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Gerhard (Gershom) Scholem (1897–1982) was the preeminent modern scholar of Jewish mysticism. Of Scholem Martin Buber once remarked, “all of us have students, schools, but only Gershom Scholem has created a whole academic discipline!” His contribution lay in five distinct yet connected areas which will be detailed below: the research and analysis of kabbalistic literature spanning from late antiquity to the twentieth century; the phenomenology of mystical religion; Jewish historiography; Zionism, and the spiritual and political condition of contemporary Judaism and Jewish civilization. He published over 40 volumes and close to 700 articles almost all of which are listed in the Scholem Bibliography published in 1977. He trained at least three generations of scholars of Kabbala many of whom still teach in Israel and the Diaspora. Scholem was also part of a select group of German-Jewish intellectuals from the Weimar period who rejected their parent's assimilationist liberal lives in favor of Zionism. He immigrated to Palestine in 1923 and quickly became a central figure in the German-Jewish immigrant community that dominated the intellectual landscape in Mandate Palestine from the 1920's until the Second World War.
- 1. Biographical information
- 2. Early Work
- 3. Major Trends in Jewish Mysticism and Origins of the Kabbala
- 4. Sabbatei Zevi: Mystical Messiah and the Centrality of Messianism
- 5. Eranos and the Phenomenology of Religion
- 6. Historiography and Theology
- 7. Zionism
- 8. Contemporary Jewish Life and the Future of Jewish Civilization
- Academic Tools
- Other Internet Resources
- Related Entries
Gershom Scholem was born Gerhard Scholem in Berlin in 1897. The Scholem family had lived in Berlin since the early part of the nineteenth century. Gerhard's father Arthur was an assimilated Jew and German nationalist, quite common among middle-class Berlin Jews at that time. Arthur Scholem had a successful business as a printer and it was there Scholem first became exposed to books at a very young age. There is a story that in 1911, when Scholem had already rejected his father's politics and openly espoused Zionism, his mother bought him a portrait of Theodore Herzl as a Christmas present. Another version has it that the portrait was hung on the Christmas tree in the Scholem home. There were four boys in the Scholem family three of whom rebelled against their father's politics and Jewish identity in different ways. The eldest son Reinhold joined the staunchly nationalist Deutsche Volkspartie, the third son Werner became a communist, and Gershom became a Zionist. Having no Jewish education prior to his Zionist turn in 1911 the adolescent Scholem began learning Hebrew and studying Talmud in one of the Berlin community schools. By 1915 he was immersing himself in any kabbalistic works he could find even though he admitted understanding very little. Although Zionism brought Judaism to the center of the young Gershom's life it never really inspired religious observance although Scholem tells us in the biography of his early life From Berlin to Jerusalem that he did experiment with some form of observance while still an adolescent in Germany. Throughout his life, however, Scholem remained a committed secularist, and secularism played an important role in his rendering of Jewish history and the study of Kabbala.
The rift between Scholem and his father grew as Gershom openly criticized his father's German nationalism and bourgeois lifestyle. It reached a breaking point after a heated argument about his brother Werner's impending court-marshal for treason while serving in the Germany army. Arthur exploded and banished the young Gershom from the family home, giving him 100 German Marks for his journey. This forced Gershom to find other living arrangements in Berlin. He had already become acquainted with the young Zionist Zalman Rubashov who later became Zalman Shazar, the third president of Israel. Rubashov, claiming Scholem's banishment made him a “refugee for Zionism,” invited him to board at a rooming house on the west side of Berlin that housed numerous Eastern European Jewish immigrants one of whom was Shai Agnon. Many of the Zionists he met there were older and would subsequently have an important influence on his life especially after he immigrated to Palestine in 1923.
Inspired by his radical Zionism and utter disdain for German nationalism Scholem expressed strong opposition to the Great War (and subsequently nationalism more generally), a belief he held throughout his life and affected his Zionism later on. Unable to avoid the draft after two deferments, he entered the German army where he spent a mere two months before being discharged, labeled a “psychopath temporarily unfit for duty.” Scholem then entered The University of Berlin with an interest in studying pure mathematics which he pursued for a few semesters before deciding he did not have sufficient talent to succeed. It was around that time, in 1917, that Scholem decided to immigrate to Palestine and the rest of his education in Germany was geared toward that end. During those years (approximately 1916–1917) he met Martin Buber and, more importantly, Walter Benjamin, who would have a profound influence on Scholem's intellectual trajectory.
As was common among college youth in Germany, Scholem attended numerous universities. He ended up in Munich where he turned his attention to his dissertation. He produced a translation and annotated version of one of the first kabbalistic books Sefer ha-Bahir (the Book of Illumination), successfully defending his dissertation in January 1922 and graduating summa cum laude. After graduation Scholem put all his energy into his immigration and in mid-September 1923 set off for Palestine without any concrete plans as to how he would support himself.
Soon after his arrival he was offered a position as librarian of the “Hebrew Section” of the newly founded National Library connected with what would become the Hebrew University in Jerusalem. It was in that position that Scholem began collecting and cataloging the hundreds of kabbalistic manuscripts that few had interest in and fewer could read. His career began at that moment even though he was not appointed to a faculty position until some time later. Once he received his faculty appointment, he remained at the Hebrew University until his death in 1982.
Scholem's early work consists of two main areas of research. From 1921 (while still in Germany) until around 1936 Scholem spent untold hours collecting and analyzing every kabbalistic manuscript he could locate. This required traveling to various libraries in Europe. Once he arrived in Palestine he concentrated on the growing collection of Hebrew manuscripts located at the new National Library. This taxing, arduous, and tedious work created a data base for Scholem that would serve his entire career. During this same period he undertook a series of highly critical reviews and essays on previous scholars who dealt with Kabbala, most of which were published in the German-Jewish journal Der Jude and some in Hebrew Keriat Sefer a journal of Jewish Bibliography centered in Jerusalem. These early book reviews constitute an important — and often overlooked—part of Scholem's career. It is here that he distinguishes himself from his predecessors and develops the beginning of his historiographical approach that would only emerge in the next period of his research. His dissertation Das Buch Bahir was published in Leipzig in1923. His first major publications after his dissertation were Kitvei Yad ha-Kabbala, 1930; Perakim le-Toldot sifrut ha-Kabbala,1931; and Bibliographia Kabbalistica, 1927, all bibliographical works examining his discoveries. In addition he published more theoretical studies such as “Kabbalat R. Ya'akov ve-R. Yizhak [ha-Cohen],” 1927; “Ha-Mekubal R. Avraham b. Eliezer ha-Levi” 1925, 26 and “Die Theologie des Sabbatianismus im Lichte Abraham Cardosos” in 1928. Parts of these studies would appear later in more expanded works dealing with various kabbalistic periods. In short, Scholem began his publishing career by first absorbing the entire scope of the history of Kabbala and then slowly putting it together from the earliest period until the latest (Hasidism).
