Truthmakers

First published Sat Feb 23, 2013

This much is agreed: “x makes it true that p” is a construction that signifies, if it signifies anything at all, a relation borne to a truth-bearer by something else, a truth-maker. But it isn't generally agreed what that something else might be, or what truth-bearers are, or what the character might be of the relationship that holds, if it does, between them, or even whether such a relationship ever does hold. Indeed sometimes there's barely enough agreement amongst the parties to the truth-maker dispute for them to be disagreeing about a common subject matter. This makes navigating the literature about truth-makers a treacherous undertaking but a necessary one because of the significance the debate about truth-makers bears for contemporary metaphysics.

We can distinguish between the following questions that different approaches to truth-makers have been framed to answer:

(1)
What is it to be a truth-maker?
(2)
Which range, or ranges, of truths are eligible to be made true (if any are)?
(3)
What kinds of entities are truth-makers?
(4)
What is the motivation for adopting a theory of truth-makers?

These questions cannot be addressed in isolation from one another. Our thinking about what it is to be a truth-maker will likely have knock-on effects for how we answer the second and third questions. Our beliefs about which truths have truth-makers will likely shape our answer to the first and third. And the theoretical benefits that we think will come our way from positing truth-makers in the first place will no doubt exert a controlling influence upon our responses to the other questions. But since the first is, in a significant sense, prior to the rest—otherwise it's unclear what we're talking about—I will start out by addressing, at least in a preliminary way, the issue of what it is to be a truth-maker.

The notion of a truth-maker, like that of a clapping hand, cannot ultimately be understood in isolation from the notion of what it makes true, the other hand with which it claps, a truth-bearer. There are a variety of different candidate fillers for the role of truth-bearers—sentence tokens, judgements, propositions etc—and very often discussion of truth-makers and truth-making proceeds without an eye to which candidate best fills this role. This is understandable: metaphysicians are typically interested in what there is rather than representations thereof. But truth-bearers are the elephant in the room during these discussions. Eventually we'll have to talk about them because what we think about truth-bearers will have consequences for what we think about truth-makers. So there's a further question that we can't put off answering indefinitely,

(5)
What are the truth-bearers?

For the time being I'll remain relatively non-committal about the character of truth-bearers except for making the minimal assumption that truth-bearers are inherently representational in character. But eventually the issue will become unavoidable.

I will not dwell upon the history of the concept truth-maker. Anticipations of the contemporary use of the concept have been found in Aristotle and Suarez (Fox 1987; Künne 2003: 150–4; Schmutz 2007), Leibniz (Armstrong 1997: 14; Mulligan 2009: 39–42), Russell and Wittgenstein (Hochberg 1978; Mulligan, Simons, & Smith 1984: 287–9, 308–12; Simons 1992: 156–61; Künne 2003: 118–226, 145–8), Stout, McTaggart and Pfänder (Mulligan 2009). But it has also been disputed whether these authors are really deploying the concept of truth-making with which we are familiar rather than employing, perhaps for reasons of grammatical convenience, superficially similar turns of phrase that make it sound as if they are expressing our concept (Dodd 2002: 81–3; MacBride 2005: 137–9; Glock 2007).

1. What is a Truth-maker?

When introducing truth-makers it has become routine to begin with a disclaimer: that the sense in which a truth-maker “makes” something true is not the causal sense in which, e.g., a potter makes a pot. The concept of a truth-maker is then often elucidated in the following terms (Bigelow 1988: 125; Armstrong 1989c: 88):

(Virtue-T)
a truth-maker is that in virtue of which something is true

An earlier but equivalent form of introduction is supplied by the dictum that a truth-maker is the “ground” or “ontological ground” of a true claim (Bergmann 1961: 229, Hochberg 1967: 416–7). (Virtue-T) and its equivalents certainly seem to convey some information: that a truth-maker is a thing that stands in some significant relationship to something true. It is added that the primary notion of a truth-maker is that of a minimal one: a truth-maker for a truth-bearer p none of whose proper parts or constituents are truth-makers for p. (Whether every proposition has a minimal truth-maker is contentious.) We are also cautioned that even though people often speak as if there is a unique truth-maker for each truth, it is usually the case that one truth is made true by many things (collectively or severally).

Whether (Virtue-T) provides a satisfactory elucidation of truth-making depends on whether we have a clear understanding of “in virtue of”. Some philosophers argue this notion is an unavoidable primitive (Rodriguez-Pereyra 2006a: 960–1). But others are wary. Thus, for example, Bigelow finds the locution “in virtue of” both obscure and, as will see, avoidable “we should not rest content with an explanation which turns on the notion of virtue!” (Bigelow 1988). These kinds of concern provides a significant motivation for establishing whether it is possible to elucidate the concept of truth making in terms of notions that enjoy a life independently of the circle of notions to which in virtue of and truth making belong.

1.1 Truth-making as Entailment

One influential proposal for making an elucidatory advance upon (Virtue-T) appeals to the notion of entailment (Fox 1987: 189; Bigelow 1988: 125–7):

(Entailment-T)
a truth-maker is a thing the very existence of which entails that something is true.

So x is a truth-maker for a truth p iff x exists and another representation that says x exists entails the representation that p. It is an attraction of this principle that the key notion it deploys, namely entailment, is ubiquitous, unavoidable and enjoys a rich life outside philosophy—both in ordinary life and in scientific and mathematical practice.

Unfortunately this account threatens to over-generate truth-makers for necessary truths—at least if the notion of entailment it employs is classical. It's a feature of this notion that anything whatsoever entails a necessary truth p. It follows as a special case of this that any claim that a given object exists must entail p too. So it also follows—if (Entailment-T) is granted—that any object makes any necessary truth true. But this runs counter to the belief that, e.g., the leftovers in your refrigerator aren't truth-makers for the representation that 2+2=4. Even worse, Restall has shown how to plausibly reason from (Entailment-T) to “truth-maker monism”: the doctrine that every truth-maker makes every truth true (whether necessary or contingent). Every claim of the form p ∨ ~p is a necessary truth. So every existing thing s is a truth-maker for each instance of this form (see preceding paragraph). Now let p be some arbitrary truth (grass is green) and s any truth-maker for p ∨ ~p (a particular ice floe in the Antarctic ocean). Now it is intuitively plausible that something makes a disjunction true either by making one disjunct true or by making the other disjunct true (Mulligan, Simons, & Smith 1984: 316). This is what Restall calls “the disjunction thesis”. It follows from this thesis that either s makes p true or s makes ~p true. Given that p is true, neither s nor anything else makes it true that ~p. So s (the ice floe) must make it true that p (grass is green)! But since s and p were chosen arbitrarily it follows that all truth-makers are on a par, making true every truth (Restall 1996: 333–4).

The unacceptability of these results indicates that insofar as we have an intuitive grip upon the concept of a truth-maker it is constrained by the requirement that a truth-maker for a truth must be relevant to or about what it represents as being the case. For example, the truths of pure arithmetic are not about what's at the back of your refrigerator; what's there isn't relevant to their being true. So we're constrained to judge that what's there cannot be truth-makers for them. This suggests that operating at the back of our minds when we issue these snap judgements there must be something like the principle:

(Relevance)
what makes something true must—in some sense—be what it is “about”.

Of course the notions of “about” and “relevance” are notoriously difficult to pin down (Goodman 1961). And a speaker can know something is true without knowing everything about what makes it true. Often it will require empirical research to settle what makes a statement true. Moreover, what is determined a posteriori to be a truth-maker may exhibit a complexity quite different from that of the statement it makes true (Mulligan, Simons, & Smith 1984: 299). Nevertheless, it is clear that unless (Entailment-T) is constrained in some way it will generate truth-makers that are unwanted because their presence conflicts with (Relevance).

One way to restore accord between them would be to abandon the Disjunction Thesis that together with (Entailment-T) led us down the path to Truth-maker Monism. Indeed isn't the Disjunction Thesis dubious anyway? Consider examples involving the open future. Can't we imagine a situation arising that makes it true that one or other of the horses competing in a race will win, but which neither makes it true that one of the horses in particular will win nor makes it true that another will (Read 2000; Restall 2009)?

