Timon of Phlius

First published Thu Aug 8, 2002; substantive revision Tue Nov 9, 2010

Timon (c. 320–230 BCE) was the younger contemporary and leading disciple of Pyrrho of Elis. Unlike Pyrrho, he wrote numerous poems and prose works; fragments of and reports on some of these have survived, by far the largest number (more than sixty) being from the Silloi (Lampoons). Several of these works were devoted to, or at least included, laudatory descriptions of Pyrrho and his philosophy; the Silloi appears to have contained some passages in this vein, but consisted largely of satirical thumbnail sketches of a wide range of other philosophers, all of whom, in Timon's estimation, failed wholly or partly to achieve the ideal outlook exemplified by Pyrrho. Despite the hazards of attempting to extrapolate from this meager and highly colored material, it constitutes much the best evidence we have for the character of Pyrrho's thought. There is, however, some indication that Timon also took stands on philosophical matters about which Pyrrho is unlikely to have had anything to say. And even when he can be assumed to be emulating Pyrrho's frame of mind, he may sometimes be expanding on or adapting Pyrrho's original position rather than simply reporting it. He should not, then, be regarded as a mere carbon copy of his teacher.

The present article concentrates on the nature of Timon's writings, and on contributions to philosophy that may be thought to be original with him.

1. Life

On the basis of a number of slender indications, Timon's date of birth is generally set at around 325–320 BCE and his date of death at around 235–230 BCE. For the details of his life we are wholly dependent on the brief account in Diogenes Laertius (9.109–115) (see the entry on doxography of ancient philosophy), who wrote perhaps around 200 CE, which claims to be drawn from several earlier sources. According to Diogenes, Timon initially studied (after an early career as a dancer in his home town of Phlius) with Stilpo of Megara. After an interval in which he returned home and married, he then went to Elis to study with Pyrrho. Diogenes makes it sound as if his stay at Elis was relatively brief; he says that it lasted until Timon had children (9.109), and that at that point he was compelled to go elsewhere to make money as a sophist, or paid teacher of philosophical and other theory to late adolescent young men. But whatever the length of his association with Pyrrho, Timon became an adherent of Pyrrho's philosophy from then on. His activities as a sophist (whatever exactly these involved) appear to have left him financially secure; we are told that he then went to Athens and lived there (except for a short stay at Thebes) until his death. Diogenes names two kings with whom he was acquainted, and several poets with whom he collaborated; it is difficult to know what to make of this information, although the recent work of Clayman (2010) has shown, by means of detailed parallels with contemporary poetry, that he was deeply immersed in the poetic world of his time. During his time at Athens—probably several decades—he is likely also to have made the acquaintance of the leading philosophers of the time; Diogenes includes anecdotes featuring him making fun of Arcesilaus, who was head of the Academy during most or all of this time, but he no doubt encountered Stoics and Epicureans as well. That no representatives of any of these schools refer to him in any surviving records is perhaps not surprising, given the scathing critiques that are implicit in his portraits of them in the Silloi.

2. Works

The Silloi, in hexameter verse, has already been mentioned. The other poem from which a few fragments survive was called Indalmoi (Images or Appearances), which was in elegiac couplets (alternating hexameters and pentameters). The significance of this title is by no means clear. It might refer to the “appearances” on the basis of which Pyrrhonists are compelled to make their decisions; one of the surviving lines from the poem reads “But the appearance [to phainomenon] is powerful everywhere, wherever it comes” (quoted in Diogenes Laertius 9.105), and most scholars have taken this to point to the importance of appearances in shaping our actions. Another possibility is that the ‘images’ referred to in the title are images of Pyrrho himself, and that the poem was a depiction of Pyrrho and his blissful tranquility; the longest surviving fragment from the poem—a sequence of seven lines pieced together from three passages in Diogenes Laertius and Sextus Empiricus—certainly fits this description. A third suggestion is that ‘images’ or ‘appearances’ is to be taken in a negative sense, referring to the fictions or illusions by which naive non-Pyrrhonists are taken in. Possible support for this comes from a single pentameter line, which is regularly assigned to the Indalmoi because of the meter. This reads “but these things are judged by mind [or: by convention] on the part of humans” (Sextus Empiricus M 11.140); the context suggests that the ‘things’ in question are things (wrongly) taken to be by nature good or bad. None of these proposals as to the character of the work can be ruled out, but none can be regarded as more than conjecture. With the exception of a four-line fragment about “the nature of the divine and the good”, which is probably the most contentious of all the fragments of Timon, no other lines survive beyond the three passages just referred to. (See the discussion of “The Nature of the Divine and the Good” in the entry on Pyrrho, for a brief account of the difficulties surrounding this fragment.) Nor do we have any general description of the work (unlike in the case of the Silloi—see the next section); Diogenes Laertius does not even include it in his list of Timon's works, although he does elsewhere cite it. Thus despite the importance of the few surviving pieces of the Indalmoi, the poem as a whole is almost entirely opaque to us.