It is not without irony that Scholem's most celebrated works were written in German or Hebrew yet his most popular and arguably most influential work Major Trends in Jewish Mysticism was written in English at a time when most scholarship in Judaica was still being written in German. By the end of the 1930's Scholem was already hard at work on Sabbateanism which would result in a major book (two volumes in Hebrew, one large volume in English) entitled Sabbatei Zevi: Mystical Messiah. A preliminary study on Sabbatean antinomianism “Redemption through Sin” was published in 1936 and then appeared in English in 1970. During that time, in the late 1930's, Scholem received an invitation from the Jewish Institute of Religion in New York City to deliver a series of lectures on Jewish Mysticism. He accepted the invitation and wrote the lectures in English (a first for him). These lectures were subsequently published as Major Trends in Jewish Mysticism in 1941. This work was a watershed for the entire field of Kabbala studies and Jewish Studies more generally. For the first time he offered a synoptic yet detailed presentation of the entire history of Kabbala beginning with the German Rhineland pietists (Hasidei Ashkenaz) from the 12th century until Hasidism in the 18th and 19th centuries. In this work Scholem presents his theory of the authorship and construction of the Zohar, one of the first programmatic studies of the enigmatic kabbalist Abraham Abulafia, and offers the first glimpses of his own historiography. Moreover, the last page of Major Trends presents a few parenthetical observations about the “possibility for Jewish mysticism today” that would occupy a number of essays later in his career. His historiographical musings in Major Trends are important because it is here we are presented with Scholem's dialectical approach to history and his claim, for example, that Lurianic Kabbala with its intense focus on creation as rupture and catastrophe was a response to the Jewish expulsion from Spain in 1492. This suggests that kabbalistic circles were using metaphysics to reify historical reality, which led Scholem to coin the term “historiosophy” to describe his understanding of history and metaphysics. It also offers another first glimpse of his work on Sabbateansim which Scholem claimed was a heretical but not necessary deviant form of Jewish mysticism. By that I mean that even fairly early in his career Scholem held that Kabbala is a theology that requires a normative law (tradition) — largely as a foil — but is always in dialectical tension with that law. The fact that antinomianism rose to the surface in the Sabbatean movement, breaking the normative tradition through its combination of messianism and mysticism, should not be seen as an aberration as much as a tragic inevitability. This Sabbatean heresy, argued Scholem, did not end with the failure of the movement but influenced, and even set the conditions for, Jewish modernity. His speculations about possible influences between Sabbatean and Reform Judaism in Hungary were duly criticized by Jacob Katz for lack of historical evidence. However, the more theoretical and structural point about Kabbala more generally and Sabbateanism in particular as being in tension with normative Jewish law (halakha) and the ways that Sabbateanism may have (indirectly) informed early Reform which rejected halakha outright is a topic worthy of further thought even though it may be historically unprovable. While direct links between Sabbateans and Reformers have not been definitively unearthed, the geographical proximity of Sabbateans and early Reformers in Hungary and the extent to which Sabbateans functioned in clandestine ways is curious.
One of the great merits of Major Trends, and why it has been as influential as it has, is that all the “trends” included therein are set side by side to give one a sense that there is a definite trajectory to mystical Judaisms even if that trajectory does not follow a straight line. The descriptive part of the book begins (in Chapter 2) with hekhalot mysticism and other pre-rabbinic and rabbinic mysticisms that appear in such apocryphal works as the Book of Enoch, including angelology and magic. It then moves on to the the Rhineland German pietists, Abraham Abulafia and only then reaches the textus classicus of medieval Kabbala, the Zohar. What are conspicuous in their absence are Sefer Yezeria (the Book of Creation) and Sefer ha-Bahir (the Book of Illumination). These omissions are intentional. This work is intended to discuss major trends in Jewish mysticism and not major trends in Kabbala. The distinction is an important one for Scholem. He devotes another work called the Origins of the Kabbala (that appears in different versions in German, Hebrew, and English) where he presents a detailed analysis of the emergence of Kabbala beginning with the Bahir and the Provencal circle, and maturing in Castile and Gerona in the two centuries immediately preceding the appearance of the Zohar in Guadalajara Spain at the end of the 13th century. The first chapter of Major Trends offers us one of Scholem's earliest lengthy statements on the phenomenology of mysticism that is expanded later in his lectures at the Eranos conferences and published in the 1960's. It is here Scholem tries to define “mysticism” (he admits he is unsuccessful in doing so) and it is here he reveals some of the people he values as preceding him in this endeavor (both Jewish and Christian scholars of Kabbala). This first chapter is an important part of Scholem's early move to expand beyond the formal study of Kabbala into the area of philosophy of religion.
Scholem is convinced that Kabbala is a medieval phenomenon. That is, while there are important works of Jewish mysticism composed before the Middle Ages, the metaphysics and cosmology we know as Kabbala emerges as a reaction against the rationalism of medieval Jewish philosophy that posits a distant and unapproachable God in line with the Aristotelian and Platonic (and Neoplatonic) schools. These kabbalists, while protesting such rationalism, were themselves very influenced by two dominant trends: Gnosticism and Neo-Platonism. In his Origins, Scholem traces both Gnostic and Neoplatonic influences on these early kabbalistic thinkers, viewing them as deeply embedded in their medieval context. Kabbala in this period emerged in three locales: Provence, Castile, and Gerona and included prominent rabbinic figures, most importantly Moses Nahmanides. Origins of the Kabbala begins with an analysis of the Book Bahir (taken largely from his doctoral thesis) a work Scholem claims emerges from a circle of mystics led by the enigmatic Isaac the Blind in Provence although he suggests some strata of this enigmatic work may originate in some unknown Jewish Gnostic groups. For Scholem, the Bahir is the first book of Kabbala. When we move to Castile and Gerona, Kabbala becomes more actively engaged in posing an alternative theology to rationalist philosophy. Scholem maintains that the Gerona school was not an independent entitiy but more of an extension of the earlier Provencal circle that produced the Bahir. This polemic (between philosophers and kabbalists and between Talmudists and kabbalists) continued until the end of the sixteenth century when Kabbala won the hearts and minds of many Jews after the Spanish expulsion in 1492 and the forced conversions and expulsions in Portugal in 1496. Scholem argued this was in large part due to two factors: First, that philosophy too easily justified bogus Jewish conversion, that is, the choice to internalize Judaism and abandon outward ritual; and more importantly, that philosophy could not offer solace for the historical crisis of the expulsion. After the expulsion Kabbala moves from the periphery to become the default theology of Judaism. It is in these polemical centuries, however, that Kabbala develops its most important features that become the foundation of all subsequent Kabbala. One is its emanationist theory of creation and the descent of divine effluence into the world. Another is its elaborate version of ta'amei ha-mitzvot or reasons for the commandments (a discipline initiated in its medieval form by the most famous Jewish rationalist Moses Maimonides). Unlike many earlier pre-kabbalistic mysticisms, this inextricably connects mystical doctrine to Jewish law and ritual. A classic example of this is Ezra of Gerona's Ta'amei ha-Mitzvot printed erroneously in the name of Nahmanides. Another is the beginning of kabbalistic exegesis of Scripture. Bahya ben Asher of Saragossa's kabbalistic commentary is a classical example of this phenomenon in the pre-zoharic period that is expanded and deepened later in the Zohar and its commentaries. Yet another is the proliferation of mystical commentaries on prayer that first emerge in the Provencal fraternities of Isaac the Blind. Finally in this period we see the first systematic cosmologies that become templates for later kabbalistic doctrine. One example would be Azriel of Gerona's Sefer Esser Sephirot. I will discuss the historiographic issues implicit in these two works in another section. Suffice it to say that given the many publications of Scholem in this middle period of his career, Major Trends in Jewish Mysticism and Origins of the Kabbala stand out as the most important and influential.
