Notes to Time Machines

1. For a sampling of the physics literature on time machines, see Hawking (1992a, b), Krasnikov (1999, 2002), Morris and Thorne (1988), Morris, Thorne, and Yurtsever (1988), Visser (2003). For a sampling of the popular and semi-popular literature, see Davies (2002a, b), Gott (2001), Hawking (2001), and Nahin (1999).

2. See Arntzenius and Maudlin (2009) for a detailed discussion of the physics of time travel. We find, not without satisfaction, some indications in the recent philosophical literature that the logical and physical possibilities of time travel are more widely accepted than they were ten years ago. Recent attempts to argue for the compatibility of certain philosophical positions, such as presentism (cf. Keller and Nelson 2001; Monton 2003), with the possibility of time travel bear testimony of this development.

3. It is important to emphasize that since CTCs are always future-directed curves, the phenomenon at stake does not involve “backward causation” where the effect precedes its cause: at least locally, causation in the kind of time travel considered here is always “forward,” i.e., parallel to the direction of time.

4. The reader familiar with the physics literature will have noticed that many authors employ the concept of a time machine without due diligence. Often, they merely equate time machines with the presence of CTCs. Less frequently, they use it to designate spacetime constructions, such as wormholes, which exhibit physically realized CTCs. This supports our insistence on the utility of philosophical analysis in improving conceptual rigor.

5. Our take on this matter can be found in Earman et al. (2009). We argue that the notion of consistency constraint only makes sense when fields are propagated on a fixed spacetime background, which is contrary to the spirit of general relativity theory.

6. See Earman (1999) for an account of how these theorems came to be.

7. A relativistic spacetime (M, gab) is temporally orientable iff there exists a continuous everywhere defined timelike vector field on M. If such a field exists, reversing the arrows gives another such field. The choice of one of these fields as “pointing the way to the future” is what is meant by the assignment of a time orientation.

8. In this context, a (double) covering spacetime of a spacetime M may be defined as the set of all pairs (p, α) where pM and α encodes one of the two temporal orientations at p. A projection π: (p, α) → p maps events of the covering spacetime back into M. Locally, this projection must be a diffeomorphism in order for the covering spacetime to inherit the local differential structure of M. In case the double covering spacetime consists of two disparate parts, there exist two different, globally consistent assignments of a temporal orientation and (M, gab) is time-orientable. If the covering spacetime is connected, there exist smooth transitions from one time orientation to the other and vice versa. This implies that (M, gab) is not time-orientable, but that the covering spacetime is. Cf. Hawking and Ellis (1973), section 6.1.

9. Gödel spacetime does not possess a single global time slice. This follows from the facts that Gödel spacetime is simply connected, that it is time orientable, and that through each point of the spacetime there is a CTC.

10. If a spacetime possesses a global time slice Σ, then Σ can be turned into a partial Cauchy surface by passing to a covering spacetime which “unwinds” the future directed timelike curves that intersect Σ more than once in the original spacetime. Cf. Hawking and Ellis (1973), pp. 204f.

11. A standard result about general relativistic spacetimes shows that if V ≠ ∅, then V comprises an open subset of M.

12. The future domain of dependence D+(S) of a spacetime region SM is defined as consisting of all those spacetime points p such that every past endless causal curve through p meets S. If pD+(S) then there are possible causal processes which can affect the state of p but which do not register on S. The past domain of dependence D(S) of S is defined analogously. The total domain of dependence D(S) of S is D(S) ∪ D+(S). For a general discussion of causal determinism, see Hoefer (2003).

13. More precisely, H+(S) for an achronal set SM is defined as D+(S)I(D+(S)), where the overbar denotes the topological closure in M and I(X) denotes the chronological past of X, i.e., the set of all points pM such that there is a past directed timelike curve from X to p.

14. Theorem 8.3.5 of Wald (1984) shows that for an achronal set S, every point pH+(S) lies on a null geodesic contained within H+(S) which is either past inextendible or else has a past endpoint on the edge of S. In the case here concerned, S is a global time slice and, thus, has no edges.

15. Deutsch-Politzer spacetime in its original form, i.e., without the conformal doctoring as discussed in the subsequent paragraph, is due to Deutsch (1991) and Politzer (1992).

16. That is, there are geodesics that cannot be extended to indefinitely large values of an affine parameter. In fact, Deutsch-Politzer spacetime is timelike, spacelike, and null geodesically incomplete. Although there is no generally agreed upon criterion for singular relativistic spacetimes, geodesic incompleteness is generally accepted as a sufficient condition.

