Notes to Transmission of Justification and Warrant

1. For instance s's background information should in this case include scientific assumptions—e.g., that a lethal quantity of the toxins contained in the specified mushrooms will kill an ordinary human being who has taken no antidote shortly after its absorption—and assumptions about Jones—e.g., that Jones is an ordinary individual who has taken no antidote.

2. E1 provides s with justification for P1 only given some background information. For instance s's background information should include assumptions about the toadstools in the risotto—e.g., that a large risotto of Boletus Satana is sufficiently rich in lethal toxins.

3. It is standard practice to distinguish propositional justification from doxastic justification. Roughly, a subject s has propositional justification for believing a proposition p just in case, whether or not s actually believes p, it would be epistemically appropriate for s to believe p. On the other hand s is doxastically justified in believing p just in case s has propositional justification for believing p and s actually believes p in virtue of that justification.

4. Imagine for example that after learning E3, you read in the newspaper that some hooligans have been enjoying putting signs with the name ‘New Castle upon Tyne’ in place of the signs with the name ‘Edinburgh’ at Edinburgh railway station to confuse passengers. This defeats your initial justification for Q3, but is unable to overturn the additional justification that transmits from P3 to Q3.

5. Consider for instance Toadstool. Suppose that s acquires no justification from E1 for P1 because s ignores E1 or has a defeater of the justification from E1 for P1, or that s ignores that P1 entails Q1. In these cases, whether or not Q1 is justified for s, s has no justification for Q1 in virtue of s's justification from E1 for P1 and s's knowledge that P1 entails Q1. Yet if E1 had been known by s or if s had no defeater of the justification from E1 for P1, and s had known that P1 entails Q1, s would have acquired some justification for Q1 in virtue of her justification for P1 from E1 and her knowledge of the entailment from P1 to Q1.

6. This is presumably what Wright actually means. For instance Wright resumes the information dependence template by saying that the justification from e for p cannot transmit to p's consequence q ‘if the justification for p supplied by e depends in the first place on prior and independent justification for q’ (Wright 2002, 336, edited). Elsewhere, much in the same spirit, Wright observes that transmission may fail in ‘cases where there is justification for the premises in the first place only because the conclusion is antecedently justified’ (2003, 57–58, edited). As we explain in Sect. 5.1, Wright contends that we sometimes have justification to accept background propositions. Wright's notion of acceptance is clarified in note 13.

7. Chandler (2009) also adumbrates a similar interpretation of the dependence relation.

8. Wright (2011) describes this type of justification as second order justification or as involving second order justification. We find these characterisations a bit misleading.

9. Brown (2004) has criticised an earlier refinement of (c) in Wright (2003) and proposed an alternative amendment of the disjunctive template, criticised in turn by Wright (2011).

10. Saying that one is rationally required to doubt x is not saying that one has justification for doubting x. One can be rationally required to doubt x even if one has no justification for doubting x. In general, when a subject s is rationally required to have a propositional attitude a towards a proposition p, this is demanded by the coherence with s's other attitudes towards other propositions or the same proposition, whether or not these attitudes are justified.

11. Davies (2003a, 2004 and 2009) distinguishes between the dialectical project of a speaker who aims at convincing a hearer who doubts of a given proposition q and the epistemic project of a subject s who aims at settling the question whether q is true. Within the epistemic project it is s herself who supposes that q is false—i.e., who has a suppositional doubt about q (where s's suppositional doubt about q is compatible with s's actually having justification for believing q or s's being entitled to believe q).

12. For example, Wright believes that a cornerstone for the region of discourse about other people's mental states is the proposition that other people do have minds. If one had no independent justification for believing this proposition, one's observation that another person's behaviour and physical conditions are in all respects as if she were in a given mental state could supply one with no justification for believing that that person is actually in that mental state (cf. Wright 2004).

13. Rational entitlements are, for Wright, unearned in the sense that they depend on no a priori or a posteriori evidence. Furthermore, acceptance is to be understood, for Wright, as a more general attitude than belief that includes belief as a subcase. Acceptance of p also includes attitudes like acting under the assumption that p or taking p for granted. Cf. Wright (2004).

14. Pryor (2000)'s original formulation of dogmatism takes perceptions to be mental states different from beliefs (though likewise provided with representational or propositional content); perceptual justification is thus taken to be non-inferential. Pryor's more recent characterisations of dogmatism allow for inferential notions of perceptual justification (see for instance the manuscript by Pryor in Other Internet Resources and Pryor forthcoming).

15. A similar diagnosis of the ineffectiveness of Moore's proof has been offered by Burge (2003).

16. Davies's various limitation principles have undergone various transformations in time (see Davies 1998, 2000, 2003a and 2009). Important criticism can be found in McLaughlin (2003).

17. One might wonder whether there is a link between the conditions of satisfaction of the antecedent of (LP) and the conditions of satisfaction of the disjunctive template. It is harder to answer affirmatively in this case. A problem is that (LP)—like the information dependence template—aims to account for transmission failure of inferential justification, whereas the disjunctive template has the specific function to account for transmission failure of non-inferential justification.

18. Things get worse as one considers Wright (2011)'s reformulation of (d) as (d*): not-q entails r. In this case it is clear that Water does not instantiate the (so reformulated) disjunctive template. For it seems possible that s (or s's community) has failed to be embedded in an environment that contains water—so that Not-Q9 is true—but ‘water’ nonetheless refers to a natural kind (the watery substance abounding on Twin Earth)—so that R is false.

19. Endorsed more hesitantly in Wright (2011).

20. Davies (2003a) made use of a limitation principle that McLaughlin (2003) has shown to be flawed. Here we have replaced that limitation principle with (LP*).

Copyright © 2013 by
Luca Moretti <>
Tommaso Piazza <>

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