Eugen Rosenstock-Huessy (1888–1973) was a sociologist and social philosopher who, along with his close friend Franz Rosenzweig, and Ferdinand Ebner and Martin Buber, was a major exponent of speech thinking or dialogicism. The central insight of speech thinking is that speech or language is not merely, or even primarily, a descriptive act, but a responsive and creative act which is the basis of our social existence. The greater part of Rosenstock-Huessy's work was devoted to demonstrating how speech/language, through its unpredictable fecundity, expands our powers and, through its inescapably historical forming character, also binds them. According to Rosenstock-Huessy, speech makes us collective masters of time and gives us the ability to overcome historical death by founding new, more expansive and fulfilling spaces of social-life.
Rosenstock-Huessy also belonged to that post-Nietzschean revival of religious thought which included Franz Rosenzweig, Karl Barth, Leo Weismantel, Hans and Rudolf Ehrenberg, Viktor von Weizsäcker, Martin Buber, Lev Shestov, Hugo Bergmann, Florens Christian Range, Nikolai Berdyaev, Margaret Susman, Werner Picht (all of whom were involved in the Patmos publishing house and its offshoot Die Kreatur) and Paul Tillich. Common to this group was the belief that religious speech, which they saw as distinctly not metaphysical, disclosed layers of experience and creativity (personal and socio-historical) which remain inaccessible to the metaphysics of naturalism.
As with Franz Rosenzweig (who goes to great length in The Star of Redemption and Understanding the Sick and the Healthy to demonstrate that God, man and world underpin three fundamentally different and irreducible foundations of explanation which have shaped our history), Rosenstock-Huessy was convinced that humanism's attempt to free itself from all gods (making humanity and/or nature the ground of reality) was based upon a failure to grasp more ancient insights into the nature of the real and the relationship between reality, language and history. To this important extent, again like Rosenzweig, he argued that language was more fundamental than either philosophy or religion and philosophy's attempt to free itself from and reduce religion to a deficient kind of philosophy was based upon its failure to take language, and hence reality, sufficiently seriously. As he would say in a letter to Cynthia Harris: ‘Not religion but language forces man to distinguish between this world and the real world, the world as we know it and the genuine, or better known world. The crux of theology is a crux of language, and all our rationalists are not protesting against religion but against speech’ (1943, 162).
But unlike Karl Barth or Paul Tillich, for example, who saw themselves as fusing philosophy and theology, Rosenstock-Huessy refused to see himself primarily as a philosopher or theologian—though when the term philosopher was qualified by the preceding ‘social’, he was more willing to accept that designation. His criticisms of theology and philosophy were numerous, varied in content and highly nuanced—and hence unable to receive full treatment here. Generally, though, he thought both were, what he called, ‘second order activities’, or products of the reflective mind at ‘play’. Philosophical and theological speech trailed behind and were dependent upon the more urgent and creative acts of ‘founding’, that is, those acts which emerge out of life's exigencies, which are epoch making ‘events’ and which are at the source of human institutions and new forms of life, and which cannot be separated from the vocabulary, or, more specifically, the shared names and foci of orientation which connect us across space and over time. In the most philosophical of all his works, the first volume of his Soziologie, when contrasting the respective limits of theology with philosophy, he says that theology is guilty of reducing us to sinners and angels and thus not adequately accounting for our being flesh and blood, while philosophers tend to reduce us to objects and things in the dead space of the universe and ‘to mirror the objective world in their subjective world’ (1956, 286). ‘Religion,’ he says in that same section, ‘is unjust against nature and the human spirit (Geist)’; while philosophy is blind to ‘the time-endowing forces’ (‘die zeitstiftenden Gewalten’).
Against philosophers and theologians, he saw his task as restoring our attunement to the potencies embedded in our speech and institutions so that we could draw upon the power of past times in order to strengthen our openness to the promise of the future in the present. To this end, while his corpus cuts across numerous disciplines, his major systematic work, one rewritten throughout the course of his life, was his two volume Soziologie (still untranslated, and for some years it has been in process of being re-released in Germany as an annotated edition). The subtitles to the two volumes give an important clue to the basis of Rosenstock-Huessy's social philosophy: volume one being The Predominance (Übermacht) of Spaces, volume two being The Full (or Complete) Count (or Number) of the Times. His social philosophy is concerned with how, when a world implodes on or devours them—through what he terms the four social diseases of anarchy, decadence, revolution and war (1970a, 11–16)—people can escape the tyranny of forces that have come to rule the space in which they dwell by founding a new time which will then open up other spatial possibilities. For him, then, the key to human freedom is the capacity both to found the new and draw upon the powers encapsulated in bodies of time past which enable us to live in a present in which we feel blessed by the future. Rosenstock-Huessy repeatedly argues that philosophy generally is particularly weak in assisting us with this task and it is ultimately to sociology that Rosenstock-Huessy turned as ‘the way to win again our freedom over spaces and through times’ (1956, 23). Hence against the Cartesian cogito, which he saw as providing the underpinning formulation of the philosophy of modernity, Rosenstock-Huessy retorts with the much more archaic Respondeo etsi mutabor—‘I respond although I will be changed’ (1938, 817–830; 1970b, 17–33). In other words, we are fundamentally responsive creatures—and our creations are shaped by our responses either to the weight and push of the past, the burdens or joys of the present or the pull and call of the future. Like Vico, whom Rosenstock-Huessy greatly admired, he believes we are inescapably rooted in history, even though our great revolutions attempt to rip us out of it, in order to begin anew and build a much better world, thereby opening up new paths of self-hood.
Philosophy's major deficiency, for Rosenstock-Huessy, is that it is not sufficiently sensitive to time, speech or history. To a large extent this is because logic itself is timeless. As he says in ‘The Terms of the Creed’, ‘logic is that mode of spiritual life in which the divinity of timing is omitted’. Logic transports us out of time and offers the mind a stable, but unreal space. For Rosenstock-Huessy, this search for a stable space is reflected in recurrent philosophical elements which privilege the implacability of space (or a particular space) over the ceaselessness of time. Modern philosophy's division of things into subject and object (a spatial configuration) is a case in point, but it goes back to the ancients whose building blocks such as topics (from topos place), ‘categories’ (from kata = ‘down to’ and agora = ‘the public assembly’ i.e. declaiming in the assembly), reason's sphericality, and ideas (the very term idea, eidein = ‘to see’, referring to something visible to the mind's eye) all suggest a commitment to (the mental) space's primacy. The same point is made somewhat more elaborately in the first volume of the Soziologie (280–284) where he argues that dialectical thought is triadic, but anything that really happens and makes itself manifest, i.e. appears (erscheint), is at least quadrilateral. It must be something in space and time, and hence conform to the inner/outerness or subjective/objective matrix of space, as well as the trajective and prejective-ness of time. He called this four-fold matrix the cross of reality and it is applied repeatedly throughout his works.
While Rosenstock-Huessy provided a range of arguments against philosophers wanting to make more of reason and less of language, time and history than their due, and while he preferred to classify himself as a sociologist, he can also be seen as a social philosopher who argued for the philosophical necessity of the fusion of history, linguistics, anthropology, sociology, and religion. Franz Rosenzweig certainly saw Rosenstock-Huessy in this light, and he once said to him: ‘You have never…been to me anything other than a “philosopher”’(1969, 82). In this respect he belongs to that long line of critics of philosophy that range from ancients to moderns and comic poets to religious thinkers—from Aristophanes to Lucian, from Rabelais to Tatian, from Tertullian to Luther, from Pascal to Marx and Nietzsche. All these critics have provided criticisms of philosophy that have ended up, in different ways, and at different times, transforming the direction and content of philosophy.