But even if the Disjunction Thesis is given up still this leaves in place the embarrassing consequence of defining what it is to be a truth-maker in terms of classical entailment, viz. that any existing thing turns out to be a truth-maker for any necessary truth. Some more radical overhaul of (Entailment-T) is needed to avoid over-generation. One possibility is to redefine what is to be a truth-maker in terms of a more restrictive notion of “relevant entailment” (in the tradition of Anderson & Belnap) that requires what is entailed to be relevant to what it is entailed by (Restall 1996, 2000; Armstrong 2004: 10–12). Whether exploring this avenue will take us very far remains a matter of dispute. Simons, for example, reflects,

In truth however I suspect our intuitions about truth-makers may be at least as robust as our intuitions about what is good for a logical system of implication, and I would not at present attempt to explicate truth-making via the arrow of the relevance logic system R. (2008: 13)

Nevertheless since truth-making concerns the bestowal of truth, entailment its preservation, there must at some level be an important connection to be made out between truth-making and entailment; the effort expended to make out such a connection will be effort spent to the advantage of metaphysicians and logicians alike. But even granted this is so there are reasons to be doubtful that any overhaul of (Entailment-T), however radical, will capture what it is to be a truth-maker. One vital motivation for believing in truth-makers is this. Positing truth-makers enables us to make sense of the fact that the truth of something depends on how things stand with an independently given reality. This is how Bigelow reports what happens to him when he stops believing in truth-makers:

I find I have no adequate anchor to hold me from drifting onto the shoals of some sort of pragmatism or idealism. And that is altogether uncongenial to me; I am a congenital realist. (1988: 123)

Truth-makers are posited to provide the point of semantic contact whereby true representations touch upon an independent reality, upon something non-representational. Since entailment is a relation between representations it follows that the notion of a truth-maker cannot be fully explicated in terms of the relation of entailment—regardless of whether representations are best understood as sentences or propositions or some other candidate truth-bearer (Heil 2000: 233–4; 2003: 62–5; Merricks 2007: 12–13). Ultimately (Entailment-T), or a relevance logic version if it, will leave us wanting an account of what makes a representation of the existence of a truth-maker—whatever it entails—itself beholden to an independent reality.

1.2 Truth-making as Necessitation

This difficulty arises because entailment is a relation that lights upon representations at both ends. Appreciating this Armstrong recognised that truth-making

cannot be any form of entailment. Both terms of an entailment relation must be propositions, but the truth-making term of the truth-maker relation is a portion of reality, and, in general at least, portions of reality are not propositions. (2004: 5–6; see also Lowe 2006: 185)

Accordingly Armstrong made a bold maneuver. He posited a metaphysically primitive relation of necessitation (i.e., one not itself defined in terms of possible worlds because Armstrong is “opposed to the extensional view proposed by those who put metaphysical faith in possible worlds”’ preferring an ‘intensional account” of modality instead (1997: 151, 2004: 96)). The relation in question lights upon a portion of reality at one end and upon a truth at the other. In the simplest case that means that the truth making relation is one that “holds between any truthmaker, T, which is something in the world, and the proposition” that T exists (2004: 6). Armstrong then defined what is to be a truth-maker in terms of this metaphysical bridging relation:

(Necessitation-T)
a truth-maker is a thing that necessitates something's being true.

This conception of truth making avoids the “category” mistake that results from attempting to define truth-making in terms of entailment. It also makes some advance upon (Virtue-T) and its primitive use of “in virtue of” because at least (Necessitation-T) relates the notion of truth making to other modal notions, like that of necessity, upon which we have some independent handle. But what is there positively to be said in favour of conceiving of truth-makers in terms of “necessitation”? Suppose that T is a candidate truth-maker for a truth p even though T fails to necessitate p. Then it is possible for T to exist even when p is false. Armstrong now reflects “we will surely think that the alleged truth-maker was insufficient by itself and requires to be supplemented in some way” (1997: 116). Suppose this supplementary condition is the existence of another entity, U. Then “T+U would appear to be the true and necessitating truth-maker for p” (2004: 7). Armstrong concludes that a truth-maker for a truth must necessitate the truth in question.

Unfortunately this argument takes us nowhere except around in a circle. (Necessitation-T) embodies the doctrine that it is both necessary and sufficient for being a truth-maker that a thing necessitates the truth it makes true. Armstrong's argument for this doctrine relies upon the dual assumptions: (1) anything that fails to necessitate p (witness T) cannot be a truth-maker for p,whereas (2) anything that succeeds in necessitating p (witness T+U) must be. But (1) just is the claim that it is necessary, and (2) just the claim that it is sufficient for being a truth-maker that a thing necessitates the truth it makes true. Since it relies upon (1) and (2), and (1) and (2) are just equivalent to (Necessitation-T), it follows that Armstrong's argument is incapable of providing independent support for the conception he favours of what it is to be a truth-maker.

Even though this argument may be circular, does (Necessitation-T) at least have the favourable feature that adopting it enables us to avoid the other difficulty that beset (Entailment-T), viz. over-generation? Not if there are things that necessitate a truth whilst still failing to be sufficiently relevant to be plausible truth-makers for it. If the necessitation relation is so distributed that it holds between any contingently existing portion of reality, e.g., an ice-floe, and any necessary truth, e.g., 2+2=4, then we shall be no further forward than we were before. So Armstrong needs to tell us more about the cross-categorial relation in question to assure us that such cases cannot arise. Smith suggests another problem case for (Necessitarian-T).

Suppose that God wills that John kiss Mary now. God's willing act thereby necessitates the truth of “John is kissing Mary”. (For Malebranche, all necessitation is of this sort.) But God's act is not a truth-maker for this judgement. (Smith 1999: 6)

If such cases are possible then (Necessitation-T) fails to provide a sufficient condition for being a truth-maker.

1.3 Truth-making as Projection

Smith tries to get around this problem by adding to (Necessitation-T) the further constraint that a truth-maker for a given truth should be part of what that truth is about: “roughly: it should fall within the mereological fusion of all the objects to which reference is made in the judgment” (1999: 6). His suggestion is that a typical contingent judgement p not only makes singular reference to the objects whose antics it describes but also “generic reference” to the events, processes and states that are associated with the main verb of the sentence that is used to express the judgement in question. So, for example, the judgement that John is kissing Mary incorporates not only singular reference to John and Mary but also generic reference to all kisses. Smith identifies the projection of a judgement with the fusion of all these things to which it refers (singularly or generically). He then defines what is to be a truth-maker in terms of this notion:

(Projection T)
a truth-maker for a judgement p is something that necessitates p and falls within its projection

Since God's act of willing isn't one of the things to which the judgement that John is kissing Mary makes singular or generic reference—it doesn't fall within the projection of this judgement—His act isn't a truth-maker for this judgement. But that fateful kiss does fall within the generic reference of the judgement that John is kissing Mary and necessitates the truth of that judgement; so the kiss is a truth-maker for it.

Whether taking up (Projection-T) will avoid classifying malignant cases of necessitating things as truth-makers will depend upon whether the notion of projection can be made sufficiently precise to vindicate the intuition that the net cast by a judgement won't catch these unwanted fishes with the rest of its haul; whether if the judgement that xφ incorporates singular reference to x and generic reference to φ-ings, it doesn't incorporate (even more) generic reference to anything else that may (waywardly) necessitate xφ.

Smith attempts to make the notion of projection precise using just mereology and classical entailment. Something belongs to the projection of a judgement xφ only if it is one of the things to which the judgement is existentially committed (Smith 1999: 7). In order to capture the “generic” as well as the singular consequences of a judgement, Smith includes amongst its existential consequences the fusions that result from applying the mereological comprehension principle (T≤) (∃xφx iff there exists a unique fusion of all and only φ-ers) to the immediate commitments of the judgement. For example, the judgement that Nikita meows is immediately committed to the existence of a meow and thereby to the unique fusion of all and only meows. Because God's act of willing John to kiss Mary doesn't fall within the class of logical-cum-mereological consequences of the judgement that John is kissing Mary, His act isn't a truth-maker for it.

But this still threatens to over-generate truth-makers (Gregory 2001). The judgement that John is kissing Mary has amongst it existential consequences that someone exists. Since Smith assumes that “x exists”, like “x meows” and “x kisses Mary”, is a predicate, it also follows via (T≤) that the projection of this judgement includes the fusion of all and only existing things (Smith 1999: 10). But since (ex hypothesi) God's act exists—and so belongs to the aforementioned fusion and thereby the projection of the judgement in question—and necessitates that John is kissing Mary, it fails to rule out God's act as a truth-maker for it!

The projection of a judgement needs to be made far more relevant to what a judgement is intuitively about; the logical-mereological notion of a projection supplied doesn't even provide a basis for affirming that singular judgements don't generically refer to every existing thing. An initial attractive move to avoid this particular problem would be to deny that “exists” is a predicate. But more generally, it remains to be seen whether an appropriate notion of a judgement's referential net, its projection, can be made out that's isn't too permissive—thereby including illegitimate truth-makers—without having to deploy resources that are not obviously clearer or more problematic than that of truth-making itself (see Smith 2002 and Schnieder 2006b for contrasting prognoses).

1.4 Essentialism

Others attempt to avoid over-generating truth-makers by appealing to the notion of essence, a notion that purports to be far more discriminating than necessitation (Fine 1994; Lowe 1994). The difference in grain between these notions becomes evident when we reflect that although it is (supposed to be) necessarily the case that if Socrates exists then his singleton does too, it isn't part of the essence of Socrates that he belongs to this set. If these notions really are different then we will need to distinguish between those entities that merely necessitate a true claim on the one hand and those that are also part of its essence on the other. This suggests a strategy for ruling out spurious truth-makers: they're the ones that only necessitate true claims, whereas the real ones are also implicated (somehow) in the essences of the claims they make true.

