Transcendentalism

First published Thu Feb 6, 2003; substantive revision Mon Mar 7, 2011

Transcendentalism is an American literary, political, and philosophical movement of the early nineteenth century, centered around Ralph Waldo Emerson. Other important transcendentalists were Henry David Thoreau, Margaret Fuller, Amos Bronson Alcott, Frederic Henry Hedge, and Theodore Parker. Stimulated by English and German Romanticism, the Biblical criticism of Herder and Schleiermacher, and the skepticism of Hume, the transcendentalists operated with the sense that a new era was at hand. They were critics of their contemporary society for its unthinking conformity, and urged that each person find, in Emerson's words, “an original relation to the universe” (O, 3). Emerson and Thoreau sought this relation in solitude amidst nature, and in their writing. By the 1840s they, along with other transcendentalists, were engaged in the social experiments of Brook Farm, Fruitlands, and Walden; and, by the 1850s in an increasingly urgent critique of American slavery.


1. Origins and Character

What we now know as transcendentalism first arose among the liberal New England Congregationalists, who departed from orthodox Calvinism in two respects: they believed in the importance and efficacy of human striving, as opposed to the bleaker Puritan picture of complete and inescapable human depravity; and they emphasized the unity rather than the “Trinity” of God (hence the term “Unitarian,” originally a term of abuse that they came to adopt.) Most of the Unitarians held that Jesus was in some way inferior to God the Father but still greater than human beings; a few followed the English Unitarian Joseph Priestley (1733–1804) in holding that Jesus was thoroughly human, although endowed with special authority. The Unitarians' leading preacher, William Ellery Channing (1780–1842), portrayed orthodox Congregationalism as a religion of fear, and maintained that Jesus saved human beings from sin, not just from punishment. His sermon “Unitarian Christianity” (1819) denounced “the conspiracy of ages against the liberty of Christians” (P, 336) and helped give the Unitarian movement its name. In “Likeness to God” (1828) he proposed that human beings “partake” of Divinity and that they may achieve “a growing likeness to the Supreme Being” (T, 4).

The Unitarians were “modern.” They attempted to reconcile Locke's empiricism with Christianity by maintaining that the accounts of miracles in the Bible provide overwhelming evidence for the truth of religion. It was precisely on this ground, however, that the transcendentalists found fault with Unitarianism. For although they admired Channing's idea that human beings can become more like God, they were persuaded by Hume that no empirical proof of religion could be satisfactory. In letters written in his freshman year at Harvard (1817), Emerson tried out Hume's skeptical arguments on his devout and respected Aunt Mary Moody Emerson, and in his journals of the early 1820's he discusses with approval Hume's Dialogues on Natural Religion and his underlying critique of necessary connection. “We have no experience of a Creator,” Emerson writes, and therefore we “know of none” (JMN 2, 161).

Skepticism about religion was also engendered by the publication of an English translation of F. D. E. Schleiermacher's Critical Essay Upon the Gospel of St. Luke (1825), which introduced the idea that the Bible was a product of human history and culture. Equally important was the publication in 1833—some fifty years after its initial appearance in Germany—of James Marsh's translation of Johann Gottfried van Herder's Spirit of Hebrew Poetry (1782). Herder blurred the lines between religious texts and humanly-produced poetry, casting doubt on the authority of the Bible, but also suggesting that texts with equal authority could still be written. It was against this background that Emerson asked in 1836, in the first paragraph of Nature: “Why should we not have a poetry and philosophy of insight and not of tradition, and a religion by revelation to us, and not the history of theirs” (O, 5). The individual's “revelation”—or “intuition,” as Emerson was later to speak of it—was to be the counter both to Unitarian empiricism and Humean skepticism.

