A group right is a right held by a group as a group rather than by its members severally. The “group” in “group right” describes the nature of the right-holder; it does not describe the mere fact that the right is confined to the members of a group rather than possessed by all members of a society or by humanity at large. Much of the controversy that surrounds group rights focuses on whether groups can hold rights and, if they can, on the conditions that a group must satisfy if it is to be a right-holder. Some proponents of group rights conceive right-holding groups as moral entities in their own right, so that, as a right-holder, a group has a being and status analogous to those of an individual person. Others give groups no such independent standing, but conceive group rights as rights that are shared in and held jointly by the group's members. Some opponents of group rights challenge the very proposition that groups can bear rights. Others do not, but worry about the threats that such rights pose for individuals and their rights. They, in turn, are met by claims that individual rights and group rights, suitably formulated, are complementary rather than conflicting and that some group rights might even be human rights.
- 1. Identifying group rights
- 2. Moral and legal group rights
- 3. Groups as right-holders
- 4. Group rights: corporate and collective
- 5. Group rights and collective goods
- 6. Scepticism about group rights
- 7. Fears of the implications or consequences of group rights
- 8. Group rights and individual rights: co-existence and complementarity?
- 9. Group rights and human rights
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A group right is a right possessed by a group qua group rather than by its members severally. It contrasts with a right held by an individual person as an individual. An example of a commonly asserted group right is the right of a nation or a people to be self-determining. If there is such a right, it is a right possessed and exercised by a nation or a people as a group. It is logically possible that a single individual could have a right that an entire people should be self-determining, so that an invader would violate that individual's right rather than a right held by the people themselves; but nowadays it would be difficult to find anyone who would accept the political morality needed to turn that logical possibility into a serious claim of right. We might try to interpret a collective right of self-determination as merely an aggregation of the individual rights of self-determination of those who make up the relevant nation or people. But an individual's right of self-determination is normally understood as the right of a person to determine his or her own life rather than a right over the lives of others. Thus, the right of a group to determine the character and destiny of its collective life cannot be merely a summing together of individual rights of self-determination. We may certainly appeal to individual rights of self-determination, and to the values that underlie them, in making the case for a collective right of self-determination, but that does not imply that the collective right would be no more than the set of individual rights to which we appeal.
Other rights that are now frequently asserted as group rights include the right of a cultural group that its culture should be respected and perhaps publicly supported; the right of a linguistic group that its language should be usable and provided for in the public domain; and the right of a religious group that it should be free to engage in collective expressions of its faith and that its sacred sites and symbols should not be desecrated. In each of these cases, the right, insofar as it is a group right, is a right held by the relevant group qua group, and the duties generated by the right are duties owed to the group as a whole rather to its members severally.
Group rights should not be confused with rights that people possess in virtue of being members of groups. People normally possess rights as members of universities or sports clubs or businesses or trade unions or churches or states but, in the ordinary run of cases, these are individual rights. For example, the right of a member of a university to use its library, or the right of a citizen to vote in elections, is the right of an individual person. An infringement of that right would infringe the right of the individual right-holder, rather than a group right of the relevant university or state. In fact, most rights held by individuals are associated with group identities or group memberships of some sort. If we are willing to extend rights to non-human animals, even human rights will be rights unique to a particular group; yet most human rights are conceived as individual rights and, on some views, can only be individual rights.
A group right should not therefore be identified with a “group-differentiated” right. That term has been coined by Will Kymlicka (1995) to describe a right that is accorded to a particular group but not to the larger society within which the group exists. For example, a society might accord special rights, such as special territorial rights or rights of self-government, to an indigenous minority in recognition of the special status that that minority should enjoy within the larger society, or out of concern for the vulnerability of the minority's traditional form of life. These would be “group-differentiated rights”. That term is now sometimes abbreviated to “group right”, which is unfortunate since a group-differentiated right may or may not be a group right in the ordinary sense (a right possessed by the group qua group rather than by its members severally). For example, if the group-differentiated right is the right of a group to be self-governing, it will be a group right. But if it is, for example, a right unique to the members of an indigenous minority to fish in certain waters and if that right is vested in, and is exercisable by, the several individuals who make up the minority, it will be a group-differentiated individual right. (Cf. Kymlicka 1995, 45–48.)
Group rights can be legal or moral or both. If a legal system accords rights to a group, or recognises it as an entity possessing rights, it will simply be the case for that legal system that the group has rights. Those legal rights might then spawn moral rights. A law may create a wrong that would not otherwise be a wrong but, if the legal system is generally just and if the law serves a useful purpose, its breach may be considered a moral, as well as a legal, wrong. For example, you may have no right to a particular good in the absence of a law giving you legal title to it but, once you have legal title, my theft of that good can wrong you morally as well as legally. Similarly, once a group has been accorded legal rights, we might think that, in at least some cases, violations of its legal rights wrong it morally as well as legally. A group may therefore be credited with legally-dependent moral rights.
However, if group rights could only ever be creatures of law, we could not protest that a legal system was failing to recognise or to respect a group's right. Proponents of group rights, like proponents of individual rights, have been keen to use the language of rights in arguing about the form that legal, political and social arrangements should take. That implies a conception of group rights that is moral in foundation and that might be used to determine what legal rights groups should have. It is as moral rights that group rights are most controversial. Individual rights are subject to innumerable disputes, but virtually no-one denies that individuals, as persons or in other capacities, are capable of possessing rights. By contrast, many people reject the very idea that groups can possess moral rights, and even those who embrace the idea of group rights frequently disagree about the sorts of group that can possess them.
No-one ascribes rights promiscuously to every kind of group, so what is it that marks out a group as the kind of group that might bear rights? An essential condition for many theorists is the integrity manifested by a group: a group must surmount a threshold of unity and identity if it is to be potentially capable of bearing rights.