Eugen Rosenstock was born in 1888. His parents were assimilated (i.e. non religious) German Jews. His mother and father, a banker, encouraged academic pursuits in their children. At school his classes were in Latin, and from a young age he devoted himself to history and linguistics. His passion for learning languages extended to teaching himself Egyptian hieroglyphics while a teenager. He is probably one of the very few social philosophers who (apart from his fluency in several modern European languages) not only read the biblical writers, ancient philosophers, poets, orators and Church fathers in their original languages, but was equally at home deciphering the walls of an Egyptian temple. This schooling formed the basis of an approach to reality which always considered the different underlying imperatives—divine and human—that fused a group or led to its dissolution. It also provided him with what he insisted was a guiding methodological principle in his life: to make no historical argument that was not based upon his own consultation of the original source material.
He joined the Protestant church at 17. By his own account, this was not due to any great existential anxiety, but to having reached the conclusion at a very young age that what was stated in the Nicene Creed was manifestly obvious (1970b, 197). Rosenstock-Huessy insisted that Christianity was not a religion of transcendence and was not to be confused with Platonism of any sort, but was about building the ages or times to come in this world. It was first and foremost a discovery about the process of incarnation and the way to overcome social death. Nor for him was the Church, as it was, for example, for Karl Barth or Emil Brunner, for the great part a massive deviation from the gospel. Rather, not only in spite of but, to a significant extent, because of its flaws, it was the story of the incarnation of the spirit and the recreation of human nature into a different body, the body of Christ. In other words, the task of the Church was that of making man like God, what the Church fathers in the Athanasian creed had called ‘anthropurgy’ (1946, 108). Such core Christian terms as ‘last judgment’ or ‘redemption’, then, had nothing to do with the individual surviving after death in a place called heaven or hell (an idea he thought owed more to Plato than Jesus or Paul). Resurrection meant the resuscitation of historically spent forms of life so that their powers could be tapped for generations to come; the last judgment refers to the decision either to ‘resurrect’ a dead form of life, or let it die. Thus in his ‘Faculty Address on The Potential Christians of the Future’:
And I know of the Last Judgment as a reality because I have seen Last Judgments passed on Proust's France, on Rasputin's Russia, on Wilhelm II's Germany, President Harding's America. Similarly I believe in resurrection of the body because I see resurrections of bodies, all through history, on earth. Any genuine soul will be incarnated time and again (1941, 11–12).
Examples of incarnations he mentions, beside Christ himself in the Church, are St. Francis in the Franciscan order and all its achievements, Leonardo da Vinci by succeeding generations of engineers, Sigmund Freud in the psychiatric movement, Marx in the workers' movement, and so on (1956, 303–309).
Rosenstock-Huessy studied jurisprudence and received his doctorate (for Herzogsgewalt und Friedensschutz) from the University of Heidelberg at the age of 21, from which time he went on to teach at the university. He was also to receive a second doctorate in 1923 in philosophy from the same university, for his Königshaus und Stämme in Deutschland zwischen 911 und 1250, a book he had published in 1914. His teachers included Rudolf Sohm and Otto Gierke, both key figures in the historical school of law. While he was not a disciple of either, throughout his life he would never cease writing on the growth and decay of socio-political formations and what forced people to hate one form of life and seek to found another.
Amongst his students was Franz Rosenzweig. In 1913 Rosenstock-Huessy played a pivotal role in convincing Rosenzweig that the ‘living God’ was not the God of metaphysics who, thankfully, had been pronounced dead by Nietzsche, but referred to a power more ‘meaningful’ and ‘truthful’ than could be accounted for by the limited powers of philosophy. By this he was not referring to any mystical powers, but the full gamut of creative and redemptive powers that are created and revealed throughout the human story. In this respect he played an important role in convincing Rosenzweig that truth was not so much a property of things or states of affairs captured by the reflecting mind, but a state of fecundity produced by the act appropriate for the time in which it was performed. If Rosenstock-Huessy can be said to have an epistemology which can be reproduced in one sentence, it is Goethe's ‘What is fruitful, that alone is true’, which is but a recasting of the biblical ‘by their fruits you shall know them’ (1968, 11).
In 1914, he met and married Margrit Huessy whom he loved dearly. They had a son, Hans, and they remained married until her death in 1958. He was then joined by Freya von Moltke, who was to be his companion until his death in 1973. Freya von Moltke was the widow of his former student, Helmuth von Moltke, a key member of the Kreisau circle who was executed by Hitler near the conclusion of World War 2.
During the Great War, Rosenstock-Huessy served as a captain in the German army where he fought on the Western front. In 1916 he began an intense correspondence with Rosenzweig (now published in English as Judaism Despite Christianity) who by that time had decided not to follow Rosenstock-Huessy and his cousins, the Ehrenbergs, into Christianity, but to fully embrace the Jewish faith into which he had been born. That correspondence has remained a major post-Nietzschean Christian/Jewish dialogue. While in that correspondence Rosenstock-Huessy was uncompromising in his insistence that Judaism was a spent historical force, he continued to reflect upon Rosenzweig's decision to remain a Jew throughout his life. He came to the opinion that Rosenzweig had convincingly demonstrated the eternal role of Judaism in the human story.
A year after this exchange began Rosenzweig met and fell in love with Rosenstock-Huessy's wife, Margrit or Gritli. Rosenstock-Huessy accepted, though not without suffering (Stahmer, 2006), the love that had developed between his best friend and his wife, and years later he would confide to his friend and devotee Georg Müller that Margrit had been Rosenzweig's muse throughout the writing of The Star of Redemption, and, more precisely, that Rosenzweig's understanding of revelation, which plays such a decisive role in that same work, came directly out of his experience of his love for Gritli. This has been borne out in the relatively recent publication of Rosenzweig's letters to Gritli (Briefe an Gritli) which has been the biggest event in Rosenzweig scholarship since Edith Rosenzweig's edition of his Briefe in 1935.
Rosenstock-Huessy had entered the Great War as a Christian Nationalist. By the War's end he was convinced that Germany's salvation required the dropping of all nationalist allegiances—its failure to do so, he predicted, would only throw it back again into further war. He also emerged from the War with an idea (first outlined in book-form in Die Hochzeit des Kriegs und der Revolution) that he would develop in Out of Revolution and Die Europäischen Revolutionen und der Charakter der Nationen—that the Great War was the culmination of a millennium of revolutions and that it was these very catastrophes which provided the genesis of new and more powerful institutional bulwarks for what would become the fulfillment of the kingdom promised to the Jews and later to the human race through Christianity.
A core element of Rosenstock-Huessy's social philosophy, which emerged directly from his experience of the War and his subsequent ‘vision’ of the meaning of a thousand years of European wars and revolutions and political legacies, was that suffering was a fundamental component of human learning. For the most part, and particularly socially, truth was something imprinted on us by pain and trauma rather than something merely learnt by candlelight. As he said bluntly in one public lecture: ‘suffering is the only source of wisdom, and not my brain here ’ (1967, Microfilm 656, Reel 18). He develops this idea in ‘The Secret of the University’ in a manner which suggests we should be much more attentive to the catastrophic conditions under which any new philosophy emerges if we wish to see it in its proper light— philosophy being but one response to a social catastrophe which requires a great redirection of energies for either society's survival or its complete overthrow and the establishment of a new type.