For Scholem Jewish messianism and Sabbateanism are intimately connected. This is not because Sabbateanism is the only form of Jewish messianism but because Sabbateanism represents, for him, the quintessence of the tension between tradition and its self-destruction that lies at the root of all forms of Jewish messianism reaching back to the Hebrew Bible. This idea came to Scholem very early in his career, decades before he even began serious work on his magisterial Sabbatai Zevi: Mystical Messiah. He was first made aware of Sabbateanism by his friend Zalman Rubashov probably between 1916–1918, but he didn't begin research on the movement until 1927 and published his first article on the Marrano Sabbatean Abraham Miquel Cardozo “Die Theologie des Sabbatianismus im Lichte Abraham Cardosos” in 1928. This was followed by the more important theoretical study “Redemption though Sin” published in 1936. In this essay Scholem posits what would become his central claim about messianism and tradition. First, that there are essentially two kinds of messianism; restorative and utopian-catastrophic. Both of these are manifest in the singular movement of Sabbateansism. The restorative model envisioned the messianic as a return to an older era (i.e., the Davidic kingdom) that was revolutionary but only within the confines of the tradition. The utopian-catastrophic model (Scholem also calls it apocalyptic) envisions a rupture of tradition and the inauguration of an entirely new era. While these models existed before Sabbateansim, the restorative model in the Maimonidean messianism and the utopian model in the messianic theology of the anonymous 14th century Sefer Temunah and later apocalyptic mystics such as David Reuveni, only in Sabbateanism do they both emerge fully as “dark forces” that affect, and threaten, the entire Jewish nation. Moreover, once these forces are unleashed — especially in a traditional world whose authority had already been weakened — they can never again be totally suppressed, even though the formal Sabbatean movement loses much of its direct influence by the 18th century either through attrition or religious conservatism. That is, for Scholem, Sabbateanism is such an important topic precisely because it re-directs Jewish history by exposing the underside of Jewish mysticism, Judaism's “counter-history,” in a way that creates the conditions for Jewish modernity, including Zionism. In this sense, Sabbateanism is the lynchpin to Scholem's entire intellectual project.
The Sabbatean heresy did not emerge in a vacuum. There are many theories about why it became as popular as it did. Scholem's general approach is that while Kabbala, like all intellectual constructs, reacts to history, it is the esoteric trends that are often the most potent forces needed to unleash innovation, which is often deemed heretical (at least at the outset). Thus the roots of Sabbateanism were not the impoverished or oppressed state of the Jews (although these factors may have played a role) but the dominance of Lurianic Kabbala born in mid-16th century Safed. Scholem notes that the messianic in Lurianism was not apocalyptic and may even have been a conservative protest again utopian messianists like Reuveni a generation earlier. Lurianism offered a gradual progressive messianism of tikkun or the reparation of the broken cosmos built on the foundations of its theory of creation as rupture and exile. Yet Lurianism also rose at a time (a generation after the Spanish expulsion) when Jews were in need of a new theology to justify their new reality. The fact that the Ottoman Sultan Bayazid II invited Jews to re-settle Erez Israel after 1516 and the fact that Lurianic Kabbala arose in Safed, one of the four holy cites according to tradition (the others are Jerusalem, Hebron, and Tiberias) gave added heft to its messianic teachings. In short, according to Scholem, with Lurianic Kabbala, Kabbala emerged from its subterranean — and largely conservative—existence (or at least without a formidable competitor) and set the stage for the antinomian counter-traditional dimensions of Kabbala to erupt and gain popular attention. There are at least three factors that contributed to Lurianism's success and subsequently the success of Sabbateanism: (1) the weakening of rabbinic authority in the sixteenth-century (even considering that the same locale and same decades gave us the Shulkhan Arukh); (2) the lack of any viable ideological competitor with the demise of philosophy after the expulsion; and (3)Luria's comprehensive and compelling myth coupled with the positive historical development of the first systematic, albeit slow, re-settlement of Jews in Erez Israel since the early Middle Ages.
What Lurianism did not offer was a charismatic messianic figure to finalize its messianic vision. Here is where Sabbateanism found its role. Scholem notes that Nathan of Gaza, Sabbatai Zevi's prophet and spokesperson, largely nullified the need for continued Lurianic practice once the “messiah” was revealed. Not unlike Paul's view of the law, for Nathan once the messiah arrived one's faith must now be focused on his role in finalizing the process. In fact, culminating the process required the messiah to break the law in order to redeem his people, thus opening the “counter-historical” notion of antinomianism that lay dormant in so much of mystical Jewish doctrine.
After Sabbatai Zevi's decision, under duress, to convert to Islam and remain under the protection of the Sultan (where he died a decade later) his disciples split into “moderate” and “radical” camps. The moderates held that they should remain Jews, even observant ones, and keep their faith in Sabbatai Zevi as a secret doctrine. The “radicals” held they must imitate their master and thus convert to Islam to continue the redemptive process. Included in this radical camp was Jacob Frank (1726–1791) (about whom Scholem had little to say) who, with most of his disciples, converted to Catholicism in 1759. The radicals did not present much of a problem for the Jews as they disappeared from the community. The moderates, however, presented a grave problem and inspired a whole industry of Sabbatean hunting that extended into the 19th century. The point in all this, according to Scholem, is that Sabbateanism destroyed Jewish tradition from within a century before the Enlightenment, and may have even brought the latter into existence.
