Notes to Theory and Bioethics

1. The “principlism” of Beauchamp and Childress consists of the identification and elaboration of four fundamental moral principles: viz., autonomy, beneficence, non-malificence (more commonly known as the “harm principle”), and justice. It conceives of these principles as being prima facie (i.e., not absolutely) binding and lacking any a priori lexical ordering among them. These principles are supposedly drawn either from the confluence of many leading ethical theories (e.g., Kantian deontology and rule-utilitarianism) or from “common morality.” This approach to morality has many affinities with the moral theories of W.D. Ross and William Frankena.

2. The following paragraphs are drawn from my paper, “The Owl and the Caduceus: Does Bioethics Need Philosophy?” In F.G. Miller, J.C. Fletcher, and J.M. Humber (eds.), 2003, The Nature and Prospects of Bioethics: Interdisciplinary Perspectives, Totowa, NJ.: Humana Press: 3-5.

3. Once these anthologies move from the obligatory theoretical introduction to subsequent chapters on various bioethical problems, however, references to high theory are few and far between.

4. Bernard Gert has emphasized the importance of taking a systematic approach to our moral judgments in bioethics (Gert et al. 2006).

5. For a nice graphic illustration, see Jim Loy's webpage Ptolemy's Epicycles

6. Alasdair MacIntyre (1981) also famously criticizes the assumption, which he sees as central to “the Enlightenment project,” that our moral lives exhibit a unified structure.

7. Just as Jonsen eventually came to moderate his version of casuistry and to acknowledge a justificatory role for moral principles, so Beauchamp and Childress eventually acknowledged the important role of casuistry in the formulation and application of principles. (See Beauchamp and Childress 2009: 376-381.)

8. For an insightful exposition and critique of Dancy’s particularism, see Little and Lance (2006).

9. One important holdout to this methodological convergence remains Bernard Gert’s common morality approach. Whereas Beauchamp and Childress have generally responded to critical challenges by attempting to incorporate them into an ever-broadening and self-correcting methodological program, Gert’s approach has been to draw lines in the sand, sharply differentiating his powerful but rather idiosyncratic approach from both traditional ethical theories and from rival methods within bioethics, especially the principlism of Beauchamp and Childress. Thus, although Gert’s system certainly has made significant contributions to the field, it has not had as pervasive impact on the field as that enjoyed by principlism.

10. This suspicion of moral intuitions is more politely captured by James Griffin, who observes that “It is especially in ethics that intuitions have risen so far above their epistemological station” (Griffin 1996: 5).

11. Just how much additional support WRE brings to NRE is unclear, since all those theories presumably grow out of a body of case-based intuitions. See Daniels (1996) and Arras (2007).

12. I do not mean to suggest here that theorizing is the only source of moral knowledge or enlightenment in bioethics. As Cora Diamond (1995), Martha Nussbaum (1992), and many others would insist, richly textured narratives can also provide understanding and moral awareness in this area.

Notes to Supplement

13. See also Nussbaum (2000a).

14. Rawls initially stated his problem in terms of rational decision theory, according to which any rational agent, circumscribed by various factors in an idealized choosing situation or original position, would choose his two favored principles of justice. In subsequent works, Rawls backed off this ambitious program, choosing instead to situate his social contract theory within the historical-cultural-political milieu of a liberal, democratic society.

15. The following section taken from Arras (2009): 13, 15.

16. Beauchamp and Childress part company from Rawls, however, when they declare the tenets of the common morality to be foundational in a way that Rawlsian considered judgments are not.

Copyright © 2010 by
John Arras <jda3a@virginia.edu>

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