Thus Peter French (1984) distinguishes between “aggregate collectivities” and “conglomerate collectivities”. An aggregate collectivity is a mere collection of individuals such as a crowd or the people standing at a bus stop or a statistical category such as middle-income earners. If we were to ascribe either moral responsibility or moral rights to an aggregate, that responsibility and those rights would be reducible, without remainder, to the responsibilities and rights of the individuals who make it up. A conglomerate collectivity, by contrast, possesses a unified being since it is formally constituted as an organisation with an internal structure, rules, offices and decision-procedures. (For a similar, but not identical, distinction between aggregates and organisations, see Copp 1984.) Examples of groups that French classifies as conglomerates are the Democratic Party, the US Congress, the US army, the Red Cross, university faculties and business corporations. Organizations of this sort possess identities that are not exhausted by the identities of the persons in them; one person's leaving and another's joining does not result in a new organization. Thus, “what is predicable of a conglomerate is not necessarily predicable of all of those or any of those individuals associated with it” (1984, 13), including the rights and responsibilities that we might ascribe to the conglomerate. French does not mean to deny that the individuals in a conglomerate, such as a business corporation, will also have rights and responsibilities relating to its activities; he denies only that the rights and responsibilities of the conglomerate can be distributed without remainder amongst those individuals. Thus, on his view, if the Gulf Oil Corporation buys or sells property, or joins a cartel, or is found causally responsible for environmental pollution and held morally responsible for cleaning it up, the Corporation as agent and patient is not reducible to the individuals who are currently associated with it.
In a similar vein, Dwight Newman (2004, 128–9) distinguishes between “sets” and “collectivities”. A set, like French's aggregate, becomes a different set each time its membership changes. It has no identity separate from the individuals who make it up. A collectivity, by contrast, remains identifiable as the same collectivity even though its membership changes. For both French and Newman, a group's having an identity that survives changes in its individual membership is an essential feature of its being the kind of group that might bear rights. (See also Graham 2002, 68–9; Scruton 1989; Van Dyke 1977.)
The phenomenon of a group's having an identity and existence that is separate from its members is most readily apparent in the case of formally organised groups. So, for example, we can think of a football club or a university department or a trade union as remaining the same football club, university department or trade union, even though the individuals who constitute its members change over time. When you or I join or leave a formally constituted organisation, there is something independent of ourselves that we join or leave. Thus, if we ascribe rights to a formally constituted group, the right-bearing group will be something other than the set of individuals who happen to belong to it at any moment.
Formal organisation may not be deemed essential to a group's having an irreducible and enduring identity. People often think of nations, for example, as entities that have identities that run across successive generations of nationals. A nation's historic entitlement to a particular territory would be typically thought of as the entitlement of the nation conceived as a single enduring entity, rather than a right that has been inherited and bequeathed by successive generations of nationals so that, historically, there has been no continuous entity that has enjoyed rights over the territory. People are given to thinking of nations in this unitary and enduring fashion even in cases, such as the Kurds, where a nation has not been instantiated in a state, or in cases, such as the Poles, where it has been deprived of political independence for significant periods of its history. Whether we conceive a group as having an identity and being that supersedes that of its members turns not just on what we find in the world, but also on how we choose to see it.
For some proponents of group rights, we should look for the integrity that is essential to a right-bearing group neither in the group's internal organisation nor in its objective characteristics but in its subjectivity. What matters is that the individuals who make up the group feel themselves strongly bound together as members of a group with which they identify. Thus Marlies Galenkamp holds that a right-holding group has to possess a strong form of intra-group solidarity and has to be the kind of group that communitarians describe as a constitutive community (1993, 81–100, 111–2, 131; see also Segesvary 1995). Michael McDonald (1991) argues that it is the shared understanding amongst individuals that they are normatively bound to each other that makes them a group for moral purposes. That shared understanding may be related to and promoted by shared objective characteristics, such as a common history, language, system of belief or social condition, but it is still the subjectivity of the group rather than those objective features that is crucial to its being a group. Similarly, for Larry May (1987), a group has irreducible moral status as a group when its members are so related to one another that they can perform actions and possess interests together as a group that they could not as separate individuals. A group whose members are united by these solidarity relationships is, May argues, capable of bearing both moral responsibility and moral rights, as a group, that cannot be disaggregated into those of its members severally.
While those who focus on these subjective dimensions of a group still insist that the group has a moral standing that is not reducible to that of its members, they cannot obviously allow that a right-bearing group has a being or identity that is separable from that of its members. If sharing an intersubjective experience or enjoying certain sorts of relationship is crucial to the integrity of a group, the group must consist of a body of individuals who undergo that experience or who share in those relationships. Unlike French's conglomerate or Newman's collectivity, the group cannot be more or other than the group as constituted by its members.
A significant measure of unity and identity would seem an essential condition for a group's being the kind of group that might bear rights, but that condition would seem necessary rather than sufficient. Those who are sceptical of the very idea of group rights do not deny that groups come in different forms or that some exhibit a high degree of unity or that groups can be very important in people's lives. They simply deny that there is reason to ascribe to groups, however unified and however significant, the moral standing that they must possess if they are to be independent right-holders. So how do proponents of group rights seek to provide that reason?
A favoured tactic is to identify features that groups share with human individuals. If we accept that human individuals possess rights because they possess certain features, we should accept that groups also possess rights if they too possess those features. French (1984) is a particularly bold proponent of this strategy. Although formal organisation plays a significant part in his account of groups as moral entities, he sees the attribution of moral personality to a group as quite separate from the question of whether the group enjoys legal personality. For French, to be a moral person is to be a “noneliminable subject in an ascription of moral responsibility” (38). That, in turn, requires a capacity for intentional action. But, he argues, conglomerate groups, such as business corporations, that possess internal decision structures and stated policies, are capable of actions that we can properly represent as the intentional actions of the group. That is enough to make those groups “fully-fledged moral persons” capable of bearing both moral responsibility and moral rights. Groups that are moral persons “will have whatever privileges, rights and duties as are, in the normal course of affairs, accorded to all members of the moral community” (32).
