Saadya [Saadiah]

First published Tue May 6, 2003

In his philosophical commitment to reason and revelation as joint grounds for knowing and living, Saadya creates a space for the interplay of faith, understanding, tradition, and law. Saadya defends the truth as well as the reasonableness of Biblical and rabbinic writings within the Jewish tradition, engages in polemics against members of the Jewish community who dispense with rabbinic authority, and brings a unique blend of philosophical and theological sensibilities to bear on questions of epistemology, morality and religion. Well-known for his discussion of the difference between “laws of reason” and “laws of revelation,” Saadya is also often characterized, in his focus on the importance of human reason, as following certain trends in Islamic (in particular, Mu‘tâzilite) Kalâm theology.

1. Life

Saadya Gaon (Saadya ben Joseph, known in Arabic as Sa'id ‘ibn Yusuf al-Fayyûmî) was born in Fayyûm (upper Egypt) in 882 and died in Baghdad in 942. Theologian, philosopher and rabbi, Saadya's legacy includes a number of philosophical and theological treatises, 2 Arabic translations of the Bible, a [mostly non-extant] Biblical commentary in Arabic, various rabbinical, mathematical, and grammatical writings, a Hebrew dictionary, liturgical poems and a Jewish prayer book.

A key figure in the life of the Jewish community, Saadya's rabbinic career included influential involvement in a controversial Jewish calendrical reform and a contested rise to the position of head Rabbi at the Sura Academy.

In his general philosophical comportment, Saadya upholds the need for and importance of reason, even in a religious context of revelation and faith. In fact, in his commitment to the importance of human reason (including the sense in which reason can judge the rightness of at least a number of Biblical commands and prohibitions), Saadya's theological ideas may be said to reflect Islamic Kalâm sensibilities (in particular, the teachings of the Mu‘tâzilites).

2. The Importance of Reason: The Book of Doctrines and Beliefs

It is this commitment to upholding the importance of reason — and its fruits, knowledge and certainty — that lies at the core of Saadya's  main philosophical text, the Kitâb al-Amânât wal-'I‘tiqâdât, or The Book of Doctrines and Beliefs (known in Samuel Ibn Tibbon's Hebrew translation as Sefer ha-'Emûnôt ve-ha-Deôt). In what follows, we will refer to this text as the Amânât. In this magnum opus, Saadya aims to move people beyond the various epistemological and existential paralyses through which they are consigned to living always and only in the shadows of error and doubt. Concerned to help cure this distinctive human ill, Saadya hopes to provide people instead with truth and certainty — the grounds for right living. And so, following upon an opening passage of epistemological praise to “the Lord, the God of Israel, to whom the truth is known with absolute certainty,” Saadya begins the Amânât, with a statement of his work's epistemological purpose:

…I will begin this book, which it is my intention to write, with an exposition of the reason why men, in their search for Truth, become involved in errors, and how these errors can be removed so that the objects of their investigations may be fully attained; moreover, why some of these errors have such a powerful hold on some people that they affirm them as the truth, deluding themselves that they know something… (Altmann, 27)[1]

The sad state of affairs among men which Saadya sees as the impetus for his work is described a few lines later in terms of erroneous life-patterns which stem from various failures of reason:

I have been led to make these introductory remarks by my observation of the state of many people in regard to their doctrines and beliefs [note: this is the title of the work]. Some there are who have arrived at the truth and rejoice in the knowledge that they possess it…Others have arrived at the truth, but doubt it; they fail to know it for a certainty and to hold on to it…Still others confidently affirm that which is false in the belief that it is true; they hold on to falsehood, and abandon that which is right…Others again base their conduct on a certain belief for a time, and then reject it on account of some defect they find in it; then they change over to another belief and renounce it in turn because of something in it which seems questionable to them…These people are changing continually all their life… (Altmann, 28-9)

Concerned to remedy a people's inability to surmount error and doubt, Saadya's epistemological curative is directly in the service of life: Saadya wants to be able to provide his readers with the capacity to know truly and with certainty because he wants to provide them a genuine space in which to live truly and with certainty.

Saadya, we may say, essentially sets out to provide his readers with a dual reason-based and faith-based ground for living. It is in the service of this dual-ground for living that Saadya grapples throughout his text with the question of reason's relation to revelation, beginning with an analysis of four modes of proper knowing, viz. knowledge from sense perception, knowledge from reason, knowledge from inference and knowledge from tradition.

3. Tradition, Revelation and Prophecy

Tradition for Saadya demarcates a unique category of knowing, in that, unlike the 3 other epistemological processes he addresses (viz. sensory, inferential and reason-based knowing), knowing by tradition comes to a person (or a group) all at once (as opposed to being a process unfolding in time, as is the case for the other 3 modes of knowing). Furthermore, knowledge received from tradition is not only immediately received, but is additionally immediately certain to its recipient(s). “tradition” translates Saadya's Arabic “al-kabar” (Ibn Tibbon's Hebrew: haggadah), which literally has the sense of “a report.” The conceptual heart of tradition can hence be understood as a kind of reliable report — or heard testimony transmitted from person to person. It might further be noted that tradition (al-kabar) has its root in the Arabic verb kabara, “to experience,” with the additional sense of “to know,” and even “to know thoroughly.” As such, Saadya's Arabic notion of tradition-as-report carries with it already a suggestion of reliable knowledge.

