Transmission of Justification and Warrant
Ted is on his way to the Philosophy Department, early in the freezing morning. Although he doesn't know how cold it is, Ted conjectures that the temperature must be below 0 °C. Out of curiosity, he checks the weather app of his smartphone. To his astonishment, he sees that it is -30 °C. He concludes that this is the least temperature to which he has been exposed ever. Ted's belief about his personal record owes its justification to Ted's belief that it is -30 °C, justified by the evidence supplied by his smartphone, and Ted's acknowledging that if it is -30 °C, then this is the least temperature to which he has been exposed ever. When one's belief q derives its justification from the justification that one has for another belief p in this way, it has become customary to say that the justification for p transmits to q across the inferential link from p to q.
Transmission of justification across inference is a valuable and indeed ubiquitous epistemic phenomenon in everyday life and science. It is thanks to the phenomenon of epistemic transmission that inferential reasoning is a means for substantiating predictions of future events and, more generally, for expanding the sphere of our justified beliefs or reinforcing the justification of beliefs that we already entertain. However, transmission of justification is not without exceptions. As a few epistemologists have come to realise, more or less trivial forms of circularity can prevent justification from transmitting from p to q even if one has justification for p and one is aware of the inferential link from p to q. In interesting cases this happens because one can acquire justification for p only if one has independent justification for q. In this case the justification for q cannot depend on the justification for p and the inferential link from p to q, as genuine transmission would require.
The phenomenon of transmission failure seems to shed light on philosophical puzzles, such as Moore's proof of a material world and McKinsey's paradox, and it plays a central role in various philosophical debates. For this reason it is being granted continued and increasing attention.
- 1. Introduction
- 2. Epistemic Transmission
- 3. Failure of Epistemic Transmission
- 4. Transmissivity as Resolving Doubts
- 5. Applications
- Academic Tools
- Other Internet Resources
- Related Entries
Arthur has the measles and stays in a closed environment with his little sister Mafalda. If Mafalda ends up contracting the measles herself because of her staying in close contact with Arthur, there must be something—the measles virus—which is transmitted from Arthur to Mafalda in virtue of a relation—the relation of staying in close contact with one another—instantiated by the two siblings. Epistemologists have been devoting their attention to the fact that epistemic properties—like being justified or being known—are often transmitted in a similar way. An example—which we shall not discuss in this entry—is the transmission of knowledge via testimony from an individual to another. Suppose Caroline is far from the window. When Tom realises that it is raining by looking out the window and tells Caroline about the rain, Caroline acquires Tom's knowledge by transmission. A different but equally important phenomenon—which this entry is dedicated to—is the transmission of epistemic justification across an inference or argument from one proposition to another.
Consider proposition q constituting the conclusion of an argument having proposition p as premise (where p can be a set or conjunction of more propositions). If p is justified for a subject s by evidence e, this justification may transmit to q if s is aware of the entailment between p and q. When this happens, q is justified for s in virtue of her justification for p based on e and her knowledge of the inferential relation from p to q. Consider this example from Wright (2002):
E1. Three hours ago, Jones inadvertently consumed a large risotto of Boletus Satana.
P1. Jones has absorbed a lethal quantity of the toxins that toadstool contains.
Q1. Jones will shortly die.
Here a subject s can deductively infer Q1 from P1 given some background information. Suppose s acquires justification for P1 by learning E1. In this case s will also acquire justification for Q1 in virtue of her knowledge of the inferential relation from P1 to Q1 and her justification for P1. Thus s's justification for P1 will transmit to Q1.
It is widely recognised that epistemic justification sometimes fails to transmit across an inference or argument. In interesting cases of transmission failure, s has justification for believing p and s knows the inferential link between p and q, but s has no justification for believing q in virtue of her justification for p and her knowledge of the inferential link. Here is an example from Wright (2003). Suppose s's background information entails, among ordinary things, that Jessica and Jocelyn are indistinguishable twins. Consider this possible reasoning:
E2. This girl looks just like Jessica.
P2. This girl is actually Jessica.
Q2. This girl is not Jocelyn.
In Twins E2 can give s justification for believing P2 only if s has independent justification for believing Q2 in the first instance. Suppose that s does have independent justification for believing Q2, and imagine that s learns E2. In this case s will acquire justification for believing P2 from E2. But it is intuitive that s will acquire no justification for Q2 in virtue of her justification for believing P2 based on E2 and her knowledge of the inferential link between P2 and Q2. So Twins instantiates transmission failure when Q2 is independently justified.
An argument incapable of transmitting to its conclusion a specific justification for its premise(s)—e.g., a justification based on evidence e—may turn out to be able to transmit to the same conclusion a different justification for its premise(s)—e.g., one based on different evidence e*. Replace for instance E2 with E2* = ‘This girl's passport certifies she is Jessica’ in Twins. E* appears capable of providing s with justification for believing P even if s has no independent justification for Q2. Suppose then that s has no independent justification for Q2, and that she acquires E2*. It is intuitive that s will acquire justification from E2* for P2 that does transmit to Q2. Now the inference from P2 to Q2 instantiates epistemic transmission.
Although many of the epistemologists taking part in the debate on epistemic transmission and transmission failure speak of transmission of warrant, rather than justification, they all seem to use the term ‘warrant’ to refer to some kind of epistemic justification. Most epistemologists investigating epistemic transmission and transmission failure—e.g., Wright (2011, 2007, 2004, 2003, 2002 and 1985), Davies (2003a, 2000 and 1998), Dretske (2005), Pryor (2004), Moretti (2012) and Moretti & Piazza (2013)—broadly identify the epistemic property capable of being transmitted with propositional justification. Only a few authors explicitly focus on transmission of doxastic justification—e.g., Silins (2005), Davies (2009) and Tucker (2010a and 2010b). In this entry we will follow the majority in discussing transmission and failure of transmission of justification as phenomena primarily pertaining to propositional justification. (See however the supplement on Transmission of Propositional Justification versus Transmission of Doxastic Justification.)
Epistemologists typically concentrate on transmission of (propositional or doxastic) justification across deductively valid arguments (or arguments deductively valid given background information). The fact that justification can transmit across deduction is crucial for our cognitive processes because it makes the advancement of knowledge—or of justified belief—through deductive reasoning possible. We are all sufficiently familiar with this type of cognitive processes. Suppose evidence e gives you justification for believing hypothesis or proposition p and you know that p entails another proposition q that you have not directly checked. If the justification you have for p transmits to its unchecked prediction q through the entailment, you acquire justification for believing q too.
Epistemologists may analyse epistemic transmission across ampliative (or inductive) inferences too. (Note that arguments deductively valid given background information can often be turned into good ampliative arguments by simply removing some background information.) Yet this topic has received much less attention in the recent literature on epistemic transmission. (See however interesting remarks in Tucker 2010a.)
In the remaining part of this entry we will focus on transmission and transmission failure of propositional justification across deductive inference. Unless differently specified, by ‘epistemic justification’ or ‘justification’ we will always mean ‘propositional justification’.
As said, s's justification for p based on evidence e transmits across entailment from p to p's consequence q whenever q is justified for s in virtue of s's justification for p based on e and her knowledge of q's deducibility from p. This initial characterisation can be distilled into three conditions individually necessary and jointly sufficient for epistemic transmission:
s's justification for p based on e transmits to p's logical consequence q if and only if:
(i) s has justification for believing p based on e, (ii) s knows that q is deducible from p, and (iii) s has justification for believing q in virtue of the satisfaction of (i) and (ii).