No philosopher ever sat down as if in a classroom to answer the questions of his predecessor. To consider the history of philosophy in this way is insanity. Descartes grew out of the Thirty Years War. He has remained its eternal Privat-dozent. Kant became a philosopher after the Seven Years War, Schopenhauer came to meditation on the battlefields of Napoleon. The Franco-Prussian War forced Friedrich Nietzsche out of mere philology (1950, Item 427, Reel 8).
After the War Rosenstock-Huessy worked in Daimler Benz as an editor of a worker's magazine before he returned to the academic life. The desire to bridge the divide between education and the world remained a constant thread of Rosenstock-Huessy's life, including his being a founding member of institutions such as the Academy of Labor in Frankfurt (1921) and the German Academy for Volk Research and Adult Education (1926) and being vice chairman of the World Association of Adult Education (1928–1932). He was also a pioneer of the German work service movement in Germany, which was designed to engage students with the rest of the community (a movement which was later to be politicized and corrupted by the Nazis), and, after emigrating to the United States, the establishment of Camp William James in Vermont (which was undertaken as part of Franklin Roosevelt's Civilian Conservation Corps). The importance of the fusion of education with work, for Rosenstock-Huessy, was based on his fundamental belief that humanity would only free itself from the perils of its past through creative collective acts, including reinvigorating the institutions which had themselves emerged as responses to, and ways out of, catastrophes, as well as the establishment of new institutions appropriate for the times.
With Hitler's coming to power in 1933, Rosenstock-Huessy, his wife and son left Germany. The émigré political scientist Carl Friedrich helped him get work at Harvard, but it was not a satisfying experience for him or many of his colleagues. He was forced to leave Harvard because he insisted that ‘God’ was a living presence in history. Within ‘speech thinking’, a core axiom is that a name which generates reality (as ‘God’ does through invocation, supplication, devotion and the like) is real (more real, he insisted, than abstractions such as mind or body). At Harvard there was the collision of two paradigms and their respective vocabularies: Rosenstock-Huessy's ‘speech or dialogical-thinking’ with its anti-naturalism (ironically, in that environment, a voice of one) versus the naturalistically based behaviorism that then predominated. A good example of the differing perspectives can be seen in Crane Brinton's scathing comments on Out of Revolution (1938) and Rosenstock-Huessy's withering retort in his review of Brinton's The Anatomy of Revolution (1939).
Rosenstock-Huessy then started teaching social philosophy at Dartmouth where he remained for the rest of his academic career. While the stars of former friends and associates, such as Buber and Tillich, waxed in the United States, he was largely unknown and unlistened to, except for some devoted undergraduates who taped his undergraduate lectures for posterity. He had not been completely forgotten in Germany, where his post-war lectures were well attended and his books reviewed in newspapers. While his name still crops up from time to time in European historical or sociological works (his Die Europaischen Revolutionen is something of a German minor classic in European Studies), Rosenstock-Huessy's ideas have not received a large audience. In part, at least, this has to do with his failure to conform to conventional academic categories of classification and scholarly protocols and disciplinary requirements, in particular the theological/secular divide. In addition, there was almost no prevailing mood into which Rosenstock-Huessy's thought seemed to tap: neither the aesthetic/literary mood of modernism (in general Rosenstock-Huessy thought art was play—and the period which spanned two world wars was not a time in which play would help stave off the next catastrophe); nor the subsequent radical student mood which Marxian-based social theories attended to (Rosenstock-Huessy thought neo-Marxists of all kinds to be a hundred years out of date); nor the psychoanalytic movement that derived from Freud or Jung (he deeply mistrusted psychiatry, believing it placed too much weight upon the ego and did not adequately grasp the collective socio-historical formations which shape it); nor phenomenology (whose dependence upon lived experience was closer in spirit to his own thought, but, nevertheless, its purview remained insufficiently dialogical and insufficiently institutional for him to see much value in it). He was also unforgiving of Heidegger (as he was of Carl Schmitt whom, before Hitler's rise to power, he had once been on cordial terms with) and in the Soziologie, he recounts, with contempt, a story in which Elfride Heidegger talks of her husband and her having to weigh up whether they would back the Marxists or the Nazis (1958, 52–53). The proliferation of work in linguistics, which might have seemed to have provided him with natural allies, did not help his case because he was deeply opposed to what he thought was the prevailing atomistic and unduly scientistic approach to the study of language. Mauthner and Saussure, for example, he thought were so wrong they barely warranted engaging with. And someone like C.S. Peirce, whose pragmaticism has certain affinities with Rosenstock-Huessy's understanding of truth, also differs from Rosenstock-Huessy in his preoccupation with ‘reasonable’ and ‘objective statements’ as the road to truth. He saw himself more in the organicist tradition of Humboldt and was glad to find in R.A. Wilson's The Miraculous Birth of Language a contemporary linguist who had reached some similar conclusions to his concerning language's role and character in our social evolution.
This lack of academic ‘fit’ was a fact not lost on him and in the final paragraph of his Out of Revolution he wrote, with an eye as much to his Harvard experience as to his awareness of how he was being read:
I have survived decades of study and teaching in scholastic and academic sciences. Every one of their venerable scholars mistook me for their intellectual type which he most despised. The atheist wanted me to disappear into Divinity, the theologians into sociology, the sociologists into history, the historians into journalism, the journalists into metaphysics, the philosophers into law, and—need I say it?—the lawyers into hell, which as a member of our present world I have never left. For nobody leaves hell all by himself without going mad (1938, 758).
By the time Rosenstock-Huessy died in 1973 he had left behind a huge collection of written work including his two volume Soziologie (the second volume of which is an attempt at universal history), the works on revolution, a collection of essays and small books gathered in a two volume work on language, Die Sprache des Menschengeschlechts, and a three volume work on church history (with Joseph Wittig), Das Alter der Kirche, to various writings on grammar, biblical interpretation, Egyptology, Medieval history, industrial law and the organization of the work place.
A few years before he died, a former student, Clinton Gardner, had formed the still running Argo Press, to keep his work alive. A Gesellschaft had been started in Germany which still produces a journal/newsletter, Stimmstein, devoted to his work, influence, and related issues. In 1972 four families in Holland set up ‘Rosenstock-Huessy House’ in Haarlem to put Rosenstock-Huessy's ideas concerning adult education and voluntary service into practice through providing accommodation for people in crisis. A DVD edition of his collected works has been created, thanks to the labours of Lise van der Molen and the efforts and donations of the Rosenstock-Huessy Fund. W.H. Auden first heard of Rosenstock-Huessy in 1940 from a friend and wrote a preface to a collection of his writings (published by Argo in 1970 under the salient title I am an Impure Thinker). After Rosenstock-Huessy's death, Auden wrote a valedictory poem, ‘Aubade’, which was published in The Atlantic Monthly.