Diogenes (9.110) claims that, in addition to the poems already mentioned, Timon wrote sixty tragedies and thirty comedies, as well as epics, satyr plays and kinaidoi (usually translated ‘obscene poems’—kinaidos normally means ‘catamite’; see Strabo 14.1.41, Athenaeus XIV.620e–f for what appear to be other references to the same verse form). He says that Timon indulged in poetry while taking time off from philosophy; but the poems he lists in this context include the Silloi, which certainly qualifies as part of Timon's philosophical activity. The report is confused in other ways as well; in any case, no trace of this voluminous non-philosophical corpus, if it ever existed, seems to have survived. (There are a few lines of Timon's verse that cannot be definitely attributed to either the Silloi or the Indalmoi; but there is no particular reason to believe that they derive from any of these other works.)

The remaining works attributed to Timon are prose works. Of these the most important is the Pytho. We are told (by Aristocles in Eusebius, Praeparatio evangelica 14.18.14) that this described a meeting and a dialogue between Timon and Pyrrho; Timon portrayed himself as encountering Pyrrho by a temple, as he was walking towards Pytho (the region that included Delphi). Whether the work itself was in a dialogue form, or merely recounted a dialogue in the third person, is not clear. But it appears that this dialogue consisted of a thorough presentation of Pyrrho's outlook and demeanor; Diogenes Laertius, in what seems to be a reference to the same work (9.67), says that Timon ‘clarifies’ (diasaphei) Pyrrho's disposition (diathesin) in the account that he ‘goes through’ (diexeisin, a word often used of detailed exposition). This account will presumably have been placed in Pyrrho's mouth, with Timon himself depicted as an eager pupil. (This motif seems to have been a recurring one in Timon's writings; fragments from both the Silloi and the Indalmoi consist of questions put to Pyrrho—most probably by Timon himself as speaker—about how he manages to sustain his tranquility.) There is one quotation from the Pytho and one further report about a statement that it included; both are of some philosophical significance, and will be touched on below, but neither furnishes any additional clues concerning the general character of the Pytho itself. It has usually been thought that the setting of the dialogue has symbolic significance (Delphi being the seat of the important oracle of Apollo), but the interpretations that have been offered of this are various. Aristocles offers a summary of an account by Timon of the central points of Pyrrho's philosophy, and this is often thought to have occurred in the Pytho; but this is no more than plausible speculation. (The summary itself, however, is crucial for the reconstruction of Pyrrho's views; for discussion see the entry on Pyrrho.)

Diogenes (9.105) mentions a work called On the Senses and Sextus (M 3.2) mentions a work called Against the Physicists. Again, the specific words or ideas that are attributed to Timon in these contexts deserve some discussion, but they tell us little or nothing about the works themselves, beyond what the titles would anyway suggest. It is worth noting, however, that there is no indication that these works consisted of or included exposition of Pyrrho's philosophy. Finally, Diogenes tells us (9.115) that Timon praised Arcesilaus (who, during Timon's lifetime, took the Academy in a skeptical direction) in a work called Arcesilaus' Funeral Banquet—this by contrast with his attacks on him in the Silloi, as Diogenes mentions and as we can confirm from the surviving fragments. This work is generally taken as evidence that Timon outlived Arcesilaus. But given Timon's penchant for elaborate narrative conceits, the inference is hazardous. As Clayman (2010), 13–15 has made clear, the funeral banquet was a recognized parodic verse form dating back to before Timon's day, and by no means requires that its subjects be actually deceased; the genre also gives us grounds for wondering whether the praise of Arcesilaus was partly or even wholly mock-praise.