(In the literature the term ‘in virtue of’ is often replaced by other expressions such as ‘depending on’, ‘conditional on’, ‘based on’, etc.)
Condition (iii) is crucial for distinguishing transmission of justification across entailment from closure of justification across (known) entailment. A basic formulation of the principle of epistemic closure states that if s has justification for believing p and s knows that p entails q, then s has (or potentially has) justification for believing q. Closure does not specify that s has justification for q in virtue of having justification for p and knowing that p entails q (for further discussion see Tucker 2010b).
It doesn't seem misleading or inappropriate to give the intuitive notion of in virtue of used in (iii) a counterfactual interpretation (though this notion could probably be sharpened in other ways). This enables us to reformulate (iii) as follows (cf. Moretti & Piazza 2013):
s has justification for q, and if s hadn't any justification for p based on e or hadn't known that p entails q, s would have had no justification for q.
The above condition appears satisfied in many intuitive cases of transmission of justification. For example, in Toadstool s has justification for Q1. Furthermore, if s hadn't any justification for P1 based on E1, or hadn't known that P1 entails Q1, s would have had no justification for Q1. For instance, if s's justification for P1 were defeated by evidence that the specific variety of Boletus Satana in Jones' risotto is insufficiently rich in lethal toxins, s would no longer be justified in believing Q1.
Unfortunately, it is easy to find many other cases in which it is intuitive that the justification for p based on e transmits to q even if condition (iii), interpreted counterfactually, is not satisfied. These cases can be described as situations in which only part of the justification that s has for q is based on her justification for p and her knowledge of the entailment from p to q. Consider the following example. Suppose you are travelling on a train heading to Edinburgh. At 16:00, as you enter Newcastle upon Tyne, you spot the train station sign. Then, at 16:05, the ticket controller tells you that you are not yet in Scotland. Now consider the following reasoning:
E3. At 16:05 the ticket controller tells you that you are not yet in Scotland.
P3. You are not yet in Scotland.
Q3. You are not yet in Edinburgh.
As you learn E3, given suitable background information, you acquire justification for P3; moreover, to the extent to which you know that not being in Scotland is sufficient for not being in Edinburgh, you also acquire via transmission justification for Q3. This additional justification is transmitted irrespective of the fact that you already have justification for Q3, acquired by spotting the train station sign ‘Newcastle upon Tyne’. If we required of transmission of justification the fulfilment of the countefactual formulation of (iii), cases like these would become invisible. That condition is not fulfilled if you are already justified in believing Q3, as the closest possible worlds in which E3 does not justify P3 for you—say, because you know that the controller is a pathological liar—are presumably worlds in which, before learning E3, you spot the train station sign ‘Newcastle upon Tyne’ all the same.
A simple way to deal with this complication is to amend the tripartite analysis of epistemic transmission by turning (iii) into (iii+), saying that at least part of the justification that s has for q has been achieved by her in virtue of the satisfaction of (i) and (ii). Let us say that a justification for q is an additional justification for q whenever it is not a first-time justification for it. When the notion of in virtue of is analysed in counterfactual terms, (iii+) can be reformulated as the following disjunction:
s has first-time justification for q, and if s hadn't any justification for p based on e or hadn't known that p entails q, s would have had no first-time justification for q,
s has an additional justification for q, and if s hadn't any justification for p based on e or hadn't known that p entails q, s would not have had additional justification for q.
Suppose the counterfactual formulation of (iii+) is true because its second disjunct is true. In this case it is only s's additional justification for q that depends on the satisfaction of (i) and (ii). So only part of the justification that s has for q has been obtained by s in virtue of the satisfaction of (i) and (ii).
Much of the extant literature on epistemic transmission concentrates on examples of transmission of first-time justification. These examples include Toadstool. We have seen, however, that what intuitively transmits in certain cases is simply additional justification. Epistemologists have identified at least two—possibly overlapping—kinds of additional justification (cf. for instance Moretti & Piazza 2013).
One is what can be called independent justification because it appears—intuitively—independent of the original justification for q. This notion of justification could probably be sharpened by appealing, again, to counterfactual analysis. Suppose s's justification for p based on e transmits to p's logical consequence q. This justification transmitted to q is an additional independent justification just in case the following three conditions are met: (1) s was already justified in believing q before acquiring e, (2) as s acquires e, s is still justified in believing q, and (3) if s had not been antecedently justified in believing q, upon learning e, s would have acquired via transmission a first-time justification for believing q. Journey instantiates transmission of justification by meeting (1), (2) and (3). Thus Journey exemplifies a case of transmission of additional independent justification.
Consider now that justification for a proposition or belief normally comes in degrees of strength. The second kind of additional justification can be characterised as quantitatively strengthening justification. Suppose again that s's justification for p based on e transmits to p's logical consequence q. This justification transmitted to q is an additional quantitatively strengthening justification just in case the following two conditions are satisfied: (1) s was already justified in believing q before acquiring e, and (2*) as s acquires e, the strength of s's justification for believing q increases. Here is an example from Moretti (2012). Your background information says that only one ticket out of 5,000 of a fair lottery has been bought by a person born in 1970, and that all other tickets have been bought by older or younger people. Consider now this reasoning:
E4. The lottery winner's passport certifies she was born in 1980.
P4. The lottery's winner was born in 1980.
Q4. The lottery's winner was not born in 1970.
The proposition Q4, given its high chance, is already justified on your background information only. As you learn E4, it is intuitive that you acquire an additional quantitatively strengthening justification for Q4 via transmission. For your justification for P4 transmitted to Q4 is intuitively quantitatively stronger than your initial justification for Q4.
In many cases when q receives via transmission from p an additional independent justification, q will also receive a quantitatively strengthening justification. This is not true in general though. For there seem to be cases in which an additional independent justification transmitted from p to q intuitively lessens an antecedent justification for q (cf. Wright 2011). One of these cases is given at the end of this section.
An interesting question is whether it is true that as q receives via transmission from p an additional quantitatively strengthening justification, q also receives an independent justification. This seems true in some cases—for instance in Lottery above. It is controversial, however, whether it is the case that whenever q receives via transmission a quantitatively strengthening justification, q also receives an independent justification. For example, while Wright (2007) seems to believe so, the following case from Wright (2011) would seem to be a counterexample: you watch a very mobile flock of sheep in a pen. Someone tells you that (Q) there are fewer than 20 sheep in the pen. To check this claim you count as carefully as you can, and get the result that (P) there are 18 sheep in the pen. Given your antecedent justification for believing Q, you are justified in trusting your own counting and so you acquire a justification for P that intuitively transmits to Q, thereby strengthening your antecedent testimony-based justification for it. However, if this antecedent justification had not been in place, given that the flock was very mobile, by counting the sheep you could not have acquired a justification for P. Thus, the additional quantitatively strengthening justification transmitted to Q is not independent.
To summarise, additional justification comes apparently in two species at least: independent justification and quantitatively strengthening justification. This fact enables us to lay down three specifications of the general condition (iii+) necessary for justification transmission, each of which represents a condition necessary for the transmission of one particular type of justification. Let us call these specifications (iii-ft), (iii-ai) and (iii-aqs).
(iii-ft) says that s has first time justification for q achieved in virtue of the satisfaction of (i) and (ii). In counterfactual terms (iii-ft) says that:
s has first-time justification for q, and if s hadn't any justification for p based on e or hadn't known that p entails q, s would have had no first-time justification for q.