We have so far avoided any definite conception of truth-bearers. But we can no longer avoid talking about the elephant in the room. If truth-makers are implicated in the essences of truth-bearers then truth-bearers can neither be sentences nor judgements. Truth-bearers of these kinds only bear their representational features accidentally; they could have been used to say or think something different, or occurred in contexts where they lacked significance altogether. Since they could have meant something different, or nothing at all, the truth-makers of these truth-bearers can hardly be implicated in their essences. Accordingly truth-bearers that essentially implicate their truth-makers must be creatures that could not have shifted or lacked their representational features. They must be propositions in the deep sense of being items that are incapable of meaning anything other than they do. Conceiving of propositions only in this sense and appealing to their essences, what is to be a truth-maker admits of the following definition (Mulligan 2003: 547, 2006: 39, 2007; Lowe 2006: 203–10, 2009: 209–15):

(Essential-T)
a truth-maker of a proposition is something such that it is part of the essence of that proposition that it is true if that thing exists.

If this definition is adopted then it is plausible to maintain that many of the spurious cases of truth-makers we have considered will thereby be weeded out (Lowe 2006: 202–3). It isn't part of the essence of the proposition that John is kissing Mary that it is true if there exists an act of God's willing it. Nor is it part of the essence of the proposition that 2+2=4 that it is true if there is a particular ice floe in the Antarctic. It isn't even part of the essence of the proposition that 2+2=4 that it is true if π exists. So none of these things are (spuriously) classified, if (Essential-T) is our touchstone, as truth-makers for these propositions.

But the benefits of adopting (Essential-T) come only at significant cost. The idea of a truth-maker is introduced as “intuitively attractive” (Lowe 2006: 207). But (Essential-T) requires an ontology of propositions that is not only platonic—already anathema to naturalists—but also mysterious, viz. “self-interpreting” propositions that mean what they do irrespective of what speakers or thinkers ever do with the signs or judgements that express them. So the idea of a truth-maker turns out to be far less intuitive and attractive than it initially seemed because of its commitment to an abstract and mysterious array of truth-bearers. (Of course if the notion of truth making did enough illuminatory work for us that would provide a reason for relinquishing such doubts about propositions so conceived but that the notion of truth making does so remains to be established). It's also questionable whether our grip upon the notion of the essence of a proposition is any firmer than our grasp of the notion of the generic reference of a judgement, or what a statement is about, or that in virtue of which it is true, or even the notion of truth-maker itself.

In fact the commitment already emerges from (Necessitarian-T) if the necessitation relation it embodies is conceived as internal in the following sense: “An internal relation is one where the existence of the terms entails the existence of the relation” strung out between the terms; otherwise a relation is external (Armstrong 1997: 87). Armstrong argues that the relation of truth-making has to be internal (in just this sense) because if it weren't then we would have to allow that, absurdly, “anything may be a truth-maker for any truth” (1997: 198). But then nothing but propositions—conceived in the self-interpreting sense—can be truth-bearers that are internally related to their truth-makers. Any other candidate for this representational role, as we've already reflected—a token belief state or utterance—could have been endowed with a different representational significance than the one it possesses. So the other eligible candidates, by contrast to propositions, aren't internally related to what makes them true.

Armstrong's commitment to the truth-making relation's being internal clashes with his naturalism (David 2005: 156–9). According to Armstrong,

Truth attaches in the first place to propositions, those propositions which have a truth-maker. But no Naturalist can be happy with a realm of propositions. (Armstrong 1997: 131)

So Armstrong counsels that we don't take propositions with “ontological seriousness”:

What exists are classes of intentionally equivalent tokens. The fundamental correspondence, therefore, is not between entities called truths and their truth-makers, but between the token beliefs and thoughts, on the one hand, and truth-makers on the other. (Armstrong 1997: 131)

But naturalistically kosher token beliefs and thoughts aren't internally related to what makes them true. So Armstrong's naturalism commits him to denying that the truth-making relation is internal after all. Heil has also inveighed in a naturalistic spirit against incurring a commitment to propositions that are designed to have their own “built-in intentionality” whilst continuing to maintain that truth-making is an internal relation (2006: 240–3). Since we have no idea of what a naturalistic representation would look like that was internally related to what made it true, this appears to be an impossible combination of views. Our inability to conjure up a credible class of truth-bearers that are internally related to their truth-makers provides us with a very strong incentive for supposing that the truth-making relation is external. The long and short of it: if we are wary, as many naturalists are, of the doctrine that truth-bearers are propositions, then we should also be wary of thinking that the truth-making relation is internal. This spells trouble for (Necessitarian-T) and (Essentialist-T) if necessitation and essential dependence are supposed to be internal relations.

One strategy for getting around this difficulty holds that truth-making is a relation between a sentence given a fixed meaning and its truth-maker (Bigelow 2009: 136). But what kind of entity is a sentence, e.g., with its actual meaning? And how does the meaning of a sentence enable the truth-making relation to hold between the sentence in question and its truth-maker? Not, presumably, by the meaning of the sentence filling a further (hidden) argument position in the truth-making relation—intermediate between the truth-bearer and the truth-maker—because that would be to reintroduce propositions by the back door. But it not, then how does the meaning of a sentence feed into the obtaining of the truth-making relation?

1.5 Axiomatic Truth-making

The difficulties that have beset the definitions of truth-making proffered so far have suggested to some philosophers that a pessimistic induction is in order: that the project of defining truth-making in more basic terms is misconceived, much as the project of defining knowledge in more basic terms has come to seem misconceived because e.g., of the Gettier cases. But there's no gain to be had from, doing nothing more than declaring the notion of a truth-maker to be primitive. If it's primitive then we also need to know how the notion may be fruitfully applied in association with other concepts we already deploy—entailment, existence, truth etc.—to describe the interplay of truth-bearers and the world. As Simons remarks,

The signs are that truth-making is not analysable in terms of anything more primitive, but we need to be able to say more than just that. So we ought to consider it as specified by principles of truth-making. (2000: 20)

In other words, the notion needs to be introduced non-reductively but still informatively and this is to be achieved by appealing to its systematic liaisons with other concepts.

This is the approach that was originally shared by Mulligan, Simons and Smith (1984: 312–8). The principal schemata they employed to convey to us an articulate grasp of what truth-making means in non-reductive terms included:

(i)
(Factive) If A makes it true that p, then p
(ii)
(Existence) If A exists, then A makes it true that A exists
(iii)
(Entailment) If A makes it true that p, and that p entails that q, then A makes it true that q

Each of these schemata specifies a definite linkage between the application of the notion of truth-making and some other condition. Truth-making is introduced as the notion that sustains all of these linkages. Putting the schemata together what it is to be a truth-maker is then definable intra-theoretically as follows,

(Axiomatic-T)
A truth-maker is something x such that (i) if x makes it true that p then p, (ii) if x exists then x makes it true that x exists… and so on for each of the axiom schemata of our favoured theory of truth-makers.

It is important to appreciate that adopting this approach to truth-making doesn't have the benefits of theft over honest toil. For one thing it doesn't obviate the threat of superfluous truth-makers for necessary truths. (Entailment) is the principle that truth-making tracks entailment: if A makes p true then it makes all the consequences of p true too. It's a principle that recommends itself irrespective of whether truth-making can be defined. This is because it dovetails smoothly with the idea that one truth-maker can make many truths true. For example, suppose that a particular a has some absolutely determinate mass. It is entailed by this description that various determinable descriptions are also truly predicable of a. Some of these truths say more than others, nonetheless they all have the same truth-maker. Why so? Because they are entailed by a's having the mass it does (Armstrong 1997: 130; 2004: 10–11). To answer so is to appeal to (Entailment). But if the entailment that truth-making tracks is classical then we are back to flouting (Relevance). If q is necessary then any contingent p classically entails q. So if something at the back of your refrigerator makes it true that p then by (Entailment) it makes q true too. To avoid flouting (Relevance) in this way (Entailment) had better be a principle that links truth-making to a more restrictive, non-classical notion of entailment (Mulligan, Simons, & Smith 1984: 316). So we won't be saved the logical labour of figuring out which non-classical connective it is that contributes to capturing what it is to be a truth-maker.

Nor will appealing to (Axiomatic-T) save us the hard work of figuring out what truth-makers and truth-bearers must be like in order to collectively realise the structure described by the axiom schemata for truth-makers we favour. But there is nothing about these schemata that demands truth-bearer and truth-maker be internally related.

1.6 Truth-Making as Grounding

A more recent approach attempts to define truth-making in terms of primitive notions of grounding and fundamentality. According to Schaffer, if a proposition p is true at a world w, then p's truth at w is grounded in the fundamental features of w (2008a: 10–18, 2008b: 309–12, 2010: 309–11). What is it then to be a truth-maker?

(Grounding-T)
A truth-maker x for a proposition p at w is something such that (i) x is fundamental at w and (ii) the truth of p at w is grounded in x.

Schaffer recommends this approach partly because the notion of grounding it incorporates is “hyperintensional”: it's a notion that's fine-grained enough to distinguish those entities, e.g., the cardinal numbers, that ground a necessary truth, such as 2+2=4, from those that don't, e.g., our friend the ice floe. His hope is that because the notion is so fine-grained (Grounding-T) will be able to avoid the over-generation that beset (Entailment-T) and (Necessitation-T) but without having to appeal, like (Projection-T), to an underdeveloped notion of “about” or “relevance”. But do we have a sufficiently developed notion of grounding and what it means to be fundamental?