In the year 1933, on the suggestion of Rudolph Otto, the Dutch heiress Olga Froebe-Kapteyn initiated an annual conference on her estate near Ascona, Switzerland that became known as the Eranos Conference. The goal of this gathering was to bring together scholars of different religious traditions to discuss themes related to religion and spirituality. Scholem attended many of these conferences, presented numerous papers, and took part in the larger ecumenical discussions. In the years Scholem attended, Carl Jung was a central figure and many of the themes in the conferences reflected Jung's particular interest in religious symbolism and mythology. Other important figures included Mircea Eliade, Henri Corbin, Karl Lowith, Gerhard van der Leeuw, Erich Newmann, and Paul Tillich. This conference proved to be an important outlet for Scholem to move beyond his more parochial studies in Israel and explore the areas of comparative religion and phenomenology that interested him in his youth. It also enabled him to return to a more cosmopolitan European and international setting and present his more specific Hebraic research to a new audience. Scholem published some of these essays in the conference's annual proceedings, the Eranos Yearbook, and some in German and English journals. Other essays from Eranos appeared in a six-volume collection entitled Judaica published in Germany between 1963–1997. The best collection of some of these articles in English appears in On the Kabbalah and its Symbolism, 1965. In particular “Religious Authority and Mysticism,” “Kabbalah and Myth,” and “Tradition and New Creation in the Ritual of the Kabbalists” represent Scholem's attempt to present his research to a non-specialist yet educated audience of scholars of religion and psychology. While some of his students claim that these essays do not make up an essential part of Scholem's oeuvre, others claim that, in fact, these are some of the richest and perhaps the most provocative dimensions of Scholem's intellectual project. Combined with other essays such as “Tradition and Revelation as Religious Categories in Judaism” these essays address larger questions of philosophy and phenomenology of religion as they relate to Kabbala that are not dealt with in his more technical Hebrew essays. When later scholars reflect on the intellectual trajectory of Scholem's project, these essays prove indispensable. Moreover, the relationships he cultivated from attending these conferences expanded his own thinking and, by extension, his reconstruction of the history of Kabbala.
Early on Scholem became committed to critical historical scholarship as a mode of not only understanding the past but reconstructing the present. That is, history and philology were, for him, the only basis for any legitimate Jewish theology in a world that could no longer support authentic mysticism. While he did write theological essays, one could argue that his historical/philological essays also had a theological foundation. Scholem grew up in a world (Weimar Germany and then Mandate Palestine) that was rife with intellectual activity all focused on the reconstruction of Jewish life and culture around Zionism. The Hebrew University (which began as an “Institute for Jewish Studies” in 1924) where he taught, was expressly created for that purpose. Scholem's historical work emerged as a critique of two distinct movements.
The first was the Wissenschaft des Judentums (the Science of Judaism), led by the 19th century Jewish historians Leopold Zunz, Moritz Steinschneider, and Henrich Graetz. These historians reconstructed Jewish history for a newly emancipated western European Jewish community placing special emphasis on normative rabbinic literature and culture (Talmud and Midrash) and the medieval rationalist tradition as the backbone of Judaism. They ignored or disparaged all forms of mysticism and Kabbala, claiming it to be an outdated and dark part of the Jewish past. Scholem's entire re-construction of Kabbala (and by extension of Judaism) would be an unrelenting battle against them. As he wrote in a 1944 essay “Modern Jewish Studies” “In brief: the stones that were rejected by the builders [the Science of Judaism] will become the cornerstone.” Scholem referred to their rejection of Kabbala as the “origin sin” of the Science of Judaism from which everything else was merely an extension. This sentiment was reiterated in a 1962 essay “What Others Rejected: Kabbala and Historical Criticism” delivered upon receiving one of the Rothschild Prizes. While Scholem claimed laconically that the exilic and thus apologetic mentality that tainted the Science of Judaism's historical project was not, in fact, rectified with the new national and sovereign consciousness he also acknowledged that nationalism (one form of Zionism) presented its own distorting lenses even as it corrected some mistakes of the past.
Second, in the early decades of the 20th century the philosophies of Hermann Cohen and Martin Buber — the former a neo-Kantian rationalist, the latter a romantic existentialist—were immensely popular. Scholem rejected both grand schemes in favor of careful historical analysis of the regnant literary sources of Judaism. In addition, in response to Adolph von Harnack's influential The Essence of Christianity (Harnack argued, among other things, that Christianity was rooted in Gnosticism and thus needn't be dependent on any Jewish sources damaging the very idea of a German Jewish culture) theologians such as Leo Baeck argued for an ‘essence’ of Judaism to counter Harnack's position that Judaism was irrelevant and illegitimate for Christianity. Buber and Scholem both rejected the notion of an essence of Judaism yet both differed on the alternative. Buber focused on the notion of Erlebnis, or intuitive experience, as the anchor of a human's relationship to God via revelation (or relation). That is, for Buber, experience was a meta-lingual phenomenon and thus language was inferior to pure experience. For Buber, then, there is no essence of Judaism but there may be an essence of religious experience that transcends language and thus particularity. Scholem rejected this and argued that Judaism can only be renewed through the historical consciousness of Erfahrung or concrete historical experience. This kind of experience is mediated through language, specifically, the language of the textual tradition. Influenced by Walter Benjamin's early theory of language, Scholem argued that language was of “divine origin” (however this is understood) and thus the experience of revelation was itself linguistic. For Scholem, therefore, there is no essential religious experience as all human experience is mediated through language and thus particular to a cultural and linguistic context. He also held there was no essence of Judaism if by that we mean some core sets of values that can be exhibited in all forms of Jewish literature.
For him Judaism is, according to one close reader of Scholem “an anarchistic plurality of sources.” Thus the best way to understand Judaism is through the philological and historical analysis of those sources without any pre-conceived vision of a grand narrative that unites them. Scholem's position against the Essentialist school surfaces in the first chapter of Major Trends where he struggles to define the mystical experience. It surfaces again in the 1960's and 1970's in light of the nature of language in “On the Name of God and Linguistic Theory in Kabbala.” The “Name of God” essay was a topic Scholem first expressed interest in writing in the early 1920's until he realized he did not have sufficient knowledge of Kabbala to do so. The essay was published in two parts in 1972. In Major Trends he navigates a position between the essentialists and the pure constructivist position. It should be noted that even given Scholem's dependence on language, he does not advocate a pure constructivist position on the nature of experience. That is, he does not argue there is simply no meaning whatsoever to experience outside of language or that there is no experience outside of language. Language for Scholem is a vehicle for understanding experience but whether it is, in fact, the very origin of experience is something Scholem never definitively argues and remains a issue of debate among Scholem's interpreters.