(iii-ai) says that s has additional independent justification for q achieved in virtue of the satisfaction of (i) and (ii). In counterfactual terms (iii-ai) says that:
s has additional independent justification for q, and if s hadn't any justification for p based on e or hadn't known that p entails q, s would not have had additional independent justification for q.
(iii-aqs) says that s has additional quantitatively strengthening justification for q achieved in virtue of the satisfaction of (i) and (ii). In counterfactual terms (iii-aqs) states that:
s has additional quantitatively strengthening justification for q, and if s hadn't any justification for p based on e or hadn't known that p entails q, s would not have had additional quantitatively strengthening justification for q.
Transmission of first-time justification makes the advancement of justified belief through deductive reasoning possible. However, the acquisition of first-time justification for q is not the sole possible improvement of one's epistemic position relative to q that one could expect from transmission of justification. To begin with, when q is already justified, one's epistemic standing towards q may be enhanced via transmission when the additional justification flowing from p to q is quantitatively strengthening. In this case, one's epistemic position with respect to q is improved in the sense that the strength of the justification for believing q is boosted. Transmission of additional justification for q may enhance one's epistemic position with respect to q whether or not the additional justification is quantitatively strengthening. Consider again Journey. As you learn E3, whether or not the degree of your antecedent justification for Q3 increases, Q3's epistemic standing relative to you improves nonetheless. For the additional justification transmitted to Q3 is independent of the antecedent justification for Q3, with the consequence that your overall justification for Q3 is more stable: if the antecedent justification for Q3 were defeated, in many cases the transmitted additional justification would survive. This epistemically beneficial phenomenon can be called transmission of ground-extending justification. A fourth possibility is when s is already justified in believing q and s acquires a justification from e for p that transmits to q as an additional independent justification that defeats q's antecedent justification. In this case s would improve her overall epistemic position towards q because s would replace an ill-founded justification for q with a (prima facie) trustworthy justification for it. One could describe this epistemically beneficial phenomenon as transmission of justification for a proposition that ends up supplanting an old justification for it. Here is an example. Since you spotted the obituary of Andrea in the yesterday Times, you have background evidence E* that gives you justification for believing (Q5) that Andrea will not spend her holiday in Mexico. Consider now this reasoning:
E5. Unexpectedly, you meet Andrea in town; she says she will not leave Europe for holiday.
P5. Andrea will not leave Europe for holiday.
Q5. Andrea will not spend her holiday in Mexico.
E5 gives you justification for believing P5 but E5 also defeats your original justification from E* for Q5. As you deduce Q5 from P5, your justification for P5 based on E5 transfers to Q5. So you are still justified in believing Q5 even if, presumably, to a lesser extent.
It is widely acknowledged that justification sometimes fails to transmit across known entailment (this acknowledgement dates back at least to Wright 1985). Moreover, it is no overstatement to say that the recent literature has investigated the phenomenon of failure of transmission of justification more extensively than that of transmission of justification. As we have seen, justification based on e transmits from p to q across the entailment if and only if (i) s has justification for p based on e, (ii) s knows that q is deducible from p, and (iii+) at least part of s's justification for q is based on the satisfaction of (i) and (ii). It follows from this characterisation that no justification based on e transmits from p to q across the entailment if condition (i), condition (ii), or condition (iii+) are not satisfied. These are cases of transmission failure.
The most trivial cases of transmission failure are such that it is true that condition (iii+) is unsatisfied because condition (i) or condition (ii) are unsatisfied, but it is also true that (iii+) would have been satisfied if both condition (i) and (ii) had been satisfied (cf. Tucker 2010b). In these cases the fact that no justification based on e transmits across inference from p to q is trivially explained by the fact that s has no justification for p from e in the first instance or s is unaware of the deductive link between p and q. Also note that these cases involve arguments that are not unsuitable for the purpose to transmit justification depending on evidence e: had the epistemic circumstances been congenial to the satisfaction of (i) and (ii), these arguments would have transmitted the justification based on e from p to q. As we could put the point, these arguments are transmissive of the justification depending on e—namely, they are capable of transmitting justification depending on that evidence when the epistemic circumstances are appropriate.
More interesting cases of transmission failure—or, for some authors (e.g., Beebee 2001), the only genuine cases of transmission failure—are those in which condition (iii+) remains unsatisfied even though both condition (i) and (ii) are satisfied. These cases concern arguments non-transmissive of justification depending on a given evidence, i.e., arguments incapable of transmitting justification depending on that evidence under any epistemic circumstance. Twins exemplifies one of these cases with respect to the justification depending on E2 when s has independent justification for Q2. In those circumstances (i) s has justification from E2 for P2. Furthermore (ii) s does know that P2 entails Q2. However, s has no justification for Q2 in virtue of her justification for P2 from E2 and her knowledge of the entailment from P2 to Q2. So (iii+) is not met. (Less interesting cases of transmission failure involving non-transmissive arguments are those in which (i) or (ii) are not satisfied. These are similar to the most trivial cases with the sole difference that the arguments would not have transmitted justification depending on given evidence from their premises to their conclusion even if (i) or (ii) had been satisfied.)
It is worth noting that none of these cases of failure of transmission of justification considered above entails failure of epistemic closure. For in none of these cases s has justification for believing p, s knows that p entails q, and s fails to have justification for believing q.
Unsurprisingly, the epistemologists contributing to the literature on transmission failure have principally devoted their attention to the cases of transmission failure involving non-transmissive arguments. Some epistemologists have attempted to identify conditions whose satisfaction suffices to make an argument non-transmissive of justification based on a given evidence. The next section is devoted to reviewing the most influential of these proposals.
Some non-transmissive arguments explicitly feature their conclusion among their premises. To illustrate the point, let us reformulate the conditions for transmission (i), (ii) and (iii+) to make them apply to deductive arguments with two premises p1 and p2 and conclusion q as follows: (i*) s has justification for p1 based on e1 and justification for p2 based on e2 (where e1 and e2 may coincide), (ii*) s knows that q is deducible from the conjunction of p1 and p2, and (iii+*) at least part of s's justification for q is based on the satisfaction of (i*) and (ii*). Consider a premise-circular argument that deduces p2 from p1 and p2. This argument cannot satisfy condition (iii+*) even if conditions (i*) and (ii*) are satisfied. The reason being that no part of s's justification for p2 can be acquired in virtue of, among other things, the satisfaction of (ii*). For if (i*) is satisfied, p2 will be justified for s by the relevant evidence e2 independently of s's knowledge that p1 and p2 jointly entail p2. And thus not in virtue of the satisfaction of (ii*).
Non-transmissive arguments are not necessarily premise-circular arguments. A different source of non-transmissivity instantiating a subtler form of circularity is the dependence of evidential relations on background or collateral information. This type of dependence is a rather familiar phenomenon: the boiling of a kettle on a camping stove gives one justification for believing that the temperature of the liquid inside is approximately 100 °C only if one knows that the liquid is water and that atmospheric pressure is the one of the sea-level. It doesn't if one knows that the kettle is on the top of a high mountain, or if one knows that the kettle contains, say, sulphuric acid.
Wright argues, for instance, that the following epistemic set-up, which he calls the information-dependence template, suffices for an argument's inability to transmit justification.
A body of evidence, e, is an information-dependent justification for a particular proposition p if whether e justifies p depends on what one has by way of collateral information, i. […] Such a relationship is always liable to generate examples of transmission failure: it will do so just when the particular e, p, and i have the feature that needed elements of the relevant i are themselves entailed by p (together perhaps with other warranted premises). In that case, any warrant supplied by e for p will not be transmissible to those elements of i. (2003, 59, edited.)