Here, explicitly identifying Scripture as tradition (though elsewhere, he speaks of rabbinic writings as tradition too), he explains:

[God] knew that His laws and the stories of His wondrous signs would, through the passage of time, require people to hand them down to posterity, so that they might become as evident to later generations as they were to the earlier ones. Therefore, He prepared in our minds a place for the acceptance of reliable tradition (al-kabar as-sâdiq) and in our souls a quiet corner for trusting it so that His Scriptures and stories should remain safely with us (Altmann, 109)

Reliable tradition, hence, is the report that one can trust. It is an immediate source for certain knowledge.

While in his discussions of tradition, Saadya uses the word ‘kabar’ which we have already seen to carry with it the sense of reporting (but also, knowing), on this issue of tradition-as-report it is useful also to consider another Arabic root, sami‘a (to hear). While in and of itself, this root simply means ‘to hear,’ it is, we might note, conceptually linked to the notion of ‘report’ in the simple sense that receiving a report most often involves hearing. And so, there is, in the Arabic, a conceptual link between ‘to hear’ and Saadya's notion of tradition (kabar, as a “report”). In fact, the Arabic root ‘to hear’ appears in one of its constructed forms (samâ‘î) with the literal straightforward meaning of ‘traditional’, or ‘derived from tradition’. This link, then, between the notions of hearing and tradition in Saadya's Arabic linguistic and conceptual space is important to helping us properly ‘recover’ the essence of Saadya's notion of “revelation.” Contrary to the Latin-rooted “revelation,” which literally means, “recovering” (from Latin vêô, to cover, and hence “to reveal” literally as “to recover”), the Arabic term which gets translated as “revelation” in Saadya's work is grounded in the Arabic root “to hear.” Consider in particular Saadya's important discussion of a class of Biblical precepts, often translated as “laws of revelation.” Following on a distinction already drawn in rabbinic sources, but providing the first extended discussion of this distinction in a Jewish philosophical text, Saadya draws our attention to the presence of 2 classes of laws in the Hebrew scriptures, most frequently translated as the “laws of reason” and the “laws of revelation.” For the “laws of reason,” Saadya uses the word ‘aqliyyât, from the word ‘aql (lit. the faculty of intellect), and hence, we might say, these laws are ‘the ones that are (or, can  be) known by human intellect,’ or ‘the ones that are (or, at least can in theory be) arrived at through human reason’. As for the “laws of revelation,” Saadya here employs the word sam‘iyyât, from the root sami‘a, ‘to hear’; hence these laws are literally ‘the ones that are heard’. The point, then, is to be aware that the Arabic root of the word translated as “revelation” in the distinction between “laws of reason” and “laws of revelation” is a word that linguistically carries on its sleeve the notion of “being heard” and, as such, carries with it a more immediate correlation with the very concept of tradition (as the [heard] report) than does the Latin-rooted term “revelation.”

Appreciating the link — through the conceptual chain of reporting and hearing — between tradition and revelation in Saadya is important for many reasons. First, it is important in and of itself, reminding us that translation can often make us miss the conceptual overtones of the tradition we are trying to recover. Secondly, this link speaks directly to Saadya's own commitment to the rabbinic tradition in Judaism as itself just as important as — and on equal epistemological footing with — the revealed scripture (contrary to the Karaite movement in Judaism which during Saadya's time was especially vociferous in flatly denying any binding authority to rabbinic law, and against whose ideas Saadya composed polemical responses). In other words, coming to appreciate the conceptual link in Arabic between the idea of revelation and that of tradition (as we have shown above) might certainly be useful in helping us better appreciate Saadya's own treatment of the rabbinic tradition (or, oral law) as divinely revealed. Furthermore, coming to appreciate this ‘link-in-hearing’ between revelation and tradition additionally helps to elucidate the direct link in Saadya between these two concepts, and prophecy. For Saadya, prophecy is, in part, a divinely “created word” heard by the prophet. On this picture, it is obvious — simply from the conceptual space of the Arabic terms — that, through this idea of hearing, revelation, tradition and prophecy are all intimately related. Although his notion of prophecy also includes a visual element, the “created glory” (though it is interesting to note that for Saadya, the ultimate prophetic experience of Moses was only auditory and did not include this visual element), it is nonetheless important to stress the immediate connection between notions of divine speaking, and human reception-as-hearing, itself with overtones for both revelation and tradition as the joint repositories of ‘the things that are [reliably] heard’ (and hence, known).

In addition, then, to this “created word” auditory phenomenon revealed to the prophet, Saadya's doctrine of prophecy also involves the “created glory”, a kind of visual element of the prophecy, described in particular by Saadya as the verification mechanism for the prophet. It is in seeing the created glory that the prophet knows his prophetic encounter to be true (though, as mentioned above, Saadya suggests that the prophecy of Moses lacked this visual aspect, consisting in an encounter with created word alone).

In Saadya's Commentary on the Book of Creation (Tafsîr Kitâb al-Mabâdî), we learn more about the created glory in Saadya's doctrine of a “2nd air.” There, created glory, or the “2nd air,” is described as a prophetic intermediary of some sort between God and man.

