanced Research Workshop on Decoherence and its Implications in Quantum Computation and Information Transfer*, A. Gonis (ed.); arXiv e-print quant-ph/0106166. - Holevo, A.S. (1973) “Statistical Problems in Quantum Physics,” in
G. Murayama and J.V. Prokhorov (eds.)
*Proceedings of the Second Japan-USSR Symposium on Probability Theory*, Berlin: Springer, pp. 104–109. - Kent, A. (1999) “Unconditionally Secure Bit Commitment”
*Physical Review Letters*, 83: 1447–1450. - Lo, H.-K., Chau, H.F. (1997) “Is Quantum Bit Commitment Really
Possible?,”
*Physical Review Letters*, 78: 3410–3413. - Lo, H.-K., Popescu, S., Spiller, T. (1998)
*Introduction to Quantum Computation and Information*, Singapore: World Scientific. - Mayers, D. (1997) “Unconditionally Secure Quantum Bit Commitment
is Impossible,”
*Physical Review Letters*, 78: 3414–3417. - Navascues, M. and Wunderlich, H. (2009)“A Glance Beyond the
Quantum Model,”
*Proceedings of the Royal Society A*, November 2009, 1–10; arXiv e-print quant-ph/0907.0372. - Nielsen, M.A., Chuang, I.L. (2000)
*Quantum Computation and Quantum Information*, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press. - Pawlowski, M., Patarek, T., Kaszlikowski, D., Scarani, V., Winter,
A.,and Zukowski, M. (2009) “A New Physical Principle: Informaiton
Causality,”
*Nature*, 461: 1101; arXiv e-print quant-ph/0905.229. - Schrödinger, E. (1935) “Discussion of Probability Relations
Between Separated Systems,,”
*Proceedings of the Cambridge Philosophical Society*, 31: 555–563; 32 (1936): 446–451. - Schumacher, B. (1995) “Quantum Coding,”
*Physical Review A*, 51: 2738–2747. - Shannon, C.E., Weaver, W. (1949)
*The Mathematical Theory of Communication*, Urbana: University of Illinois Press. - Steane, A.M. (1998) “Quantum Computing,”
*Reports on Progress in Physics*, 61: 117–173. - Steane, A.M. (2003) “A Quantum Computer Needs Only One Universe”
*Studies in History and Philosophy of Modern Physics*, 34B: 469–478; arXiv e-print quant-ph/0003084. - Timpson, C.G. (2003) “On a Supposed Conceptual Inadequacy of the Shannon Information in Quantum Mechanics”
*Studies in History and Philosophy of Modern Physics*, 33: 441–468; arXiv e-print quant-ph/0112178. - van Fraassen, B. (1982) “The Charybdis of Realism: Epistemological
Implications of Bell's Inequality,”
*Synthese*, 52: 25–38. - Wootters, W.K., Zurek, W.H. (1982) “A Single Quantum Cannot be
Cloned,”
*Nature*, 299: 802–803.

## Academic Tools

How to cite this entry. Preview the PDF version of this entry at the Friends of the SEP Society. Look up this entry topic at the Indiana Philosophy Ontology Project (InPhO). Enhanced bibliography for this entry at PhilPapers, with links to its database.

## Other Internet Resources

### Preprints

- Barnum, H., Barrett, J., Leifer, M., and Wilce, A. (2008) “Teleportation in General Probabilistic Theories.”
- Barnum, H., Barrett, J., Clark, L.O., Leifer, M., Spekkens, R., Stepanik, N., Wilce, A., and Wilke, R. (2009) “Entropy and Information Causality in General Probabilistic Theories.”
- Barnum, H., and Wilce, A. (2008a) “Information Processing in Convex Operational Theories.”
- Barnum, H., and Wilce, A. (2008b) “Ordered Linear Spaces and Categories as Frameworks for Information-Processing Characterizations of Quantum and Classical Theory.”
- Fuchs, C.A. (2002) “Quantum Mechanics as Quantum Information (and Only a Little More).”
- Skrzypczyk, P., Brunner, N., and Popescu, S. (2009) “Emergence of Quantum Correlations from Non-Locality Swapping.”
- Timpson, C. (2000) “Quantum Information and the Foundations of Quantum Mechanics.”
- van Dam, W. (2005) “Implausible Consequences of Superstrong Nonlocality.”

### Other Resources

- arXiv E-print Archive for Quantum Physics.
- Todd Brun's Lecture Notes in Quantum Information Processing.
- John Preskill's Course on Quantum Information and Computation.
- Cambridge Centre for Quantum Computation.
- Home Pages of Researchers on Quantum Information.

## Related Entries

Bell's Theorem | physics: Reichenbach's common cause principle | quantum mechanics: Copenhagen interpretation of | quantum mechanics: Everett's relative-state formulation of | quantum mechanics: many-worlds interpretation of | quantum theory: quantum computing | quantum theory: quantum logic and probability theory | quantum theory: the Einstein-Podolsky-Rosen argument in