In Ja und Nein, a work written a little over four years before his death, Rosenstock-Huessy thanked Georg Müller for having summed up seven decades of thought in the three words: speech, time, history. ‘I seem’ he says ‘to have pursued the daily life of peoples and their members as reflections of this trinity. I have looked at the speech of individuals and nations, the times of lovers and haters, the history of empires, the church and society as the reflections of the divine trinity’ (1968, 9). These three terms not only sum up the orientation of Rosenstock-Huessy's life work, they also provide the key to understanding where he thinks philosophy has gone wrong.
For Rosenstock-Huessy, speech's significance was not to describe a litany of factual statements about the world of the sort ‘it is raining’—see “Es Regnet oder die Sprache steht auf dem Kopf” in Die Sprache des Menschengeschlects). Nor is it, as Saussure held, simply a means of A expressing his or her intention to B. Moreover, Rosenstock-Huessy's interest in speech is restricted to what he calls, in The Origins of Speech, ‘authentic speech’. This is not the kind of speech which has its parallels in the animal kingdom. Authentic speech is the foundation and perpetuation of constitutions and institutions—social acts that reach across generations and establish patterns of social complexity which show us the difference in our self- and world-making and that of animals.
We exist in a social reality which has been made by others and which we make for others. And thus speech gives us a plasticity which separates us from other animals and which enables us to work with time and space like no other species familiar to us. Speech is the way that we reorganize the universe (1970a, 19).
No language is communication with others only, it is communication with the universe. We try by speaking to communicate our experience of the universe to our fellow men; by listening, reading, learning, we try to get hold of their experience of the universe. To speak means to reenact cosmic processes so that these processes may reach others. In every sentence, man acts within the cosmos and establishes a social relation for the sake of saving the cosmos from wasting acts in vain. Man economizes the cosmic processes by making them available to all other men. Man, by speech, establishes the solidarity of all men for the acceptance of our universe (1970a, 122–123).
That solidarity is ultimately historical, for it is only by being able to draw upon the powers of the past and future that the human being can survive the crises of their present. Thus speech and history form an indissoluble connection. As he says, ‘Language is the vehicle on which history invades the animal life of man. And the study of history and the study of language are one and the same study’ (1943, 173).
Speech, then, is a responsive and creative act in which we discover things about ourselves, each other, and the world itself which we would never have chanced upon had we not the power to reframe the universe through speech—speech accounts for our unpredictable nature. And a large part of Rosenstock-Huessy's objection to naturalism is that either it ignores speech completely and reduces us to more basic animal or physical processes, or, if it does take account of speech, it places speech on the same continuum as animal cries and calls.
The social character of speech also means that it is not only a matter of what is being said when we speak to one another, but also who is talking to whom—what a parent says to a child, a president to his or her people, what friends say to one another. As he writes in Ja und Nein:
In speech it is not a matter of what I think about myself, or even just what I say, rather it's a matter of how we address each other reciprocally. We don't speak, as the semanticists declare, to understand something. We speak, so that each understands the other through the manner that we address him and we ourselves through the way he address us. Each man proceeds thus: A false address can irritate someone for the entire day. Because speech comes into the world in order to ensure that your representation of me, and mine of you, is situated in the right places in the cosmos (1968, 23).
This one example shows how Rosenstock-Huessy differs from Saussurian linguistics which break up the world into the units of language irrespective of how language circulates socially. It also shows how far removed Rosenstock-Huessy is from the naturalistic based philosophical models which see the world as an object to be understood. For Rosenstock-Huessy, the truth of the world we participate in—which includes the panoply of names and concepts and theories which we ascribe to nature—could never have been ‘noticed’ by a disinterested scientific spectator some three thousand years ago because it wasn't there yet. It takes time for us and our truths to become created and revealed to us and speech is the power of disclosing ourselves to each other, and ourselves, in part through our respective roles which enable us to preside over a particular domain of ‘powers’. Speech takes and makes time. In an important sense, for Rosenstock-Huessy, speech is revelation which is, in turn, orientation (which is also a process of mutual development):
The double character of revelation consists in the way in which it allocates to the speaker as much as to the people whom the speaker sees before him, a new and at the same time a determined place...revelation is orientation. Orientation is a correlation between at least two new poles; one may call it a ‘correspondence’, because this relationship between two letter writers is today more likely to be understood than between two speakers. In a correspondence two speakers respond in such a manner that the longer it continues the more each correspondent becomes polarized in his own character (1968, 21).
In speech then we really make each other and hence we are literally, for Rosenstock-Huessy, the word made flesh. The corollary of this is that ‘we ourselves become structured by grammar’. He puts it more forcefully when he writes ‘most men are shards of broken grammar’ (1968, 37 and 43), and he went so far as to hold that grammar is the key to us as social organisms. In keeping with this, he proposed a re-working of the social sciences on the basis of a grammatical revolution. Indeed, he believes that as things are now, the social sciences rest on a grammar that is akin to Ptolemaic astronomy. (See ‘Die kopernikanische Wendung der Grammatik’ in Die Sprache des Menschengeschlechts.)
Very briefly, he argues that the intellectual life of nations, and the professions which give us social orientation, are responses to the universe seeking its own enhancement through the distribution of tasks and activities which have a grammatical underpinning. Thus, deploying the quadrilateral matrix necessary for correctly observing any social reality, he argues that our experiences will be accumulated and devolved through these spatial/temporal grammatical modules so that:
the subjunctive of grammar, in the life of a great nation, is represented by music, by poetry, by all the arts. The equations of our calculating logic are spread out in all the sciences and techniques. The trajective, linking us with the living past, lives in us through all the traditions. The prejective is represented by prophecy, ethics, programmatic movements (1970a, 187).
Accordingly, the professions (lawyers, preachers, artists and scientists) are grammatical necessities, each profession accentuating an aspect of reality whose grammatical mode is the trajective, prejective, subjective and objective respectively. For Rosenstock-Huessy, a society's survival and development depends very much on its ability to cope adequately with its inner and outer spatial and trajective and prejective temporal potencies. We need to work with all these potencies and the great danger of philosophy is that it elevates its own importance—and the procedures and grammatical elements which constitute it—at the expense of other potencies which are only disclosed and developed through other grammatical elements and procedures. In this respect, Rosenstock-Huessy sees that when philosophy tries to dominate society it does so at the expense of other powers of society and hence ultimately is pernicious. Its main deficiency lies in its under-appreciation of the fecundity and importance of the polyform nature of speech.
Rosenstock-Huessy complains that linguistics has followed philosophy in elevating the mind above speech, as if the mind itself is the real thinker and speech simply a rather poor means to get from a to b. (‘Fritz Mauthner wrote 6000 pages and proved in one and a half million words that all words lie’ (1962, Vol. 1, 554)). Such approaches to speech all follow what he calls ‘the abstract madness of the school grammar’, which makes the mistake of explaining ‘the last grammatical creation, the declarative sentence “these are”, as the beginning of speech.’ In fact, he says, a declarative sentence is:
only a conclusion, behind which it has to be started again from the beginning. From the declarative sentence nothing ensues for the future. That's why no knowledge of nature helps us to answer the question how we should live. The bible with its ‘let there be light’ and ‘there was light’ has the experiential demonstrable grammar. Imperative (prejective), conjunctive or optative (subjective), preterite or perfect (trajective), neutral indicative (objective) are grammatical necessities arising out of times and spaces. A higher scientific grammar can exist because from now we can see the modes, the tenses, persons in a completely different way to the Alexandrians (1968, 32).