The prophetic air in question is described by Saadya as “second” precisely in the sense that it is anterior to, as well as subtler and more powerful than, regular elemental air (which he calls “manifest air”). In other words, from the human vantage point, regular breathable air is “first”, and “prophetic air” is “second.” If we take this in some spatial sense, the idea would seem to be that this 2nd more subtle, refined variety of air lies midway between the regular human realm and the divine realm. This reading would suggest that created glory is not only a source for prophecy, but is, at least prima facie, a cosmic intermediary, playing an intermediating role in the prophetic encounter. Futhermore, thus seeing the 2nd air as a ‘cosmic intermediary’ might seem to suggest that it is an hypostasized reality, a point which seems further supported by Saadya's own description of this 2nd air as a ‘shay makhlûq’ (‘a created thing’).

Along these lines, it might be noted that in an influential study of the prophetic phenomenon in Saadya, Altmann sees Saadya's commitment to created glory as a commitment in particular to some sort of an hypostasized entity; in fact, it is precisely on the basis of this hypostasizing view that Altmann argues for distinguishing Saadya's theory of prophecy from the Mu‘tâzilite view.[2] All this said, though, the exact nature of the created glory in Saadya is somewhat ambiguous, and, as such, it seems at least plausible to deny that this element of Saadya's prophetic view is intended in a strictly reified sense. What is clear, in any case, is that it is through his descriptions and analyses of created word and created glory that Saadya strives to unambiguously ground the legitimacy and objectivity of prophecy, and hence, of tradition itself.

4. “Laws of Reason” vs. “Laws of Revelation”

While the entire Bible is, for Saadya, revealed (particularly as an auditory prophecy-to-Moses which is then reported to — and hence, received as tradition by — future generations), Saadya's focus on the “laws of revelation” demarcates not all of the revealed Bible, and not even all of the laws found in the revealed Bible, but rather, only a subsection of those laws. To better understand what the “laws of revelation” refer to, consider again the contrast class, viz. the “laws of reason” (which are of course also found in the revealed Bible). As mentioned above, this distinction between 2 classes of Biblical laws is already alluded to in rabbinic literature (cf. Babylonian Talmud, Yoma 67b); Saadya, though, is seen as the first Jewish writer to really engage this discussion philosophically. Saadya addresses this distinction in the third chapter of his Amânât (a chapter devoted to an investigation of “commandment and prohibition”). The “laws of reason” (again, the ones described as “ ‘aqliyyât ” from the root “intellect”) are essentially characterized there as commandments and prohibitions in the Bible whose reasons could be arrived at independently by any rational human being. In other words, these are laws which ought to ‘make sense’ to any reasonable person, and, as such, are basic (one might say, natural) moral laws which, left to our own devices, we ought come up with on our own. Examples of such laws are the prohibitions against murder, adultery, theft, and lying. The “laws of reason” are described by Saadya as legislating over matters that, as Saadya says, God “has implanted approval [or, in cases of prohibition, disapproval] of…in our reason” (Altmann, 97). The “laws of revelation” (sam‘iyyât, again, from the root sami‘a, ‘to hear’) are described on the contrary as follows:

The Second Class of law consists of matters regarding which reason passes no judgment in the way either of approval or disapproval so far as their essence is concerned… (Altmann, 97)

In the pages immediately following, Saadya gives as examples of such laws: the laws demarcating Sabbath and other festival days as separate from ‘ordinary’ days, rules about who gets chosen as a prophet and/or leader, the Jewish dietary laws, certain sexual prohibitions, and laws of purity and impurity.

5. Reason and Revelation in Dialogue

Having seen the difference between the “laws of reason” and the “laws of revelation,” we get an even better sense of Saadya's uniquely religious epistemological stance by looking more generally at how reason and revelation relate to one another in his system. Broadly considering ways in which reason and revelation come together for Saadya, we find the complexity of Saadya's epistemological sensibility, the sense, that is, in which revelation is both brought in support of, but also itself supported by, reason.

First, Saadya provides what he takes to be a reason-based account of why the “laws of reason” were included by God in the revealed Bible at all — after all, if they are the sorts of things that reasonably sensible human beings ought to arrive at on their own, why did God bother revealing them? To this question, Saadya can be taken as providing two answers:

1. God, in His benevolence, did not see fit to leave us to figure morality out on our own; even though we could arrive at certain key moral ideas on the basis of our own human reasoning, God, by revealing these moral ideas to us, essentially gives us a shortcut, as it were.

…the Lord (be He exalted and glorified) has informed us through the words of His prophets that he wishes us to lead a religious life by following the religion which He instituted for us. This religion contains laws (sharî‘a), which he has prescribed for us, and which it is our duty to keep and to fulfill in sincerity…His messengers established these laws for us by wondrous signs and miracles, and we commenced to keep and fulfill them forthwith. Later we found that speculation confirms the necessity of the law for us. It would, however, not have been appropriate to leave us to our own devices… (Altmann, 95; italics added)

For Saadya, it is only reasonable that God in His kindness reveal to us even those laws which we could, in theory, arrive at on the basis of our own reasoning, for this both expedites as well as ensures our engagement with proper norms for living. Human reason is in this way shown to be helped by revelation. And yet, in this very act of analysis — in which a reasoned account of the importance of revelation is given — Saadya essentially at one and the same time shows us how revelation is helped — at least in the sense of supported — by reason.

