Skepticism and Content Externalism

First published Fri Oct 29, 2004; substantive revision Tue Mar 20, 2012

[Editor's Note: The following revised entry has a new title. It was previously titled Brains in a Vat.]

One skeptical hypothesis about the external world, namely that one is a brain in a vat with systematically delusory experience, is modelled on the Cartesian Evil Genius hypothesis, according to which one is a victim of thoroughgoing error induced by a God-like deceiver. The skeptic argues that one does not know that the brain-in-a-vat hypothesis is false, since if the hypothesis were true, one's experience would be just as it actually is. Therefore, according to the skeptic, one does not know any propositions about the external world (propositions which would be false if the vat hypothesis were true).

Hilary Putnam (1981) provided an apparent refutation of a version of the brain-in-a-vat hypothesis, based upon content externalism (also known as semantic externalism). This is the view that the meanings and truth conditions of one's sentences, and the contents of one's intentional mental states, depend upon the character of one's external, causal environment. This entry is primarily focussed upon evaluating the Putnamian considerations that seem to show that one can know that one is not a brain in a vat.


1. Skeptical Hypotheses and the Skeptical Argument

The Cartesian skeptic puts forward various logically possible skeptical hypotheses for our consideration, such as that you are now merely dreaming that you are reading an encyclopedia entry. The more radical Evil Genius hypothesis is this: you inhabit a world consisting of just you and a God-like Evil Genius bent on deceiving you. In the Evil Genius world, nothing physical exists, and all of your experiences are directly caused by the Evil Genius. So your experiences, which represent there to be an external world of physical objects (including your body), give rise to systematically mistaken beliefs about your world (such as that you are now sitting at a computer). (For an overview of the problem of external world skepticism, see Greco 2007.) Some philosophers would deny that the Evil Genius hypothesis is genuinely logically possible. Materialists who hold that the mind is a complex physical system deny that it is possible for there to be an Evil Genius world, since, on their view, your mind could not possibly exist in a matterless world. Accordingly, a modern skeptic will have us consider an updated skeptical hypothesis that is consistent with materialism. Consider the hypothesis that you are a disembodied brain floating in a vat of nutrient fluids. This brain is connected to a supercomputer whose program produces electrical impulses that stimulate the brain in just the way that normal brains are stimulated as a result of perceiving external objects in the normal way. (The movie ‘The Matrix’ depicts embodied brains which are so stimulated, while their bodies float in a vats.) If you are a brain in a vat, then you have experiences that are qualitatively indistinguishable from those of a normal perceiver. If you come to believe, on the basis of your computer-induced experiences, that you are looking at at tree, then you are sadly mistaken.

After having sketched this brain-in-a-vat hypothesis, the skeptic issues a challenge: can you rule out the possibility described in the hypothesis? Do you know that the hypothesis is false? The skeptic now argues as follows. Choose any target proposition P concerning the external world, which you think you know to be true:

  1. If you know that P, then you know that you are not a brain in a vat.
  2. You do not know that you are not a brain in a vat. So,
  3. You do not know that P.

Premise (1) is backed by the principle that knowledge is closed under known entailment:

(CL) For all S,α,β: If S knows that α, and S knows that α entails β, then S knows that β.

Since you know that P entails that you are not a brain in a vat (for example, let P = You are sitting at a computer), by (CL) you know that P only if you now its entailed consequence: you are not a brain in a vat. Premise (2) is backed by the consideration that your experiences do not allow you to discriminate between the hypothesis that you are not a brain in a vat (but rather a normal human) from the hypothesis that you are a brain in a vat. Your experience would be the same regardless of which hypothesis were true. So you do not know that you are not a brain in a vat.

2. Putnam's BIVs and the Disjunctive Argument

In a famous discussion, Hilary Putnam has us consider a special version of the brain-in-a-vat hypothesis. Imagine that you are a brain in a vat in a world in which the only objects are brains, a vat, and a laboratory containing supercomputers that stimulate the envatted brains. Imagine further that this situation has arisen completely randomly, and that the brains have always been envatted. No evil neuroscientists or renegade machines have brought about the brains' envatment. Call such a special brain in a vat a ‘BIV’. A skeptical argument just like that above can be formulated using the BIV hypothesis. Putting things now in the first person, Putnam argues that I can establish that I am not a BIV by appeal to semantic considerations alone—considerations concerning reference and truth. This will block the BIV version of the skeptical argument.