An important source for the transcendentalists' knowledge of German philosophy was Frederic Henry Hedge (1805–90). Hedge's father Levi Hedge, a Harvard professor of logic, sent him to preparatory school in Germany at the age of thirteen, after which he attended the Harvard Divinity School. Ordained as a Unitarian minister, Hedge wrote a long review of the work of Samuel Taylor Coleridge for the Christian Examiner in 1833. Noting Coleridge's fondness for “German metaphysics” and his immense gifts of erudition and expression, he laments that Coleridge had not made Kant and the post-Kantians more accessible to an English-speaking audience. This is the task—to introduce the “transcendental philosophy” of Kant, (T, 87)—that Hedge takes up. In particular, he explains Kant's idea of a Copernican Revolution in philosophy: “[S]ince the supposition that our intuitions depend on the nature of the world without, will not answer, assume that the world without depends on the nature of our intuitions.” This “key to the whole critical philosophy,” Hedge continues, explains the possibility of “a priori knowledge” (T, 92). Hedge organized what eventually became known as the Transcendental Club, by suggesting to Emerson in 1836 that they form a discussion group for disaffected young Unitarian clergy. The group included George Ripley and Bronson Alcott, had some 30 meetings in four years, and was a sponsor of The Dial and Brook Farm. Hedge was a vocal opponent of slavery in the 1830's and a champion of women's rights in the 1850's, but he remained a Unitarian minister, and became a professor at the Harvard Divinity School.

Another source for the transcendentalists' knowledge of German philosophy was Madame de Staël (Anne-Louise-Germaine Necker) (1766–1817), whose De l'Allemagne (On Germany) was a favorite of the young Emerson. In a sweeping survey of European metaphysics and political philosophy, de Staël praises Locke's devotion to liberty, but sees him as the originator of a sensationalist school of epistemology that leads to the skepticism of Hume. She finds an attractive contrast in the German tradition that begins with Leibniz and culminates in Kant, which asserts the power and authority of the mind.

James Marsh (1794–1842), a graduate of Andover and the president of the University of Vermont, was equally important for the emerging philosophy of transcendentalism. Marsh was convinced that German philosophy held the key to a reformed theology. His American edition of Coleridge's Aids to Reflection (1829) introduced Coleridge's version—much indebted to Schelling—of Kantian terminology, terminology that runs throughout Emerson's early work. In Nature, for example, Emerson writes: “The Imagination may be defined to be, the use which the Reason makes of the material world” (O, 25).

German philosophy and literature was also championed by Thomas Carlyle, whom Emerson met on his first trip to Europe in 1831. Carlyle's philosophy of action in such works as Sartor Resartus resonates with Emerson's idea in “The American Scholar” that action—along with nature and “the mind of the Past” (O, 39) is essential to human education. Along with his countrymen Coleridge and Wordsworth, Carlyle embraced a “natural supernaturalism,” the view that nature, including human beings, has the power and authority traditionally attributed to an independent deity.

Piety towards nature was also a main theme of William Wordsworth, whose poetry was in vogue in America in the 1820s. Wordsworth's depiction of an active and powerful mind cohered with the shaping power of the mind that his collaborator in the Lyrical Ballads, Samuel Taylor Coleridge, traced to Kant. The idea of such power pervades Emerson's Nature, where he writes of nature as “obedient” to spirit and counsels each of us to “Build … your own world.” Wordsworth has his more receptive mode as well, in which he calls for “a heart that watches and receives” (in “The Tables Turned”), and we find Emerson's receptive mode from Nature onward, as when he recounts an ecstatic experience in the woods: “I become a transparent eyeball. I am nothing; I see all; The currents of the universal being circulate through me.” (O, 6).

Emerson's sense that men and women are, as he put it in Nature, gods “in ruins,” led to one of transcendentalism's defining events, his delivery of an address at the Harvard Divinity School graduation in 1838. Emerson portrayed the contemporary church that the graduates were about to lead as an “eastern monarchy of a Christianity” that had become an “injuror of man” (O, 58). Jesus, in contrast, was a “friend of man.” Yet he was just one of the “true race of prophets,” whose message is not so much their own greatness, as the “greatness of man” (O, 57). Emerson rejects the Unitarian argument that miracles prove the truth of Christianity, not simply because the evidence is weak, but because proof of the sort they envision embodies a mistaken view of the nature of religion: “conversion by miracles is a profanation of the soul.” Emerson's religion is based not on testimony but on a “perception” that produces a “religious sentiment” (O, 55).