2. Following a further line of reasoning (itself outlined more fully below in our treatment of Saadya's analysis of why God issued “laws of revelation”), Saadya explains how, by including “laws of reason” in the list of divinely revealed commandments and prohibitions, God, in effect, allows His subjects to do what they would be doing anyway (viz. acting in accordance with basic, reason-based moral ideals), but enables them to get the additional bonus of being rewarded for ‘doing God's bidding’.

When faced with this statement [viz. that the commandments and prohibitions are a divine gift], the first impulse of reason will be to object that God should have been able to bestow upon men perfect bliss and to grant them everlasting happiness without imposing upon them commandments and prohibitions. Moreover, it would seem that in this way His goodness would have been more beneficial to them, seeing that they would have been free from the necessity of making any laborious effort. My answer to this objection is that, on the contrary, the order instituted by God, whereby everlasting happiness is achieved by man's labours in fulfillment of the law, is preferable. For reason judges that one who obtains some good in return for work which he has accomplished enjoys a double portion of happiness in comparison with one who has not done any work and received what he receives as a gift of grace. reason does not deem it right to place both on the same level. This being so, our Creator has chosen for us the more abundant portion, namely, to bestow welfare on us in the shape of reward, thus making it double the benefit which we could expect without an effort on our part… (Altmann, 94)

God gives His followers more opportunity to reap rewards by making even the self-evident norms of moral living matters of divine obeisance. We might say that for Saadya, God supplements a natural law ethics (and/or a Virtue Theory ethics) with a divine command theory for the purpose of increasing human rewards. reason, in this way, is helped by revelation. And yet again, in the very composition of an account of the reasonableness of revelation, Saadya here too shows revelation to be helped — at least in the sense of supported — by reason.

Regarding the larger question of obeisance to God, Saadya (in chapter 3 of the Amânât) provides what he takes to be a reason-based account of why one ought to follow God and obey His laws, and can in this way be seen as providing a reason-based appraisal of revelation most broadly construed. This argument is provided in 4 parts, and centers, in turn, on the reasonableness of God's expecting us to render thanks to Him, the reasonableness of God expecting us to respect Him and His name, the reasonableness of God's expecting us to act rightly towards fellow humans, and the reasonableness of God's giving us commands and prohibitions for the express purpose of being able to give us rewards. In this discussion, Saadya in yet another way employs reason in support of revelation. Here, revelation is once again helped — at least in the sense of supported — by reason.

In fact, Saadya even provides what he takes to be a reason-based account of the “laws of revelation” — the very laws “regarding which reason passes no judgment” and which, as such, are not, in his very own opinion on the matter, subject to human evaluation at all! According to Saadya, humans don't know what God has in mind regarding this class of laws, and yet, champion of reason as Saadya appears to be, he nonetheless decides (albeit tentatively, and with qualification) to provide reasons for these laws. In fact, Saadya not only gives reasons for the “laws of revelation” as a class of law in general, but he then additionally offers explanations for the particularities of individual cases in point of such laws. In this latter effort, Saadya not only provides numerous possible reasons for the particularities of any given “law of revelation,” but attempts in his explanations to show how the law in question is actually of practical benefit to humans.

Starting with the first, more general level of explanation, Saadya provides a reason for God's having commanded “laws of revelation” broadly speaking: First, it was a benevolent act designed by God to give humans extra opportunities to serve Him, and, thereby, extra opportunities to increase their rewards and happiness:

But our Lord has given us an abundance of such commandments and prohibitions [viz. laws of revelation] in order to increase our reward and happiness through them, as is said, ‘The Lord was pleased, for His righteousness’ sake, to make the law great and glorious’ (Isa. 42.21). That which belongs to the things commanded by God assumes the character of ‘good’, and that which belongs to the things forbidden by Him assumes the character of ‘evil’ on account of the Service thereby performed…” (Altmann, 97-98)

By having more opportunities to serve God, we are given more opportunities to reap divine rewards. For Saadya, nothing could be more reasonable.

An example, then, of Saadya's subsequent attempt to provide even further reasons for the particulars of specific “laws of revelation” (reasons, moreover, which point to the practical benefits of those laws) can be seen in his two attempted explanations of the Jewish dietary laws:

The prohibition not to eat certain animals has this advantage: it makes it impossible to liken any of the animals to the Creator since it is unthinkable that one should permit oneself either to eat or to declare as impure what one likens to God; also it prevents people from worshiping any of the animals, since it is unthinkable that one should worship either what serves for food or what one declares as impure (Altmann, 101)

In both his more general and more individualized attempts to explain the reasonableness of the “laws of revelation,” Saadya once again employs reason in support of revelation.