A capacity for agency may be deemed essential for right-holding simply because it is thought to be essential to an entity's having moral standing. Or it may be thought crucial because choice is an essential feature of rights themselves. According to the choice theory of rights, to have a right is to have a choice such that it makes sense to ascribe rights only to beings that are capable of choice (e.g. Hart 1982, Steiner 1998). Whatever the reason, making a capacity for agency a necessary condition of right-holding severely limits the range of groups that might hold rights. Galenkamp, for example, insists that a capacity for agency is essential to a group's being a subject of rights (1993, 62, 71–3, 101–10). Yet her paradigmatic case of a right-holding group is a group distinguished by its common culture (112, 138–71). Some cultural groups, such as indigenous peoples, may be structured so that they can make and act on decisions as groups, but very many lack the institutional apparatus necessary for them to be ‘agents’ in any credible sense.
For other theorists, agency is necessary neither for moral standing nor for right-holding. It is enough that we have reason to regard a group as an object of moral concern; a group does not have to be a moral agent to be a moral patient. Even if a group is capable of moral agency, not all of its rights need concern or presuppose its agency. Thus Keith Graham points out that we can and do apply a range of moral epithets to groups: groups can be treated justly or unjustly, they can be deceived and treated offensively, and they can flourish more or less well (2002, 89–93). Thinking about groups in this way implies that they have moral status and that we can reasonably ascribe rights to them. For both May (1987) and McDonald (1991), the critical consideration is that a group can have interests as a group—interests that are more than the aggregated interests of its individual members. That is why a group is capable of being harmed and of being treated unjustly as a group. In the case of groups, as in the case of individuals, we may think of those harms and injustices as violations of rights (cf. Simon 1995, 2001).
Similarly, for Newman (2004), a group that is a collectivity rather than a mere set, has interests as a collectivity that are not merely the aggregated interests of its individual members. For example, the interest of a university is not merely a product of the interests of its individual members and its interests may run counter to those of some who belong to it, such as poor researchers and incompetent teachers. Indeed, on this view, it would seem logically possible that the interests of a university, as an institutional entity with a stated aim, could be at odds with those of all of its current academic staff. Suppose, for example, that its stated aim is achieving excellence in research and teaching but none of its current staff is capable of delivering that excellence. The university's interest may then lie in sacking all of its current staff which, we can assume, will be contrary to their interests. (However, as suggested below, that might encourage the thought that the interests and rights of a university are more properly described as those of an “institution” than a “group”.) For Newman, it is not the interests of the collectivity that derive from those of its members; the interests of members qua members derive from those of the collectivity of which they are members. If we follow the interest theory of rights and hold that to have a right is to have an interest that grounds a duty (Raz 1986, 166), a collectivity will have rights whenever its interests are sufficiently significant to create duties for others.
The various approaches to group rights described in the previous section share a common feature. Each supposes that ascribing a right to a group entails conceiving the group as moral entity in its own right: the group must possess a moral standing that is not reducible to the standing of its members. That is why arguments about group rights frequently assume the same character as arguments about the ascription of rights to foetuses or the dead or future generations or non-human animals. In each of these cases, the central issue is whether we should allow that the relevant entity has the moral standing necessary for it to bear rights.
If, for groups, we answer that question affirmatively, we shall conceive group rights analogously with individual rights. A group right, like an individual right, will be a right held by a single unitary entity. The right of a group will be “its” right rather than “their” right. Indeed, we might think of a group right as the right of a “group-individual”. Groups might bear duties in the same fashion. A group, as a single integral entity, can possess duties just as it can possess rights, and those duties may derive from group rights. For example, each nation's right of self-determination is most obviously directed at other nations who, as nations, have corresponding duties to respect one another's rights. (It remains logically possible, of course, that duties stemming from group rights will fall upon individual persons, just as it is possible that the rights of individual persons will generate duties for groups.)
This might be described as the “traditional” conception of group rights, in that it describes the way in which group rights have been most commonly understood. In recent years, however, some proponents of group rights have conceptualised them quite differently. They have understood a group right as a right that is the shared or jointly held right of a set of individuals. In this conception, a group right is still properly so-called because the individuals who make up the right-holding group possess a right together that none of them possesses separately. The right is not a mere aggregation of rights held individually by the members of the group. But, a group right conceived in this way does not entail giving a moral status to the group qua group that is separate from that of its members severally. Rather, the moral standing that underwrites the group right is the moral standing of the several individuals who jointly hold the right. The group right is therefore conceived as “their” right rather than “its” right (Jones 1999a).
The distinction between these two conceptions of group rights has frequently passed unnoticed and there is no agreed vocabulary that marks it. The term corporate will be used here to describe the traditional conception, since that conception presents a right-holding group as a unitary entity. The term collective will be used to describe the conception of a group right as a shared or joint right, since it conceives a right-holding group as a “collection” of individuals, albeit a collection that is bound together in a way that enables them to hold their right collectively. (Note that, contrary to this usage, many proponents of the “corporate” conception of group rights use the term “collective” to describe those rights; e.g. Galenkamp 1993, McDonald 1991, Newman 2004.)
Joseph Raz has provided the most influential statement of the collective conception. According to Raz, if a right is to be a collective right, it must satisfy the following three conditions:
First, it exists because an aspect of the interest of human beings justifies holding some person(s) to be subject to a duty. Second, the interests in question are the interests of individuals as members of a group in a public good and the right is a right to that public good because it serves their interest as members of that group. Thirdly, the interest of no single member of that group in that public good is sufficient by itself to justify holding another person to be subject to a duty. (1986, 208)
Raz's conception of a collective right is tied to his interest theory of rights, according to which X has a right only if X is capable of having rights and if, other things being equal, “an aspect of X's well-being (his interest) is a sufficient reason for holding some other person to be under a duty” (1986, 166). Thus, a group of individuals has a collective right if their shared interest is sufficient to ground a duty in others, and if the interest of any single member of the group is insufficient by itself to ground that duty. When these conditions are satisfied, the group of individuals possess a right together that none of them possesses separately. In fact, Raz argues that the interests that ground a right are not necessarily limited to the interests of the right-holder; they can also include interests that others have in the right-holder's having the right (1986, 245–63; 1994, 44–59; 1995). For example, the right of journalists not to disclose their sources is grounded not only in their own interests but also in the public's interest in their having that right. That consideration can also apply to collective rights. The rights of a group in respect of its culture, for example, might be grounded not only in the interests of the group's members in their culture but also in the interests of “outsiders” in the continued existence of the group's culture.