For Rosenstock-Huessy, the Alexandrian grammar table, which was originally developed in the 4th century BC as part of larger pedagogical architectonic of the sciences and which is still the standard manner of grammar instruction, has been one of the great hidden obstacles to understanding real or speech thinking. His claim is that the Alexandrian architectonic carries with it a specific orientation to ourselves and reality whose core elements mistakenly become solidified and privileged and passed on as if reality itself were essentially—always and everywhere—composed of its elements. In particular it privileges the disinterested, impersonal, reflective mode, which breaks up the world into subject and predicate, subject and object. This orientation also brings everything under the rule of the indicative mood of the declarative sentence.
It is this emphasis upon the declarative sentence, which provides the answer to ‘what is?’, that lies behind the repeated accusation he makes against philosophy—that it has instrumentalized speech. As Rosenstock-Huessy says in ‘The Race of Thinkers or the Knacker's Yard of Faith’ (1962, Vol. 2, 612): ‘The scandalous [and terrific and unheard] claims of the thinkers consist in this: that first they think, and only after that do they mis-advisedly or treacherously disclose what they think to us with the help of speech as their tool.’
Of course, philosophy from its inception appealed to the possibility of judging the world. Thus the importance to it of the subjunctive or optative mood. As he wrote in his early work An Applied Science (or Know How) of the Soul:
Things controlled by the indicative are calmly dismissed into the world. The indicative describes and tells about things which are resting, which have been, which are finished or at hand… Being and existence are indeed the epitome of the indicative in all its varieties, because it ‘allows’ something to be said about the world…The philosophy which deifies man is called Idealism since it thrives on freedom of the will. Freedom, however, is the most pithy expression for the subjunctive which expresses everything coming to be. Freedom is the most pithy expression for not wanting to obey yet the laws of existence, for wishing to think of oneself not as part of the world but as divinely inspired, as an Idealist (1924, 14).
Philosophy in which the intellect lets everything revolve around the ‘I’ starts with the assumption of eternal freedom. Natural science, emphatically revolving around the ‘it’, starts with the principles of law (1924, 42).
Kant's distinction between theoretical and practical reason exemplifies how this move from indicative to subjunctive is attempted—as the categorical imperative first requires acknowledging that the will (the base of the subjunctive) is only free when it is not in violation of the laws potentially knowable by theoretical reason (the indicative). Thus, when Kant says that he wishes to create a rational faith by defining the limits of experience, just as when he says that ‘ought’ implies ‘can’, he is really showing, from Rosenstock-Huessy's perspective, that the entire metaphysical edifice is derived from a lexical ordering of grammar.
The architecture of the Alexandrian grammar was itself a result of the central role that it had ascribed to philosophy in the sciences so its concurrence with philosophy in grammatical priorities should come as no surprise. To a large extent it does this because it has already made some fundamental linguistic commitments which Rosenstock-Huessy thinks have plagued philosophy from its very inception and whose span can be witnessed from Parmenides to Heidegger, and which he also sees as repeatedly dragging philosophy and its followers into phantasmic pursuits. In the first instance, and what he holds responsible for philosophy's break from what he calls its ‘aboriginal humanity’, is its grammatical preference for pronominals rather than names (1970b, 77–90).
Rosenstock-Huessy argues that it is not only from the moment of birth that one is inducted via names—the names of one's parents, their family, one's birthplace, one's own name— but our life is a continuous accrual of names as each person is shaped by his or her experiences, thus developing new qualities or characteristics. Through the course of a life each of us is enmeshed in an expanding cluster of titles that reflect one's responses to the callings and imperatives of one's parents, friends, teachers, spouse and children, colleagues, government, society and, far from being least, one's enemies. Naming is orientating. As he says in Ja und Nein:
In every healthy society, one is inducted and introduced (vorgestellt), because life continues as a chain of people and things who have been introduced/ represented (Vorgestellten). That's how one enters history, in so far as one asks after my name and then one acclaims the other…The human world does not consist of ‘will and representation’ but as love and introduction/representation (1968, p. 22).
Names, then, refer to dynamic processes that move over time. On the other hand pronominals transport us beyond those processes to something more stable; they take us out of the specific relationship and have us think about relationships in a more general manner. As with Schelling's distinction between positive and negative philosophy and the limits of the later, Rosenstock-Huessy is highly suspicious of abstractions and he believes that philosophers have tended to put too much faith in them, believing that they provide the magic key for bringing order into the disorder of the world. The accusation by Socrates that his interlocutors do not have a specific virtue unless they can provide a logically tight definition for ‘what (the specific) virtue is’, and the Parmenidian formulation that ‘being is’ are, for Rosenstock-Huessy, but variants of this mistaken grammatical faith.
For Rosenstock-Huessy, the problem with the kind of case Plato makes in favor of essences and against names in the Cratylus (where he provides a satire on the sophists' use of etymology) is that the essence is purchased at the expense of the many processes which names rightly recognize as many. Of course Plato insists that the one and the many must be brought into the union of knowledge's correct definition. But Rosenstock-Huessy argues that names are primarily an historical founding, and hence not a logical matter. Rosenstock-Huessy emphasized this point in his Lectures on Greek Philosophy when he contrasted Book 2 of the Iliad, where Homer recalls the ships and the names of the places and commanders of the different armies of the Greeks, with Plato. ‘Homer's heart,’ he says, ‘is in following the first impressions also in the physical, in the real life…He's not systematic. He's anti-philosophical…Because a philosopher must have all his material gathered before he can subdivide it…Therefore it's always a second impression, it's an afterthought.’ Whereas the philosopher is suspicious of the same name that may be concealing different essences, Homer is not interested if two people have the same name in trying to establish a common essence, but in this naming of the ships ‘poetry has to keep the individual names of every one city here’ (1956b, Oct 18).
Unlike a pronoun, a specific name locates, sums up, emphasizes an event that has been or will become; it is done to orientate (even if, as in a lie, to veil). As Rosenstock-Huessy says:
The political power of names makes people circulate. Names signify our division of labor. They make room for a man and a thing. The ‘throne’, the ‘hustings’, our ‘tongue’ as Greeks, the ‘eye of justice’, the ‘thunder of Zeus’, those were all names whose invocation made people move out or in…
Names make no sense unless they stand in mutual relation. Mother is not mother unless she may call, under the law, somebody the father. Brother is brother to a sister. And unless he calls her sister and she calls him brother, the name is worthless. The general and the sergeant, the master and the apprentice, the army and the navy make room for each other, in the wonderful whole of names. All names belong to this holon, to society. No name is good without the others. The Pan of the universe drives people panicky, that is they lose speech. The holon of the city gives everybody a name in such a manner that everybody else now can be named by him, too (1970b, 83–84).
On the other hand, a pronoun is a way of not being precise about such things as location, emergence, faith, hope, or love:
Pronouns are a compromise between the real name of a person or a thing and the pointing finger while such person or thing is within the reach of our sense perception. To call a spade a spade is one thing; to point to the spade while it lies before us, which simply requires the gesture and a ‘there!’, is a totally different act. One is the act of naming, the other is an attempt to reduce naming to its informal minimum (1970b, 82).