And yet, turning to some stronger senses in which, on the contrary, reason is supported by revelation, Saadya (in a section in chapter 3 of the Amânât addressing why it is necessary for God to send “messengers and prophets”) provides a general explanation not only (as above) of why the “laws of reason” are themselves revealed, but of why the “laws of reason” must be further accompanied by additional revealed information. In this discussion, Saadya stresses that even the most rational moral ideal is beset with vagueness about the details of how best to effect the sought after result; and so, while reason can tell us that we ought not commit adultery, it doesn't necessarily provide us with the sorts of ‘when, where and how’ details that are needed to translate even the best moral theory into actual practice. In effect, Saadya explains that,

…mankind is fundamentally in need of the prophets, not solely on account of the revelational laws, which had to be announced, but also on account of the rational laws, because their practice cannot be complete unless the prophets show us how to perform them. Thus, for instance, reason commands gratitude toward God for the blessings received from Him, but does not specify the form, time, and posture appropriate to the expression of such gratitude. So we are in need of prophets. They gave it a form which is called ‘prayer’; they fixed its times, its special formulae, its special modes and the special direction which one is to face when praying… (Altmann, 103-104)

In one sense, this too can be seen as another reason (supplementing the two provided above) why the “laws of reason” are themselves revealed in the Bible: different from anything addressed above, here the idea would be that the Biblical revelation includes details for action that human reason on its own does not provide. And yet, it seems worth noting that Saadya in this section of his text (as represented by the above quote) seems to focus explicitly on those requisite details that are provided by the rabbinic tradition (details about times of prayer, etc.). This seems to suggest that this line of reasoning about the relationship of reason and revelation is slightly different from what we have addressed above. And so: whereas above, the question was ‘Why are the “laws of reason” revealed in the Bible?’, here, the question is ‘Why are the “laws or reason” accompanied by revealed Oral law traditions about these laws?’ Seeing Saadya's line of reasoning here in this way, we may highlight the link between the notions of revelation, prophecy and tradition, here precisely in the sense of rabbinic tradition. As discussed above, for Saadya, the authority of the written Bible and the oral law (or, rabbinic tradition) are on equal footing. Here again, though now with implications for the role of rabbinic tradition, we see that, for Saadya, reason is helped by revelation (here, it would seem, in the sense of rabbinic tradition).

In further support of some stronger senses in which Saadya employs revelation in support of reason, there seems to emerge what we might identify as a kind of ‘illuminationist’ strain in Saadya's epistemology, a strain in light of which human reason seems ultimately grounded upon a personal divine revelation of sorts. Consider how Saadya, right at the Amânât's outset, revealingly qualifies the nature of human reason in a discussion of his own role as ‘knower’ through an especially evocative image of sinking men in the hands of a salvific diver. Describing his reaction to the state of his community's ignorance and doubt, Saadya says:

…my heart grieved for my race, the race of mankind, and my soul was moved on account of our own people Israel, as I saw in my time many of the believers clinging to unsound doctrine and mistaken beliefs while many of those who deny the faith boast of their unbelief and despise the men of truth, although they are themselves in error. I saw men sunk, as it were, in a sea of doubt and covered by the waters of confusion, and there was no diver to bring them up from the depths and no swimmer to come to their rescue. But as my Lord has granted unto me some knowledge which I can use for their support, and endowed me with some ability which I might employ for their benefit, I felt that to help them was my duty, and guiding them aright an obligation upon me, as the Prophet says, “The Lord God hath given me the tongue of them that are taught, that I should know how to sustain with words him that is weary” (Isa. 50.4), although I confess to the shortcomings of my knowledge… (Altmann, 29)

Saadya sees himself as the able swimmer setting out to rescue the people Israel — and all of mankind — from their drowning fates, and yet, in his image, his own reliance upon the hand of God is immediately evident: Saadya sees himself as the salvific diver, or, to change imagery, the ‘tongue’ that through books might speak people out of their quandaries, and yet, as he states above, it is “my Lord [who] has granted unto me some knowledge… and endowed me with some ability.” Finding in himself a guiding voice, he is quick to find too that his is a voice that is received from above: His voice is that of the “them that are taught” — his ability to help save those who are drowning is not his own, but is, rather, ‘taught,’ a gift given to him by God.

In this, there emerges an important sense in which, for Saadya, reason rests on a kind of personal revelation. And so, here too, revelation is ultimately brought in support of reason.

The importance of revelation as a ground in Saadya can be further seen in his understanding of the commandments and prohibitions as themselves gracious gifts from God:

The first of His acts of kindness towards His creatures was the gift of existence…Thereafter He offered them a gift by means of which they are able to obtain complete happiness and perfect bliss… (Altmann, 93)

In his sensitive responsiveness to even existence itself as divine gift, Saadya finds in the commandments and prohibitions of revelation a God-given path to salvation: by following these God-given precepts, one can hope to secure his or her welfare. In this, his understanding of Jewish law as heavenly gift, we can already see the sense in which for Saadya, revelation is a ground for living — it is the basis upon which a person can live in the light of divine favor.