The claim that s's justification from e for p requires s to have background information i is customarily understood as equivalent (in this context) to the claim that s's justification from e for p depends on some type of independent justification for believing or accepting i.
It is possible to interpret this notion of dependence in counterfactual terms (see for instance Moretti & Piazza 2013). On this reading, to say that e gives s justification for believing p in a way that depends on s's independent justification for believing q is equivalent to saying that e gives s justification for believing p and that if s had no independent justification for believing q, e would not give s justification for believing p.
The instantiation of the information-dependence template appears sufficient for an argument's inability to transmit first-time justification. Consider again the following triad:
E2. This girl looks just like Jessica.
P2. This girl is actually Jessica.
Q2. This girl is not Jocelyn.
Suppose s's background information entails that Jessica and Jocelyn are indistinguishable twins. Imagine that s acquires E2. It is intuitive that E2 could justify P2 for s in Twins only if s had independent justification for believing Q2 in the first instance. Thus Twins instantiates the information-dependence template. Note that s acquires first-time justification for Q2 in Twins only if (i) E2 gives her justification for P2, (ii) s knows that P2 entails Q2 and (iii-ft) s acquires first-time justification for believing Q2 in virtue of (i) and (ii). The satisfaction of (iii-ft) requires s's justification for believing Q2 not to be independent of s's justification from E2 for P2. However, if (i) is true, the informational-dependence template requires s to have justification for believing Q2 independently of s's justification from E2 for P2. Thus, when the information-dependence template is instantiated, (i) and (iii-ft) cannot be satisfied at once. In general, no argument satisfying this template together with a given evidence will be transmissive of first-time justification based on that evidence.
One may wonder whether a deductive argument from p to q instantiating the information-dependence template will be unable to transmit additional justification for q. The answer seems to be affirmative when the additional justification is independent justification. Suppose the information-dependence template is instantiated such that s's justification for p from e depends on s's independent justification for q. Note that s acquires additional independent justification for q only if (i) e gives her justification for p, (ii) s knows that p entails q, and (iii-ai) s acquires an additional independent justification in virtue of (i) and (ii). This additional justification is independent of s's antecedent justification for q only if, in particular, condition (3) of the characterisation of additional independent justification is satisfied. (3) says that if s had not been antecedently justified in believing q, upon learning e, s would have acquired via transmission a first-time justification for believing q. (3) entails that if q were not antecedently justified for s, e would still justify p for s. Hence, the satisfaction of (3) is incompatible with the instantiation of the information-dependence template, which entails that if s had not antecedent justification for q, e would not justify p for s. The instantiation of the information-dependence template then precludes the transmission of independent justification.
The instantiation of the information-dependence template might also appear sufficient for an argument's inability to transmit additional quantitatively strengthening justification. Wright for instance suggests:
You could not acquire a first-time justification to think that q was satisfied in that way by transmission from p, since you would have to have justification for q already in order to conjure a justification for p; nor is it intelligible how such reasoning could strengthen a justification for q which you already possessed—for the justification for q cannot, in the circumstances be stronger than the justification for p, and the latter, presumably, is bounded by the strength of the demanded anterior justification for q. (2007, 36, edited.)
This suggestion might appear intuitively plausible: perhaps it is reasonable to expect that, if the justification from e for p depends on independent justification for another proposition q, the strength of the justification available for q sets an upper bound to the strength of the justification possibly supplied by e for p. However, it is arguable that there are arguments instantiating the information-dependence template that are able to transmit additional quantitatively strengthening justification from premise(s) to conclusion. Wright himself has presented an example—the mobile flock one described above—to illustrate this point. That argument seems both to instantiate the information-dependence template and to transmit to its conclusion an additional quantitatively strengthening justification. Moretti & Piazza (2013) present a more complex—and perhaps more convincing—example.
(Some authors have attempted Bayesian formalisations of the information-dependence template: see the supplement on Bayesian Formalisations of the Information-Dependence Template.)
So far we have seen that non-transmissivity may depend on premise-circularity or on reliance on collateral information. There is at least a third possibility: an argument can be non-transmissive of the justification for its premise(s) based on given evidence because that evidence justifies directly the conclusion—i.e., independently of the argument itself (cf. Davies 2009). In this case the argument instantiates indirectness, for s's going through the argument would result in nothing but an indirect (and unneeded) detour for justifying its conclusion. If e directly justifies q, no part of the justification for q is based on, among other things, s's knowledge of the inferential relation between p and q. So (iii+) is unfulfilled whether or not (i) and (ii) are fulfilled. Here is an example from Wright (2002):
E6. Jones has just kicked the ball between the white posts.
P6. Jones has just scored a goal.
Q6. A game of soccer is taking place.
Suppose s learns evidence E6. On ordinary background information E6 justifies P6 for s, s knows that P6 entails Q6, and E6 also justifies Q6 for s. It seems false, however, that Q6 is justified for s in virtue of her knowing that Q6 is deducible from P6 and her having justification for P6 based on E6. Quite the reverse, Q6 seems justified for s by E6 independently of s's knowing that Q6 is deducible from P6 and s's having justification for P6 based on E6. This is so because in the (imagined) actual scenario it seems true that s would still possess a justification for Q6 based on E6 even if E6 did not justify P6 for s. To see this, think of a situation slightly different from the (imagined) actual situation in which, just before seeing Jones kicking the ball between the white posts, s had noticed that the referee's assistant raised her flag to signal Jones's off-side. Against this altered background information, E6 no longer justifies P6 for s but it still justifies Q for s. So it seems false that in the (imagined) actual scenario, s would have justification for Q6 in virtue of, among other things, her knowing that Q6 is deducible from P6. Thus Soccer is non-transmissive of the justification depending on E6. In general, no argument instantiating indirectness in relation to some evidence will be transmissive of justification based on that evidence.
The information-dependence template and indirectness are diagnostics for a deductive argument's inability to transmit the justification for its premise(s) p based on evidence e to its conclusion q, where e is conceived of as a believed proposition capable of supplying inferential and (typically) fallible justification for p. (Note that even though e is conceived of as a belief, the collateral information i, which is part of the template, doesn't need to be believed on some views.) The justification for a proposition p might come in further forms. For instance, it has been proposed that a proposition p about the perceivable environment around the subject s can be justified for s either by s's believed proposition that it perceptually seems to s as if p, or by the fact that s directly apprehends the truth of p by the operation of her perceptual faculties. In the last case, s is claimed to attain a kind of non-inferential and infallible justification for believing p. The latter view has been explored by epistemological disjunctivists (see for instance McDowell 1982, 1994 and 2008, and Pritchard 2007, 2008, 2009, 2011 and 2012). Arguably, the exercise of other cognitive faculties—like memory, intellection or introspection—might also be, in favourable circumstances, a direct way to apprehend the truth of a proposition.
One might find it intuitively plausible that when s apprehends the truth of p by direct perception of the state of affairs that p, s attains non-inferential and infallible justification for believing p that doesn't rely on any of s's background information. Since this justification for believing p would be a fortiori unconstrained by s's independent justification for believing any consequence q of p, in these cases the information-dependence template could not possibly be instantiated. Therefore, one might be tempted to conclude that when s directly apprehends the truth of p, s acquires a justification that typically transmits to the propositions that s knows to be deducible from p (cf. Wright 2002). Pritchard (2009) comes very close to endorsing this view explicitly.