The historiographical dimension of Scholem's reconstruction of Judaism is perhaps his most contested thesis. He offers a kind of Hegelian position. In brief it unfolds as follows: The biblical period is where Judaism struggles to free itself of pure myth and, while partially successful, never quite severs itself from the mythic world of its surroundings. This period is followed by the rabbinic period of late antiquity introducing the institutional period of the Jewish religion. The rabbis suppressed myth, magic, and cult in favor of a normalized legal system that rationalized biblical mythic motifs and presented a God who, while not impersonal, was more distant from human experience than in the biblical period which was centered on prophecy. The Jewish Middle Ages began with Judaism's absorption of Hellenistic/rational culture and produced a God even more distant than the rabbinic God. Moreover, in this period while law remained obligatory it was challenged by reason as the sine qua non of the religious life. Myth moves from a sate of suppression to being outright rejected. It is here, Scholem posits, that Kabbala enters. In part a reaction against medieval rationalism (curiously not unlike Scholem's rejection of the Enlightenment rationalism of the Science of Judaism) Kabbala emerges in part to revive the biblical myth and also offer myths of its own born from a reification of rabbinic Midrash into a mystical cosmology. In Hegelian fashion, this mystical period then results in a renewal of rationalism in the Enlightenment where mysticism moves underground again (it is rejected by the proponents of the Science of Judaism) to be followed by its resurgence in yet another period of Jewish self-assertion and its re-connection to land and power in Zionism. This dialectical approach has been duly criticized as “too neat” ignoring the messy edges of any historical epoch. For example, some have argued that Scholem intentionally downplays the mythic components in rabbinic Judaism and the ways in which early kabbalists also fashioned themselves as philosophers. For example, the ecstatic mystic Abraham Abulafia wrote commentaries to Maimonides' rational work and did not consider his own project as contradictory to Maimonides. The critique continues that Scholem favored the more “mythic” kabbalistic schools such as the Rhineland pietists, the Zohar, Luria, Sabbatai Zevi, and Hasidism because they serve his purpose and viewed those who do not as not central to the historical trajectory of Kabbala.
One of the vexing questions in Scholem's historiographical rendering of Kabbala is the place of myth in medieval kabbalistic literature. On the one hand, Scholem seems to prefer symbol over myth when discussing Kabbala, suggesting that Kabbala's reification of the biblical narrative does not yield a mythic drama, including a cadre of mythic figures, but rather a series of symbolic clusters or hypostatic forms that are identified through the prism of the personalities in the Hebrew Bible. On the other hand, in numerous places Scholem suggests Kabbala re-introduces myth into the Jewish discourse as a critique of Judaism's rational expositors. Critics have suggested Scholem underestimated the mythic nature of theosophic Kabbala (the Zohar and its interpreters) and was too invested in notions of symbolism that were common in his time (e.g. Jung, Riceour, Eliade). In any event, the question of myth verses symbol in Kabbala remains an important issue to be examined by Scholem's readers and future scholars. One important consequence of this question is whether one defines Scholem's dialectical historiography as Hegelian or psychoanalytic. If we say myth yields to symbolism in Kabbala, Kabbala's new Jewish theology would better fit into the Hegelian mode as an antithesis to medieval rationalism. If we say myth dominates symbol in Kabbala, we could argue for a case of the Freudian “return of the repressed” where the ancient Israelite myth repressed by rabbinic institutionalization and medieval rationalism returns to undermine both, even as it ostensibly remains wedded to the orthodoxy rabbinic Judaism provides.
In any case, it is hard to know exactly how seriously Scholem intended us to take his dialectical historiography or whether, in fact, it served more as a heuristic tool to enable us to see a sweeping picture that subsequent generations could revise. It is also worth considering how much the warp and woof of the messianic and antinomian that underlies much of Scholem's historiography of Kabbala is born from, and serves, his Zionism, In an interview a short time before his death he admitted that he believed his work was already “dated” and thus, I assume, in need of revision and revaluation. Given the waning belief in grand narratives, Scholem's historiography has met sharp criticism yet there is little doubt its main features have thus far stood the test of time.
A second component that accompanies Scholem's dialectic of myth, rationalism, and mysticism is his theory of esotericism. Committed to the notion that social and cultural change are driven by ideas more than events, Scholem adds that the ideas that often have the most profound impact are esoteric ones that are suppressed yet surface when certain historical conditions arise. This serves as one of his main criticisms of Wissenschaft des Judentums, that is, that the presentation of Judaism without its esoteric components is not only bad history but misunderstands the main forces that drive change in Jewish life and ideas. One scholar termed this Scholem's “counter-history.” For Scholem Judaism's ostensible anchor, tradition, is always in danger of undermining itself because it contains the seeds of its own demise in the form of esotericism, mysticism, and myth. As history unfolds, it often adjusts and survives its own inner challenge but other times, as in Sabbateanism, it does so only by a combination of draconian means (this often backfires) or by exercising its own elasticity to absorb the heretical and thereby make it normative.
For Scholem, the one case where tradition may not have been able to recover is modernity. For him modernity, and the secular, undermines the central pillar of tradition, its belief in the divine nature of Scripture. Once this goes, he posits, in some way the dialectic is broken in that mysticism needs tradition as its foil in order to survive. The shattered ideational foundation of Jewish identity in modernity can only be replaced with something that is heretical, messianic, and secular: that is, Zionism. One scholar refers to this as Scholem's “creative anarchy.” In his famous last comments on the last page of Major Trends Scholem acknowledges that modernity destroyed the conditions for mysticism as we knew it historically but he acknowledges it could indeed rise in a different guise in the future. This all seems to embody Scholem's own identification as a “religious anarchist.” He may mean numerous things by this enigmatic assertion. He may mean that he believes, as mentioned above, that Judaism has no essence but is only a series of connected yet not always coherent textual traditions and sets of ideas. He may also mean that he believes controlled anarchy as the demise of any heteronomous authority sets the proper conditions for the discovery of suppressed esoteric trends in a society. As he believes these trends are crucial to understanding any culture, he supports religious anarchy to the extent that it enables “the professor” of Jewish mysticism to do his (or her) work. In this second case, anarchy appears synonymous with secularity.
As mentioned, Scholem became a Zionist in 1911 when he was 14 years old. In many ways, and like many in his generation and locale, his Zionism was one of protest against the bourgeois lifestyle and assimilated Jewish identity of his parents. In his native Germany Herzl's political Zionism was dominant but Scholem soon met Eastern European immigrants and became exposed to the spiritual and cultural Zionism of Ahad ha-Am. He became involved in the Zionist youth movement Blau Weiss (but later spoke out critically against it) and was strongly influenced by the charismatic Martin Buber who was a leader among the Zionist youth in Germany at that time. He committed to immigrating to Palestine quite early in his life, to some extent motivated by the banishment from his home the fact that he was young, still unmarried, and had few financial obligations. In any case, once he arrived in Palestine he quickly became part of the German immigrant intellegencia, some of whom had formed a group called Brit Shalom dedicated to the creation of a Jewish-Arab binational state. Some in the group were committed radicals and liberals and others, like Scholem, were more pragmatic in their approach, although he also viewed binationalism as a moral obligation. In either case, almost all the members of Brit Shalom came from Germany (or spent time there) and, having experienced the Great War, had a bitter disdain for nationalism in general. They all saw the dangers of ethnocentric nationalism from their German past and all, as Zionists, wanted to deter any Jewish state from repeating those errors.
