Notes to Eugen Rosenstock-Huessy

1. Sprache in German refers to both speech and language. In general, Rosenstock-Huessy, when writing in English, talked of speech when describing his central preoccupation—but not always and he also referred to what he was doing as grammatical thinking.

2. He was to engage critically with Barth throughout his life but see especially the letter to Barth (1920b, 9–16) and his autobiographical reflections (1968, 81–84). See his ‘Comments’ (1942).

3. Die Soziologie Vol. 1: Die Übermacht der Räume provides a lengthy analysis of the distinction between seriousness and play; it concedes that what is created as play may enter again into the stream of life in seriousness, which of course happened with the death of Socrates.

4. Generally, Rosenstock-Huessy insists upon distinguishing between theology and religion, the former being a medieval creation to deal with a medieval problem, which involved recasting religious speech into a form more in tune with the philosophical or, as he frequently called it, the Greek mind. See 1970a, 37–43, and 1991a, 22–82.

5. Stahmer and Gormann-Thelen (1998) correctly identify Vico, Hamann, Goethe, Saint-Simon and Paracelsus as being important spirits of inspiration for his work.

6. The Kantianism of this particular formulation is deliberate. He argues, in this section, that Kant’s great service was in laying out the limits of dialectic and logic and he credits Kant with laying out the method for sociological thinking.

7. He also said that Rosenstock-Huessy was the most important influence upon the development of his own ‘New Thinking’. For his part, Rosenstock-Huessy not only saw himself as involved in a life-time’s dialogical project with Franz Rosenzweig, but he held that the true breakthrough in their contribution to speech thinking would only be grasped by readers who read them together—in all their differences.

8. The full text of The Gritli Letters (Gritli Briefen) is freely available online, transcribed by Ulrike von Moltke, and edited by Michael Gormann-Thelen and Elfriede Büchsel.

9. Wittig was a Catholic priest who had been excommunicated from the Church. The book was, in part, a defense of Wittig's orthodoxy.

10. The German is ‘Die unerhörte Behauptung der Denker geht dahin, daß sie erst denken, und dann erst das, was sie denken, mit Hilfe der Sprache als ihres Werkzeuges, uns verraten’. It is the use of unerhörte and verraten that makes the polemic work so well in German and so hard to ‘get’ in English, because these words express such fundamentally different and even contrary tones, ideas and words in English and Rosenstock-Huessy means all the contraries: unerhörte can be translated as unbelievable/ unheard/ impermissible/ terrific/ scandalous while verraten as disclose/ betray.

11. Vorstellung is translated here as ‘introduction’ which follows on from the previous discussion, but in the final line—taken from Schopenhauer’s work of that name—Rosenstock-Huessy is playing with the fine line that exists between the terms representation, imagination, idea and introduction (Schopenhauer’s book is translated either as The World as Will and Representation or The World as Will and Idea.) Indeed the word Vorstellung has an important but shifting philosophical pedigree in German idealism: for Kant, it is the basis of concepts and intuitions (Anschauungen); for Hegel, it is the preliminary form of the concept before it is specified and developed as idea, associated with feelings and hence its proper sphere of expression is art. But Rosenstock-Huessy goes back to the much more basic everyday use of the term in sich vorstellen meaning ‘to introduce oneself’, which also has resonances of presentation—as in ‘I would like to present myself’, ‘to show you myself’, ‘to be in your circle’. One might add this initial act of presentation is the condition of re-presentation, of the Stellung—the condition/ position/ emplacement—that is set before us.

12. Ereignis (event) is of course a core category in Heidegger, but to the extent that it is not bound up with specific named events means that it functions in a purely abstract way.

13. For his critique of Bergson see 1963, 529–530. For Rosenstock-Huessy, the mechanistic deployment of time is simply the reproduction of philosophy’s hidden presumption of the superiority of space. Again, the point is visible in Kant who makes time the condition of the transcendental imagination and hence of the categories, but time can only be verified by being represented as an imagined line, i.e. by the invocation of the inner intuition of the form of space.

14. That Rosenstock-Huessy’s understanding of Christianity would find itself challenged is hardly surprising. Thus, for example, Karl Löwith in his 1946 review of The Christian Future says that Rosenstock-Huessy’s ideas are essentially closer to paganism (especially Goethe) and that he secularizes and vaporizes Christianity. For his part, Rosenstock-Huessy sees the kind of criticism being made by Löwith as due to a complete inability to understand the connection between the Christian, the pagan and the Jew, and the widespread tendency, repeated by Löwith, to project Greek philosophical abstractions—soul, immortality, timelessness, the good, etc.—onto Christianity. Rosenstock-Huessy, who was very critical in private correspondence to Georg Müller of Löwith, simply could not understand how Löwith could not see the connection between the murdering machines of modernity and modern philosophy.

15. It is interesting to compare this strategy with Franz Rosenzweig, whose The Star of Redemption has so often been criticized for its decision to show precisely where Judaism differs from every other way of world-making (including Christianity which he saw as a ‘divine’ ally who would always also be an enemy). In effect, though, Rosenstock-Huessy conceived of his ‘Cross of Reality’ as being the necessary complement of Rosenzweig’s ‘Star’ and that his task, as a Christian, was to discover what was redeemable, and hence capable of being shared universally, in every life-way.

Copyright © 2012 by
Wayne Cristaudo <>

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