Some other theorists whose approach to group rights is consistent with what is described here as the “collective” conception are Nathan Brett (1991), Allen Buchanan (1993, 1994), Leslie Green (1991), Vinit Haksar (1998), Lesley Jacobs (1991) and Seumas Miller (2001). (See also Margalit and Raz 1990.) The collective conception need not be tied to an interest theory of rights. Miller, for example, gives an account of the collective conception that owes nothing to that theory (2001, 210–33). But the ascendancy of the interest theory of rights in recent years has meant that those who have adopted the collective conception have frequently followed Raz in combining it with the interest theory. Moreover, that theory does provide a ready-made account of what it is that individuals share—interests—that makes them a right-holding group. The way that interests can accumulate across individuals also helps to explain how it is that a group of individuals can have a right, as a group, that none of them possesses singly. For Raz, the number of individuals in a group can affect both whether the group has a right and how weighty its right is (1986, 187, 209). Others are less comfortable with that “aggregative” feature of Raz's conception; yet the relevance of numbers is often hard to dismiss. Consider, for example, the claim of a linguistic minority that its language should be usable, and provided for, in the public domain. Given the public costs of meeting that claim, it would seem implausible to hold that we should take no account of the size of a linguistic minority (of which there may be several) in deciding whether the claim amounts to a right.
The fact that, on the collective conception, the individual members of a group hold their right jointly does not entail that the right must be grounded in an interest that an individual could have as an independent individual. Some goods take a necessarily collective form, so that they cannot be made available to an individual in isolation from others; for example, the good constituted by a group's culture or its communal form of life. Yet it still makes perfectly good sense to hold that a group right to those goods is morally grounded in the interests of the several individuals who make up the relevant group and that the right is held jointly by those individuals. Thus, even though the collective conception gives no moral standing to a group independently of its members, it can still account for groups' having rights to goods that are necessarily of a non-individual form.
At the same time, there is nothing in the logic of the collective conception that limits the possible objects of group rights to non-individualizable goods. Nor, if we adopt the interest theory, need the right-holding group be a group in virtue of anything other than the shared interest that grounds their right. The second condition that Raz stipulates for a collective right suggests that individuals must be members of a group before they can go on to have interests of a sort that might ground a collective right. Miller, too, makes membership of a social group a defining condition of a joint right's being a collective right (2001, 211). But it is not clear why we should hold that a set of individuals can have a collective right only if they are antecedently identifiable as members of a group.
Consider the following example. A city is characterised by very heavy traffic that poses a danger to its pedestrians. The city's pedestrians have an interest in there being a network of walkways so that they can move around the city in safety. Each pedestrian, as an individual, has an interest in those walkways, but the interest of just one pedestrian is insufficient to create a duty for the city authorities to construct the walkways. However, the shared interest of all pedestrians may well suffice to ground that duty, in which case pedestrians will have a collective right that the authorities should construct and maintain the walkways. The point of this example is not to insist that, in these circumstances, pedestrians would indeed have that right. Rather it is to show that (a) a group might have a right to a good that is intelligible as a good for an independent individual, and (b) a right-holding group need be a group only in virtue of the shared interest that grounds their right. The group need not be institutionalised as a group, nor need it be distinguished by a common ascriptive feature. (In the example given, the fact that the right-sharing individuals are identifiable as “pedestrians” contributes nothing, independently of their interest in being able to walk around the city safely, to their having a collective right.)
The collective conception can, then, make sense of group rights both to goods that would be intelligible as goods for independent individuals and to goods that are intelligible only as goods enjoyed collectively with others. It is often supposed that, if a good takes a necessarily collective form (e.g. the collective good of possessing a common culture), the interest in that good can be understood only as the irreducible interest of a group. That is associated with the supposition that, if the shared interest generates a group right, the right-holding group must also be understood as an irreducible moral entity. Both suppositions are mistaken. Even in the case of a shared or collective interest, the interests that do the moral work in generating a right are entirely intelligible as the interests of the several individuals who make up the group and whose good is at stake. Similarly, the moral standing necessary for the individuals, as a group, to have a right to the shared good can be the standing of the several individuals who compose the group. Thus, vindicating group rights need not entail showing that the right-holding group has either interests or a standing that is not reducible to those of its members.
At the same time, there is a limit to the range of cases the collective conception can encompass. As was mentioned earlier, there can be cases in which the interest of a group logically precedes that of its members and in which the members have interests simply because, qua members, they share in the interest of the group. For example, a football club may have the stated aim of being as successful as possible in playing against rival clubs. The club will then have an interest in whatever will promote that aim, including fielding the strongest team possible in each game. I, as a member of the club, will share in its interests. So, for example, if it is in the club's interest to drop me from its team because I am not playing well enough, that will also be in my interest qua member. That interest qua member may conflict with a personal interest that I have in remaining a team player, but arguably that does not disturb my interest qua member. If we understand the interest that grounds a group's right as an interest that the group has independently of its members, and if we understand the members' interests as mere derivatives of that group interest, we must understand both the interest and the right of the group according to the corporate model. The group right cannot be understood adequately as a product of the aggregated interests of the individuals who populate the group (Newman 2004).
For the same reason, the collective conception cannot easily make sense of a group right as a right possessed by a group whose identity is unaffected by changes in its membership. As Newman points out (2004, 134), if we conceive a group right as a right held jointly by those who compose the group, each change in the group's membership must entail a change in the identity of the right-holding group. On the other hand, that may not be an objection. Groups, such as cultural, linguistic, ethnic and religious groups, are often shifting amorphous entities and we may have to get used to the idea that right-holding groups can be groups that have constantly changing compositions. Practically, that may be of little consequence for group rights provided that there is a reasonable continuity of interest amongst the group's changing members, so that the content of the right does not change with every change in membership.