Scholem's active participation in Brit Shalom was fairly short-lived. He soured on the idea after the 1929 Hebron riots where Palestinian Arabs marauders attacked and killed Jewish civilians. This massacre, which was a watershed event for many on the Jewish left at that time, gave Scholem pause at to whether any true co-existence could be possible. However, as late as 1937, in a letter to Walter Benjamin, his life-long friend who never accepted Zionism, Scholem wrote against partition (of separate Jewish and Arab states) and upheld his belief in binationalism as the “moral ideal solution.” After the Holocaust Scholem's belief in binationalism eroded even more, even though he never abandoned a belief that, given other circumstances, it was the best option. In a letter in 1972 he admitted Brit Shalom had mistakenly read the historical situation and that “Hitler totally changed the perspective.” As time went on Scholem became reconciled with the state, and even defended it, although be spoke vociferously against the settlements after 1967 and correctly saw the movement as a dangerous combination of messianic triumphalism and mystical optimism.
Scholars disagree as to the extent Scholem separated the two parts of his life, first as a scholar of Jewish mysticism and second as a public intellectual, particularly a Zionist. Some argue that his Zionism is reflected in his entire scholarly career while others suggest he successfully bifurcated both parts of his life. As a believer in the almost mystical power of language he maintained that the revival of the Hebrew language in Mandate Palestine/Israel was necessary to bring the esoteric components of the tradition — founded so deeply on the play of language — to the fore. He also believed that Zionism in Mandate Palestine/Israel, as a growing culture in need of a new identity, was fertile ground for a renaissance constructed from the resources of forgotten dimensions of the tradition. This is not to say he believed in some kind of neo-kabbalistic culture. He did not. Scholem remained a committed secularist throughout his life believing, I think, that secularism and secular Zionism were a crucial part of any new Jewish society. Perhaps, then, even those who maintain that Scholem's academic work is not tainted by his ideology can agree that for him Zionism, in its cultural and political manifestations, served as the necessary frame for his project of reconstructing Jewish history from the perceptive of mystical esotericism.
Throughout his career Scholem played the important role of public intellectual in Mandate Palestine/Israel. He often wrote in Israeli newspapers, magazines, was frequently interviewed in print and radio, and weighed in on a variety of political, cultural, and social issues. Many of these essays were collected in the two-volume Devarim be-Go published in 1976 and a third volume entitled ‘Od Davar published in 1989. A selection of these and other essays were published in English in Jews and Judaism in Crisis, 1976 and more recently in On the Possibility of Jewish Mysticism Today, 1997. In these volumes Scholem reflects on everything from the state of the university, general Israeli education, Israeli politics, the state of the Diaspora, and personal reflections of his own on studying Jewish mysticism. These include book reviews, short comments about his contemporaries, and letters he wrote to various colleagues and friends. One of his most well-known, and revealing, letters about his own investment in the study of Kabbala was a 1925 letter to the Israeli poet Hayyim Nahman Bialik that was published in Hebrew in Devarim be-Go and now appears in German translation. Scholem knew the importance of his stature as the founder of the modern study of Kabbala and he responded by engaging with issues of his day from that perch. He was often self-deprecating about his “popular” essays but he took them very seriously and they occupied a fair amount of his psyche and energy.
He also wrote hundreds of letters to scholars and dignitaries around the world that have recently been published in Gershom Scholem: A Life in Letters: 1914–1982. The correspondence between him and Walter Benjamin was published separately as The Correspondence of Gershom Scholem and Walter Benjamin: 1932–1940. A volume of his poetry was published as In the Fullness of Time: Poems, 2003. A new volume of his early diaries has just been published as Lamentations of Youth: the Diaries of Gershom Scholem, 1913–1919, 2008.
Coming in Israel in the 1920's when Zionism was still a revolutionary cultural project Scholem knew he was in the midst of a secular revolution whose origins, according to him, extended back to the distant esoteric past. His role was not simply to unearth but also to interpret, not only publish but to educate a generation. He was arguably the most important Jewish Studies scholar in the twentieth century and surely one of its most important and influential voices.
The hundreds of texts and personalities he brought to light from late antiquity to modernity and the forcefulness and complexity of his grand theses about Kabbala and Jewish history has fed more than three generations of scholars and will surely nurture many more. More recently, he is being discovered in European circles as an important figure in Weimar Jewish culture. Serious studies in German are presently being published by young scholars who know little about Kabbala and do not have much interest in Zionism but view Scholem as an important intellectual and philosophical mind compared with such figures as Benjamin, Strauss, Adorno, Horkheimer, and Arendt. His intellectual reach was, in fact, extraordinary, and thus this new interest should be celebrated.
There is a bibliography of Gershom Scholem's writings until 1977 entitled Bibliography of the Writings of Gershom Scholem, Jerusalem, Magnus Press, 1977. Below I will focus on his major works, books and a selection of articles about him. I do not list works in other languages that were translated into English except when the original book or article is substantively different than the English translation. I do not include essays about Scholem that appear in volumes listed under “Books about Gershom Scholem” below.
- A Life in Letters — 1914–1982, Cambridge, MA, Harvard University Press, 2002.
- Alchemy and Kabbala, Connecticut, Spring Publications, 2006.
- Avraham ha-Kohen Herrera: Ba'al Sha'ar ha-Shamayim [Hebrew], Jerusalem, Mosad Bialik, 1978.
- Das Buch Bahir, Darmstadt, Wissenschaftliche Buchgesellschaft, 1970.
- Devarim be-Go (two volumes), Tel Aviv, Am Oved, 1976.
- Die Geheminisse der Schopfung: Ein Kapital aus dem Sohar, Berlin, 1935.
- From Berlin to Jerusalem, New York, Schocken Books, 1980.
- Ha-Kabbala be-Gerona: Perakim be-Toldot ha-Kabbala be-Sefard, Jerusalem, Akadamon, 1964.
- Ha-Kabbala shel Sefer ha-Temunah ve-Avraham Abulafia, Jerusalem, Akadamon, 1965.
- Jewish Gnosticism, Merkabah Mysticism, and Talmudic Tradition., New York, JTS Pres, 1965.
- Judaica (three volumes), Frankfurt, Suhrkamp, 1968–1973.
- Kabbala, New York, Dorset Press, 1974.
- Le-Heker Kabbala shel R. Yizhak Cohen, Jerusalem, Akadamon, 1934.
- Leket Margoliot, Tel Aviv, 1941.
- Lurianic Kabbalah: Collected Studies by Gershom Scholem, Los Angeles, Cherub Press, 2008.