The “Divinity School Address” drew a quick and angry response from Andrews Norton (1786–1853) of the Harvard Divinity School, often known as the “Unitarian Pope.” In “The New School in Literature and Religion” (1838), Norton complains of “a restless craving for notoriety and excitement,” which he traces to German “speculatists” and “barbarians” and “that hyper-Germanized Englishman, Carlyle.” Emerson's “Address,” he concludes, is at once “an insult to religion” (T, 248) and “an incoherent rhapsody” (T, 249).

An earlier transcendentalist scandal surrounded the publication of Amos Bronson Alcott's Conversations with Children Upon the Gospels (1836). Alcott (1799–1888) was a self-taught educator from Connecticut who established a series of schools that aimed to “draw out” the intuitive knowledge of children. He found anticipations of his views about a priori knowledge in the writings of Plato and Kant, and support in Coleridge's Aids to Reflection for the idea that idealism and materiality could be reconciled. Alcott replaced the hard benches of the common schools with more comfortable furniture that he built himself, and left a central space in his classrooms for dancing. The Conversations with Children Upon the Gospels, based on a school Alcott (and his assistant Elizabeth Peabody) ran in Boston, argued that evidence for the truth of Christianity could be found in the unimpeded flow of children's thought. What people particularly noticed about Alcott's book, however, were its frank discussions of conception, circumcision, and childbirth. Rather than gaining support for his school, the publication of the book caused many parents to withdraw their children from it, and the school—like many of Alcott's projects, failed.

Theodore Parker (1810–60) was the son of a farmer who attended Harvard and became a Unitarian minister and accomplished linguist. He published a long critical essay on David Friedrich Strauss's Das Leben Jesu, and translated Wilhelm Martin Leberecht de Wette's Introduction to the Old Testament, both of which cast doubt on the divine inspiration and single authorship of the Bible. After the publication of his “A Discourse Concerning the Transient and Permanent in Christianity” (1841) he was invited to resign from the Boston Association of Ministers (he did not), and was no longer welcome in many pulpits. He argued, much as Emerson had in the “Divinity School Address,” that Christianity had nothing essential to do with the person of Jesus: “If Jesus taught at Athens, and not at Jerusalem; if he had wrought no miracle, and none but the human nature had ever been ascribed to him; if the Old Testament had forever perished at his birth, Christianity would still have been the Word of God … just as true, just as lasting, just as beautiful, as now it is…” (T, 352). Parker exploited the similarities between science and religious doctrine to argue that although nature and religious truth are permanent, any merely human version of such truth is transient. In religious doctrines especially, there are stunning reversals, so that “men are burned for professing what men are burned for denying” (T, 347).

Surveying the scene in his 1842 lecture, “The Transcendentalist,” Emerson begins with a philosophical account, according to which what are generally called “new views” are not really new, but rather part of a broad tradition of idealism. It is not a skeptical idealism, however, but an anti-skeptical idealism deriving from Kant:

It is well known to most of my audience, that the Idealism of the present day acquired the name of Transcendental, from the use of that term by Immanuel Kant, of Konigsberg [sic], who replied to the skeptical philosophy of Locke, which insisted that there was nothing in the intellect which was not previously in the experience of the senses, by showing that there was a very important class of ideas, or imperative forms, which did not come by experience, but through which experience was acquired; that these were intuitions of the mind itself; and he denominated them Transcendental forms (O, 101–2).

Emerson shows here a basic understanding of three Kantian claims, which can be traced throughout his philosophy: that the human mind “forms” experience; that the existence of such mental operations is a counter to skepticism; and that “transcendental” does not mean “transcendent” or beyond human experience altogether, but something through which experience is made possible. Emerson's idealism is not purely Kantian, however, for (like Coleridge's) it contains a strong admixture of Neoplatonism and post-Kantian idealism. Emerson thinks of Reason, for example, as a faculty of “vision,” as opposed to the mundane understanding, which “toils all the time, compares, contrives, adds, argues….” (Letters, vol. 1, 413). For many of the transcendentalists the term “transcendentalism” represented nothing so technical as an inquiry into the presuppositions of human experience, but a new confidence in and appreciation of the mind's powers, and a modern, non-doctrinal spirituality. The transcendentalist, Emerson states, believes in miracles, conceived as “the perpetual openness of the human mind to new influx of light and power…” (O, 100).