Finally, note three things about the distinction between corporate and collective rights. First, the limits of the collective conception identified above stem from its unwillingness to conceive a group separately from its members. They do not stem from any inability of the collective conception to make sense of necessarily shared or collective interests—interests that individuals can have only along with others. Secondly, we can most readily conceive a group separately from its members when it is formally constituted as an institution, as in the case of a football club or a university. But once we separate a group from its members in that way, we run into the issue of whether we should really ascribe the right to an institution rather than to a group. Presumably it is for that reason that people do not normally describe the rights of Congress or Parliament or the Supreme Court as “group rights”. Thirdly, it is logically possible to interpret some group rights as corporate and others as collective, so that we are not obliged to commit ourselves exclusively to just one of these conceptions.
The distinction between corporate and collective rights concerns the way in which we might conceive the subject of a group right. But the issue of whether there is reason to ascribe rights to groups is sometimes approached through their possible objects—through what group rights might be rights to. If there are goods that have a necessarily group character and if there are rights to those goods, it would seem that those must be group rights. So are there such goods?
The obvious place to start is with the economist's idea of public goods. We might reasonably suppose with Raz (1986, 208) that a right can be a group right only if it is a right to a good that is public to the members of the right-holding group. For the relevant group, the good must be non-excludable (it must be available to all members of the group) and non-rival (its consumption by one member of the group must not diminish its possible consumption by other members). However, as Denise Réaume has pointed out (1988, 8–9), some goods that are deliverable only as public goods can reasonably be considered objects of individual rights. Clean air is a standard example of a public good, but we can reasonably hold that individuals have rights to clean air as individuals. An industrialist who seriously pollutes a community's atmosphere might be held to violate the right to breathe unpolluted air of each individual in the affected community rather than a collective or corporate right of the community as a group.
Réaume's own proposal (1988, 1994), which has attracted much attention amongst commentators on group rights, is that we should understand group rights as rights to “participatory goods”. A participatory good is a public good of a particular type. It is a good whose enjoyment by an individual depends upon its also being enjoyed by others. Consider the case of clean air again. Although this is typically a good that is public to a group, each individual breathes in and out as an individual and enjoys the good of clean air as an individual. The goodness of clean air for me does not depend upon its also being good for you, even though it is good for you. Now consider goods such as friendship, a team game, and a convivial party (Réaume 1988, 12–13; Waldron 1993, 355–6). Those are necessarily social goods. I cannot enjoy genuine friendship as an entirely individual good; I can play a team game only if others do too; and I can take pleasure in conviviality only as a shared experience. So some goods are necessarily “participatory” in nature. These goods have also been described as “communal” (Waldron 1993, 339–69), “shared” (Green 1988 207–9; Raz 1995, 35–6), and “common” (Marmor 2001).
Participatory goods are goods that must be both produced and enjoyed publicly, and goods that are simultaneously produced and enjoyed by those who participate in them. While participatory goods combine production with consumption, it is the necessarily public character of their enjoyment that really distinguishes them from other public goods. It is because they can be enjoyed only as shared goods that, Réaume argues, only groups can have rights to them. Her claim is not that every participatory good must be the object of a right; rather it is that, if there is a right to a participatory good, that must be a group right. The relevant right here is neither the liberty-right to participate in the good nor the claim-right to be unprevented by others from participating in the good, both of which will normally be individual rights. Rather it is a right to the participatory good itself (e.g. the right not merely to participate in an orchestra but the right that there shall be an orchestra, the right not merely to participate in a culture but the right that the culture shall be protected and sustained).
Some goods that can yield rights, and that are, Réaume argues, participatory in at least some of their aspects, are living in a cultured society, sharing a common language, and being a member of a religious community. If groups have rights to these participatory goods, do others have duties to provide them with those goods? If, for example, a group has a right to its culture as a participatory good, that might imply that it is entitled to constrain the freedom of its dissident members in ways that ensure the continuance of its culture. If a linguistic minority has a right to its language as a participatory good, that might imply that it is entitled to coerce reluctant others to use its language in order to sustain and promote the language as a participatory good. However, those are not the sort of rights that Réaume proposes since they would be unacceptably onerous for those who bore the duty (1988, 16–17; 1994, 133–4; see also Marmor 2001). Moreover, some participatory goods can be the goods they are only if people participate in them willingly.
The group rights that Réaume suggests might relate to participatory goods are rights against “outsiders” rather than “insiders”. And they would be rights not to outsiders' participation in the good, but to their non-prevention of, and their non-interference with, the group's participatory good and perhaps also rights to measures and resources that will facilitate the group's continued enjoyment of its participatory good. A linguistic minority may, for instance, have a right that the majority society should establish, maintain and respect arrangements that will secure the minority's ability to continue using its language. Similarly, an indigenous minority may have a right that the majority society should institute arrangements that will protect its traditional form of life, which form of life is, for the minority's members, a participatory good. But these externally directed rights would remain rights grounded in the group's interest in its participatory good and that, for Réaume, means they must be group rights.
There is an obvious gap in Réaume's attempt to identify group rights as rights to participatory goods (1994, 123–4). If only groups can have rights to participatory goods, it does not follow that groups can have rights only to participatory goods. They may also have rights to non-participatory goods, such as safe walkways or community health safeguards or coastal defences. Even the claim that rights to participatory goods must be group rights has not escaped challenge. James Morauta (2002) argues that, conceptually, a participatory good could be the object of an individual right. An individual might, for example, have a right to require others to participate with him in speaking his language and those others may be duty-bound to comply if he so insists. That may be a morally unappealing state of affairs but there is nothing in the logic of rights or participatory goods that rules it out (provided that the very nature of the good at issue does not require voluntary participation). The lacuna that Morauta identifies indicates that the proposition that only groups can have rights to participatory goods relies upon more than just the “structural features” of those goods. It relies also upon a moral assumption about the relative standing of the individuals who have interests in, or who lay claim to, a participatory good.