Under closer scrutiny this conclusion may not look that compelling though. Suppose one accepts a notion of epistemic justification with internalist resonances saying that a factor J is relevant to s's epistemic justification only if s is able to conclude, by reflection alone, whether J is or is not realised. On this notion, s's direct perception that p cannot provide s with justification for believing p unless s can rationally claim that she is directly perceiving that p upon reflection alone. Directly perceiving that p, however, is subjectively indistinguishable from hallucinating that p, or from being in some other delusional state in which it merely seems to s that she is directly perceiving that p. For this reason, one may find it compelling that s can claim by reflection alone that she's directly perceiving that p only if s has an independent reason for ruling out that it merely seems to her that she does (cf. mostly Wright 2011). If this is true, for many deductive arguments from p to q, s will be unable to acquire non-inferential and infallible justification for believing p of the type described by the disjunctivist capable of transmitting to q. In particular, this will happen whenever q is the logical negation of a proposition ascribing to s some delusionary mental state in which it merely seems to her that she is directly perceiving that p.
Wright's disjunctive template is meant to be a diagnostic of failure of transmission of non-inferential justification when epistemic justification is conceived of in the internalist fashion suggested above. According to Wright (2000), for any propositions p, q and r and subject s, the disjunctive template is instantiated whenever:
(a) p entails q;
(b) s's justification for p consists in s's being in a state subjectively indistinguishable from a state in which r would be true;
(c) r is incompatible with p;
(d) r would be true if q were false.
Consider again Twins but suppose that s's justification for believing P2 is based on s's having the state of affairs that P2 directly available in her perception. Let's call Twins* this variant of Twins. It is easy to check that Twins* instantiates the disjunctive template. To begin with, (a) P2 entails Q2; (b) s's justification for believing P2 is constituted by s's direct perception that P2, which is subjectively indistinguishable from the state s would be in if it were true that (R) the girl is Jocelyn; (c) R is incompatible with P2; and, trivially, (d) if Q2 were false R would be true.
Since Twins* instantiates the disjunctive template, it is non-transmissive of at least first-time justification. Note in fact that s acquires first-time justification for Q2 in this case if and only if (i) s has justification for P2 based on her direct perception that P2, (ii) s knows that P2 entails Q2, and (iii-ft) s acquires first-time justification for believing Q2 in virtue of (i) and (ii). Also note that (iii-ft) requires s's justification for believing Q2 not to be independent of s's justification for P2 based on her direct perception that P2. However, if (i) is true, the disjunctive template requires s to have justification to for believing Q2 independent of s's justification for P based on her direct perception that P2. (For if s could not independently exclude that Q2 is false, given (d), (c) and (b), s could not exclude that the incompatible alternative R to P2, which s cannot subjectively distinguish from P2 on the ground of her direct perception that P2, is true.) Thus, when the disjunctive template is instantiated, (i) and (iii-ft) cannot be satisfied at once.
McLaughlin (2003) has argued that if we accept the disjunctive template as a diagnostic for failure of transmission of non-inferential justification, we should conclude that justification cannot transmit across any argument from p to q known to be deductively valid whenever the justification for p is non-inferential and fallible, i.e., whenever having non-inferential justification for p is compatible with p's being false. The worrisome fact is that many arguments of this type intuitively transmit non-inferential fallible justification. Here is an example from Brown (2004). Consider the following deductive argument:
P7. The animal in the garbage is a fox.
Q7. The animal in the garbage is not a cat.
Suppose s has a fallible justification for believing P7 based on s's experience as if the animal in the garbage is a fox. If this experience by s is not conceived of as a direct apprehension of P7's truth, the justification that it supplies to s for P7 is certainly fallible. Take now R to be P's logical negation. Since the justification that s has for P7 is fallible, condition (b) above is met by default. As one can easily check, conditions (a), (c) and (d) are also met. So Fox instantiates the disjunctive template. Yet it is intuitive that Fox does transmit justification to its conclusion.
One could simply respond to McLaughlin that his argument is misplaced because it aims to show that transmission of fallible justification is blocked by the application of the disjunctive template irrespective of the fact that this template was meant to apply to infallible and not fallible justification. However, possessing a general diagnostic for transmission failure of non-inferential justification, whether fallible or infallible, would seem to be desirable in itself. A more useful response to McLaughlin is thus to refine the conditions listed in the disjunctive template in order not to let McLaughlin's argument go through while letting this template account for transmission failure of both fallible and infallible non-inferential justification. Wright (2011) for instance suggests replacing (c) with the following condition:
(c*) r is incompatible (not necessarily with p but) with some presupposition of the cognitive project of obtaining a justification for p in the relevant fashion.
According to Wright (2011)'s characterisation, a presupposition of a cognitive project is any condition such that doubting it before carrying out the project would rationally commit one to doubting the significance or competence of the project irrespective of its outcome. For a wide class of cognitive projects examples of these presuppositions include: normal and proper functioning of the relevant cognitive faculties, the reliability of utilised instruments, the obtaining of the circumstances congenial to the proposed method of investigation, the soundness of relevant principles of inference utilised in developing and collating one's results, and so on. Such presuppositions are propositions that we typically take for granted in everyday cognitive projects (like glancing at a clock to check the time) as well as in carefully controlled scientific experiment.
With (c*) in the place of (c), Fox no longer instantiates the disjunctive template. For the truth of R—the proposition that the animal in the garbage is not a fox—appears to jeopardize no presupposition of the cognitive project of obtaining a perceptual justification for P7. Thus (c*) is not fulfilled. On the other hand, arguments that intuitively do not transmit do satisfy (c*). Take again Twins. In that case R is the proposition that this girl is Jocelyn. Since R entails that environmental conditions are unsuitable for attaining perceptual justification for believing P2, R looks incompatible with a presupposition of the cognitive project of obtaining perceptual justification for P2. Thus R does satisfy (c*) in this case.
In order to illuminate philosophical puzzles (e.g., McKinsey Paradox illustrated above in Sect. 5.2) Davies has proposed other conditions—which he calls limiting principles—whose satisfaction would prevent an argument from possibly transmitting justification. Some of these principles will be discussed in Sect 5.1 and Sect. 5.2. Further conditions are considered in Pryor (forthcoming a) and Coliva (2012).
Let us say that a subject s doubts q just in case s either disbelieves or withholds belief about q, namely refrains from both believing and disbelieving q after deciding about q. s's doubting q should be distinguished from s's being open minded about q and from s's having no doxastic attitude whatsoever towards q (including withholding belief) because s has never thought of q or has not yet decided what attitude to have towards q (cf. Tucker 2010a). Let us say that a deductively valid argument from p to q has the power to resolve doubt about its conclusion just in case it is possible for s to be rationally moved from doubting q to be justified in believing q solely in virtue of grasping the argument from p to q and the evidence offered for p.
There is today wide agreement in the literature that the property of being a transmissive argument does not coincide with the property of being an argument capable of resolving doubt about its conclusion (see for example, Beebee 2001, Coliva 2010, Markie 2005, Pryor 2004, Bergmann 2004 and 2006, White 2006, Silins 2005 and Tucker 2010a). A reason for thinking so is that whereas the property of being transmissive appears to be a genuinely epistemic property of an argument, the one of resolving doubt seems to be only a dialectical feature of it, which varies with the audience whose doubt the argument is used to address. Consider for instance the following case in which the patently transmissive argument in Toadstool (presented in Sect. 1) does not resolve doubt about its conclusion. Suppose that that argument and evidence (E1) that three hours ago Jones consumed a large risotto of Boletus Satana are used to convince a stubborn external world sceptic of the conclusion (Q1) that Jones will shortly die. The sceptic is rationally required to doubt Q1 because, since she doubts the existence of the whole world, she will be rationally required to doubt the existence of Jones. For the same reason the sceptic will also be rationally required to doubt the existence of the poisoned risotto that E1 asserts has been ingested by Jones. Thus Toadstool will not convince the sceptic into believing Q1. For the sceptic's doubting Q1 will rationally require her to doubt that E1 is true, and thus that E1 is evidence for P1 (cf. Beebee 2001, Wright 2011 and Pryor 2004).