17. More precisely, strong causality is violated at a point p of spacetime M if there is a neighborhood of pM such that every subneighborhood has the property that some causal curve intersects it more than once. It follows from Proposition 6.4.7 of Hawking and Ellis (1973, 195) that strong causality cannot hold on a compact set SM if a past inextendible causal curve is imprisoned within S.

18. In more detail, this condition requires that the stress-energy tensor Tab, which describes the distribution of matter-energy, satisfies TabVaVb ≥ for all timelike vectors Va. In the case of perfect fluid with energy density μ and pressure p, this requirement is satisfied iff μ ≥ and μ + p ≥ 0. Obviously, in the vacuum case (Tab ≡ 0) the weak energy condition is automatically satisfied. See Wald (1984, 218-220) for more details on the energy conditions.

19. For an illustrative example, see the cut-and-paste construction in Hawking and Ellis (1973, 58f). The resulting spacetime is maximal but not hole free. To rule out such examples Hawking and Ellis employ the requirement that a physically acceptable spacetime (M, gab) be locally inextendible, i.e., there is no open subset UM with non-compact closure in M such that the sub-spacetime (U, g|U) affords an extension (U′, g′) in which the closure of the isometric image of U is compact. Unfortunately, this requirement is too strong: it fails for Minkowski spacetime!

20. The uniqueness proof for solutions to the initial value problem for Einstein’s field equations contains an “up to diffeomorphism” proviso. The reader familiar with Einstein’s “hole argument” will appreciate the significance of this proviso; see Norton (2008). We ignore these issues since they are not relevant to present concerns.

21. An achronal spacelike hypersurface S is said to be a Cauchy surface for a spacetime (M, gab) iff D(S) = M.

22. The existence of a Cauchy surface for a spacetime (M, gab) is equivalent to the requirement of global hyperbolicity, which is the conjunction of two conditions: (i) (M, gab) is strongly causal at every point pM, and (ii) J+(p) ∩ J(q) is compact for all p, qM. J+(p) designates the causal future of p, defined as the set of all points in M which can be reached from p by a future-directed non-spacelike curve in M. The causal past J(p) is defined analogously. If CTCs are present then, obviously, global hyperbolicity fails.

23. A weaker form of cosmic censorship requires only that any naked singularities that develop from regular initial data are hidden behind the event horizons of black holes. For a recent review of the prospects of cosmic censorship, see Wald (1998).

24. That quantum fields violate the weak energy condition is irrelevant to the present context, which is classical general relativity theory. It does, however, become relevant to the discussion of the following section.

25. For other expressions of doubt about the status of the condition that H+0) is compactly generated, see Ori (1993) and Krasnikov (1999).

26. Actually, it is the renormalized stress-energy tensor that is used in calculating backreaction effects; see below.

27. The Unruh and Hawking effects, though closely related, are different. For an authoritative account, see Wald (1994).

28. For a review of loop quantum gravity, see Rovelli (2004). For string theory there is little in the middle ground between popularizations (e.g. Greene 1999) and formidably technical treatises. But Zwiebach (2004) is a reasonably accessible text.

29. For overviews of these results, see Visser (2003).

30. This is the so-called Hadamard condition, which demands that the two-point correlation function for the quantum field is of what is called the Hadamard form.

31. For a review of the causal set approach with the relevant references, see Brightwell et al. (2003). A set is called causal iff it is endowed with a binary relation which is transitive, acyclic, and past-finite, i.e., each element has a finite number of elements to its past. This relation is interpreted as capturing relations of causal precedence and thus as encoding the causal structure of spacetime at the scale of Planck.

32. “Suggests” rather than “implies” because the theorem requires the construction of a bijection between the elements of the causal set and the points of the spacetime manifold to be emulated. Malament (1977) shows how this bijection, if it preserves the causal structure, and if both the set and the spacetime are future- and past-distinguishing, also preserves the topological and therefore the metrical structure. A spacetime (M, gab) is future- (or past-) distinguishing iff for all p in M and for all open neighborhoods of p, there exists an open subset of the neighborhood which contains p such that no future- (or past-) directed curve through p which leaves the subset ever returns to it. Thus, a future-distinguishing spacetime cannot contain CTCs.

Copyright © 2010 by
John Earman <>
Christian Wüthrich <>

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