Suppose, for example, that one person in a nation had, uniquely, a right that that nation should be self-determining. His fellow-nationals should then be part of a self-determining unit, not because they are entitled to be, but because he is entitled that they should be. He therefore has a right over their lives that they themselves do not. Normally, we would regard that sort of inequality in moral standing as entirely unacceptable; but it is because we take that moral unacceptability for granted that we are predisposed to accept that rights to participatory goods—or, indeed, rights to public goods as public goods—must be group rights. Of course, people of equal standing can be unequally interested in a good but, in any sizeable group, it is most unlikely that one individual's interest in a good that is public to the group will be so special and so disproportionate that that individual will have, uniquely, a right to the good as a good for the group as a whole.
Criticism of group rights can take a case-by-case form. The critic might argue that close inspection of particular rights that are commonly claimed as group rights reveals either that they are not rights at all or that they dissolve into individual rights (e.g. Griffin 2003; Lagerspetz 1998). However, much criticism is directed at the very idea of group rights. That criticism is generally of two sorts: either it is sceptical of the claim that groups can hold rights or it is fearful of the implications or consequences of ascribing rights to groups.
Sceptics often object to the ontology of groups that they take to be implicit in the idea of group rights. To suppose that groups, like individual persons, can hold rights is to suppose that groups can have a being and an integrity that match those of individual persons. But groups are collections of individuals and to make them out to be supra-human entities that are somehow more than, or other than, the sum of their parts is mistaken: “only individuals can make decisions, can literally have values, literally engage in reasoning and deliberation” (Narveson 1991, 334). Those who make and administer the law may have good reason to create and to operate with fictions, such as the legal fiction of corporate personality. But moral rights and duties can attach only to real persons; “fictitious entities have no rights” (Graff 1994, 194). Groups do not exist separately from their members and, when we ascribe rights to groups as such, we ignore that simple truth. (Narveson 1991, 331–5; Wellman 1995, 157–77; cf Vincent 1989).
Doubts about the integrity of groups are sometimes sociological rather than ontological in nature. Generally, we might suppose that the groups to which we ascribe rights have a unity and identity that is independent of, and that provides the foundation for, our ascription of rights to them. A group, such as an ethnic or cultural group, has a certain “natural” existence and we recognise it as having rights because of the kind of existent it is. In reality, however, pre-institutionalised groups are shifting and changing entities and lack clear boundaries. In addition, any section of humanity that we might fasten upon as a group is likely to be part of a larger sociological entity and to have within it smaller entities that might also claim to be “groups”. So there can be a significant element of arbitrariness about the segments of humanity that we identify as “groups”. We may suppose that, in ascribing rights to a group, we merely acknowledge the entitlements of a pre-existing entity, but, in reality, it may be the ascription of rights itself that identifies, creates and fixes a segment of humanity as a “group”. (Flanagan 1985; Kukathas 1992, 110–15; Offe 1998, 125–31; Waldron 2002. Cf. Mello 2004; Mitnick 2000, 2004; Sharp 1999.)
Groups may be found improper subjects of rights because they lack properties, other than genuine integrity, that are deemed essential for right-holding. In general, proponents of the interest theory of rights have been able to view group rights more generously than those who adhere to the choice theory, although the supposition that groups can have interests has not gone unchallenged (Wall 2003, 273). Choice theorists will not extend rights to groups that are incapable of “exercising” them, such as groups distinguished merely by an ascriptive identity. They might extend rights to organised groups that possess decision-procedures (Sumner 1987, 209–11), but some argue that even those groups are not capable of the kind of agency required for right-holding (Wellman 1995, 157–65; Wall 2000, 2003, 270–6; cf. Nickel 1997). Again, if sentience is a necessary condition of right-holding, that may disqualify groups as right-holders: “groups are composed of sentient individuals, but they do not themselves feel anything” (Rainbolt 2001, 79–80. See also Kymlicka 1989, 241–2; Ellis 2005, 206–7. For a contrary view, see Graham 2002, 89–104).
A related objection focuses upon groups as entities of value. When we ascribe rights to groups as such, we may seem to ascribe value to groups as such. Against that, many people hold that only individual human beings can be of ultimate value—a position that might be described as “value-individualism” (Hartney 1991; Ellis 2005; Kukathas 1992, 112; Narveson 1991, 329, 335–45). Value-individualists do not deny that groups and communities are a fact of social life, nor do they deny that groups and communities can matter very much to people and play a crucial role in their well-being. But they do insist that, ultimately, groups have value only in so far as they are of value for individual human beings. Groups, unlike individual persons, cannot have intrinsic value, even though some of their activities may be intrinsic goods. Hence, they cannot hold rights that presuppose their intrinsic value; at best, they may have rights that are of instrumental value to individual human beings (Haksar 1998).
For the most part, scepticism about group rights presupposes a corporate conception of those rights. It challenges claims that groups can have a being, status or value that is not reducible to that of their members. But, since the collective conception makes none of those claims, it is largely untouched by that scepticism. It is not, however, exempt from other sorts of objection to group rights.
Worries about the moral implications or consequences of ascribing rights to groups, relate not only to whether we should accept that groups have rights but also to how ready we should be to vest rights in groups. The common thread running through these worries is the threat that group rights may pose to individuals and their rights. Sometimes the concern is for those inside, and sometimes for those outside, the right-holding group.
One concern is that, if we give moral standing to groups as such, we shall lose sight of individuals within the group (Vincent 1989, 714). If a group can have standing as a group independently of its individual members, those individuals will have no standing on any matter on which the relevant standing lies with the group. On those matters, the separate wills of individuals cannot count. They will not be overridden; they will simply pass unrecognised. Thus, group rights may seem to be starkly at odds with the “separateness of persons”.