In spite of these considerations, a few authors (e.g., Davies 1998, and 2003a, 2004, and 2009, McLaughlin 2000 and Wright 2002, 2003, and 2007) have insisted that we should conceive of epistemic transmissivity in a way that proves very closely related or even identical to the capability of resolving doubt. Whereas some of these authors have eventually conceded that epistemic transmissivity cannot be defined as capability of resolving doubt (e.g., Wright 2011), others have attempted to articulate their views in full (see mostly Davies 2003a, 2004 and 2009). Suppose one wants to claim that an argument is transmissive when it is at the service of resolving a subject's doubt about the conclusion. One possible way to go is to conceive of the epistemic property of being non-transmissive of justification as the analogue of the dialectical property of being question begging in Jackson (1987, §6)'s sense. An argument begs the hearer's question in Jackson's sense when the hearer's doubting its conclusion rationally requires her to adopt new background assumptions on which its premises are no longer justified by the evidence adduced by the speaker. When an argument is question begging in this sense it is not at the service of resolving the hearer's doubt about the conclusion. In a parallel way, an argument could be considered to be non-transmissive when the fact that the subject doubts (or suppositionally doubts) its conclusion, in her own thought, rationally requires the subject to adopt new background assumptions on which the premises are no longer justified by the relevant evidence (cf. Davies 2003a, 2004 and 2009. For a critical discussion of Davies' project see Coliva 2010). As we will see below, it can be argued that Moore's proof and the inference central to McKinsey paradox are non-transmissive in this sense.
The notions of transmissive and non-transmissive argument, above and beyond being investigated for their own sake, have been put to work in relation to specific philosophical problems and issues. An important problem is the explanation of why Moore's infamous proof of a material world looks ineffective. Another issue pertains to the solution of McKinsey paradox. A third issue concerns Boghossian (2001 and 2003)'s explanation of our logical knowledge via implicit definitions, criticised as resting on a non-transmissive argument schema (see for instance Ebert 2005 and Jenkins 2008). As the debate focusing on the last topic is only at an early stage of its development, it is preferable to concentrate on the first two, which will be reviewed in respectively Sect. 5.1 and Sect. 5.2 below.
Much of the contemporary debate on Moore's proof of a material world is interwoven with the topic of epistemic transmission and its failure. Moore's proof can be reconstructed as follows:
E8. My experience is in all respects as of a hand held up in front of my face.
P8. Here is a hand.
Q8. There is a material world (since any hand is a material object existing in space).
Many philosophers find Moore's proof unsuccessful. A tempting explanation of this impression is that Moore is in non-transmissive in some of the senses described in Sect. 3 (see mainly Wright 1985, 2002, 2007 and 2011) or non-trasmissive in the non-standard sense described in Sect. 4—i.e., as incapable of resolving doubt about its conclusion (see mainly Davies 1998, 2000, 2003a, 2003b, 2004 and 2009). A different explanation is that Moore's proof does transmit justification but is dialectically ineffective (see mainly Pryor 2004).
According to Wright there exist cornerstone propositions—or simply cornerstones—for different areas of discourse. Along with Wright's characterisation of it, c is a cornerstone for an area of discourse d just in case for any proposition p belonging to d, p could not be justified for any subject s if s had no independent justification for accepting c (see mostly Wright 2004). Wright contends that the conclusion Q8 of Moore is a cornerstone for the area of discourse about perceivable things. The consequence is that if s had no independent justification for Q8, no proposition e describing an apparent perception could supply s with justification for any perceptual hypothesis p. It follows from this that Moore instantiates the information-dependence template considered in Sect. 3.2. For Q8 is part of the collateral information for which s needs independent justification if s is to receive some justification for P8 from E8. Hence Moore is non-transmissive. (See mainly Wright 2002.) It is worth emphasising that the thesis that Moore's proof is useless because non-transmissive in the sense explained is compatible with the claim that by learning E8 in Moore s does acquire a justification for believing P8. Wright (2004) contends for instance that we are rationally entitled to accept Q8 (as well as other cornerstones in general). Thus by learning E8 we do acquire justification for P8.
The evidence E8 in Moore is constituted by a proposition believed by s. One might suggest, however, that this is a misinterpretation of Moore's original proof. One might argue, in other words, that what is meant to give s justification for believing P8 in Moore's original proof is s's experience of a hand. If this is true, s's justification for P8 is no proposition believed by s, with the consequence that the information-dependence template cannot apply to Moore's proof and cannot be invoked to explain what is wrong with it in terms of transmission failure. Even so, one could still contend that Moore's proof is non-transmissive because it instantiates the disjunctive template—or a variant of it—described in Sect. 3.2 (cf. Wright 2002). Consider again Moore. Since P8 entails Q8, (a) is satisfied. Let R be the proposition that this is no hand but s is victim of a hallucination. Since R would be true if Q8 were false, (d) is also satisfied. Furthermore, take the grounds of s's justification for P8 to be s's direct apprehension of the truth of P8. Since this experience is a state for s indistinguishable from one in which R is true, condition (b) is also satisfied. Finally, it might be argued that one should not rely on one's apparent perceptions in forming one's beliefs about the environment if one is aware of the fact that one is hallucinating. In Wright's sense, then, the proposition that one is not hallucinating is a presupposition of the cognitive project of learning about one's environment through perception. It follows that R is incompatible with a presupposition of s's cognitive project of learning about one's environment through perception. Thus (c*) seems to be fulfilled too. So Moore's proof will not transmit the justification that s possesses for the premise to the conclusion. This is another possible explanation of why Moore's proof looks ineffective. Wright's analyses of Moore's proof and Wright's conservatism have mostly been criticised in conjunction with his theory of entitlement. A presentation of these objections is beyond the scope of this entry. (See however Davies 2004, Pritchard 2005 and Jenkins 2007. For a defence of Wright's views see for instance Neta 2007.)
Adapting the terminology introduced by Pryor (2004), a theory treats a hypothesis h conservatively with respect to a proposition p when the theory says that s has prima facie justification for believing p only if s has independent justification for believing h. A theory treats h liberally with respect to p, on the other hand, if it denies that in order to have prima facie justification for believing p, s must have independent justification for believing h. Consider now a non-perceiving hypotheses r with respect to a perceptual hypothesis p. For example, r might be: s is hallucinating that p. (Here r describes a situation incompatible with s having a veridical experience that p.) A theory of perceptual justification treats not-r (i.e., the logical negation of r) conservatively with respect to p if it says that s acquires a justification for believing p on the basis of her apparent perception that p only if she has independent justification for believing not-r. Whereas a theory of perceptual justification treats not-r liberally with respect to p if it says that in order to acquire a justification for believing p on the basis of her apparent perception that p, s does not need any independent justification for not-r. Note that the logical negation of Q8 in Moore is a non-perceiving hypothesis with respect to any perceptual hypothesis p. For if there is no material world, none of our experiences of material objects is veridical. Thus we can say that Wright's conception of the architecture of perceptual justification treats Q8 conservatively with respect to any perceptual hypothesis p (Pryor 2004, 335).