For Rosenstock-Huessy the problem of names is also a key component in the dispute between Heraclitus' flux and Parmenides' sphere of being. Like Nietzsche, he saw that the two philosophies represent the choice between one path generally not taken by philosophers (Heraclitus') which would enable us to enter more deeply into the tensions and struggles of life, and another (the road more traveled of Parmenides) which stabilizes and logicizes and hence simplifies the abstract world, thus making it of very limited real worth for orientating us in life. In what he calls a ‘conjuration’, a letter he composes from Heraclitus to Parmenides, he has Heraclitus say to Parmenides: ‘“Being” is the scalp of the divine acts and the political names. This scalp hangs dangling on your belt. To hell with your “pronoun”, to hell with your “pro-verb” “being”. Or we shall all find ourselves in hell’ (1970b, 90).
In Ja und Nein he makes the point that what is done with nouns is also done with verbs, most notably in the case of philosophy with the verb sein (to be)/ noun Das Sein which is then rendered as being, which he sees as simply the dead husk or the smoke of what once had life.
Children say ‘you’, ‘I’, ‘there’, ‘here’… Philosophers though love one pronoun above all others: the little word ‘being’. Being involves the loss of seeing and hearing (Sein. Da vergehen ihm Hören und Sehen). He wants to ground being. ‘Being’ (‘Das Sein’) along with the forms am, are, is, is a pro-verb in exactly the same way as ‘this’ is a pronoun. The famous copula ‘is’ stands for all verbs as a stenophon, an abbreviation. Only one who experiences all verbs and cites them as ‘being’ can talk of being. This is because pronouns are senseless without the words for which they stand. Most philosophies of being speak of ‘being’, without having drunk from and been sated by the fullness of all verbs; that's why they are noise and smoke, and that's why the existentialists explained the war to them. There is only the essence of God after you have experienced that God rages, creates, blesses and shakes up (1968, 38–39).
The great choice for post-Nietzschean thinking, for Rosenstock-Huessy, is not so much, as Heidegger believed, a choice between continuing to remain entrapped in our compliance with beings rather than Being, but between continuing to take our orientation from pronominals rather than giving attention to names. In this respect Heidegger is Greek—i.e. still philosophical—whereas Rosenstock-Huessy is (to use a much loved word of Heidegger) genuinely ‘primordial’ or pre-philosophical because he thinks the pre-philosophical was wiser in its fidelity to language. Moreover, from Rosenstock-Huessy's perspective, what Heidegger has in common with the essentialist thinking he is so critical of, is that he still fools himself into thinking that he is not part of the great events of historical experiences which are encapsulated in names. Heidegger thinks that with thought he can move beyond them. The thought itself, for Heidegger, when it is not merely pronominal pro-verbial thought, is so saturated in history it cannot be overleaped except by a social rupture and a new social foundational act and name. From Rosenstock-Huessy's perspective, Heidegger's deployment of Being, as a gesture of defiance against the technicity into which the world has fallen, is precisely the same kind of optatively-governed gesture which characterizes the philosopher's freedom (an aesthetic/ moral one). Heidegger's refers to himself in his Der Spiegel interview of 1966 as awaiting a new god, a god who must remain nameless, on an earth from which the gods have fled. From Rosenstock-Huessy's perspective, this is indicative of just how barren is his landscape of possibilities. For all Heidegger's talk of being beyond metaphysics, from Rosenstock-Huessy's perspective, Heidegger is so afraid of repeating the gestures and moves of metaphysics that he is imprisoned by them. He is still primarily a philosopher, and far less a Mensch, as the speech thinkers like Rosenstock-Huessy sought to be, exercising ‘common sense’ and working with the common stock of names.
By appealing to the primacy of names, Rosenstock-Huessy is not saying that one must always accept one's tradition; traditions have to constantly be reinvented or reconfigured. However he does dispute that the basis of that transformation is primarily a philosophical act, as if the disinterested philosopher could digest and judge everything with his or her own mind. Names are constantly being renegotiated and ‘to think means to introduce better names’ (1970a, 174). But for the most part this process occurs through the trial and catastrophes of events and a social consensus about the meaning of the event. Tracing the naming of what is now known as the Holocaust is one example of how naming is often a matter of trial and error before there is a consensus about which name is appropriate for the experience that has traumatized a group and which that social group wishes to embed in its collective/institutional memory and pass on to future generations (1970a, 174).
The downgrading of the importance of the name in philosophy, for Rosenstock-Huessy, has as its counterpart the downgrading of the vocative case and hence the dialogical component of truth. For Rosenstock-Huessy, the vocative is the condition of dialogue and hence the real condition of a new truth. Unlike philosophers, who generally begin with the nominative case, he argues that a case such as the nominative is dependent upon, and hence subordinate to, the vocative. ‘Vocatives create the preconditions for reciprocal communication; whereas nominatives and other cases take their place inside of communication. The vocative provokes the conversation’, he says in Ja und Nein (1968, 25). And:
The vocative means: turn around and face me; we want to talk with each other for a while. Such a summons, invitation, challenge, introduction sets men in motion. The other cases enable all the named to have their place. The vocative, however, turns them around!…The nominative only points to different things, how they stand or lay…but the vocative belongs in the conjugation. The caller and the called belong in the conjugation (1968, 26).
This may be contrasted with the Socratic and more modern Cartesian traditions. In these traditions the concrete self dissolves either into the object to be studied or into the cognitive or methodological rules of the transcendental subject. In both instances the truth is the objective fact or state of affairs. But for Rosenstock-Huessy what is being left out of this picture is the participative role we all have in world-making and that role brings with it a knowledge and sense of our own purposefulness. What is so important is that creative address requires being open to the unpredictable. The social world is generated by decisive acts of inspiration and history and is , inter alia, a tapestry of inspired and unpredictable acts. The more predictable a group's actions become, the more spiritless they become.
This lack of emphasis upon the vocative is closely related to Rosenstock-Huessy's attempt to redress what he sees as the over accentuation of the modern faith in analysis, which is part of its philosophical legacy and also part of philosophy's aspiration to rule. According to Rosenstock-Huessy, the real sequence of orientation is: obey, communicate, explain, systematize.
In the first instance one hears a name called out above one, then one communicates with another, who participates in the same named group as him. In the third we report, everything that has been done and has happened under this name; we report, we explain and we establish what is happening. Finally we oversee everything and compare and draw the sum of everything into a logical system. We analyze (1968, 32).
Analysis, then, is the conclusion of a process. At no stage does Rosenstock-Huessy claim that analysis or philosophy are completely unhelpful—but their benefits require that they are part of a linguistic whole and that whole is what forms the social organism within which philosophy may play its role. According to Rosenstock-Huessy, philosophy tends to mistake the part for the whole and wrongly assume that the small measure of reason we have is being powerful enough to be the measure of all. The process briefly described above is what forms the collective ‘we’. This formation of the ‘we’ is at the basis of all common endeavors. It applies as much to the case of philosophers or natural scientists—for the group of ‘analysts’—as for any group. Science tends to concentrate on the array of its results and the application of methods and experiments etc. which achieve them. However, no less real are the human and institutional processes that are involved. The audacity of Galileo; the sweat and sacrifice of a science student to learn difficult material; the solidarity in pursuit of the truth about nature's workings: these are all indispensable to science and enable scientists to share a common pursuit and what Rosenstock-Huessy calls a particular ‘present’ in a ‘time body’. As he writes in his Soziologie:
Only because all physicists describe one Physics, because ‘Physics’ has existed from 1600 to 1950, thanks only to this omnipresence of Physics for 350 years, is the chain of experiments and mistakes meaningful. Physics can make gigantic mistakes and false teachings, a thousand times more than a single mortal, because it has a great present, on which the most distant future and the oldest past work (1956, 290).