Another fear concerns the power that group rights may enable a group to wield over its members (e.g. Macdonald 1989; Offe 1998, 131–5; Waldron 1993, 363–6). When we concede that a group has rights, those may be rights that it holds against its own members and that it can use to regiment their lives. Thus, once again, the rights held and wielded by a group may be rights exercised at the expense of those who fall within it. In one respect, that seems an unnecessarily invidious way of representing the relationship between groups and their members. There is nothing unusual about a group's organising itself so that it can make decisions collectively, either directly or through appointees, that bind its members severally. That describes the normal state of affairs for tennis clubs, anglers' associations, political parties, churches and any number of quite unremarkable groups. The right of a group collectively to make decisions that bind its members severally is a simple description of democracy.
So why has there been so much angst about allowing that groups can have rights over their members? The answer is that, in recent years, group rights have been discussed primarily in relation to groups that have an involuntary membership: groups that are distinguished by their race, ethnicity, culture, or language. People do not choose to be members of these “ascriptive” groups, nor can they easily leave them as they might leave a club or association. If they find the group's authority oppressive or its way of life intolerable, they cannot simply opt out, since their membership of the group is treated by others—insiders or outsiders or both—as a natural “given” to which normal rights of entry and exit do not apply. That is why Will Kymlicka, for example, a liberal deeply sympathetic to the claims of cultural groups and indigenous peoples, is reluctant to allow that the rights of groups can be directed inwardly as restrictions upon the group's own members, rather than outwardly as protections against the external world (Kymlicka 1995, 34-48; cf. Marmor 2001).
Concerns about the potential for oppression implicit in group rights often have an empirical dimension. Demands for group rights are often looked upon most favourably when they are made by indigenous peoples, cultural minorities and religious groups whose way of life is threatened by external influences. But frequently, it is alleged, the real effect of conceding rights to these sorts of group is to reinforce the power of conservative elites whose wishes and interests clash with those of others in the group. Typically, an elite will want to use its power to maintain the traditions and integrity of the group and will be unwilling to tolerate dissent, deviance and demands for reform. It will also seek to maintain the position of those within the group who have traditionally been subordinate. This issue is often described as the problem of “minorities within minorities” (Eisenberg and Spinner-Halev 2005; Green 1994), but it can also be a problem of majorities (e.g. women) within minorities. In short, while according rights to a group may enhance the position of some of its members, it may seriously diminish the freedom and well-being of others. (Cohen et al. 1999; Deveaux 2000; Kukathas 1992, 113-15; Okin 2002; Shachar 2001; Tamir 1999, 158-64, 173-4)
A closely related fear concerns the potential of group rights to rival and override the rights of individuals (e.g. Buchanan 1994; Caste 1992; Graff 1994; Isaac 1992; Macdonald 1989, 126-7; Tamir 1999, 161). One of the strongest motivations for ascribing rights to individual persons is to provide them with safeguards. Individuals as individuals are vulnerable to those who wield power in all of its many forms and to the might of numbers. Individuals who hold unpopular views or who live unorthodox forms of life or whose existence proves tiresome or objectionable to others, are in constant danger of being crushed by the many who view them negatively. When we give rights to individuals, we provide them with moral shields that protect them from the excesses of power, including the excesses of collective power. But, if we ascribe rights to groups as well as to individuals, we might find that the rights of individuals are met and overtaken by those of groups, so that rights lose their potency as safeguards for individuals. We might fear that, when the rights of a mighty group conflict with those of a mere individual, it is Goliath rather than David who will more frequently emerge as the victor.
Group rights conceived collectively may seem less threatening to individuals than group rights conceived corporately. On the corporate conception a group has a moral standing independently of its members; the standing of the group can therefore displace that of its individual members so that their separate wills or interests or voices as individuals count for nothing. By contrast a collective right is held jointly by the individuals who make up the collectivity and is grounded in the standing and interests of those individuals. Thus, on the collective conception, there can be no question of individuals disappearing morally into a group in which they cease to have any independent status. But fear of collective rights may still be provoked by the way in which they derive from an aggregation of individual interests. As we have already seen, on Raz's conception of collective rights, numbers count. Numbers affect both whether groups have rights and how weighty their rights are (1986, 187, 209). Others are loath to accept that rights can derive from, or be affected by, that sort of aggregation (Réaume 1988, 2003; Tamir 1999, 166-71). In contemporary philosophy, rights-thinking is commonly opposed to maximizing consequentialism, of which utilitarianism is the prime example. Ascribing rights to individuals is a way of acknowledging their separateness as persons and of safeguarding them from the aggregative excesses of utilitarianism. But if the aggregation of interests can yield collective rights, a morality of rights may begin to assume the character of, and to present the same dangers as, the very sort of utilitarian thinking that many rights-theorists intend it to preclude.
A number of things might be said in response to these worries. First, very much depends upon the content that we give group rights. It is possible to invest individual rights with a content that would make them unsavoury, but that would not discredit the very idea of individual rights; similarly, the possibility that we might find some group rights objectionable is no reason to dismiss group rights altogether. Secondly, it would seem strangely arbitrary, given the moral significance that we give to rights, to insist that the objects of rights can be only goods that individuals can enjoy as independent individuals and never goods they can enjoy only in association with others. Some theorists of rights seem to think just that. But we cannot take for granted that no good, whose shared nature was such that it could be the possible object only of a group right, could ever have the significance that would justify its actually being the object of a right.
Thirdly, there is no reason why individual rights and group rights should not both figure in our moral thinking. Indeed, they commonly do. For example, it would be entirely commonplace to hold that a people, as a political unit, has a collective right to be self-determining but only within the limits set by individuals' human rights. Group rights do not have to clash with individual rights and a complete moral theory would articulate individual rights and group rights so that they formed a coherent set (cf. Buchanan 1994; Holder and Corntassel 2002). It may prove impossible to anticipate and avoid every conflict amongst rights, but, even if it does, we need not suppose that conflicts will arise more commonly between group rights and individual rights than amongst individual rights themselves (McDonald 1998; Waldron 1993, 203-24).
There is also a well-established tradition of political thought, associated particularly with Alexis de Tocqueville and the English Pluralists, which sees the existence of groups as essential to the dispersion of power and maintenance of liberty within a society. According to that tradition, groups do not glower threateningly at individuals. Rather, the rights of groups help to counter and hold in check a potentially overmighty state. (Stapleton 1995; Lustgarten 1983. See also Frohnen 2005 and Gedicks 1989.)