As anticipated, some philosophers contend that Moore's proof does transmit justification and that its ineffectiveness has a different explanation. An important conception of the architecture of perceptual justification, called dogmatism in Pryor (2000 and 2004), embraces a generalised form of liberalism about perceptual justification by stating that our experiences give us immediate and prima facie justification for believing their contents. Saying that our perceptual justification is immediate is saying that it does not presuppose—not even in part—justification for anything else. Saying that our justification is prima facie is saying that it can be defeated by additional evidence. Our perceptual justification would be defeated, for example, by evidence that a relevant non-perceiving hypothesis is true or just as probable as its negation. For instance, s's perceptual justification for believing P8 in Moore's proof would be defeated by evidence against Q8, or evidence that Q8 and Not-Q8 are equally probable. On this point the dogmatist and Wright do agree. They disagree on whether s's perceptual justification for P8 requires independent justification for believing or accepting Q8. The dogmatist denies that s needs that independent justification. Thus, according to the dogmatist, Moore's proof transmits the perceptual justification available for its premise to its conclusion.
The dogmatist argues (or may argue), however, that Moore's proof is dialectically flawed (cf. Pryor 2004). The contention is that Moore's is unsuccessful because it is useless for the purpose to convince the idealist or the external world sceptic that there is a material world. In short, the idealist and the global sceptic don't believe that there is a material world. Since the idealist and the sceptic don't believe Q8, they are rationally required to distrust any perceptual evidence offered in favour of P8 in the first instance. For this reason they both will reject Moore's proof as one based on an unjustified premise. Pryor's dogmatist analysis of Moore's proof has principally been criticised in conjunction with his liberalism in epistemology of perception. A presentation of these criticisms is beyond the scope of this entry. (See however Wright 2007, White 2006, Schiffer 2004, and Siegel and Silins, forthcoming.)
Whether one endorses a form of conservatism or liberalism about perceptual justification, one could explain the ineffectiveness of Moore's proof in a way that differs from either diagnosis presented above. This alternative account diagnoses Moore's proof with being non-transmissive in the specific sense (discussed Sect. 4) of being incapable of resolving doubt about its conclusion. Note that this interpretation agrees with the dogmatist's—who also thinks, or may think, that Moore's proof is unable to convince the idealist and the sceptic of the existence of a material world—but it also disagrees with it in regarding this fault as epistemic in nature rather than dialectic.
Diagnoses of non-transmissivity as incapability of resolving doubt can be systematised by appealing to limitation principles—i.e., principles that restrain justification transmission. A limitation principle that seems to explain why Moore is non-transmissive as incapable of resolving doubt about its conclusion has been proposed by Davies (2009) and it reads roughly as follows:
- The justification from e for believing the premise(s) p of a valid argument with conclusion q cannot be transmitted from premise(s) to conclusion if doubt about q would directly rationally require acceptance of a defeater for the justification from e for p.
The antecedent of (LP) would seem to be satisfied by E8, P8 and Q8 in Moore. Suppose s doubted (in her thought) Q8. This alone would rationally commit s to doubting that E8 actually justifies P8. Thus Moore turns out to be non-transmissive when (LP) is in place.
Interestingly enough, any argument satisfying the information-dependence template also satisfies the antecedent of (LP). Suppose the justification from e for the premise(s) p of a known deductively valid argument concluding in q is conditional on independent justification for q. This implies that any subject examining the argument who had a doubt about q would be rationally required to accept a defeater for the justification for p based on e. Hence non-transmissivity as incapability of satisfying (iii+) engendered by reliance on collateral information entails non-transmissivity as incapability of resolving doubt.
Accepting generalised conservatism about epistemic justification would have the converse effect: any argument satisfying the antecedent of (LP) would also satisfy the information-dependence template (cf. Davies 2009). Generalised epistemic conservatism says that for any e, p and q, if any doubt about q would defeat the prima facie justification from e for p, then e can supply justification for p only conditional on independent justification for q. Suppose now that p entails q, e prima facie justifies p, and that generalised conservatism is true. Also suppose that any doubt about q would directly rationally require acceptance of a defeater for the justification from e for p, so that this argument from p to q satisfies the antecedent of (LP). In this case e can supply justification for believing p only conditional on independent justification for believing q, so that the information-dependence template is satisfied. In conclusion, if generalised conservatism about epistemic justification is accepted, non-transmissivity as incapability of resolving doubt will entail non-transmissivity as incapability of satisfying (iii+) produced by reliance on collateral information.
McKinsey (1991, 2002, 2003 and 2007) has offered a reductio argument for the incompatibility of first-person privileged access to mental content and externalism about mental content. The privileged access thesis roughly says that it is necessarily true that if a subject s is thinking that x, then s can in principle know a priori (or in a non-empirical way) that she herself is thinking that x. Externalism about mental content roughly says that predicates of the form ‘is thinking that x’—e.g., ‘is thinking that water is wet’—express properties that are wide, in the sense that possession of these properties by s logically or conceptually implies the existence of relevant contingent objects external to s's mind—e.g., water. McKinsey argues that s may reason along these lines:
P9. I am thinking that water is wet.
P10. If I am thinking that water is wet then I have (or my linguistic community has) been embedded in an environment that contains water.
Q9. I have (or my linguistic community has) been embedded in an environment that contains water.
Water produces an absurdity. If the privileged access thesis is true, s knows P9 non-empirically. If semantic externalism is true, s knows P10 a priori by mere conceptual analysis. Since P9 and P10 do entail Q9 and knowledge is presumably closed under known entailment, s knows Q9—which is an empirical proposition—by simply competently deducing it from P9 and P10 and without conducting any empirical investigation. As this is absurd, McKinsey concludes that the privileged access thesis or semantic externalism must be false.
One way to resist McKinsey's incompatibilist conclusion that the privileged access thesis and externalism about mental content cannot be true together is to argue that Water is non-transmissive. Since knowledge is presumably closed under known entailment, it remains true that s cannot know P9 and P10 while failing to know Q9. However, McKinsey paradox originates from the stronger conclusion—motivated by the claim that Water is a deductively valid argument featuring premises knowable non-empirically—that s, by running Water, could come to know non-empirically the empirical proposition Q9 that she or members of her community have had contact with water. This is precisely what could not happen if Water is non-transmissive: in this case s could not learn Q9 on the basis of her non-empirical justification for P9 and P10, and her knowledge of the entailment between P9, P10 and Q9 (see mainly Wright 2000, 2003 and 2011, and Davies 1998, 2000, 2003a, 2003b and 2009).
A first possibility to defend the thesis that Water is non-transmissive is to argue that Water instantiates the disjunctive template (considered in Sect. 3.2) (cf. Wright 2000, 2003 and 2011). If Water is non-transmissive, s could acquire a justification for, or knowledge of, P9 and P10 only if s were in possession of an independent justification for, or knowledge of, Q9. (And to avoid the absurd result that McKinsey recoils from, this independent justification for Q9 should presumably be empirical.) If this diagnosis is correct, one need not deny P9 or P10 to block the intuitively false consequence that s could acquire knowledge of the empirical proposition Q9 in virtue of only non-empirical knowledge.