Schaffer tells us “Grounding is an asymmetric, irreflexive and transitive relation. It thus induces a partial ordering, whose minimal elements are the fundamental entities” (2008a: 17, 2008b: 311, 2009: 376). But this informs us only about their formal properties, not about the content of those notions. Schaffer undertakes to clarify their content further “by way of illustration”. He invites us to consider the following pairs: (a) Socrates and his singleton, {Socrates}, (b) Socrates and the fact that Socrates exists, (c) the Swiss cheese and its holes, (d) natural features and moral ones, (e) sparse and abundant properties, (f) “neural” properties and mental ones, (g) “truth-makers and truths” (2008b: 311, 2009: 375). Schaffer suggests that these pairs provide “clear examples of grounding”: it is “plausible”, “natural” and “standard” to regard the second term of each pair as grounded in the first. He then reflects, “The relation of the truth of propositions to what is fundamental fits this pattern” (2008b: 311).

But to many philosophers no common pattern is apparent here. They have found membership, fact-constituency and truth-making altogether unlike one another—relationships with very different characters that bind together prima facie very different structures about which we want to say quite different things. The concept of “grounding” appears to cry out for treatment as a family resemblance concept, a concept whose instances have no more in common than different games do (Wittgenstein 1953: §§ 66–7).

Consider, just for example, Lewis who denied the existence altogether of sets, facts and holes (except as a manner of speaking) (Lewis & Lewis 1970, Lewis 1986, 1993). For Lewis, (a), (b) and (c) don't have anything in common except that he doubted the existence of the second term of each pair; whereas, as we will see, he doubted the existence of the first term of (g), viz. truth makers. It's an further indicator of the lack of consensus about truth-making and grounding that even other philosophers who are willing to take both these notions seriously and conceive of them as constitutively related, e.g., Cameron, find it “natural”, as he puts it (2010: 184), to define grounding in terms of truth-making rather than the other way around as Schaffer proposes.

(Grounding-T) also quantifies over propositions that are related by a hyperintensional relation to their truth-makers. Schaffer doesn't tell us whether grounding is external or internal but this already means that propositions must have their meanings essentially. So it needs to be explained how this conception of truth-making avoids the problem that afflicted (Necessitarian-T) and (Essentialist-T), viz. that explaining how it is possible for propositions to be so tightly related to their truth-makers without being committed to an abstruse ontology of self-interpreting propositions. (For other concerns about grounding see Incurvati 2012 and Daly 2012).

2. Which range of truths are eligible to be made true (if any are)?

Even when truth-maker panegyrists agree about what it is to be a truth-maker, they often still disagree about the range of truths that are eligible to be made true. This results in further disagreement about what kinds of entities truth-makers are. There is potential for disagreement here because of the appearance that different ranges of truths require different kinds of truth-makers. Sometimes, discovering themselves unable to countenance the existence of one or other kind of truth-maker, panegyrists may find themselves obliged to reconsider what truths really require truth-makers or to reconsider what it is to be a truth-maker. We can get a sense of the complex interplay of forces at work here by starting out from the most simple and general principle about truth-making (maximalism) and then seeing what pressures are generated to make us step back from it.

2.1 Maximalism

Truth-maker maximalists demand that every truth has a truth-maker—no exceptions granted. So they advance the completely general principle,

(Maximalism)
For every truth, then there must be something in the world that makes it true.

The principle lies at one end of the spectrum of positions we can potentially occupy. At the other end, we find truth-maker nihilism, the idea that no truth needs to be made true because (roughly) the very idea of a truth-maker is a corrupt one: there is no such role as making something true for anything to perform. Truth-maker optimalism is the intermediate position that only some truths stand in need of truth-makers: not so few that truth fails to be anchored in reality but not so many that we strain credulity about the kinds of things there are.

2.1.1 The Liar?

Milne (2005) has offered the following knock-down, if not knock-out, argument against maximalism. Take the sentence,

(M)
This sentence has no truth-maker.

Suppose that (M) has a truth-maker. Since it's made true, M must be true. And since it's true, what (M) says must also be the case: that M has no truth-maker. So if (M) has a truth-maker then it doesn't have a truth-maker. By reductio ad absurdum (M) therefore has no truth-maker. But this is just what (M) says. So, contra (Maximalism), there is at least one sentence, (M), that is true without benefit of a truth-maker.

Rodriguez-Pereyra (2006c) has responded to this argument by maintaining that (M) is like the Liar sentence

(L)
This sentence is false.

It's a familiar position in the philosophy of logic to respond to the inconsistency that arises from supposing that (L) is either true or false—if it is, it isn't and if it isn't, it is—that the sentence (L) isn't meaningful, despite superficial appearances (see, for a useful introduction to these issues, Sainsbury 1995: 111–33). According to Rodriguez-Pereyra, because (M) is akin to the Liar sentence there's no reason to suppose that (M) is meaningful either. But if (M) isn't meaningful then (M) certainly can't be true; in which case (M) can't be a counterexample to maximalism either.

This response is flawed because, as Milne points out, (M) is importantly unlike (L): (L) gives rise to an outright inconsistency when only elementary logic rules are applied to it; whereas (M) isn't inconsistent per se but only when combined with a substantive metaphysical principle: maximalism. If, by contrast, you don't believe in truth-makers then you have every right to treat (M) as just another true sentence—just as you have every right to think (P) is true if you don't believe in propositions,

(P)
This sentence does not express a proposition

It's only if one was (absurdly) to think that maximalism was a logical truth that (M) could be intelligibly thought to be “Liar-like”. Of course, one person's modus ponens is another's modus tollens. So if one already had very strong independent reasons for being committed to maximalism, Milne's argument would provide a reason for thinking that (M) is meaningless (even though it isn't Liar-like). But even if there are such reasons—or appear to be—we can't claim to have control of our subject matter until we have established what it is about the constitutive connections that obtain between truth-making, truth and truth-bearers that determines (M) to be meaningless (if it is); until we've established the lie of the land, we can't be sure that we're not kidding ourselves thinking (M) to be meaningless rather than maximalism to be false. The lesson repeats itself: a convincing theory of truth-makers requires a coeval theory of truth bearers.

2.1.2 Could there be nothing rather than something?

Here's another shot across the bows, this time from Lewis. Take the most encompassing negative existential of all: absolutely nothing exists. Surely this statement is possibly true. But if it were true then something would have to exist to make it true if the principle that every truth has a truth-maker is to be upheld. But then there would have to be something rather than nothing. So combining maximalism with the conviction that there could have been nothing rather than something leads to contradiction (Lewis 1998: 220, 2001: 611). So unless we already have reason to think there must be something rather than nothing—as both Armstrong (1989b: 24–5) and Lewis (1986: 73–4) think they do—maximalism is already in trouble.

2.1.3 Maximalism is distinct from 1–1 Correspondence

What is there to be said in defence of maximalism? Even though he favours it, Armstrong finds himself obliged to admit that “I do not have any direct argument” for recommending the position (2004: 7). Instead he expresses the hope that

philosophers of realist inclinations will be immediately attracted to the idea that a truth, any truth, should depend for its truth for something “outside” it, in virtue of which it is true.

Let us follow Armstrong's lead and treat maximalism as a “hypothesis to be tested”. (See Schaffer 2008b: 308 for a more direct argument that relies upon (Grounding-T).)

Maximalism needs to be distinguished from the even stronger claim,

(Correspondence)
For each truth there is exactly one thing that makes it true and for each truth-maker there is exactly one truth made true by it.

But that there's clear blue water between these claims is evident if we combine maximalism with (Entailment)—that whatever makes a truth p true makes what p entails true too. So p and all of its consequences are not only all made true (as maximalism demands) but they also share a truth-maker (as Correspondence denies). This takes us halfway to appreciating that so far from being an inevitably profligate doctrine—as its name suggests—maximalism is compatible with denying that some logically complex claims have their own bespoke truth-makers. (The inspiration for thinking this way comes from the logical atomism of Russell (1918–19) that admitted some logically complex facts but not others—it is to be contrasted with Wittgenstein's version of the doctrine (1921) which admitted only atomic facts.)

Suppose, for the sake of expounding the view, that some truth-bearers are atomic. Also suppose that P and Q are atomic and t makes P true. Then, by Entailment, t makes PQ true too. Similarly, if s makes P true and s* makes Q true then, by Entailment, s and s* together make P & Q true. Since the task of making PQ and P & Q true has already been discharged by the truth-makers for the atomic truth bearers, there is no need to posit additional truth-makers for making these disjunctive and conjunctive truths true. Similar reasoning suggests that there is no need to posit bespoke truth-makers for existential generalisations or truths of identity either (Mulligan, Simons, & Smith 1984: 313; Simons 1992: 161–3; Armstrong 2004: 54–5). But maximalism is not thereby compromised: even though disjunctive and conjunctive truths lack specific truth-makers of their own, they're still made true by the truth-makers of the basic claims from which they're compounded by the logical operations of disjunction and conjunction.

