Notes to Religious Diversity (Pluralism)

1. The phrase “religious exclusivist” has been used by some as a label for anyone who claims that her perspective on a religious issue is true (and, thus, that any incompatible perspective is false). In this sense, for example, anyone who claims that her perspective on the question of who will spend eternity with God is true — whether that perspective is that no one spends eternity with God, that the proponents of only certain religions will spend eternity with God, or that everyone will spend eternity with God — is by virtue of this truth claim a religious exclusivist. Looked at in this way, “religious pluralism,” however it is defined, is not a competing position. Rather, an individual is either a religious exclusivist or not. If a person believes that a given perspective on a religious issue is true, then, regardless of the nature or content of that perspective, she is a religious exclusivist; if a person doesn't hold such a belief, then she is not a religious exclusivist with respect to the issue in question.

2. We must distinguish the type of selective pluralism I'm describing from what Kevin Meeker has labeled “anarchistic pluralism.” As will be discussed later, a selective pluralist is someone who believes that more than one, but not necessarily all, competing perspectives are equally close to the truth, while an anarchistic pluralist is someone who believes that all competing perspectives on a given issue are equally close to the truth. Most individuals who consider themselves pluralists are selective pluralists since they would want to reserve the right to maintain both that some perspectives are equally “true” while also claiming some perspectives to be false (Meeker 2003, 524-534). S. Mark Heim, whose views will be considered later, might be considered by some an anarchistic pluralist (Heim 1995).

3. Also, it is clearly the case that many exclusivists (for example, many exclusivistic Christians or Muslims) want their epistemic competitors to consider seriously the modification or abandonment of even their rock bottom beliefs on the basis of belief assessment. Thus it is difficult to see how such exclusivists can justifiably exclude their own rock bottom beliefs from assessment.

4. The focus of discussion about reasonable belief among those engaging in the current “epistemology of disagreement” dialog is not exclusively, or even primarily, on religious beliefs. However, the various perspectives do apply directly to religious beliefs.

5. Kelly James Clark agrees: “Whatever warranted beliefs about God one has antecedently … will remain warranted in the face of claims of religious diversity” (Clark 1997, 317).

6. One possible exception is Paul J. Griffiths (Griffiths 1988, 400-404).

7. It is important to note explicitly that a person can be an exclusivist on this issue while a non-exclusivist in relation to other issues, for instance, with respect to the question of who can experience God's presence now.

8. One famous Christian exclusivist of this type was Karl Barth. Attempts to reconcile ourselves to God, he argued, are doomed to failure. It is, instead, only through the true revelation of God in Jesus Christ that God provides and reveals the means for our salvation (Peterson et al. 2003, 270-271).

9. Proponents of this view often point to Romans 9: 16-22, where we read that just as a potter can do with a lump of clay whatever she or he wants for whatever reason, so too can God do what God wants with and to us as humans for God's own reasons.

Copyright © 2010 by
David Basinger <basingerd@roberts.edu>

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