To substantiate the thesis that Water instantiates the disjunctive template one should first emphasise that the kind of externalism about mental content underlying P10 in Water is compatible with the possibility that s suffers from illusion of content. Were this to happen with P9 in Water, s would seem to introspect that she believes that water is wet whereas there is nothing like that content to be believed by s in the first instance. Consider:
R. ‘water’ refers to no natural kind so that there is no content expressed by the sentence ‘water is wet’.
s's state of having introspective justification for believing P9 is arguably subjectively indistinguishable from a situation in which R is true. Thus condition (b) of the disjunctive template is met. Moreover, R appears incompatible with an obvious presupposition of s's cognitive project of attaining introspective justification for believing P9, at least if the content that water is wet embedded in P9 is constrained by s or her linguistic community having being in contact with water. Thus condition (c*) is also met. Furthermore, P9 entails Q9 (when P10 is in background information). Hence condition (a) is fulfilled. If we could also show that (d) is satisfied in Water, in the sense that if Q9 were false R would be true, we would have shown that the disjunctive template is satisfied by Water. Wright (2000), for instance, takes (d) to be actually fulfilled and concludes that the disjunctive template is satisfied by Water.
Unfortunately, the claim that (d) is satisfied in Water cannot easily be vindicated (cf. Wright 2003). Condition (d) is satisfied in Water only if it is true that if s (or s's linguistic community) had not been embedded in an environment that contains water, the term ‘water’ would have referred to no natural kind. This is true only if the closest possible world w in which this counterfactual's antecedent is true is like Boghossian (1997)'s Dry Earth—namely, a world where no one has ever had any contact with any kind of watery stuff, and all apparent contacts with it are always due to multi-sensory hallucination. If w is not Dry Earth, but Putnam's Twin Earth, however, the counterfactual turns out to be false, as in this possible world people usually have contact with some other watery stuff that they call ‘water’. So, in this world ‘water’ refers to a natural kind, though not to one having chemical composition H2O. Since determining which of Dry Earth or Twin Earth is modally closer to the actual world (supposing s is in the actual world)—and so determining whether (d) is satisfied in Water—is a potentially elusive task, the claim that Water instantiates the disjunctive template appears to be less than fully warranted.
An alternative dissolution of McKinsey paradox—also based on a diagnosis of non-trasmissivity—seems however to be available if one considers the proposition (Q10) saying that s (or s's linguistic community) has been embedded in an environment containing some watery substance (cf. Wright 2003 and 2011). This alternative strategy assumes that Q10, rather than Q9, is a presupposition of s's cognitive project of attaining introspective justification for P9. Consider this expansion of Water:
P9. I am thinking that water is wet.
P10. If I am thinking that water is wet, then I have (or my linguistic community has) been embedded in an environment that contains water.
Q9. I have (or my linguistic community has) been embedded in an environment that contains water.
Q10. I have (or my linguistic community has) been embedded in an environment that contains some watery substance.
When Q9 is replaced with Q10 and R is the same proposition displayed above, it is easy to see that conditions (d), (b) and (c*) of the disjunctive template are satisfied. Furthermore (a) is satisfied at least in the sense that it seems a priori that P9 via Q9 entails Q10 (if P10 is in background information) (cf. Wright 2011). Even if Water does not instantiate the disjunctive template, a new diagnosis of what's wrong with McKinsey paradox could then rest on the claim that Water* instantiates the disjunctive template. On this novel diagnosis of non-transmissivity, what would be paradoxical is that s could earn justification for Q10 in virtue of her non-empirical justification for P9 and P10 and her knowledge of the a priori link from P9, P10 via Q9 to Q10. If one follows Wright (2003)'s suggestion that s is rationally entitled to accept Q10—namely to accept the presupposition that there is a watery substance that provides ‘water’ with its extension—Water becomes innocuously transmissive, and the apparent paradox surrounding Water vanishes. This is so at least if one grants that it is a priori that water is the watery stuff of our actual acquaintance, once it is presupposed that there is any watery stuff of our actual acquaintance. For useful criticism of responses of this type to McKinsey paradox see Sainsbury (2000), Pritchard (2002), Brown (2003) and (2004), McLaughlin (2003), McKinsey (2003) and Kallestrup (2011).
According to a different interpretation, the paradox elicited by Water is to the effect that s would be in position to settle the question—in the sense of removing doubt—about whether she or her community have been embedded in an environment containing water by simply reflecting on the content of her mental states and by attending to some specific implication of content externalism, but without engaging in any empirical investigation. If one accepts this interpretation, a way to dissolve the paradox is to show that Water is non-transmissive precisely in the sense that it is incapable of resolving doubt about its conclusion (cf. Davies 1998, 2000, 2003a and 2009). As we have seen in the previous section, diagnoses of non-transmissivity as incapability of resolving doubt can be systematised by appealing to limitation principles. Consider then following limitation principle, which is alluded to—even if not explicitly formulated—in Davies (2009):
- The justification from e1 and e2 for believing respectively the premise p1 and p2 of a valid argument with conclusion q cannot be transmitted from the premises to the conclusion if doubt about q taken together with the acceptance of the premise p2 as supported by e2 would directly rationally require acceptance of a defeater for the justification for p from e1.
Suppose the antecedent of (LP*) is satisfied by an argument that s has carried out. If s doubts the conclusion of the argument, s should also doubt at least one of its premises. So the argument is unable to dispel doubt about its conclusion and it is non-transmissive in this sense. It can be argued that Water does satisfy the antecedent of (LP*) so that it is non-transmissive in this sense.
Take E9 to be the theory of externalism about mental content. As we have already seen E9 gives s justification for believing P10 in Water—i.e., the conditional: ‘If I am thinking that water is wet, I have (or my linguistic community has) been embedded in an environment that contains water’. Note that E9 gives s justification for, not only P10, but also the following conditional:
If there is a content such as the proposition that water is wet to be thought by me, then (Q9) I have (or my linguistic community has) been embedded in an environment that contains water.
Suppose now that s doubts Q9. Since Q9 is the consequent of the above conditional, which s accepts, s is committed to doubting its antecedent. So s has to doubt that there is a content like the proposition that water is wet. But s's doubt that there is such a content for her to think rationally requires s to accept a defeater for her justification for believing P9 offered by her reflective evidence E10 (presumably, the proposition that it seems to me that I'm thinking that water is wet). For if there is no content like the proposition that water is wet for s to think, s cannot be thinking that water is wet, no matter what she might seem to introspect she is thinking. In conclusion, it appears that Water satisfies the antecedent of (LP*). For s's doubting Q9 taken together with her acceptance of the premise P10 as supported by E9 directly rationally requires s to accept a defeater for her justification from E10 for P9. Thus Water seems to prove non-transmissive in the sense of not being able to resolve antecedent doubt about its conclusion. For criticism see Beebee (2001), Pritchard (2002), McLaughlin (2003) and McKinsey (2003).
It has been argued that Water constitutes just one instance of the wider problem of armchair knowledge, where each instance of this problem is a palpably valid inference whose premise(s) can apparently be known to be true from the philosopher's armchair and yet whose conclusion is a proposition whose truth-value cannot apparently be known without rising from the armchair and conducting empirical investigation. The dissolutions of McKinsey paradox just considered could arguably be generalised to settle other instances of the problem of armchair knowledge (cf. Davies 2000, 2003a and 2003b).
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- Pryor, J., Uncertainty and undermining, paper manuscript.
- Transmission and Transmission Failure in Epistemology, entry in the Internet Encyclopedia of Philosophy, by C. Tucker (University of Auckland).
- Transmission of Warrant, PhilPapers online research in philosophy.
- Systematic Models of Transmission-Failure, list of papers maintained by Jim Pryor