2.1.4 The need for bespoke truth-makers

But positing truth-makers for atomic truths doesn't obviate the need—supposing maximalism—to posit additional truth-makers for negative and universal truths. This becomes apparent in the case of negative truths when we compare the truth-tables for conjunction and disjunction with the truth-table for negation. The former tell us that the truth of a disjunctive formula is determined by the truth of one or other of its disjuncts, whilst the truth of a conjunctive formula is determined by the truth of both its conjuncts. But the truth-table for negation doesn't tell us how the truth of ~P is determined by the truth of some other atomic formula Q from which ~P follows; it only tells us that ~P is true iff P is false. The strategy for avoiding bespoke truth-makers for logically complex truths can't get a grip in this case: there's no Q such that supplying a truth-maker for it obviates the necessity of positing an additional truth-maker for ~P (Russell 1918–19: 209–11; Hochberg 1969: 325–7).

The problem is even starker for universal truths: there's no truth-table for them because there is no set of atomic formulae whose truth determines that a universally quantified formula is true too. Why so? Because whatever true atomic formulae we light upon (Fa, FbFn), it doesn't follow from them that ∀xFx is true. To extract the general conclusion one would need to add to the premises that a, bn are all the things there are; that there's no extra thing waiting in the wings to appear on stage that isn't F. But this extra premise is itself universally quantified, not atomic. So it can't be argued that the truth-makers for Fa, FbFn put together already discharge the task of making ∀xFx true because they entail it (Russell 1918–9: 236–7; Hochberg 1969: 335–7).

2.1.4.1 Truth-makers for Negative Truths

The most straightforward response—since we are treating maximalism as a working hypothesis—is to find more fitting truth-makers for those truths that aren't already made true by the truth-makers for the atomic truths that entail them. Whilst looking around for truth-makers for negative truths Russell reflected,

There is implanted in the human breast an almost unquenchable desire to find some way of avoiding the admission that negative facts are as ultimate as those that are positive. (1919: 287)

He was right that our desire for positive facts and things makes us awkward about acknowledging that negative facts or things are the truth-makers of negative truths. Nonetheless, discussions about whether there are truth-makers for a given range of truth bearers on one or the other side of the positive-negative divide are apt to appear nebulous. This is because, as Russell had himself previously noted, there is “no formal test” or “general definition” for being a negative fact; we “must go into the meanings of words” (1918–19: 215–6). Statements of the form “a is F” aren't invariably positive (“so-and-so is dead”), nor are statements of the form “a isn't F” (“so-and-so isn't blind”) always negative. But it doesn't follow from the fact that a syntactic test cannot be given that there is nothing to the contrast between positive and negative. Molnar suggests that the contrast can be put on a sound scientific footing. For Molnar, natural kinds are paradigm instances of the positive, to be identified on a posteriori grounds (2000: 73). To say that a thing belongs to a natural kind identified in this way is to state a positive fact. To state a negative fact is to negate a statement of a positive fact.

It's a very natural suggestion that if the negative claim that a isn't F is true it's made true by the existence of something positive that's incompatible with a's being F (Demos 1917). For example, the truth-maker for the claim that kingfishers aren't yellow is the fact that they're blue because their being blue is incompatible with their being yellow. But what makes it true that these colours are incompatible? The notion of incompatibility appears itself to be negative—a relation that obtains between two states when it's not possible for them to obtain together. So this proposal threatens to become regressive: we'll need to find another positive truth-maker for the further negative claim that yellow and blue are incompatible, something whose obtaining is incompatible with the state of yellow and blue's being compatible, and so on (Russell 1918–9: 213–5, 1919: 287–9; Taylor 1952: 438–40; Hochberg 1969: 330–1; Grossman 1992: 130–1; Molnar 2000: 74–5; Simons 2008). There's another worry: it's not obvious that there are enough positive states out there to underwrite all the negative truths there are. Even though it may be true that this liquid is odourless this needn't be because there's something further about it that excludes its being odorous (Taylor 1952: 447; Mulligan, Simons, & Smith 1984: 314; Molnar 2000: 75; Armstrong 2004: 62–3; Dodd 2007: 387).

One could circumvent the threatened regress by denying that the incompatibilities in question require truth-makers of their own because they're necessary truths and such truths are a legitimate exception to maximalism—because “they are true come (or exist) what may” (Simons 2005: 254; Mellor 2003: 213). There is some plausibility to the idea that formal truths (tautologies) don't stand in need of truth-makers; their truth is settled by the truth-tables of the logical constants. But material necessary truths—such as that expressed by “yellow is incompatible with blue”—appear to make just as substantive demands upon the world as contingent truths do (Molnar 2000: 74). In a sense they appear to make even more of a demand since the world must be so endowed that it could not in any circumstances have failed to live up to the expectations of material necessary truths. It's a peculiar feature of our philosophical culture that even though it's almost universally acknowledged that Wittgenstein's plan (1921: 6.37) to show all necessity is logical necessity ended in failure—indeed foundered upon the very problem of explaining colour incompatibilities—that so many philosophers continue to think and talk as though the only necessities were formal ones so that necessary truths don't need truth-makers (MacBride 2011: 176–7).

Russell reluctantly chose to acknowledge negative facts as truth-makers for negative truths. He just couldn't see any way of living without them. But negative facts are an unruly bunch. Try to think of all the ways you are. Contrast that with the even harder task of thinking of all the ways you aren't! If negative truths are acknowledged as truth-makers they will have to be indefinitely numerous, unbounded in their variety; choosing to live with them is a heavy commitment to make (Armstrong 2004: 55). What's worse, if negative facts are akin to positive facts—as their name suggests—then they must be made up out of things, properties and relations arranged together. But, prima facie, many of these things, properties and relations aren't existing elements of reality. So unless, like Meinong, we believe in the non-existent, we'll have to admit that negative facts aren't configurations of their constituents and so an entirely different kind of entity from positive facts altogether (Molnar 2000: 77; Dodd 2007: 388).

It is for such reasons that Armstrong counsels us to adopt a more parsimonious account of what makes negative truths true (2004: 56–9). Armstrong's own account lies at the opposite extreme to Russell's. Whereas Russell posited indefinitely many negative facts to make negative truths true, Armstrong posits just one thing that's responsible for making them all true, viz. a totality fact.

We should register C.B. Martin's doubt that this is throwing out the baby with the bath water (1996: 59). According to Martin, we already recognise in ordinary discourse that different negative truths have different truth-makers—not just one as Armstrong proposes. For example, we recognise that what makes it true that there is no oil in this engine is different from what makes it true that there are no dodos left. What makes claims like these true are absences, lacks, limits, holes and voids, where these are conceived not as things but as “localised states of the world”, robustly first-order and “causally relevant” to what goes on (Martin 1996: 58, 65–6; Taylor 1952: 443–5). But, as many philosophers have argued, when we talk about an absence having causal effects what we're really saying can be understood without reifying negative states and appealing instead to the actual effects, or the counterfactual effects, of a positive state (Molnar 2000: 77–80; Armstrong 2004: 64–7; Lewis 2004; Beebee 2004).

2.1.4.2 Truth-makers for general truths

Armstrong's grand design is to sweep away the difficulties that attend the admission of negative facts by positing a special kind of general fact that also serves as the truth-maker for general truths. Russell admitted general facts too but he acknowledged that, “I do not profess to know what the right analysis of general facts is” (Russell 1918–9: 236–7). But Armstrong has gone further and assigned to general facts the following structure: a general, or totality fact consists in a binary relation T of totality that holds between an aggregate on the one hand and a property on the other when the aggregate comprises all the items that fall under the property in question (Armstrong 1989b: 93–4, 1997: 199–200, 2004: 72–5).

For example, China, France, the Russian Federation, the U.K. and the U.S.A. comprise the permanent membership of the UN Security Council. So the aggregate (A) of them bears the T relation to the property (P) of being a permanent member of the Council (T(A, P)). Since the aggregate bears that relation to that property, there can be other permanent members of the Council who aren't already included in it. So the totality fact T(A, P) suffices for the general truth that China, France, the Russian Federation, the U.K. and the U.S.A are all its members. It also suffices for the truth of the negative existential that there are no other members of the Council. So once we've recognised that T(A, P) exists, there's no need to recognise additional bespoke truth-makers for these negative truths.

In a similar way Armstrong endeavours to sweep away the need for negative facts by affirming “the biggest totality state of all, the one embracing all lower-order states of affairs”, i.e., the existence of a totality state that consists in an aggregate of all the (1st order) states of affairs there are related by T to the property of being a (1st order) states of affairs (2004: 75). It's one of Armstrong's abiding contentions that the world is “a world of states of affairs, with particulars and universals only having existence within states of affairs” (1989: 94). Consequently this totality state comprises a vast swathe of what exists—whether particulars, universals or states of affairs that consist in particulars having universals. So it follows from the existence of this totality fact that there are no more (1st order) states of affairs that are not already included in the aggregate of states that T relates to the property of being a (1st order) states of affairs. Nor are there any particulars or (1st order) universals had by those particulars that are not constituents of the state of affairs included in that aggregate. It also follows that there are no more particulars or (1st order) universals. So this totality fact serves as truth-maker for all these negative truths.