- Major Trends in Jewish Mysticism, New York, Schocken Books, 1941.
- Mekharim u-Mekorot le-Toldot ha-Shabta'ut ve Gilguleha, Jerusalem, Mosad Bialik, 1974.
- Mekharei Shabtaut, Tel Aviv, Am Oved, 1991.
- The Messianic Idea in Judaism and Other Essays, New York, Schocken Books, 1971.
- On Jews and Judaism in Crisis, New York, Schocken Books, 1976.
- On the Kabbalah and its Symbolism, New York, Schocken Books, 1969.
- On the Mystical Shape of the Godhead: Basic Concepts in Kabbala, New York, Schocken Books, 1991.
- On the Possibility of Jewish Mysticism in Our Time, Philadelphia, Jewish Publication Society, 1997.
- The Fullness of Time: Poems, Jerusalem, Ibis Editions, 2003.
- The Origins of Kabbala, Princeton, Princeton University Press, 1992.
- Pirkei Yesod ha-Havanat ha-Kabbala u-Semaleha, Jerusalem, Magnus Press, 1976.
- Reshit ha-Kabbala, Jerusalem and Tel Aviv, Schocken Books, 1962.
- Sabbatei Sevi: The Mystical Messiah 1626–1676, Princeton, Princeton University Press, 1973.
- Uber einege Grundbegreiffe des Judentums, Frankfurt am Main, Suhrkamp, 1970.
- Ursprung und Anfange der Kabbala, Berlin and New York, de Gruyter, 1962.
- Walter Benjamin — The Story of a Friendship, Philadelphia, Jewish Publication Society, 1982.
- Zohar: The Book of Splendor, New York, Schocken Books, 1949.
- Alter, Robert, 1991, Necessary Angels: Tradition and Modernity in Kafka, Benjamin and Scholem, Cambridge, MA, Havard University Press.
- Aschheim, Steven, 2001, Scholem, Arendt, Klepmerer: Intimate Chronicles in Turbulent Times, Bloomington, IN, Indiana University Press.
- Aschheim, Steven, 2006, Beyond the Border: The German-Jewish Legacy Abroad, Princeton, Princeton University Press.
- Biale, David, 1982, Gershom Scholem: Kabbalah and Counter-History, Cambridge, MA, Harvard University Press.
- Bloom, Harold, ed., 1987, Gershom Scholem, New York, Chelsea Books.
- Dan, Joseph, 1988, Gershom Scholem an the Mystical Dimension of Jewish History, New York, New York University Press.
- Goetschel, Willi and Nils Roemer eds., 1997, Theme Issue on Gershom Scholem, Washington, DC.
- Handelman, Susan, 1991, Fragments of Redemption: Jewish Thought and Literary Theory in Benjamin, Scholem, and Levinas, Bloomington, IN.
- Jacobson, Eric, 2003, Metaphysics of the Profane: The Political Theology of Walter Benjamin and Gershom Scholem, New York, Columbia University Press.
- Andreas Kilcher, 1998, Die Sprachtheorie der Kabbala als ästhetisches Paradigma. Die Konstruktion einer ästhetischen Kabbala seit der Frühen Neuzeit. Stuttgart, Meltzer.
- Mendes-Flohr, Paul, ed., 1994, Gershom Scholem: The Man and his Work, New York and Jerusalem, SUNY Press.
- Moses, Stephen, 1990, “Scholem and Rosenzweig: The Dialectics of History,” History and Memory 2.2: 100–116.
- Moses, Stephen and Sigrid Weigel eds., 2000, Gershom Scholem: Literatur und Rhetoric, Bohlau.
- Ohana, David, 2012, Modernism and Zionism, Hampshire, England: Palgrave.
- Schaefer, Peter and Gary Smith eds., 1995, Gershom Scholem: Zwischen den Disziplinen, Frankfurt am Main, Suhrkamp.
- Schaefer, Peter and Joseph Dan eds., 1993, Gershom Scholem's Major Trends in Jewish Mysticism: 50 Years After, Tubingen, Mohr.
- Schweid, Eliezer, 1985, Judaism and Mysticism According to Gershom Scholem: A Critical Analysis and Programmatic Discussion, Atlanta, GA, Scholars Press.
- Shapira, Avraham, ed., 1997, Continuity and Rebellion: Gershom Scholem in Speech and Dialogue [Hebrew], Tel Aviv, Am Oved.
- Wasserstrom, Steven, 1999, Religion after Religion: Gershom Scholem, Mircea Eliade and Henri Corbin at Eranos, Princeton, Princeton University Press.
- Mystika ve-Yahadut lifi Gershom Scholem, Jerusalem Studies in Jewish Thought, supplement 3, 1983/84, Jerusalem, Magnus Press.
- Abrams, Daniel, 2000, “Defining Modern Academic Scholarship: Gershom Scholem and the Establishment of a New (?) Discipline,” Journal of Jewish Thought and Philosophy 9: 267–302.
- Abrams, Daniel, 2000, “Presenting and Representing Gershom Scholem: A Review Essay,” Modern Judaism, 20(2): 226–243.
- Ben-Shlomo, Joseph, 1983, “The Spiritual Universe of Gershom Scholem,” Jerusalem Quarterly, 29: 127–144.
- Ben-Shlomo, Joseph, 2003, “Pantheism and Jewish Mysticism according to Gershom Scholem and his Critics,” [Hebrew] Da'at, 50–52: 461–481.
- Brocke, Michael, 1998, “Gershom Scholem: Wissenschaft des Judentums zwischen Berlin und Jerusalem,” Freiburger Rundbrief, 5(3): 179–186.
- Dan, Joseph, 1989, “Gershom Scholem—Between History and Historiosophy,” Binah, 2: 219–249.
- Dan, Joseph, 1999, “Gershom Scholem—Between Mysticism and Scholarship,” Jewish Mysticism, IV: 225–258.
- Munteanu Eddon, Raluca, 2003, “Gershom Scholem, Hannah Arendt and the Paradox of ‘non-nationalist’ Nationalism,” Journal of Jewish Thought & Philosophy, 12(1): 55–68.
- Funkenstein, Amos, 1992, “Gershom Scholem: Charisma, Kairos, and the Messianic Dialectic,” History and Memory, 4: 123–140.
- Horowitz, Rivka, 1992, “Franz Rosenzweig and Gershom Scholem on Zionism and the Jewish People,” Jewish History, 6: 99–111.
- Huss, Boaz, 2005, “Ask No Questions: Gershom Scholem and the Study of Contemporary Jewish Mysticism,” Modern Judaism 25(2): 141–158.
- Huss, Boaz, 2007, “‘Authorizes Guardians’: The Polemics of Academic Scholars of Jewish Mysticism Against Kabbalah Practitioners,” Political Encounters: Esoteric Discourse and its Other, O. Hammer, K. von Stuckrad eds. (Leiden and Boston: Brill), pp. 81–103.