Here is how Putnam motivates his anti-skeptical semantic considerations. Suppose that there are no trees on Mars and that a Martian forms a mental image exactly resembling one of my tree-images as a result of perceiving a blob of paint that accidentally resembles a tree. Putnam's intuition is that the Martian's image is not a representation of a tree. This is due to the lack of any causal connection between the image and trees (even, we will suppose, any attenuated causal connection such as interaction with a visiting Earthling who has seen trees). If I were a BIV, then my mental image resembling a tree would no more be a representation of a tree than would the Martian's mental image. Neither of us would have the sort of causal contact with trees which is required for our images to refer to trees. The same reasoning applies to any tokens of the word ‘tree’ which might come to be uttered (or thought) by the Martian and by the BIV. (In speaking about BIVs, we will use ‘utter’ to mean, in effect, ‘seem to utter’, since a BIV cannot speak or write, but only seems to himself to be speaking or writing. Similar remarks apply to ‘speak’.)

What does the BIV's token of ‘tree’ refer to, if not to trees? Putnam offers three possibilities:

  1. to ‘trees-in-the-image’ (I take it that by ‘the image’, Putnam means the succession of experiences had by the BIV),
  2. to the electrical impulses that stimulate the brain and thereby cause it to have experiences just like those a normal human has when it sees a tree, and
  3. to the computer program features that are causally responsible for the stimuli described in (ii) and thus the experiences described in (i).

On the natural, pre-Putnam assignment of references which one would make in evaluating the truth value of a BIV's utterance of ‘Here is a tree’, we would hold that the brain's token of ‘tree’ refers to trees and, hence, that his sentence token is false, since he is not near a tree. On each of Putnam's proposed reference assignments, though, the brain's sentence token comes out true (provided that the brain is indeed being stimulated so as to have experiences just like those a normal human has when seeing a tree and that the stimulation is caused by the appropriate electrical impulses generated by a computer's program features). On account (i), for example, the BIV's utterance of ‘Here is a tree’ is true iff the BIV is having experiences as of being near a tree.

Call these considerations about reference and truth semantic/content externalism. This view denies a crucial Cartesian assumption about mind and language, viz., that the BIV's sentences express systematically mistaken beliefs about his world, the very same beliefs had by a normal counterpart to the BIV, with matching experiences. On the contrary: the BIV's sentences differ in reference and truth conditions (and, accordingly, in meaning) from those of his normal counterpart. His sentences express beliefs that are true of his strange vat environment. The differences in the semantic features of the sentences used by the BIV and those used by his normal counterpart are induced by the differences in the beings' external, causal environments.

Account (iii) of the referents of the BIV's words gives the most plausible semantic/content externalist reference assignment, since recurring program features that systematically cause the BIV's ‘treeish’ experiences play a causal role vis a vis the BIV's uses of ‘tree’ that is analogous to the causal role played by trees vis a vis a normal human's uses of ‘tree’.

Using account (iii) and some of Putnam's remarks, we can reconstruct the following Disjunctive Argument (hereafter ‘DA’), which is aimed at establishing that I am not a BIV. If DA succeeds, then we have a response to a skeptical argument involving the BIV hypothesis which shares the form of the Cartesian argument (1)-(3) above. If DA succeeds, then it generates knowledge that I am not a BIV. Thus we would have a response to the skeptic's claim that since I do not know that I am not a BIV, then I do not know any target external-world proposition P.

Let ‘vat-English’ refer to the language of the BIV, let ‘brain*’ refer to the computer program feature that causes experiences in the BIV that are qualitatively indistinguishable from normal experiences that represent brains, and let ‘vat*’ refer to the computer program feature that cause experiences that are qualitatively indistinguishable from normal experiences that represent vats. A BIV, then, is not a brain* in a vat*: a BIV is not a certain computer program feature located in a certain other computer program feature. Here is DA:

  1. Either I am a BIV (speaking vat-English) or I am a non-BIV (speaking English).
  2. If I am a BIV (speaking vat-English), then my utterances of ‘I am a BIV’ are true iff I am a brain* in a vat*.
  3. If I am a BIV (speaking vat-English), then I am not a brain* in a vat*.
  4. If I am a BIV (speaking vat-English), then my utterances of ‘I am a BIV’ are false. [(b),(c)]
  5. If I am a non-BIV (speaking English), then my utterances of ‘I am a BIV’ are true iff I am a BIV.
  6. If I am a non-BIV (speaking English), then my utterances of ‘I am a BIV’ are false. [(e)]
  7. My utterances of ‘I am a BIV’ are false. [(a),(d),(f)]

DA stops short of delivering the desired result, namely a proof of

(¬SK) I am not a BIV.