It is sometimes objected that such totality facts are just negative facts in disguise: “Totality statements state the non-existence of certain entities, they state ‘no more facts’”; so we should reject totality facts if we are dissatisfied with negative ones (Molnar 2000: 81–2; Dodd 2007: 389). Armstrong responds to this charge with equanimity: “It is not denied, of course, that the totalling or alling relation involves negation. It sets a limit to the things of that sort” (2004: 73). But if negation has indeed been smuggled into the description of the role that T performs in comprising a totality state then it is difficult to avoid the suspicion that Armstrong has simply exchanged many negative facts for one big one. But we may think of Armstrong's contribution in a different way. There are two ostensible concerns that negative states of affairs present. First, there is a concern about their number. Second, there is a concern about, so to speak, their negativity. Armstrong has addressed the first concern by showing how we may reduce the number of negative states of affairs. But the second concern neither cannot be met—because, as Armstrong reflects, we cannot eliminate negation from our description of the world.

It has also been objected that Armstrong's position gives rise to a “paradox of totality” (Armstrong 1989: 94, 1997: 198–9, 2004: 78–9; Cox 1997: 53–60; Molnar 2000: 81). Take the totality state of affairs that comprises all the (1st order) state of affairs. Since this (2nd order) state is itself a state of affairs it follows that the initial aggregate of (1st order) states of affairs failed to comprise all the states of affairs there are. So there must be a further totality state that comprised the aggregate of all of them. But this (3rd order) state is also a state of affairs so it will need to be added to the mix too, and so ad infinitum.

Armstrong responds to this objection with equanimity too:

we can afford to be casual about this infinite series. For after the first fact of totality these “extra” states of affairs are all supervenient. As such, we do not have to take them with ontological seriousness. (1989b: 94)

To understand this we need to appreciate that Armstrong's notion of supervenience is non-standard: “an entity Q supervenes upon entity P if and only if it is impossible that P should exist and Q not exist” or, in other words that the existence of P entails the existence of Q. (Armstrong 1997: 11). He also holds a non-standard conception of ontological commitment, viz. that “What supervenes is no addition of being” (Armstrong 1997: 12, 2004: 23–4). Armstrong's idea is (roughly) that to be a genuine addition to being is to be a net (indispensible) contributor to the schedule of truth-makers for all the truths. But supervenient entities are superfluous as truth-makers. If the existence of an R entails the existence of a certain S which in turn entails the truth of P, then R already makes P true so there is no need to include S in the inventory of truth-makers. It follows that supervenient entities, like S, are no addition of being (Lewis 1992: 202–3).

Now bring this non-standard conception of ontological commitment to bear upon the envisaged infinite series of totality facts. It is impossible that the 2nd order totality fact comprising all the 1st order states of affairs exist and the 3rd order totality fact comprising all the 1st and 2nd order states not exist. So the 3rd totality fact—or any other state higher-order than it—is entailed by the existence of the 2nd order totality state. So all of these n > 2 higher-order totality states supervene on it. That's why Armstrong doesn't think we need to take any of them with ontological seriousness.

What should we make of this non-standard conception of ontological commitment in terms of truth-making: that to be is to be a truth-maker? Cameron (2008c) has proposed that this conception should replace the standard one that to be is to be the value of a variable. But this threatens to cut off the branch the advocates of truth-maker theory are sitting on: if they disavow that existential quantification is ontologically committing then they will be left without a means of determining the ontological commitments of truth-maker theory itself, i.e., the theory that gives the inventory, using existential quantification, of what makes all the truths true (Schaffer 2010: 16–7).

Of course, if someone grants that existential quantification is ontologically committing in the context of a theory of truth-makers then they won't stultify themselves in this way (Heil 2003: 9, 2009: 316–7, Simons 2010: 200). But this just seems like special pleading. An argument is owed that we can't legitimately commit ourselves to the existence of things that perform theoretical roles outside the theory of truth-makers (MacBride 2011: 169). Why should there be only one theoretical dance allowed in town? Why shouldn't we allow that there are other theoretical roles for existing things to perform? Indeed it's a very real possibility that when we come to understand the capacity of the truth-makers to make truth-bearers true we will find ourselves embroiled in commitment to the existence of other things in their explanatory wake that aren't truth-makers themselves. In fact Armstrong himself should have been one of the first to recognise this. For it has been an abiding feature of Armstrong's world view that we are obliged to acknowledge not only states affairs, which are truth makers, but also properties and relations, constituents of states of affairs, which aren't.

More generally, can we make any sense of the idea of “an ontological free lunch”? Why is something supervenient no addition to being? Even if we only ever came to recognise the existence of one supervening entity would we not thereby have added at least one extra item to our inventory of things that exist? Of course in the special case where the supervening entity is constituted by the entities it supervenes upon—i.e., the things that are already there—it makes some sense to say that it's not adding anything new; but it's not at all obvious that what Armstrong et al. declare to be ontological free lunches are constituted from the entities upon which they supervene (Melia 2005: 74–5).

Where does this leave us? So long as Armstrong's non-standard conception of ontological commitment remains controversial, it also remains controversial whether the infinite series of totality facts to which Armstrong is “committed” may be dismissed as mere ontological frippery.

2.2 Optimalism

One way to respond to these difficulties is to abandon maximalism in favour of optimalism, to deny that universal and negative statements need truth-makers. But Merricks argues the optimalist “way out” is blocked. Negative truths need truth-makers if any truths do, but they can't have them. So we must give up thinking that truths need truth-makers in the first place (2007: 39–67).

Here's why Merricks thinks so. In order to avoid the over-generation of truth-makers for necessary truths (etc.) Merricks imposes a relevance constraint: “a truth-maker must be that which its truth is about” (2007: 28). But can this constraint be satisfied in the case of negative existentials, such as the statement there are no hobbits? This statement isn't about hobbits, because there aren't any, and other apparent candidates, such as the universe's exhibiting the global property of being such that there are no hobbits in it, appear hoaxed up and artificial (2007: 43–55). Even if one follows Merricks this far, one may still think that negative existentials are the principled exception that proves the rule that a truth-maker for a positive truth must be what its truth is about. But, so far as Merricks is concerned, this is throwing the baby out with the bathwater:

I deny that if we set aside the intuition that “a truth, any truth” depends on being we are left with the equally compelling intuition that all truths except negative existentials depend on being. (2007: 41)

He also suggests that this position is theoretically disingenuous because no one would consider retreating to it from full-blown maximalism unless he or she had already been “spooked” by his or her failure to find truth-makers for negative truths; or if they held onto the view that truth is correspondence (Merricks 2007: 40–1; Dodd 2007: 394; Cameron 2008a: 411). Merricks surmises that if we have any reason to commit to truth-makers, we have only reason to commit outright to a truth-maker for every truth (maximalism). But since maximalism cannot be sustained because of the lack of things for negative existentials to be about, Merricks recommends the rejection of truth-makers altogether.

But optimalists aren't just “spooked” or “timid” maximalists. They stand on their two feet with a principled position of their own that need neither be based upon “gerrymandered intuition” nor adopted as a consequence of a forced retreat from maximalism. If maximalism is intellectual heir to Russell's logical atomism, then optimalism (at least in the form under consideration) is heir to Wittgenstein's version of the doctrine according to which it is only atomic propositions that represent the existence of states of affairs. The optimalists' idea is that once truth-makers have been supplied for the atomic truths there is simply no need to posit further truth-makers for the molecular ones. All we need to recognise is that an atomic statement P is true whenever a truth-maker for P exists, that P is false if and only if no truth-maker for P exists. Once the existence and non-existence of the truth-makers has settled the truth-values of all the atomic statements, the logical operations described by the truth-tables then settle the truth and falsity of all the molecular statements (another story must be told about what the truth-makers are for the non-extensional constructions—another elephant in the room). In particular, the truth-table for negation—that tells us what “~” means—assures us that if P is false then ~P is true. So all it takes to make ~P true is that no truth-maker for P exists. Thus Mulligan, Simons, and Smith:

it seems more adequate to regard sentences of the given kind as true not in virtue of any truth-maker of their own, but simply in virtue of the fact that the corresponding positive sentences have no truth-maker. (1984: 315; see also Mellor 2003: 213–4, 2009; Simons 2000:7–8, 2005: 255–6)

Simons offers the illuminating reflection:

This is the truth-maker end of Wittgenstein's insight that propositions are bi-polar: if a proposition has one truth-value, however it gets it, its contradictory opposite has the opposite truth-value without further ado;

Simons dubs the truth functional mechanism whereby the negation of an atomic statement gets the value true, “truth by default” (2008: 14).

Optimalists also think that general truths are true by default so there is no need for bespoke truth-makers for them (like totality facts). Universal quantifications ∀xFx are logically equivalent to negative statements of the form ∼∃xFx. Since the latter are negative, they're true, if they are, only by default. Then because the former statements are logically equivalent to them, the optimalists surmise that universal quantifications are true by default too (Mellor 2003: 214; Simons 2008: 14–5).