In contrast to real speech, which is developed over time, Rosenstock-Huessy sees that ‘philosophy talks to man as though the experiment of living had not yet taken place before the experiment, so to speak. “Reason” always argues before the event, before our soul, has been incarnated, before God has come into the world’ (1941, 6). Philosophy is able to occupy a zone in which our problems and its solution are ‘eternalized’—it stops time and that shows in its solutions. In sum, it is a-historical while our challenges and crises are in history and in time.
Although other philosophers (in particular Heidegger, Schelling, and Bergson) make time important, Rosenstock-Huessy was not at all convinced that they had done it sufficiently. In the case of Schelling and Bergson it was because they remained imprisoned by the mechanistic conception of sequential time in which past, present and future move in the one direction. Thus, in the opening chapter of volume 2 of the Soziologie, he takes issue with Schelling's declaration in the Ages of the World that ‘the past is known, the present cognized, the future intimated’ (1958, 16–19). While Schelling is a major critic of mechanistic philosophy, and his call for a narrative philosophy is explicitly acknowledged by Franz Rosenzweig as being one of the most important precursors of the new thinking, the notion of time expressed here is decisively sequential and not at all at odds with the mechanistic conception of time which has evolved out of philosophy. Such a representation of space and time as one finds in the new sciences of the philosophies of Descartes, Newton, and Kant (for all their differences), certainly enables the sharpening of our understanding and observation of causal or material process. However, socially and personally we experience time as the push of the past and the future. Our present is not simply a passing point on a one-way flow, but the intersection of past and future in our present—future coming back to us as much as past coming toward us. Rosenstock-Huessy believed that this is how we experience the historical catastrophes which come from the conflict between suffocating spaces and the freedom to found a new time. Heidegger's emphasis upon thrownness and projection make him much closer to Rosenstock-Huessy, but his substitution of historicity for real history, and hence real times, evident in the above discussion on names, remains a dividing line between them.
For Rosenstock-Huessy, our temporal and purposeful nature is evident in our grammar and our institutions. Institutions are the embodiment and reproduction of a particular coalition of temporal forces. ‘Without a multiplicity of times’, he says ‘I remain speechless’ (1968, 12). Moreover, time and passion and history form an important connection which all come together in speech. Above all, time is experienced as history and this is as much so individually as collectively. History is not simply a sequential flow of forces which have their naturalistic counterparts. Rather, different events stamp themselves in the hearts and minds of a people and continue to impact upon a group long after their occurrence, thereby, at different times and to different degrees, activating passions of subsequent generations. Much of Rosenstock-Huessy's work is devoted to the great ‘events’, the great catastrophes, and the time bodies ensuing from them which have given us our particular historical character. More generally, this activation of the passions by past events and the replacement of one pantheon of names by another—as a hateful future is replaced by the promise of one more venerable—is a fundamental aspect of world-making and it is ultimately why, for him, names are so important. Names are testimonies to events and, just as our speech is a means to activate us, they are the fundamental triggers of the passions and hence of our world making. Names are the testimonies of what we love, of what calls us to act or of what has become so hateful that new directions must be opened up and new names found. History is a great pantheon of names, names which are the registers of passions and total commitments past. When those names no longer em-passion then that component of a group's history is dead.
However, history is not simply a plurality of names. Rosenstock-Huessy argued that it also tends toward a common story, as speakers and listeners are forced by successive catastrophes to become increasingly integrated into common spaces and times and to see the connection between the times and hence between each other. Such a connection can only be a real connection if it takes account of the bloody conflicts and the different responses and causes behind war and revolution as much as the moments and successes of common cause. That is, it must be multi-vocular. However, being multi-vocular is not the same as being an archipelago of hermetically sealed cries; history provides the difference between Babel (the interminable inability to communicate one's suffering and one's love, faith, and hopes) and a possible common future. ‘All history is the tale of acts in which some speaker and some listener have become one’ (1970a, 109). It is the formation of ‘we ’. Thus, he says in Ja und Nein, ‘we discover the founding act of life as the shaking up or shock (Erschütterung) of a man so that he is activated, finally activated and called upon to join in the formation of history in his own name’ (1968, 26).
What ultimately concerns Rosenstock-Huessy is incarnation and he believes that philosophy not only has not been sufficiently attentive to the process of incarnation and its historical importance, but that religions, especially Christianity, have been far more successful in their fruits than philosophy—a claim he attempts to back up in his historical writings on the Church and Christendom. Modernity was in many ways an attempt by philosophy to replace Christianity in Europe as an incarnatory force with its sciences and morals and art, in sum its humanism. But he believed—and this is the seminal event overhanging all his thought—that the devastation of the World Wars had disproved its claim, and that humanism had discovered, but not sufficiently digested, the truth of incarnation: that it is based upon service to somebody. The nations became the gods of the moderns. This had not been foreseen by those philosophers who had divinized nature and/or the self. Nor had the pioneers of humanism ever envisaged a world in which monsters, such as Stalin, Hitler and the like, would be as gods ruling over ‘selves’ and the sciences.
Rosenstock-Huessy always insisted that he was a Christian thinker. If he is known at all by people in the English speaking world it is as Rosenzweig's ‘Christian’ dialogical partner and friend who tried, but failed, to convert Rosenzweig to Christianity. It is, however, important to understand what Rosenstock-Huessy meant by Christianity. The need to do this is also underscored by the fact that Rosenstock-Huessy was a thinker who wished to explicate what it means to be a Christian in a post-Christian age, i.e. in an age where most people not only no longer know what it means to be Christian but do not know that they do not know, and yet, nevertheless, are far more Christian than they realize.
Rosenstock-Huessy's Christianity has to be seen in light of his treating all past human formations (whether of the tribe, the empire, the polis, etc.) as vital compounds formed by the vocabularies, with all the expectations and summonings, of the people constituting them. These vocabularies expressed the underlying realities which made them possible. Thus talk of Jesus' divinity in Europe in the Middle Ages was connected with, and testified to, the everyday world of churches through hymns, paintings, oaths and social office. Likewise Zeus and Athena were the conditions of the Greeks making the world they made, just as Horus and Osiris and the ka were for the Egyptians. Their social classes, political powers, oaths, buildings, paintings, music etc. were not something extraneous to the powers they summoned, spoke of, or revered in their day-to-day actions. These respective ages and the creations which defined them were impossible without the gods and the extraterrestial powers that infused these worlds. And with Rosenstock-Huessy, whether he was talking about burial sites and totems, or Horus, and Osiris and the bestowing of the ka upon the Pharaoh, or Homer and the Greek pantheon, or the Jewish decision to abandon the ways of empire, he was primarily undertaking an archaeological act of linguistic and sociological excavation to show his readers what trials each people were responding to and how they had all founded new forms of life which still resonate through our lives today, if we are but attentive enough to notice.