To establish (¬SK) we need to add a couple of further steps:

(h) My utterances of ‘I am not a BIV’ are true.

(T) My utterances of ‘I am not a BIV’ are true iff I am not a BIV.

(¬SK) follows from (h) and (T). Step (h) itself follows from (g) on natural assumptions about negation, truth, and quotation, but (T) is problematic in the current anti-skeptical context. The assumption of (T) seems to beg the question against the skeptic. Putnam's semantic externalist picture is this: if I am an non-BIV (speaking English) then (T) is the correct statement of the truth conditions of my sentence ‘I am a BIV’, using the device of disquotation; but if instead I am a BIV (speaking vat-English), then the correct statement of my sentence's truth conditions is the strange one given in (b) of DA, not using the device of disquotation. So in order to know that (T) is the correct statement of my sentence's truth conditions, I need to know that I am a non-BIV (speaking English). But that is what the anti-skeptical argument was supposed to prove (Brueckner 1986). According to this objection, Supplemented DA (DA plus (h) and (T)) is epistemically circular, in William Alston's sense: knowledge of one of its premises—(T)—requires knowledge of its conclusion (Alston 1989).

3. The Simple Arguments

Let us consider two other reconstructions of Putnam's thinking regarding BIVs. Here is Simple Argument 1 (‘SA1’—see Brueckner 2003):

  1. If I am a BIV, then my word ‘tree’ does not refer to trees.
  2. My word ‘tree’ refers to trees. So,
  3. I am not a BIV. [(A),(B)]

We will discuss (B) below. Premise (A) comes from Putnam's semantic externalism, as seen above. DA's claims about the BIV's sentences' truth conditions are grounded in claims about reference such as (A): since the BIV's words differ in their referents from the corresponding words of a normal speaker, the BIV's sentences accordingly differ in their truth conditions from the corresponding sentences of a normal speaker.

The semantic differences just mentioned induce differences at the level of thought content that are exploited in the following Simple Argument 2 (‘SA2’—Brueckner 2003, Ebbs 1992, Tymoczko 1989):

  1. If I am a BIV, then I am not thinking that trees are green.
  2. I am thinking that trees are green. So,
  3. I am not a BIV.

We will discuss (E) below. Regarding (D): since the BIV's word ‘tree’ does not refer to trees when he uses the sentence ‘Trees are green’ as a vehicle for thinking a thought, his thought does not have the content that trees are green. Rather, it has some content concerning tree*'s, that is, computer program features that cause in the BIV experiences that are qualitatively indistinguishable from normal experiences that represent trees. Perhaps the content is something like this: the program feature that causes ‘treeish’ experience is associated with a program feature that causes experiences that are qualitatively indistinguishable from normal experiences that represent objects as being green.

SA2 highlights the connection between semantic externalism and the mind. Not only do meaning, reference, and truth depend upon one's external environment in the ways we have discussed; further, the representational contents of one's thoughts, beliefs, desires and other propositional attitudes also depend upon circumstances external to one's mind.

The simple arguments are simpler than DA, and they also do not commit the anti-skeptic to a specification of the referents of the BIV's words and the contents of its thoughts. The arguments rest only upon the claim that the referents and contents in question differ from my referents and contents. Another advantage of the Simple Arguments is that they do not, on the face of it, seem to beg the question against the skeptic, as did DA when supplemented so that it validly implied the conclusion (¬SK): that I am not a BIV.

4. Objections and Responses

Let us now turn to an objection to SA1. Though the argument does not obviously require knowledge that I am a non-BIV (speaking English), as Supplemented DA seemed to, its premise (B) does seem upon reflection to be question-begging. On a natural understanding of (B), the truth of this premise requires the existence of trees as referents for my word ‘tree’. So to know that (B) is true, I would need to know that I am a non-BIV in a world containing trees, rather than a BIV in a treeless vat world. This problem infects SA2 as well, since my ground for holding that I can think tree-thoughts while the BIV cannot is ultimately the claim that the words we use to express our respective thoughts differ in reference (trees versus things that are not trees, such as tree*'s).

SA1 can be modified so as to avoid this objection (Brueckner 2003):

A*. If I am a BIV, then it is not the case that if my word ‘tree’ refers, then it refers to trees.