2.3 Truth Supervenes Upon Being

Optimalism retains the original demand for truth-makers but restricts it to atomic statements. Optimalism accordingly disavows a commitment to truth-makers for negative statements and statements of generality. But Bigelow⎯also wary of the commitments that maximalism engenders to negative and totality facts⎯ weakens what truth-making means to a point where negative and general statements don't require bespoke truth-makers of their own (1988: 131–3). He offers the following principle to capture the kernel of truth in truth-making worth saving.

(Truth Supervenes on Being)
If something is true then it would not be possible for it to be false unless either certain things were to exist which don't, or else certain things had not existed which do (1988: 133).

This principle allows atomic truths to have truth-makers⎯because it would only be possible for them to be false if certain things had not existed: their truth-makers. But it also allows negative truths to be true without them. The statement that there are no dragons gets to be true because it would only be possible for that statement to be false if something which hadn't existed (dragons) did exist. Such statements are true not because they have truth-makers but because they have no counterexamples, ìthey lack false-makersî (Lewis 1992: 204, 2001: 610).

General truths are also true for lack of false-makers. The statement that everything is physical (if true) is true because it would only be possible for the statement to be false if something that hadn't existed did, viz. something that wasn't physical. So when truth-making is understood in this weakened sense there is no need to acknowledge, e.g., an additional totality fact to make it true that there are only five coins in my pocket; it's enough that if I hadn't stopped adding coins that statement would have been false because then there would have been at least one other coin in my pocket (Heil 2000: 236–240, 2003: 68–72, 2006: 238–40; Bricker 2006).

Despite their differences, optimalism and (Truth Supervenes Upon Being) share a key idea in common—that a negative existential truth isn't true because something exists, but because something doesn't, viz. a truth-maker for its contradictory, a false-maker for it. C.B. Martin has objected that this doesn't obviate the need to posit truth-makers for negative existentials. This is because a statement that there are no false-makers for a negative existential truth is itself a negative existential truth. So this statement “can't be used to explain or show how the latter needs no truth-making state of the world for it to be true” (1996: 61). Lewis takes Martin object that this account of the truth of negative truths isn't informative. Take the statement that there are no unicorns. Why is it true? Well because there are no unicorns. That's not much of an explanation! But, Lewis retorts, the positive existential statement that there is a cat is true because there is a cat. That's “No explanation at all, and none the worse for that” (Lewis 2001: 611–12). Fair enough; but perhaps Martin meant that optimalists and their fellow-travellers were presupposing what they set out to show—because they assumed without argument that a special class of negative claims stood in no need of truth-makers, those according to which other negative statements lacked false makers.

2.4 Humean Scepticism

Lewis has anyway argued that the doctrine that truth supervenes upon being—and, by implication, optimalism—are an uncomfortable halfway house. He began by trying to persuade us that the retreat from maximalism was already mandated. He pointed out how deeply counterintuitive it is to suppose that negative existentials are true because their truth-makers exist. It seems, offhand, that they are true not because some things do exist but because some don't. “Why defy this first impression?” (1992: 204). But, more importantly, Lewis pointed out that maximalism was incompatible with what he took to be the master principle governing our thought about modality: Hume's denial of necessary connection between distinct existences. It is a consequence of this principle that anything can co-exist with anything else that's distinct. But it is the raison d'être of any truth-maker for the negative existential truth that there are no unicorns—if there is one and whatever else it is like—that even though it is distinct from all unicorns it cannot co-exist with any of them, else it would make it true that there are no unicorns even in circumstances where unicorns existed. Similarly it is the raison d'être of any truth-maker for a general truth that such-and-such are all the facts there are that it refuses to co-exist with any other facts even though it is distinct from them. So if we're to hang onto Hume's denial of necessary connexions, we'd better give up the demand for truth-makers for negative and general truths, i.e., maximalism (Lewis 1992: 205, 2001: 610–11).

Lewis also argues that we can't stop here—just giving up maximalism for optimalism—because even the truth-makers for atomic statements conflict with Humeanism. Suppose that the statement that Dog Harry is golden is atomic. Also suppose that Harry is only accidentally golden, so the statement is contingent. What is its truth-maker? It can't be Harry because it's possible for him to exist even in circumstances where the statement is false, i.e., when he has a different coloured coat. But it can't be the property of being golden either since there are possible circumstances in which plenty of things are golden but not Harry. It can't even be the mereological fusion Harry + being golden because it's a feature of fusions that they exist even in circumstances where their parts are otherwise unrelated—e.g., when Harry is black whilst Harriet is golden. For this reason, many maximalists make common cause with optimalists to posit another fundamental kind of thing to perform the truth-making role in the case of contingent (atomic) predications: facts that consist in objects, properties and relations bound together; in this case the fact Harry's being golden (Armstrong 1989a: 41–2, 1997: 115–6; Mellor 1995: 24). Now facts in general and Harry's being golden in particular cannot be built up mereologically from Harry and being golden; otherwise Harry's being golden would be no more fit a candidate for making the statement that Harry is golden true than the fusion Harry + being golden. Since Harry's being golden isn't built up mereologically from Harry and being golden, they cannot be parts of it. But if they aren't parts of it they must be entirely distinct from this state of affairs. This is where Lewis pounced. Even though Harry's being golden is entirely distinct from its “constituents” it cannot obtain without Harry and being golden existing. More generally, the obtaining of a fact necessitates the existence of its constituents even though the fact and its constituents are entirely distinct. So we cannot posit facts as truth-makers for contingent (atomic) statements without going against Humeanism (Lewis 1992: 200, 1998: 215–6, 2001: 611).

Other maximalists and optimalists, often those wary of facts, posit (non-transferrable) tropes as truth-makers for contingent predications (Martin 1980; Mulligan, Simons, & Smith 1984: 295–304, Lowe 2006: 186–7, 204–5) Tropes, in the non-transferrable sense, are particular instances of properties that are existentially dependent upon their bearers. For example, the particular golden colour g of Harry's coat is a non-transferrable trope because g could not have existed except as the colour of his coat. Since g is non-transferrable, this trope only exists in circumstances where Harry's coat is golden; hence g's eligibility to be a truth-maker for the statement that Harry is golden. (If g was transferrable, then g could have existed in circumstances where whilst borne by Harriet, Harry bore another black trope d; so if g is transferrable it isn't eligible to be a truth-maker for the statement that Harry is golden.) But Lewis' reasoning can be easily extended to show that non-transferrable tropes cannot serve as the truth-makers for contingent statements without contradicting Humeanism. If trope g is a property that Harry bears rather than a part of him, then g is wholly distinct from Harry. Nevertheless, the existence of g necessitates the existence of Harry even though they are distinct (MacBride 2005: 121). Alternatively if g is a part of the bundle of tropes that constitute Harry, if g is non-transferrable, then the existence of g necessitates the existence of some other distinct tropes that are also parts of this bundle. So Humeanism is violated either way.

2.4.1 Subject Matter

In order to avoid contradicting Humeanism, Lewis recommended a further weakening of (Truth Supervenes upon Being). According to Lewis, the kernel of truth in truth-making is the idea that propositions have a subject matter. They are about things so whether they are true or false depends on how those things stand. This led Lewis to endorse (2003: 25):

(Subject matter)
Any proposition has a subject matter, on which its truth value supervenes.

Equivalently, there cannot be a difference in the truth-value of a proposition without a difference in its subject matter. This might consist in (1) an increase or decrease in the population of things that fall within the subject matter; or (2) a shift in the pattern of fundamental properties and relations those things exhibit (Lewis 2001: 612). Now the truth value of “Harry is golden” supervenes upon its subject matter without there needing to be any existing thing distinct from Harry or being golden that necessitates their existence; it is enough that the statement would have been false if Harry had lost his hair or been dyed. So we can avoid contradicting Humeanism by abandoning optimalism in favour of (Subject matter).

In an intriguing twist to the plot, Lewis subsequently appeared to withdraw his doubts about truth-makers (2003: 30, Lewis & Rosen 2003: 39). When building the case for (Subject Matter) Lewis had deliberately remained neutral about the metaphysics of modality (2001: 605). But Lewis recognised that if he gave up his neutrality and availed himself of counterpart theory then he could supply truth-makers aplenty whilst still adhering to his Humeanism.

According to Lewis's counterpart theory, “a is essentially F just in case all of a's counterparts (including a itself) are F” (2003: 27). Counterparts of x are objects that are similar to x in certain salient respects. Different conversational contexts make different respects salient. This means that the truth (or falsity) of essentialist judgements is always relative to the counterpart relation conversational cues select; so it will often be the case that whilst something is essentially F with respect to one counterpart relation it won't be with respect to another (Lewis 1968). In a conversation that makes it salient to think about Harry under the counterpart relation of being a golden Labrador then every relevant counterpart of him will be golden. So relative to this counterpart relation he is essentially golden. But in a different conversation that selects the counterpart relation of being a dog because then whilst all of his counterparts will be dogs Harry won't be essentially golden because some of his counterparts will be other colours. What's important is that it's one and the same thing, our beloved Harry, that's essentially golden with respect to the former counterpart relation but only accidentally so with respect to the latter. To make these essentialist judgements count as true in the right contexts we don't need one dog that's essentially golden, and another that's only accidentally so; we just need to think about Harry in two different (but compatible) ways.