Emerson keeps his distance from the transcendentalists in his essay by speaking always of what “they” say or do, despite the fact that he was regarded then and is regarded now as the leading transcendentalist. He notes with some disdain that the transcendentalists are “'not good members of society,” that they do not work for “the abolition of the slave-trade” (though both these charges have been leveled at him). He closes the essay nevertheless with a defense of the transcendentalist critique of a society pervaded by “a spirit of cowardly compromise and seeming, which intimates a frightful skepticism, a life without love, and an activity without an aim” (O, 106). This critique is Emerson's own in such writings as “Self-Reliance,” and “The American Scholar”; and it finds a powerful and original restatement in the “Economy” chapter of Thoreau's Walden.

2. High Tide: The Dial, Fuller, Thoreau

The transcendentalists had several publishing outlets: at first The Christian Examiner, then, after the furor over the “Divinity School Address,” The Western Messenger (1835–41) in St Louis, then the Boston Quarterly Review (1838–44). The Dial (1840–4) was a special case, for it was planned and instituted by the members of the Transcendental Club, with Margaret Fuller (1810–50) as the first editor. Emerson succeeded her for the magazine's last two years. The writing in The Dial was uneven, but in its four years of existence it published Fuller's “The Great Lawsuit” (the core of her Woman in the Nineteenth Century) and her long review of Goethe's work; prose and poetry by Emerson; Alcott's “Orphic Sayings” (which gave the magazine a reputation for silliness); and the first publications of a young friend of Emerson's, Henry David Thoreau (1817–62). After Emerson became editor in 1842 The Dial published a series of “Ethnical Scriptures,” translations from Chinese and Indian philosophical works.

Margaret Fuller was the daughter of a Massachusetts congressman who provided tutors for her in Latin, Greek, chemistry, philosophy and, later, German. Exercising what Barbara Packer calls “her peculiar powers of intrusion and caress” (P, 443), Fuller became friends with many of the transcendentalists, including Emerson. She organized a series of popular “conversations” for women in Boston in the winters of 1839–44, journeyed to the Midwest in the summer of 1843, and published her observations as Summer on the Lakes. After this publishing success, Horace Greeley, a friend of Emerson's and the editor of the New York Tribune, invited her to New York to write for the Tribune. Fuller abandoned her previously ornate and pretentious style, issuing pithy reviews and forthright criticisms: for example, of Longfellow's poetry and Carlyle's attraction to brutality. Fuller was in Europe from 1846–9, sending back hundreds of pages for the Tribune. On her return to America with her husband and son, she drowned in a hurricane off the coast of Fire Island, New York.

Woman in the Nineteenth Century (1845), a revision of her “Great Lawsuit” manifesto in The Dial, is Fuller's major philosophical work. She holds that masculinity and femininity pass into one another, that there is “no wholly masculine man, no purely feminine woman” (T, 418). Women are treated as dependents, however, and their self-reliant impulses are often held against them. What they most want is the freedom to unfold their powers, a freedom Fuller holds to be necessary not only for their self-development, but for the renovation of society. Like Thoreau and Emerson, she calls for periods of withdrawal from a society whose members are in various states of “distraction” and “imbecility,” and a return only after “the renovating fountains” of individuality have risen up. Such individuality is necessary in particular for the proper constitution of that form of society known as marriage. “Union,” she holds, “is only possible to those who are units” (T, 419).

Henry Thoreau studied Latin, Greek, Italian, French, German, and Spanish at Harvard, where he heard Emerson's “The American Scholar” as the commencement address in 1837. He first published in The Dial when Emerson commissioned him to review a series of reports on wildlife by the state of Massachusetts, but he cast about for a literary outlet after The Dial’s failure in 1844. In 1845, his move to Walden Pond allowed him to complete his first book, A Week on the Concord and the Merrimac Rivers. He also wrote a first draft of Walden, which eventually appeared in 1854.