6. Prooftexts, Revelation and Faith

In further support of a sense in which Saadya identifies revelation as a ground, we may look to the very methodology and structure of the Amânât itself. In particular, consider the Amânât's liberal employment of Biblical prooftexts: every reason-exemplifying analysis or argument is, within Saadya's work, ultimately rooted in a scriptural verse. Beckoning, we might say, to the lived experience of faith (as opposed to the important, though limited, cognitive experience of reason), these prooftexts themselves stand as testaments to both the centrality and phenomenological uniqueness of ‘knowing by tradition’ (or, revelation) in Saadya's world-view. Evocative and transformative in their scope, these Biblical verses are themselves revelations — and enactments — of faith in the very fabric of Saadya's reason-based endeavor. In this way, we may say that the method and form of Saadya's writing (viz. his use of prooftexts in addition to his use of reasoned arguments) helps emphasize the importance for Saadya of revelation and knowledge-from-tradition as separate from reason-based knowing. As such, we may say in particular of those Biblical prooftexts employed by Saadya in support of the importance of reasoning, that they simultaneously (one might even say, paradoxically) beckon us to (a) the limitations of reasoning, (b) the need for (and consistency with reason of) revealed Knowledge, and even (c) the need to ground a life of reasoned reflection in a life of revealed tradition. Through his constant engagement with revealed texts to support the importance of reason, Saadya, in the very act of championing reason, can be seen as planting reason on the ground of revelation.

Saadya's liberal peppering of his analyses and arguments with Biblical prooftexts can in this way be seen as incarnations of faith in his text, incarnations which speak volumes about his complex understanding of reason's relation to revelation. It would seem that faith — and not simply reason — runs throughout and grounds Saadya's text, itself a model for Saadya's conception of the well-lived life.

7. Maimonidean Critique?

Following on many of the above considerations about the grounding of reason in revelation, and struck more generally by what might be described as a ‘faith-seeks-understanding’ methodology, one may legitimately ask: In spite of his own defense of, call for and engagement with reason, is reason really the hallmark of Saadya's world-view? To see how one might answer “no” to this question, consider the writings of Moses Maimonides (a later Jewish medieval philosopher). For Maimonides, Saadya's speculative theological reasoning might easily be seen as reasoning-in-the-service-of-pre-established-ideas (in this case, theological commitments). This sort of ‘reasoning’ is precisely the sort of thing that Maimonides (in the extended critique of Kalam which he offers in his Guide of the Perplexed) lambastes as a fanciful, non-philosophical mode of pseudo-reasoning. To the extent that Saadya's work falls prey to Maimonides' critique of Kalâm theology, it would not, properly speaking, be a truly reason-based system. While Saadya states that “the truth of reliable tradition” is “based on the knowledge of sense perception and the knowledge of reason” (Altmann, 37), there are serious grounds for suggesting, nonetheless, that for Saadya, it is tradition and revelation, and the presence of God in man's life that these entail, which are ultimately the first foundations for knowing and living. The centrality of reason notwithstanding, revelation may ultimately be Saadya's final ground.

8. Revelation as Praxis

In considering the possibility of revelation as ground, consider the sense in which, for Saadya, revelation entails praxis. In addition to describing knowledge as that which God has placed within him, Saadya, in the above ‘salvific diver’ quote, sees that in having received the divine gift of knowledge, he has become a locus of obligation: in having divinely received reason's fruit, he has, at one and the same time, been called to take on the God-given responsibility to help save those who are drowning. Acting on his responsibility to snatch the lost drifters from the watery graves of doubt and error, Saadya hopes that

[t]he knowledge of God and His law will spread in the world like the spreading of water in all parts of the sea, as is said, ‘For the earth shall be full of the knowledge of the Lord, as the waters cover the sea’ (Isa. 11.9)” (Altmann, 31)

As is already evident in these sentiments at the very start of the Amânât, and as becomes clearer throughout the course of the text, for Saadya there is always an immediate correlation between the ability to think (or reason) on the one hand, and, on the other hand, both (a) a receptivity to divine giving, coupled with (b) an obligation of moral responsiveness in the face of the Other. In this (as in other ideas of his), we find an intimate and inextricable link between the human capacity to manifest reason, the human capacity to receive revelation, and the human responsibility to be ethically responsive. In this sense, ‘receiving revelation’ must itself be understood as a person's — or community's — joint resolution to hearing and acting-in-accordance-with the voice of God, itself manifest in hearing and acting-in-accordance-with the voice of tradition. tradition in this sense emerges in Saadya as a communal receptacle for revelation, parallel, though on a larger scale, to the receptive heart of the individual prophet who receives the word of God. Along these lines, we might say that revelation-cum-tradition emerges as the key ingredient to Saadya's epistemological prescription for truth and certainty, and as such, as the key ingredient to Saadya's prescription for living — his prescription, that is, for how to live life with the sort of fullness that only truth and certainty can provide, and which only faith-with-reason can hope to attain.

9. God, Unity, Creation, Soul

Saadya upholds the absolute unity of God, and argues firmly for creation ex nihilo. In this former regard, Saadya shares a sensibility with the Mu‘tâzilite theologians, and reveals a knowledge of various heated debates on this theme at play in Islamic circles during his time. On the issue of creation, Saadya defends a creation ex nihilo position (though here breaks further company with the Mu‘tâzilites who, in addition to creation ex nihilo, advanced an atomistic doctrine of continuous [re-]creation). In fact, between the various arguments he offers in his Amânât as well as in his Commentary on the Book of Creation, Saadya defends the creation ex nihilo position against 18 other theories, each of which he critiques in turn. In this series of arguments, Saadya reveals a familiarity with a number of philosophical and theological doctrines, including those of the pre-Socratics, Plato and the Pythagoreans (though it should be noted that his knowledge of these thinkers would have been largely based on doxographies and other Arabic encyclopedic sources).