2.1 The Shape and Character of the Silloi

Literary devices appear to have been extensively employed in the Silloi. Diogenes Laertius tells us (9.111) that the Silloi was divided into three books. In the first book Timon spoke solely in the first person, whereas the second and third took the form of dialogues between Timon himself and the early (late 6th c. BCE) philosopher Xenophanes. Timon is said to have questioned Xenophanes about every philosopher—the older ones in the second book and the more recent in the third book—and Xenophanes answered him. The work as a whole, however, was devoted to abuse and ridicule of non-Pyrrhonist philosophers. It looks as if part of the work was modeled after the famous scene in Odyssey Book XI where Odysseus visits the underworld; several fragments include the words ‘I saw’ or ‘I recognized’ (where the person seen or recognized is a dead philosopher), and this formula is highly reminiscent of Odysseus' language in describing his encounters with his dead comrades. There are other echoes of Homer as well, most notably from the early books of the Iliad, the effect being to represent philosophical disputants as literal combatants. Clayman (2010), chapter 3 identifies two other likely scenes: “Marketplace of Ideas” in which philosophers are shown selling their ideas, and “Hyde Park Corner”, in which philosophers address crowds. Clayman, however, convincingly argues against the hypothesis of a fishing scene, accepted by several earlier scholars; the fragments that have been taken to depict philosophers as fishers or as fish frequently do not need to be, or even lend themselves especially to being, interpreted in this way.

Timon is indebted for his style and tone in the Silloi to a tradition of moralizing diatribe prevalent among the Cynics. The word tuphos, ‘vanity,’ was a favorite Cynic term of invective, and it occurs in several fragments from the Silloi, as do a number of related terms. The Cynic Crates also wrote satirical verses; one of the few surviving fragments of Crates begins “And I saw Stilpo enduring severe pains in Megara,” which is a parody of a line from Odyssey XI and again seems to assimilate a philosophical encounter to Odysseus' underworld encounters. Crates' writings may well, then, have been an important influence on the Silloi (on this see Long 1978). A more distant inspiration was Xenophanes, who can plausibly be seen as the originator of the genre of philosophical satire in which Timon was writing. (Later sources even give Silloi as the title of a poem by Xenophanes; but it is not clear whether this title was attached to the poem before or only after Timon's day.) This is surely part of the reason for Timon's choice of Xenophanes as the main character in the second and third books.

But there were philosophical as well as literary reasons for this choice, and this takes us into the question of the outlook projected by the poem. In one of the two surviving fragments concerned with Xenophanes, he is referred to as hupatuphos, ‘partly free from tuphos.’ Pyrrho is the only one who managed to be entirely ‘free from tuphos’ (atuphos); but in the highly critical context of the Silloi, the epithet hupatuphos already raises Xenophanes above almost all the other philosophers who appear in the poem. The specific point for which Timon singles him out for this qualified praise is that he was a “mocker of Homeric deception.” This clearly refers to Xenophanes' criticism of Homer's (and Hesiod's) anthropomorphic depiction of the gods (in which, among other typically human faults, they engage in deception—Timon's coinage ‘of Homeric deception’ (Homêrapatês) may very well be a reflection of this point). This is not to say, however, that Timon wholly approves of Xenophanes' theological stance. For Xenophanes' positive view, according to which there is one unchanging god, appears to be a target for criticism in the same fragment (which is why he qualifies only as partly free from tuphos). In fact, it looks as if Timon is suspicious of theological pronouncements of any kind. For in another fragment Timon (very unusually among ancient commentators) praises Protagoras for his agnostic attitude towards the gods. This is understandable given the general framework supplied by Pyrrho; however precisely Pyrrho's thought is interpreted, he clearly rejected physical speculation—and it was under that heading that speculation about the gods was taken, in the Hellenistic period, to belong.