Nature comes to even more prominence in Walden than in Emerson's Nature, which it followed by eighteen years. Nature now becomes particular: this tree, this bird, this state of the pond on a summer evening or winter morning become Thoreau's subjects. Thoreau is receptive. He finds himself “suddenly neighbor to” rather than a hunter of birds (W, 85); and he learns to dwell in a house that is no more and no less than a place where he can properly sit. From the right perspective, Thoreau finds, he can possess and use a farm with more satisfaction than the farmer, who is preoccupied with feeding his family and expanding his operations.

In Walden's opening chapter, “Economy,” Thoreau considers the trade-offs we make in life, and he asks, as Plato did in The Republic, what are life's real necessities. Like the Roman philosophers Marcus Porcius Cato and Marcus Varro he seeks a “life of simplicity, independence, magnanimity, and trust” (W, 15). Considering his contemporaries, he finds that “the mass of men lead lives of quiet desperation” (W, 8). Thoreau's “experiment” at Walden shows that a life of simplicity and independence can be achieved today (W, 17). If Thoreau counsels simple frugality—a vegetarian diet for example, and a dirt floor—he also counsels a kind of extravagance, a spending of what you have in the day that shall never come again. True economy, he writes, is a matter of “improving the nick of time” (W, 17).

Thoreau went to Walden Pond on the anniversary of America's declared independence from Britain—July 4, 1845, declaring his own independence from a society that is “commonly too cheap.” It is not that he is against all society, but that he finds we meet too often, before we have had the chance to acquire any “new value for each other” (W, 136). Thoreau welcomes those visitors who “speak reservedly and thoughtfully” (W, 141), and who preserve an appropriate sense of distance; he values the little leaves or acorns left by visitors he never meets. Thoreau lived at Walden for just under three years, a time during which he sometimes visited friends and conducted business in town. (It was on one such visit, to pick up a mended shoe, that he was arrested for tax avoidance, an episode that became the occasion for “Resistance to Civil Government.”)

At the opening of Walden's chapter on “Higher Laws” Thoreau confesses to once having desired to slaughter a woodchuck and eat it raw, just to get at its wild essence. He values fishing and hunting for their taste of wildness, though he finds that in middle age he has given up eating meat. He finds wildness not only in the woods, but in such literary works as Hamlet and the Iliad; and even in certain forms of society: “The wildness of the savage is but a faint symbol of the awful ferity with which good men and lovers meet” (“Walking” (1862), p. 621). The wild is not always consoling or uplifting, however. In The Maine Woods, Thoreau records a climb on Mount Ktaadn in Maine when he confronted the alien materiality of the world; and in Cape Cod (1865), he records the foreignness, not the friendliness, of nature: the shore is “a wild, rank place, and there is no flattery in it” (P, 577).

Although Walden initiates the American tradition of environmental philosophy, it is equally concerned with reading and writing. In the chapter on “Reading,” Thoreau speaks of books that demand and inspire “reading, in a high sense” (W, 104). He calls such books “heroic,” and finds them equally in literature and philosophy, in Europe and Asia: “Vedas and Zendavestas and Bibles, with Homers and Dantes and Shakespeares…” (W, 104). Thoreau suggests that Walden is or aspires to be such a book; and indeed the enduring construction from his time at Walden is not the cabin he built but the book he wrote.

Thoreau maintains in Walden that writing is “the work of art closest to life itself” (W, 102). In his search for such closeness, he began to reconceive the nature of his journal. Both he and Emerson kept journals from which their published works were derived. But in the early 1850s, Thoreau began to conceive of the journal as a work in itself, “each page of which should be written in its own season & out of doors or in its own locality wherever it may be” (J, 67). A journal has a sequence set by the days, but it may have no order; or what order it has emerges in the writer's life as he meets the life of nature. With its chapters on “Reading,” “Solitude,” “Economy,” “Winter,” and “Spring,” Walden is more “worked up” than the journal; in this sense, Thoreau came to feel, it is less close to nature than the journal.

3. Social and Political Critiques

The transcendentalists operated from the start with the sense that the society around them was seriously deficient: a “mass” of “bugs or spawn” as Emerson put it in “The American Scholar”; slavedrivers of themselves, as Thoreau says in Walden. Thus the attraction of alternative life-styles: Alcott's ill-fated Fruitlands; Brook Farm, planned and organized by the Transcendental Club; Thoreau's cabin at Walden. As the nineteenth century came to its mid-point, the transcendentalists' dissatisfaction with their society became focused on policies and actions of the United States government: the treatment of the Native Americans, the war with Mexico, and, above all, the continuing and expanding practice of slavery.