In addition to refutations of 12 of the cosmogonic views (more of which he refutes in other works), Saadya provides us in the Amânât with proofs for the creation of the world ex nihilo by God. He proceeds in three stages: he begins with four proofs for the creation of the world (described respectively as proofs from finitude, composition, accidents, and time), moves on to three reasons for why that creation must be rooted in an external creator (as opposed to some idea of the self-createdness of the world), and ends by showing how that creation must furthermore be understood as creation ex nihilo (as opposed to a creation out of some pre-existent matter). As Harry Wolfson has shown, Saadya bases his four proofs for the createdness of the world on Islamic Kalâm traditions (see Wolfson, 1943).

Providing details of Saadya's arguments for creation ex nihilo is less interesting for our current purposes than making some observations about Saadya's sensibilities about reason and revelation in these discussions. In the case of creation as well as the case of God's unity, Saadya sees demonstration by reason as a cornerstone of belief. At least in the case of some religious beliefs, reason alone arrives at the ideas in question, and, furthermore, can prove that they are true. It is worth noting in this regard a potential contrast with some of the other chapters in the Amânât (such as chapters 6 and 7 on soul and resurrection respectively) which start with the phrase “Our Lord has informed us that...” Might this suggest that, for Saadya, the analysis of certain religious topics is predicated on a somewhat different methodological perspective on the role of reason? However we answer this question, it is at least true that for Saadya, in the case of creation, reason is able to prove the religious idea of an external, ex nihilo createdness. And so, Saadya speaks here of the thesis which “we seek to establish” (49), and ends the section with the description of “having thus succeeded in demonstrating by argument [the doctrine of creation ex nihilo]...” (62). This established, though, he then goes on to add “ it has been verified by the Tradition of the Prophets and by miracles...” (62). The role of revelation in Saadya's thought is always present. In addition to supplementing each demonstration with a supporting text from either the Bible or the Talmud (the written Rabbinic tradition), he ends his exercise in reason with reference to tradition, prophets, and miracles.

Following upon this delicate interplay of reason and revelation, it is interesting to note how the proofs for creation come up again in Saadya's treatment of resurrection. While the reasons Saadya gives for believing in the truth of resurrection have primarily to do with the reliability of Tradition, Saadya additionally invokes his reason-based proofs of creation ex nihilo to support the at least prima facie reasonabless of such beliefs. Speaking against the critic who finds the very idea of God's rejuvenating the dead philosophically untenable, Saadya stresses that resurrection is not “rejected by reason because the second creation of a thing which was already in existence and became dissolved, is more acceptable to reason than the creation ex nihilo” (158). Since the idea of something's being created ex nihilo is less reasonable than the idea of its being re-created, and since the idea of creation ex nihilo has already been proven true by reason, therefore, a fortiori, surely belief in resurrection is at least reasonable. Here, Saadya's proof for creation ex nihilo emerges in the service of his belief in resurrection.

Preceeding the discussion of resurrection, and following a few chapters after his analyses of creation, Saadya addresses the nature of soul. Although rejecting Plato's creation view, Saadya rests his own theory of soul upon a Platonic tripartite psychology. And so, after rejecting a number of other views of soul, Saadya describes the soul's three faculties as “the faculty of discernment, the faculty of appetite, and the faculty of courage” (147). Of course, to this Platonic foundation, he adds a number of Tradition-rooted descriptions of soul as well. In fact, even before any philosophical consideration of the nature of soul, Saadya begins his discussion with a quote from Zechariah 12:1 about God's forming “the spirit of man within him.” Also before any philosophical considerations, Saadya — following on this opening Scriptural text — speaks of God's “set[ting] a time-limit to the combined existence of body and soul” (141), to His “separating” body and soul at the time of death “until the time when the number of souls which His wisdom has decided to call into being is completed” (141), and to the time when “He re-unites [souls] with their respective bodies and metes out their reward” (141). Scriptural citations coupled with doctrines of resurrection and final judgement set the stage for Saadya's discourse on the nature of soul, leading us once again to consider the delicate interplay of reason and revelation in the pages of his thought. This interplay can be further seen in Saadya's own Plato-plus-Tradition understanding of soul. In addition to coupling Platonic tripartite psychology with Jewish beliefs about resurrection, Saadya actually links each of Plato's three discrete soul-fuctions to three discrete Hebrew terms for “soul” found in Scriptures (nefesh as corresponding to the appetitive function, ruah as corresponding to the faculty of passion and courage, and neshamah in correspondence to the faculty of knowledge) (147). Saadya additionally cites the Scriptural tendency to speak of “heart and soul together” (148) in support of what he takes to be provable on empirical grounds (upon which he elaborates), viz. that “the soul is in the heart of man” (148).