In another fragment Xenophanes is represented as regretting his failure to ‘look both ways’ (to be amphoterobleptos), and so embracing an ill-considered monism. (This interpretation of Xenophanes, which assimilates him to the Eleatics, is highly disputable given the surviving fragments, but was common in the ancient world.) The ability to ‘look both ways’ is therefore presented as a positive characteristic, and this is echoed in two other fragments. Zeno of Elea is described as ‘double-tongued’ (amphoteroglôssos)—presumably on the basis of his paradoxes arguing for two opposite conclusions—and Democritus is described as ‘two-minded’ (amphinoon); the contexts make clear that these, too, are intended as positive appellations. Timon is eager, then, to reject any fixed or one-sided view of reality. Again, the precise interpretation of this attitude will depend in part on one's conception of Pyrrho's philosophy; but the link with a Pyrrhonist outlook is, at a general level, not hard to see. In the same fragment Xenophanes is also pictured as regretting his failure to engage in skeptosunê. It is tempting to read this as an early occurrence of the notion of skepticism familiar to us from the later Pyrrhonist (or Neo-Pyrrhonist) Sextus Empiricus. But there is no clear reason for doing so; the term may just mean ‘inquiry’ in the usual sense, and Xenophanes may simply be bemoaning his inadequate investigation of things.

Zeno is not the only Eleatic thinker to receive favorable treatment in the Silloi. Timon calls Parmenides ‘high-minded’ and ‘not full of opinions,’ and says that he “elevated our thought-processes from the deception of appearance.” This clearly refers to Parmenides' rejection of ordinary common-sense views of reality, and of the senses as an adequate guide to the nature of reality; and it is no doubt on the same grounds that Parmenides' follower Melissus is described as “above many illusions and yielding to few.” This, of course, indicates that Melissus did go wrong in certain respects, but that is not surprising. As was suggested in the previous paragraph, Timon would have had little sympathy for the Eleatics' positive doctrines; he regards them as valuable because they refuse to accept any simple-minded conception according to which things are as they seem.

As was mentioned in the previous section, Timon's picture of Arcesilaus, in three surviving fragments of the Silloi, appears wholly uncomplimentary; although the imagery in these fragments (shorn of their surrounding context) is not entirely perspicuous, the general impression seems to be of an unoriginal and self-important fool. This may seem surprising given the points just mentioned; one might have expected that Arcesilaus' skepticism would have struck Timon as highly congenial. However, there do clearly seem to have been some differences in temperament and approach between Arcesilaus and Pyrrho; and this may be a case (of a kind common in intellectual history) where broad common ground led to especially intense rivalry over differences that, from an outsider's perspective, might have seemed insignificant.

We only have one fragment specifically cited from the Silloi in which Pyrrho himself is the subject; one other about Pyrrho is regularly and probably correctly assigned to the Silloi, and the same is true of a third fragment about Pyrrho's follower Philo. In all three fragments (as in the fragment on Pyrrho from the Indalmoi) the emphasis is on the attainment of a supremely tranquil disposition. This tranquility is associated with a refusal to be involved in detailed speculations about the universe, and also with not engaging in contentious disputes with philosophical opponents. (By contrast, several other fragments about non-Pyrrhonists berate them for their contentiousness.) But these fragments give few if any clues about the specifics of Pyrrho's (or Timon's) thought. The aim in the Silloi is clearly to evoke a certain kind of ideal attitude rather than to detail the means of attaining that attitude.

This is not to say, however, that the Silloi has no concern for philosophical detail. We have seen that Timon's remarks about those philosophers of whom he partially approves often point to specific views of theirs as worthy of praise or criticism. Similarly, many of the fragments on philosophers with whom he has no sympathy pick on some central point in their philosophies as material for caricature—Mind in the case of Anaxagoras, for example, or the four basic elements in the case of Empedocles. The surviving fragments include portraits of most of the major Greek philosophers up to and including Timon's time; like good political cartoons, they are sharply drawn and often savagely witty. Indeed, it is arguable that the intensity of the implied criticism in these fragments is at odds with the calm demeanor, and the lack of concern with competitive philosophical debate, that Timon elsewhere celebrates in Pyrrho. Timon may have been an effective spokesman for Pyrrho's outlook, but it is not clear that he entirely succeeds in exemplifying it himself.