Emerson's 1838 letter to President Martin Van Buren is an early expression of the depth of his despair at actions of his country, in this case the ethnic cleansing of American land east of the Mississippi. The 16,000 Cherokees lived in what is now Kentucky and Tennessee, and in parts of the Carolinas, Georgia, and Virginia. They were one of the more assimilated tribes, whose members owned property, drove carriages, used plows and spinning wheels, and even owned slaves. Wealthy Cherokees sent their children to elite academies or seminaries. The Cherokee chief refused to sign a “removal” agreement with the government of Andrew Jackson, but the government found a minority faction to agree to move to territories west of the Mississippi. Despite the ruling by the Supreme Court under Chief Justice John Marshall that the Cherokee Nation's sovereignty had been violated, Jackson's policies continued to take effect. In 1838, President Van Buren, Jackson's former Vice-President and approved successor, ordered the U. S. Army into the Cherokee Nation, where they rounded up as many remaining members of the tribe as they could and marched them west and across the Mississippi. Thousands died along the way. In his letter to President Van Buren, Emerson calls this “a crime that really deprives us as well as the Cherokees of a country; for how could we call the conspiracy that should crush these poor Indians our Government, or the land that was cursed by their parting and dying imprecations our country, any more?” (A, 3).

Slavery had existed in the United States from the beginnings of the country, but when the Fugitive Slave Law was passed by the United States Congress in 1850, it had dramatic and visible effects not only in Georgia or Mississippi but in Massachusetts and New York. For the law required all citizens of the country to assist in returning fugitive slaves to their owners. This extension of the slave-system to the north, the subject of Thoreau's “Slavery in Massachusetts” (1854), was on public view when an escaped slave named Anthony Burns was captured in Boston, tried by a Massachusetts court, and escorted by the Massachusetts militia and U. S. marines to the harbor, where he was taken back to slavery in Virginia. His owner placed him in a notorious “slave pen” outside Richmond, where Burns was handcuffed, chained at the ankles and left to lie in his own filth for four months. Thoreau denounced the absurdity of a court in Boston “trying a MAN, to find out if he is not really a SLAVE,” when the question has already been “decided from eternity” (R, 92). In his “Lecture on Slavery” of 1855, Emerson calls the original 1787 Constitution's recognition of slavery a “crime” (A, 100), and he contrasts the written law of the constitution with the “Laws” and “Right” ascertained by Jesus, Menu, Moses, and Confucius. An immoral law, he holds, is void.

The distinction between morality and law is also the basis for Thoreau's “Resistance to Civil Government” (1849). Thoreau was arrested in 1846 for nonpayment of his poll tax, and he took the opportunity presented by his night in jail to meditate on the authority of the state. The government, Thoreau argues, is but an expedient by which we succeed “in letting one another alone” (R, 64). The citizen has no duty to resign his conscience to the state, and may even have a duty to oppose immoral legislation such as that which supports slavery and the Mexican War. Thoreau concludes: “I cannot for an instant recognize that political organization as my government which is the slave's government also” (R, 67). Slavery could be abolished by a “peaceable revolution,” he continues, if people refused to pay their taxes and clogged the system by going to jail (R, 76). Although Thoreau advocates nonviolent action in “Resistance to Civil Government,” he later supported the violent actions of John Brown, who killed unarmed pro-slavery settlers in Kansas, and in 1859 attacked the federal arsenal at Harper's Ferry, Virginia. In “A Plea for Captain John Brown,” Thoreau portrays Brown as an “Angel of Light” (R, 137) and “a transcendentalist above all” (115) who believed “that a man has a perfect right to interfere by force with the slaveholder, in order to rescue the slave” (R,132). In early 1860, just months before the outbreak of the Civil War, he and Emerson participated in public commemorations of Brown's life and actions.

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civil disobedience | Emerson, Ralph Waldo | Hume, David: on religion | Kant, Immanuel | Kant, Immanuel: transcendental arguments | Thoreau, Henry David

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