B*. If my word ‘tree’ refers, then it refers to trees. So,

C. I am not a BIV.

Premise (A*) comes from semantic/content externalism. Re premise (B*): knowledge that there are trees in my world is not required in order to justify this premise. But a problem still remains. In order to know (B*), don't I need to know that I am a non-BIV (speaking English), so that I can use the device of disquotation in stating the referents of my words (if they do have referents at all)?

A similar worry can be laid at the door of SA2. In order to know its second premise, (E), I need to know what I am now thinking. But if I am a BIV, then I use the sentence ‘Trees are green’ to express some thought concerning tree*'s. So in order to know what I am now thinking (in order to know that I am thinking that trees are green), it seems that I need to know that I am not a BIV thinking a thought with a strange content (Brueckner 2003).

A reasonable response to the foregoing objection to Modified SA1 is as follows. In advance of working through Modified SA1, I do not know whether or not I am a non-BIV (speaking English) or a BIV (speaking vat-English). But I do know certain things about my own language (whatever it is and wherever I am speaking it). By virtue of knowing the meaning of ‘refers’ and the meaning of quotation marks, I know that disquotation can be correctly applied to any successfully referring term of my language, in the way that (B*) indicates for my word ‘tree’. This is a priori knowledge of semantic features of my own language (whatever it is—English or vat-English). I know (A*) in virtue of my a priori, philosophical knowledge of the theory of semantic externalism and of how it applies to the case of the BIV. Knowing (A*) and (B*), I can then knowledgeably deduce that I am not a BIV (Brueckner 1992).

A similar response to the foregoing objection to SA2 is that I have knowledge of my own mind that is not experientially based. I can gain the knowledge that I am now thinking that trees are green via introspection. Putting this self-knowledge together with my a priori, philosophical knowledge of SA2's first premise, (D), (knowledge based upon my understanding of semantic externalism), I can then knowledgeably deduce that I am not a BIV. A problem for this response has been raised by various philosophers. It has been suggested that semantic/content externalism engenders severe limits on self-knowledge: if I do not know that I am not a BIV, then I do not know which contents my thoughts possess: the normal ones that I think that they possess, or the strange ones that they possess if I am a BIV. So the response we have considered may be in trouble if semantic externalism gives rise to such skepticism about knowledge of content. (Ludlow and Martin 1998)

The foregoing defenses of the Simple Arguments emphasize a constraint on anti-skeptical arguments: their premises must be knowable a priori. The justification of their premises must not require any appeal to the deliverances of sense-experience. Now Modified SA1 is driven by the following thought: the referent of the BIV's ‘tree’ is something strange, viz., tree*'s (certain computer program features); but the referent of my ‘tree’ (if such there be) is trees; so I am not a BIV. This thought in turn rests upon the natural assumption that trees are not computer program features. But is that assumption something that I know a priori? In work unrelated to skepticism, Putnam has claimed that even though it is necessary that cats are animals (just as it is necessary that water is H2O), it is not knowable a priori that cats are animals (just as it is not knowable a priori that water is H2O). According to Putnam, the concept of cat allows that in advance of gaining knowledge of their inner structure, cats could turn out to be robots. The worry is that in a similar way, the concept of tree is such that in advance of gaining knowledge of the existence and nature of trees, trees could turn out to be computer program features. If I hold in abeyance my seeming a posteriori knowledge about trees, then, I cannot fairly say that in the vat world, there are no trees. Thus, I do not know a priori that the BIV's word ‘tree’ refers to things other than trees (in virtue of referring to computer program features which are distinct from trees) (Brueckner 2005).

This objection to Modified SA1 can be answered by focusing upon the dialectical situation between skeptic and anti-skeptic. The skeptic wishes to impugn my seeming knowledge of the external world by putting forward a skeptical hypothesis that is incompatible with the external-world propositions I believe. We are considering the skeptical hypothesis SK (= I am a BIV). On the current objection to our anti-skeptical argument, the skeptical critic undermines his own position by suggesting that SK is compatible with external-world propositions such as that I am in the presence of green trees. I can now argue as follows in response to the skeptic's current objection. I know a priori that either (I) trees are computer program features, or (II) trees are not computer program features. On the first alternative, the skeptic undermines his own overall position, and on the second alternative, the skeptic's objection is withdrawn. So we could view Modified SA1 as being an argument by cases: it is not known a priori which case obtains, but it is known a priori that the skeptic loses in each case.