Cited Works

  • Saadya, Amânât wal-i‘tiqâdât (The Book of Doctrines and Beliefs), Edition translated by Alexander Altmann in Lewy, H., Altmann, A. and Heinemann, I. Eds., Three Jewish Philosophers. New York: Atheneum, 1985.
  • Saadya, Perush Sefer Yezira, edited by J. Kafih. Jerusalem, 1972.
  • Altmann, Alexander. “Saadya's Theory of revelation:  Its Origin and Background,” in Studies in Religious Philosophy and Mysticism by Alexander Altmann. Ithaca:  Cornell University Press, 1969.
  • Wolfson, Harry Austryn. “The Kalam Arguments for Creation in Saadia, Averroes, Maimonides and St. Thomas,” reprinted in Saadia Anniversary Volume (American Academy for Jewish Research), pp. 198 - 245. New York, 1943.

Primary Sources

  • Amânât wal-i‘tiqâdât (The Book of Doctrines and Beliefs)
    (a) Edition translated by Alexander Altmann in Lewy, H., Altmann, A. and Heinemann, I. Eds., Three Jewish Philosophers. New York: Atheneum, 1985.
    [This is an abridged English translation with notes; this version of Altmann's translation of Saadya's Amânât is also available in a volume by Hackett Publishing Company.]
    (b) Edition translated by Samuel Rosenblatt. Saadia Gaon, The Book of Beliefs and Opinions . New Haven: Yale University Press, 1948.
    [This is a complete English translation based on the Arabic and the Hebrew, and contains some useful indices.]
    (c) Edition edited by L. Landauer. Leiden, 1880.
    [Arabic text (in Arabic characters).]
    (d) Edition edited by J. Kafih. Jerusalem, 1970.
    [Arabic text (in Hebrew characters) with Hebrew translation).]
  • Tafsîr Kitâb al-Mabâdî (Commentary on the Book of Creation)
    (a) Perush Sefer Yezira, edited by J. Kafih. Jerusalem, 1972.
    [Arabic text (in Hebrew characters) with Hebrew translation.]
    (b) Commentaire sur le Sefer Yesira par le Gaon Saadya, edited by M. Lambert. Paris, 1891.
    [Arabic text (in Arabic characters) with French translation.]
  • Les Ouvres complètes de Saadia b. Josef al Fayyoumi. Ed. J. and H. Derenbourh. Paris, 1893 —.
    [5 volumes of Biblical commentaries; contrary to the name of the series, it is not the complete set of Saadya's Biblical commentaries; originally planned as a 13 volume set, only volumes 1, 3, 5, 6 and 9 were compiled.] [The Arabic texts (in Hebrew characters) with Hebrew translations are available for the Song of Songs, Ruth, Ecclesiastes, Esther, Lamentations, Psalms, Job, and Proverbs in various Jerusalem published editions by J. Kafih, ranging from 1962 to 1976).]
  • Saadia's Polemic Against Hiwi al-Balkhî, edited by I. Davidson. New York, 1915.
    [Saadya's polemic against Karaism.]

Secondary Sources (in English)

  • Altmann, Alexander. “Saadya's Theory of Revelation:  Its Origin and Background,” in Studies in Religious Philosophy and Mysticism by Alexander Altmann. Ithaca:  Cornell University Press, 1969.
  • Altmann, Alexander. “Saadya's Conception of the Law”. BJRL 28 (1944): 320-9.
  • Ben-Shammai, Haggai. “Saadya's Goal in his Commentary on Sefer Yetzirah,” in Ruth Link-Salinger, Ed., A Straight Path, Studies in Medieval Philosophy and Culture, pp. 1 - 10.  Washington, D.C.:  The Catholic University Press, 1988.
  • Cohen, B. (ed.) Saadia Anniversary Volume. PAAJR, 1943.
  • Efros, I. “Saadya's Theory of Knowledge”. JQR 33 (1942-3): 133-70.
  • Efros, I. “Saadya's Second Theory of Creation in its Relation to Pythagorism and Platonism”. In Louis Ginzberg Jubilee Volume, New York, 1945, pp. 133-42 (English section)
  • Heschel, A. J. “The Quest for Certainty in Saadia's Philosophy”. JQR 33 (1942-3): 213-64.
  • Malter, H. Saadia Gaon; His Life and Works. New York, 1929.
  • Finkelstein, L (ed.) Rav Saadia Gaon; Studies in his honor. New York: Jewish Theological Seminary, 1944.
  • Rosenthal, E.I.J. (ed.) Saadya Studies. Manchester, 1943.
  • Sirat, Colette. s.v. Saadiah Gaon, in her A History of Jewish Philosophy in the Middle Ages, Cambridge University Press, 1985, pp. 18-37, and 416-18.
  • Pines, S. “Points of Similarity between the exposition of the doctrine of the Sefirot in the Sefer Yezira and a Text of the Pseudo-Clementine Homilies: The implications of this resemblance,” Proceedings of the Israel Academy of Sciences and Humanities, VII (3) (1989): 63-141.
  • Wolfson, H. A. “The Kalam Arguments for Creation in Saadia, Averroes, Maimonides and St. Thomas,” reprinted in Saadia Anniversary Volume (American Academy for Jewish Research). New York, 1943, pp. 198 - 245.
  • Wolfson, H. A. “The Kalam Problem of Nonexistence and Saadia's Second Theory of Creation”. In his Studies in the History of Philosophy and Religion, vol. II, Cambridge (Mass.), 1977, pp. 338-58.

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