3. Evidence of Other Philosophical Activity

As was noted earlier, the surviving fragments of the Indalmoi include a line that is plausibly taken to point to the importance, for the Pyrrhonist, of the appearances of things as a basis for decision and action. Whether or not it is this theme that is alluded to in the title Indalmoi itself (see above, in Section 2, Works), it looks as if this is a topic to which Timon returned in several works. The sole reference to Timon's On the Senses is a quotation that reads “that honey is sweet I do not posit, but that it appears so I agree” (Diogenes Laertius 9.105). Both the context in Diogenes, and the obvious implication of the words themselves, suggest that here too Timon is making the same point: for practical purposes it is both possible and legitimate for Pyrrhonists to let themselves be guided by appearances of things, even while they rigorously refrain from attributing definite characteristics to those things in their real nature. On this matter Timon's influence on the Pyrrhonist tradition seems to have been far-reaching; the same point and the same example (and even the notion of “agreeing” that things appear a certain way, although the Greek words are not identical) reappear in the opening pages of Sextus Empiricus' Outlines of Pyrrhonism (1.20).

The same passage of Diogenes Laertius includes a reference to another remark of Timon, this time from the Pytho; according to Diogenes, Timon said in this work that he had not “gone outside sunêtheia.” Sunêtheia can mean several things. But the meaning that best fits the context, and the one that tends to occur in epistemological contexts in general, is ‘ordinary experience.’ Diogenes is commenting on the Pyrrhonists' response to the common objection that their philosophy amounts to a rejection of life itself. The Pyrrhonists, he says, reply that this is not so, since they readily accept that things appear in their many familiar ways; it is only at the level of the underlying nature of things that they avoid definite pronouncements. The comment from the Pytho is then cited as an instance of this kind of reply. Timon, then, is apparently saying that, in allowing the appearances to guide his behavior, he is not doing away with our everyday experience of things.

The fact that Timon needs to make this statement suggests that the accusation regularly leveled against the Pyrrhonists (as well as the skeptical Academy), that it would be impossible to live in accordance with their philosophy, goes back to the earliest phase of the tradition. It was perhaps in response to this objection that Timon developed this position on the practical value of the appearances. While we cannot exclude the possibility that it was already an element in Pyrrho's thinking, there is no evidence linking Pyrrho with any remarks about appearances; this may, then, be Timon's own contribution, prompted by hostile criticism.

There are other instances where it is not clear whether Timon is simply reproducing Pyrrho's outlook or adding creatively to it. For example, Diogenes reports that in the Pytho Timon offered a gloss on the phrase ‘no more’ (ouden mallon), namely, ‘determining nothing and withholding assent’ (9.76). The phrase ouden mallon became a stock Pyrrhonist expression, and occurs several times in connection with Pyrrho's own views. But is Timon here giving his own distinctive explanation of the significance of this phrase? Given the meager evidence available, we cannot hope to settle the matter. It has even been suggested that large parts of the Pyrrhonist position expounded in the key passage of Aristocles mentioned earlier are in fact additions by Timon to a core idea of Pyrrho's. But this is controversial, and the passage as a whole has generally been taken to be giving us the philosophy of Pyrrho—though via the medium of a summary by Timon. However, since so much of what we know about Pyrrho comes through Timon, the line between these two possibilities is often very difficult to draw.

There are, though, two cases where it seems clear that Timon is speaking for himself rather than reproducing the thoughts of Pyrrho. Sextus (M 3.2) reports a comment (from Timon's On the Physicists) about the legitimacy of using hypotheses. He also twice reports a remark of Timon about divisibility and time (M 6.66, 10.197—the wording is not quite identical, but it is clearly the same thought in both places); it is a reasonable supposition that this too came from On the Physicists, although Sextus does not say so. Now in both cases Timon is involved in a very different kind of activity from anything attested for Pyrrho. He is intervening in technical philosophical debates; the very concepts at issue make this clear. But as we saw earlier, philosophical debate was something that Pyrrho rigorously avoided; this was emphasized by Timon himself as one of the main sources of his tranquility. Again, it appears that Timon does not entirely live up to the ideal that he ascribes to his teacher.