Group rights and individual rights can, then, co-exist more or less peacefully, but it is also possible for them to enjoy a more positive and mutually supportive relationship. Raz has pointed out that individual rights frequently presuppose the existence of general social goods and that individual rights themselves frequently promote social goods (1986, 193-216, 245-63; 1995). Indeed, individual rights may sometimes be rights only because they promote social goods. Raz does not claim that those social goods are generally the objects of group rights, but he does expose the error of supposing that an antagonism towards collective considerations is somehow built into the very idea or purpose of individual rights. The interests that group rights and individual rights seek to protect will frequently be the same interests.
Indeed, it may sometimes be an individual right that makes the case for a group right. We might argue, for example, that some of the goods to which individuals have rights depend for their realisation upon the health of the communities and cultures to which those individuals belong, so that there is a case for individuals sharing in group rights because those rights serve their individual rights or their individual freedom (Jacobs 1991; Kymlicka 1989, 1995; Wellman 1999). Or we might argue that individuals have equal rights to the conditions of self-development, that individual self-development requires common or joint activity, and that that makes the case for group rights to the conditions necessary for that common or joint activity (Gould 2001). Or, again, we might hold that amongst the range of options required for individual autonomy are joint options, options to pursue ends that require co-ordinated activity with other members of one's group; that too may justify group rights, such as the right of a group to control its own affairs (Wall 2007). The claim here might be either that a group right is conducive to, or, more strongly, that it is essential for, the realisation of an individual right.
Can we go still further and incorporate group rights within human rights? The preambles to the UN's Covenants on Civil and Political Rights (1966) and on Economic, Social and Cultural Rights (1966) characterise the rights set out in each Covenant as human rights. The first articles of both Covenants ascribe to all “peoples” the right of self-determination, the right freely to dispose of their natural wealth and resources, and the right not to be deprived of their means of subsistence. Rights of peoples would seem to be group rights and yet they also figure in the UN Covenants as human rights. In addition, as human rights have been given an increasingly inclusive content, an idea of a “third generation” of human rights has emerged. Political and civil rights constituted the first generation and socio-economic rights the second; both sorts of right focused on individuals as their bearers. Third generation or ‘solidarity’ human rights include rights to goods such as development, peace, a healthy environment, communication, humanitarian assistance, and a share in the common heritage of mankind. They are rights to goods that are collective in nature and rights that are often more intelligibly borne by groups than by individuals. Another area in which the issue of collective human rights has arisen is that of the rights of indigenous peoples (sometimes described as a “fourth generation” of human rights). Here there has been a long-standing debate over whether the rights the UN should recognise or establish are those of indigenous people (individuals) or of indigenous peoples (groups) (Buchanan 1993; Clinton 1990; Holder and Corntassel 2002; Ivison 2003; Oestreich 1999).
For some, human rights are necessarily the rights of human individuals so that, even if groups have rights, those cannot be human rights (e.g. Donnelly 2002; Graff 1994; Galenkamp 1993; Miller 2002; Nordenfelt 1987, Sieghart 1985; Waldron 1993, 339-69). Others insist that some of the goods that are fundamental to human life and human well-being can be enjoyed only collectively and that, if we ignore that fact, our conception of human rights will not match the reality of the human condition (e.g. Casals 2006; Crawford 1988; Felice 1996; Freeman 1995; Kymlicka 2001, 69-90; Malik 1996; Mello 2004; Van Dyke 1985).
This debate encompasses a number of distinct if related issues. One is whether the practical effect of extending human rights to groups will be to corrode the protection that human rights afford individuals, in ways already indicated. Another is whether the idea of rights has itself become over-extended. Goods such as a world peace, a healthy environment, and efficient communications, may be better understood as ideals or policy objectives for the human race rather than objects of human rights. Moreover, some third generation human rights seem to be conceived as the group rights of all humanity as a single entity, which makes puzzling who bears the corresponding duties. A further issue concerns what it is that makes a right “human”. If it is enough for a right to be a human right that the relevant international authority declares it to be so, there is no obstacle to group rights being human rights. But we normally conceive human rights as rights that human beings hold in virtue of being human and that are universal to, identical for, and possessed equally by, human beings. That sets a more discriminating test for the group rights that might qualify as human rights.
If we return to the distinction between corporate and collective rights, group rights have a greater affinity with human rights if we conceive them according to the collective model. On the corporate conception, a group right is a right held by a corporate entity, which immediately makes it other than a human right since its holder is that corporate entity. On the collective conception, a right is held jointly by a set of individuals. To qualify as a human right, a collective right would have to be universal to human beings but, if we suppose that politically every human individual belongs to a people and has an interest in that people's being self-determining, we might hold that all human beings enjoy a right to collective self-determination. All have that right, but each will hold it only jointly with other members of his or her people (Jones 1999b). However, the group rights that can satisfy this test of universality will be limited in number. Assertions of group rights are often stimulated by “difference” rather than uniformity—by features, ways of life or commitments that significantly differentiate one group from another rather than by characteristics that all human beings share (e.g. Addis 1992; Galenkamp 1993; Ingram 2000; Young 1990). Of course, it may be that group rights that provide for group differences, such as differences in culture, will themselves derive from more basic rights that are universal in scope—just as rights to practise different faiths can derive from a universal right of freedom of religion. Uniform rights need not prescribe uniform lives. But it is unnecessary to contrive a fit between group rights and human rights where one is not comfortable. Because the language of human rights has become the lingua franca of international standard setting, there has been an unfortunate tendency to present every significant international standard in that language. Many individually-held rights are not human rights but are still rights and still matter. We do not have to reinvent group rights as human rights for groups to have rights or for their rights to be morally significant.
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- International Covenant of Civil and Political Rights, United Nations, 1966.
- International Covenant on Economic, Social, and Cultural Rights, United Nations, 1966.
- Declaration on the Rights of Indigenous Peoples, United Nations, 2007.
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