For Rosenstock-Huessy, what was unique about the Christian faith was that it was a way of world-making dedicated to bringing all of human kind into one family based upon fundamental truths about suffering, love, death, creation, redemption, and incarnation. For him, the Church was big enough to embrace those with ‘otherworldly’, childish understandings and those who understood that Christianity was a commitment to making the world on the basis of sacrificial love. Whether rightly or wrongly he was generally puzzled and astonished at what he thought were the inane and childish reductions that constituted the humanist and rationalist understanding not only of Christian life, but of all pre-humanist pagan life forms. Indeed, he generally associated this attitude with a non-historical understanding of humanity—one which he saw as widespread even in the discipline of history—which so often simply transposed contemporary orientations (names) back into the past and thus missed so much of the experience of humanity because it insisted upon ascribing its own modern ‘denuded’ (humanist) view of ‘man’ to worlds which knew nothing of ‘man’ as such.
One consequence of the triumph of humanism and rationalism, he believed, was that most moderns have simply forgotten what gods were. And he returns repeatedly to the term ‘god’ to bring out its sense as a power we serve which makes us speak, and guides our actions. In one particularly pithy formulation, which neatly captures the thrust of the new thinking's insistence upon God and Man as two irreducible subjects of historical predications, he says that ‘God and Man is a reciprocal letter exchange’ (1968, 23). Restated in thoroughly secular terms and from our side, the forces we surrender to in our lives make us what we are; we become what we serve; what we sacrifice ourselves to, makes us.
The failure to understand what a god is, for Rosenstock-Huessy, is on a par with our widespread failure to see beyond our own horizon and understand the truths behind the animism of tribal peoples or the insights into the moving heavens by early imperialist peoples. Thus it was, he believed, that today so many, including so-called Christians, failed to fathom the claims about Jesus' divinity, which had to do with the overpowering of death, not in any mystical or Pythagorean manner of the continuity of the individual soul in a netherworld, but in the triumph over death and deadly forces through forming a body across time, the Church. For Rosenstock-Huessy, Jesus was proof that Caesar and Pharaoh and ‘great men’ were not gods and Jesus' divinization meant that after him no one else would be God, that our redemption was universal and mutual. Jesus' taking on the role of the crucified was to show us that we crucify God when we do evil to each other, and that we fail to achieve the maximum of our powers (our own divinity) in our failure to obey the law of love, and that to obey the commandment of love means being continually prepared to leave abodes ruled by death and die into new forms of love and fellowship.
For Rosenstock-Huessy, the basic terms of Christianity emerged out of pagan and Jewish historical experience, and this fusion was a source of great historical truth about how reality is formed out of suffering and love. Hence a huge part of Rosenstock-Huessy's corpus is devoted to showing the reality and power—the truth—of tribal and pre-modern imperial life (particularly Egypt) as well as the Greek city states and the Jewish people.
Rosenstock-Huessy also argued that Christianity emerged as a response to many of the same forces which created these other forms of life, only at a different historical time, a time where their degeneracy and deficiency had forced a new stratagem of social survival. The uniqueness of this new stratagem is that due to its peculiar fusion of suffering, sacrificial love, death, and universal redemption it was able to reinvigorate and reconstitute forms once spent. It thus enabled the possibility of tribal peoples to harmonize with empires, and poets and philosophers to join with prophets in an attempt to realize the New Jerusalem. (Rosenstock-Huessy refers to this song of Blake's a number of times.)
This was what he meant by Christianity's founding the full count of the times due to its resuscitating ‘bodies’ from other times (see especially 1938 and 1987). Like Rosenzweig, who also interpreted this combination of universalisation and redemption as the unending task of Christianity, Rosenstock-Huessy interpreted Christianity through the same broad triadic rhythm as Schelling: Petrine, Pauline and Johannine, where there is the movement from the Church visible established by Rome, to the Church invisible of the Reformation, to the Church fully devolved, yet alive, in modern society.
In Rosenstock-Huessy's account, the first millennium of the Church had created a widespread consciousness of love of the neighbour, having taken a faith of the Jews into the pagan world. By the ninth century it had created what he calls ‘the world's first universal democracy’ in All Soul's Day which declared that the soul of the poorest peasant or widow was as much loved by God as the pope or emperor and all lived in the knowledge of the judgment to come. By contrast, the second millennium had been a connected series of ‘total revolutions’. These revolutions involved the fierce actuality of last judgments, as people who had lived with the promise of the second coming in their hearts had reached such a state of hatred, desperation and lack, a hatred of love's and heaven's absence in the society surrounding them, that they had fought to bring heaven into the world. Each revolution, while total in aspiration, had only been partial in success. But the conditions of modern social and political freedom were, he attempts to show in his two main works on revolution, the by-products of local revolts with total ambitions circulating in a world that was being fused by a common history and destiny. The World Wars were, he argued, the continuation of this revolutionary process. In sum, when Christ had said he had come to bring a sword, even though he was not urging the deployment of worldly means, the teaching of love that he had sought to place in the hearts of men and women had led to a series of convulsions and cataclysms that were forcing us to obey the law of love—or perish. These revolutions, which stretched from the Investiture Conflict (or what he calls the Papal Revolution) to the First World War and the Russian Revolution, had given the modern world its shape. And, he believed, its solution, which was the fulfillment of the messianic promise to Abraham and the real rationale for the Church's very existence and which had become the real future-building mission of the (originally European, now planetary, bodies) politics of the last millennium.
That solution was what he called a metanomical society, a planetary society in which discordances could be peacefully accommodated in creative tension. In fact, while Rosenstock-Huessy remains completely passed over by what can loosely be called post-modernism (although he had used the term as early as 1949, in his paper ‘Liturgical Thinking’, as a way of describing contemporary life), he shares two major concerns with postmodernists: (a) the recognition that the global economy has reactivated the local and that any genuinely desirable revolutionary outcome must be receptive to local customs which enrich people, and (b) that we will only be able to create a life worth living at a planetary level if differences are not dissolved but able to retain their vitality.
According to Rosenstock-Huessy the lesson of history and the accumulated memory (history) of human suffering gathered through our speech-formed, time-building capacity was that we all must live as Jew, Christian, and Pagan. In his The Christian Future and the second volume of the Soziologie he would elaborate on this by arguing that in our times we needed to fuse Christ, Abraham, Buddha and Lao Tse. His decision to make Buddhism and Taoism essential components of the contemporary cross of reality was part of his attempt to help found a metanomical framework which would enable the concordance of disparities. But it is fair to say that neither Buddhism nor Taoism, nor Islam (which he writes a section on in volume 2 of the Soziologie), nor Hinduism occupied his attention anywhere near as much as the spirits of the tribes, Egypt, Greece, the Israelites and Christian peoples.
- 2005, The Collected Works of Eugen Rosenstock-Huessy on DVD, Norwich, Vt.: Argo Books. This contains all his published writings as well as many unpublished essays and notes and all of the transcribed lectures. For all titles see A Guide to the Works of Eugen Rosenstock-Huessy at <http://www.argobooks.org/collected/a_guide_to_the_works.html>.
- 1910, Herzogsgewalt und Friedensschutz, Aalen: Scientia Verlag, Breslau: M. & H. Marcus. Reprint 1969.
- 1914, Königshaus und Stämme in Deutschland zwischen 911 und 1250, Leipzig: Felix Meiner, Aalen: Scientia Verlag.
- 1920a, Die Hochzeit des Kriegs und der Revolution, Würzburg: Patmos-Verlag. Reprint 1965.
- 1920b ‘Brief an *** (Letter to Karl Barth)’, in Tumult, Vol. 20, Wien: Turia u. Kant, 1995, 9–15.
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