Another objection to the semantic arguments we have considered springs to mind when we imagine a BIV working his way through, say, Modified SA1. When the BIV thinks thoughts via the sentences (A*), (B*), and (C), he is not, for example, thinking about trees when he thinks his second premise. The (used) occurrence of the word ‘trees’ in his premise does not refer to trees but rather to something else—tree*'s, that is, certain computer program features. Understood in this way, his second premise is true. His first premise concerns the referent of his word ‘tree’ on condition that he is a brain* in a vat*. Thus, the BIV's first premise is true in virtue of having a necessarily false antecedent (since it is not logically possible for him to be a computer program feature). So the BIV's version of Modified SA1 is sound. But he uses the argument to prove the conclusion that he is not a brain* in a vat*, rather than the conclusion that he is not a BIV.

The following worry arises. Perhaps I am a BIV who uses Modified SA1 to prove that I am not a brain* in a vat*, rather than the desired result that I am not a BIV. However, this worry is unfounded. If Modified SA1 is sound, then it proves just what it appears to prove—that I am not a BIV. Just read the argument carefully when you work through it! It makes no difference to my argumentative situation if someone on Alpha Centauri uses those very sentences with different meanings from mine and proves that muons move rapidly (Johnsen 2003, Brueckner 2004).

A final objection to the semantic arguments is hard to dispute. The problem is the narrow scope of the arguments. They cannot prove that I am not a recently disembodied brain in a vat (as opposed to a Putnamian BIV). If I have been speaking English up until my recent envatment, then my words will retain their English referents (to trees and so on) and my thoughts will retain their normal contents (about trees and so on). Thus, the Putnamian semantic externalist considerations will find no purchase against the skeptical hypothesis that I am a fledgling brain in a vat (Brueckner 1986). However, in such a “recent envatment” scenario, the pertinent skeptical argument leaves unscathed many of my knowledge-claims (such as that I was born in the USA, that I own a black cat,…) So the “recent envatment” scenario lacks the skeptical power of the Putnamian BIV scenario.

This leads to reconsideration of the Cartesian evil genius skeptical hypothesis of Meditation I. Recall that in the Cartesian scenario, all that exists is my mind just as it actually is and a God-like Evil Genius that directly causes my mental states. Nothing physical exists. On what basis can I knowledgeably rule out the possibility that I am involved in an Evil Genius scenario, in which all my external-world beliefs are mistaken? If I cannot rule it out that I am in such a scenario, then, according to Descartes, I do not know any of the external-world propositions that I claim to know. The Putnamian semantic considerations over which we have obsessed can be brought to bear against the foregoing radical skeptical scenario. It seems that we should assign referents to the terms of the evil genius "victim" that are analogous to the “computer program feature” referents in the BIV story—referents that are states of the evil genius, those systematically causally responsible for, say, my “treeish” experience. So contra Descartes, if I were the "victim" of an Evil Genius, I would not have thoroughly mistaken beliefs about things apart from my mind. Instead, I would have as many correct beliefs about things apart from my mind (in this case beliefs about states of the Evil Genius) as does a normal thinker in a normal environment. An analogue to a “simple argument” could also be constructed against the traditional Cartesian hypothesis.

Finally, two other, more radical skeptical hypotheses that are left unscathed by semantic externalism are that (1) I am a brain in a vat whose experiences are randomly caused by a supercomputer, or (2) there is a whimsical evil demon inducing my experiences with no stable mental sources to serve as referents. In such scenarios, there are no systematic causal connections, for example, between the computer program features or the nature of the demon and my recurring ‘treeish’ experiences. The semantic externalist would say that, in such scenarios, my words fail to refer to things in my world, and no truth conditions can be properly assigned to my sentences. These sentences accordingly fail to express contentful thoughts. On these radical skeptical hypotheses, I am asked, then, to countenance the (alleged) possibility that I am not thinking contentful thoughts via meaningful sentences with reference and truth conditions. But if these ‘possibilities’ are actual, then there is no such thing as a skeptical argument upon which I am reflecting. Thus, these radical skeptical hypotheses may well in the end undermine themselves.

Conclusion

The brain-in-a-vat hypotheses are crucial for the formulation of skeptical arguments concerning the possibility of knowledge of the external world that are modeled on the Cartesian Evil Genius argument. We have seen that the BIV hypothesis may well be refutable, given semantic/content externalism and given the assumption that one has a priori knowledge of some key semantic properties of one's language (or, alternatively, a priori knowledge of the contents of one's mental states). Even if Putnamian arguments fail to rule out all versions of the brain-in-a-vat hypotheses, their success against the radical BIV hypothesis would be significant. Further, these arguments highlight a novel view of the relations between mind, language, and the external world.

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