Beyond the fact that these are Timon's own ideas, the amount that we can learn from Sextus' reports is less than one might have hoped. On the subject of hypothesis, he simply tells us that Timon regarded it as a question of primary importance whether anything should be assumed by hypothesis. The practice of assuming things by hypothesis appears to have had its original home in geometry, and it is not surprising that the remark is cited at the beginning of Sextus' Against the Geometers. But the occurrence of the remark in a work called Against the Physicists may suggest that Timon had in mind a notion of unargued assumption that was not restricted to any particular subject-matter. In any case, it is a fair conjecture that Timon's implied answer to the question was ‘no’; accepting things by hypothesis is equivalent to accepting them without grounds, and this is a highly dubious procedure. If so, Timon anticipates the Mode from Hypothesis, which is one of the Five Modes of the later Pyrrhonists (and where the notion of hypothesis has lost its specific link with geometry).

The other claim that Sextus attributes to Timon is that no process divisible into temporal parts—such as coming into being, perishing, and the like—can take place in an indivisible time. Sextus uses this as an argument for the conclusion that the present is not indivisible; but there is no clear indication that this was Timon's purpose as well. The claim itself is unobjectionable, indeed almost tautological; one can imagine numerous contexts in debates about the nature of time in which it might have had a point. Some scholars have sought to link it to doctrines current in the immediately preceding period, including those of Timon's first teacher Stilpo of Megara. But again, it is hard to connect such a trivially true statement with any definite philosophical position. If Timon retained any of Stilpo's teachings, they were most likely in the area of ethics; Stilpo, and the Megarians generally, seem to have espoused an ideal of mild or moderate feeling and freedom from disturbance that is recognizably akin to Pyrrho's tranquility.

Bibliography

Ancient Texts

  • Decleva Caizzi, F., 1981, Pirrone:Testimonianze, Naples: Bibliopolis. Complete collection of texts referring to Pyrrho, with Italian translation and commentary; includes most of the surviving material from Timon.
  • Di Marco, M., 1989, Timone di Fliunte: Silli, Rome: Edizione dell'Ateneo. Fragments from the Silloi, with Italian introduction, translation and commentary.
  • Diels, H., 1901, Poetarum Philosophorum Fragmenta, Berlin: Weidmann: 173–206. Comprehensive edition of texts by and about Timon, with intermittent comments in Latin.
  • Lloyd-Jones, H. and P. Parsons, 1983, Supplementum Hellenisticum, Berlin/New York: Walter de Gruyter: 368–395. Includes all verse fragments from Timon.
  • Long, A. A. and D. N. Sedley, 1987, The Hellenistic Philosophers, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press (2 vols.), sections 1–3. Includes a number of representative fragments from Timon. Vol.1 contains texts in English translation with philosophical commentary; vol.2 contains original texts with philological commentary.

Secondary Literature

  • Bett, R., 2000, Pyrrho, his Antecedents and his Legacy, Oxford: Oxford University Press.
  • Bett, R., forthcoming, Review of Clayman (2010), Gnomon.
  • Brunschwig, J., 1994, “The title of Timon's Indalmoi: from Odysseus to Pyrrho,” in J. Brunschwig, Papers in Hellenistic Philosophy, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press: 212–223.
  • Clayman, D., 2010, Timon of Phlius: Pyrrhonism into Poetry, Berlin/New York: Walter de Gruyter.
  • Decleva Caizzi, F., 1984, “Timone di Fliunte: I frammenti 74, 75, 76 Diels,” in F. Angeli, ed., La storia della filosofia come sapere critico: Studi offerti a Mario Dal Pra, Milan: 92–105.
  • Long, A. A., 1978, “Timon of Phlius: Pyrrhonist and Satirist,” Proceedings of the Cambridge Philological Society, NS 24: 68–91.
  • Svavarsson, S., 2010, “Pyrrhon and Early Pyrrhonism”, in R. Bett, ed., The Cambridge Companion to Ancient Scepticism, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 36–57.

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