- Idel, Moshe, 1991, “Rabbinism Verses Kabbalism: On G. Scholem's Phenomenology of Judaism,” Modern Judaism, 11: 281–296.
- Idel, Moshe, 2005, “Abraham Abulafia, Gershom Scholem, amnd David Kohen (ha-Nazir) on Prophecy,” [Hebrew] Derekh ha-Ruah: Sefere Yovel le-Eliezer Schweid, Jerusalem, pp. 819-834.
- Idel, Moshe, 1996, “Martin Buber and Gershom Scholem on Hasidism: A Critical Appraisal,” in Hasidism Reappraised, J. Weiss and A. Rapoport-Albert (eds.), Edgware: Vallentine Mitchell
- Kilcher, Andreas, 2000, “Kabbala und Moderne. Gershom Scholems Geschichte und Metaphysik des Judentums” Jüdische Traditionen in der Philosophie des 20. Jahrhunderts, Darmstadt: pp. 86–99.
- Lazier, Benjamin, 2002, “Writing the Judenzarathustra: Gershom Scholem's Response to Modernity, 1913–1917,” New German Critique, 85: 33–65.
- Levi, Zeev, 1977, “Gershom Scholem und die ‘Wissenschaft des Judentums’” Freiburger Rundbrief, 6: 170–172.
- Lowy, Michael, 2001, “Messianism in the Early Work of Gershom Scholem,” New German Critique, 83: 177–191.
- Pawel, Maciejko, 2004, “Gershom Scholem's dialectic of Jewish History:The Case of Sabbatianism,” Journal of Modern Jewish Studies, 3(2): 207–220.
- Magid, Shaul, 1995, “Gershom Scholem's Ambivalence Toward Mystical Experience and His Critique of Martin Buber in Light of Hans Jonas and Martin Heidegger,” Journal of Jewish Thought and Philosophy, 4: 245–269.
- Magid, Shaul, 2011, “Myth, History, and Mysticism: Gershom Scholem and the Contemporray Scene,” Jewish Quarterly Review 101(4): 511–525.
- Magid, Shaul, 2012, “The King is Dead (and has been for three decades), Long Live the King: Contemporary Kabbalah in Scholem's Shadow” Jewish Quarterly Review, 102(1): 131–153.
- Mertens, Bram, 2003, “‘The true words of the mystic’: Gershom Scholem and Franz Joseph Molitor,” Australian Journal of Jewish Studies, 17: 131–153.
- Mopsik, Charles, 1985, “Observations sur l'oeuvre de Gershom Scholem,” Pardes, 1: 6–31.
- Moses, Stephane, 1999, “Gershom Scholem's Reading of Kafka :Literary Criticism and Kabbalah,” New German Critique, 77: 149–167.
- Mosse, George, 1990, “Gershom Scholem as a German Jew,” Modern Judaism, 10(2): 117–133.
- Ohana, David, 2008, “J.L. Talmon, Gershom Scholem and the Price of Messianism,” in Jacob Talmin and Totalitarianism Today: legacy and Revision, Special Issues History of European Ideas, 34(2): 169–188.
- Raz-Krakotzkin, Amnon, 1999, “The Golem of Scholem: Messianism and Zionism in the Writings of Rabbi Avraham Isaac HaKohen Kook and Gershom Scholem,” Politik und Religion im Judentum, 223–238.
- Raz-Krakotzkin, Amonon, 2002, “Between ‘Brit Shalom’ and ‘Beit ha-Mikdash’: The Dialectic of Redemption and Messianism in Gershom Scholem,” [Hebrew] Theory and Criticism, 20: 87–112.
- Roemer, Nils, 1997, “Breaching the Walls of Captivity: Gershom Scholem's Studies of Jewish Mysticism,” German Review, 72: 23–40.
- Rosenwald, Lawrence, 1994, “For and Against Gershom Scholem,” Prooftexts, 14(3): 285–298.
- Rotenstreich, Nathan, 1977, “Symbolism and transcendence: On Some Philosophical Aspects of Gershom Scholem's Opus,” Review of Metaphysics, 31: 604–614
- Schafer, Peter, 1998, “Die Philosophie der Kabbala ist nur eine Projektion auf eine Flache: Gershom Scholem uber die wahren Absichten seines Kabbalastudiums,” Jewish Studies Quarterly, 5: 1–25.
- Schocken, Gershom, 1982, “Gershom Scholem and German-Jewish Romanticism,” Shdemot, 18: 19–26.
- Schweid, Eliezer, 1982, “In Memoriam: the Jewish World View of Gershom Scholem,” Immanuel, 14: 129–141.
- Shapira, Avraham, 1994, “The Symbolic Plane and its Secularization into the Spiritual World of Gershom Scholem,” Journal of Jewish Thought and Philosophy, 3: 331–352.
- Shapira, Avraham, 1996, “Between Philology and Historiography,” [Hebrew] Daniel Karpi Jubilee Volume, Tel Aviv.
- Skinner, Anthony David, 1999, “Jewish Modernism: The Hidden Meanings of Gershom Scholem's Sabbatei Sevi,” Jewish Studies at the Turn of the Twentieth Century II, pp. 384–388.
- Smith, Steven B., 1993, “Gershom Scholem and Leo Strauss: Notes toward a German-Jewish Dialogue,” Modern Judaism, 13(3): 209–229.
- Stegemann, Ekkehard W., 1997,“Gershom Scholem—Between Exile and Redemption,” European Judaism, 30(2): 59–71.
- Suchoff, David, 1997, “Gershom Scholem, Hannah Arendt, and the Scandal of Jewish Particularity,” Germanic Review, 72(1): 57–77.
- Weidner, Daniel, 2000, “Jüdisches Gedächtnis, mystische Tradition und moderne Literatur: Walter Benjamin und Gershom Scholem deuten Kafka,” Weimarer Beiträge, 46(2): 234–249.
- Weiner, Hannah, 1984, “Gershom Scholem and the Jung Juda youth group in Berlin, 1913–1918,” Studies in Zionism 5(1): 29–42.
- Wijnhoven, Jochanan, 1970, “Gershom G. Scholem: The Study of Jewish Mysticism,” Judaism, 19: 468–481.
- Werblovsky, R.Z.W., 1985/86, “Gershom Scholem: Human Being, Jew, Scholar,” [Hebrew] Molad, 42: 122–128.
- Zeligman, Hayyim, 2006, “The Relationship Between Gershom Scholem and Gustav Landauer,” [Hebrew] Ma'anit ha-Lev: 249–256.
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- Ozick, Cynthia, The Heretic, from The New Yorker
- Elkind, Daniel, Review of The Diaries of Gershom Scholem, 1913–1919, from The Jewish Daily Forward