According to (Necessitarian-T) and other related views, the property a truth-maker x has of making a given proposition P true is an essential feature of it. Why so? Because x is supposed to be something the mere existence of which suffices for the truth of P; it couldn't have existed without P being true (Armstrong 1997: 115). But Lewis' proposal is to treat essentialist attributions about truth-making in the same relativistic spirit that counterpart theory treats every other modal attribution (2003: 27–32). Think of Harry qua golden Labrador, i.e., under the counterpart relation of being a golden Labrador. All his counterparts selected by this relation are golden. So every world in which Harry or one of the counterparts exists is a world in which “Harry is golden” is true. In other words, Harry qua golden is truth-maker for the proposition that Harry is golden. But this doesn't commit us to necessary connexions between distinct existences—to a dog that couldn't have failed to be golden. In another context it will be just as legitimate to talk about Harry in a different way, as Harry qua dog. In that context his counterparts will include dogs that aren't golden. So Harry qua dog will be the truth-maker for the statement that Harry is a dog, but not the statement that he is golden.

In the same way that ordinary objects like Harry can serve as truth-makers for contingent predications, Lewis & Rosen (2003) suggest that the entire world—“the totality of everything there actually is”—can serve as the truth-maker for negative existentials. Take the world qua unaccompanied by unicorns. In the conversational context just set up, the world has no counterparts that are inhabited by unicorns. So the world qua unaccompanied by unicorns is essentially lacking in unicorns and therefore qualifies as a truth-maker for the statement that there are no unicorns.

Has Lewis shown how it is possible to garner truth-makers for contingent predications and negative existentials without positing totality facts or tropes that ensnare us in a web of necessary connections? Indeed has he shown how we can get by using only ordinary objects and collections of them to serve as truth-makers? We need to be clear about what Lewis is trying to do in this paper. He isn't reporting upon a damascene conversion, belatedly recognising what he had previously denied, that the truth-making role is genuine, but then ingeniously coming up with the idea that qua-versions of things perform this role just as effectively as states of affairs, only without necessary connections between distinct existences. Rather, Lewis' aim in this paper is to damn the very idea of truth-makers with faint praise. By showing how qua versions of things performed the truth-making role just as effectively as facts or tropes Lewis aimed to show how explanatorily bankrupt the truth-making role truly was (MacBride 2005: 134–6).

One might object to Lewis' controversial modal metaphysical assumptions of counterpart theory (Rodriguez-Pereyra 2006b: 193; Dodd 2007: 385). More broadly, one might question whether Lewis was right to place so much weight upon Hume's denial of necessary connections between distinct existences or question whether Lewis had interpreted it correctly (Daly 2000: 97–8; MacBride 2005: 123–7; Hoffman 2006; Cameron 2008b). It's one thing to say that we shouldn't multiply necessities without necessity but it's another thing to demand that we purge our world-view of them altogether. What about dispositions, chances, laws etc? Hume relied upon an empiricist theory of content to underpin his rejection of necessary connections. But Lewis certainly didn't advocate such a view. One is left wondering therefore whether Hume's denial of necessary connexions should be abandoned along with the theory of content that inspired it, an antiquated relic. If so, then we have yet to be given a reason to retreat from either optimalism or (Truth Supervenes Upon Being) to (Subject Matter)(MacBride 2005: 126–7).

3. What Motivates the Doctrine of Truth-makers?

3.1 To catch a cheater

What is the motivation for adopting a theory of truth-makers, whether maximalist or optimalist? Following Sider, it has become customary to describe the “whole point” of adopting a theory of truth-makers thus: to “Catch the cheaters” who don't believe in truth-makers (Sider 2001: 40–1; see also Merricks 2007: 2–3). But this is a bit like saying that the point of a benefit system is to catch out benefit frauds. It's only if there is some antecedent point in favour of truth-makers that there can be anything wrong with leaving them out. Nonetheless, it is possible that we can come to appreciate the need for truth-makers by appreciating what is lacking in theories that neglect them. This is how C.B. Martin and Armstrong came to recognise the necessity for admitting truth-makers (Armstrong 1989b: 8–11, 2004: 1–3). Consider phenomenalism: the view that the physical world is a construction out of sense-impressions. One obstacle for this view is the need to make sense in sense-impression terms of true claims we make about the unobserved world. Martin noticed that the phenomenalist could only appeal to brute, ungrounded counterfactuals about possible experience to do so. But counterfactuals do not float free in a void. They must be responsive to an underlying reality, the reality that makes them true. For Martin this was the phenomenalists' fatal error: their inability to supply credible truth-makers for truths about unobserved objects. The same error afflicted Ryle's behaviourism with its brute counterfactuals about non-existent behaviour and Prior's presentism according to which there is nothing outside the present and so there is nothing for past-tensed and future-tensed truths to be held responsible to. We come to appreciate the need for truth-makers as the common need these different theories fail to fulfil.

As Lewis points out, this demand for truth-makers represented an overreaction to what was undoubtedly a flaw in phenomenalism (1992: 217). We can already understand what's wrong with phenomenalism when we appreciate that it fails to provide an account of the things upon which the truth of counterfactuals about sense impressions supervene, i.e., when we see that it fails to satisfy (Subject Matter). This leaves under-motivated the claim that phenomenalism should also be faulted for failing to supply truth-makers to ground counterfactuals about sense-impressions. The same reasoning applies to behaviourism and presentism; they also fail to satisfy (Subject Matter). So there's no need to adopt truth makers to catch cheats. All we need to do is to recognise the strictures (Subject Matter) places upon us.

It's a further flaw of Martin and Armstrong's reasoning that even if we accede to the demand for truth-makers it doesn't follow that even idealism is ruled out. According to Armstrong if we forsake the demand for truth-makers we thereby challenge “the realistic insight that there is a world that exists independently of our thoughts and statements, making the latter true or false” (1997: 128). But even an idealist could accept that there are truth-makers whilst thinking of them as mind-dependent entities. So acceding to the demand for truth-makers doesn't tell us what's wrong with idealism (Daly 2005: 95–7). Bergmann, the grandfather of the contemporary truth-maker movement, was explicit about this: “the truth of S must be grounded ontologically. On this first move idealists and realists agree” (Bergmann 1961: 229). The realist-idealist distinction cuts across the distinction between philosophers who admit truth-makers and those that don't (Dodd 2002: 83–4).

The demand for truth-makers doesn't help “catch cheaters” at all. Just acknowledge, e.g., some brute counterfactual facts about sense data, or brute dispositions to behave in one way or another, or brute facts about what happened in the past or will happen in the future. What's unsatisfactory about these posits isn't that if they existed they'd fail to make true statements about unobserved objects or statements about mental states that failed to manifest themselves in actual behaviour or statements about the past or future. The problem is that we have difficulty in understanding how such facts or dispositions could be explanatorily sound (Horwich 2009: 195–7). Whatever we find lacking in theories that posit such items, it isn't that they fail to provide truth-makers, because they do. Of course if we are already committed to the need for truth makers then we will likely conceive of the demand for them as, e.g., drawing the phenomenalist out into the open to reveal the unfitness of their explanatory posits. But unless we already have independent reasons for recognising the demand for truth makers, catching cheaters cannot provide a motivation for positing them.

3.2 Supervenience Principles

Does this mean that we should join Bigelow in his retreat to (Truth Supervenes Upon Being) or step back with Lewis to (Subject Matter)? The problem is that these supervenience principles don't seem a satisfactory resting place either, not if our concern is to understand how true representations can touch upon an independent reality, i.e., something non-representational. First, it is familiar point that just appealing to a systematic pattern of modal co-variation between truths and their subject matters—so that there is no difference in the former without a difference in the latter—doesn't provide us within any insight into the underlying mechanism or mechanisms that sustains this dependency (Molnar 2000: 82–3; Heil 2003: 67; Daly 2005: 97–8; Melia 2005: 82–3). Second, if possible worlds are conceived as maximal representations then these supervenience principles (understood in the idiom of possible worlds) fail to articulate what it is for a representation to touch upon being, something non-representational: “For the idea that every truth depends on being is not the idea that every truth is entailed by propositions of a certain sort” (Merricks 2007: 86).

A third reason for being unsatisfied with Lewis' (Subject Matter) is based upon the observation that the supervenience involved is symmetric. Just as there is no difference in the distribution of truth-values amongst the body of propositions without a reciprocating difference in their subject matter, there is no difference in their subject matter without a difference in the distribution of their truth-values (Armstrong 2004: 7–8). But we also have the firm intuition that the truth or falsity of a proposition depends upon the state of the world in a way in which the state of the world doesn't depend upon the proposition's truth or falsity. This means that a supervenience principle like (Subject Matter) cannot be used to articulate the asymmetric way in which truth so depends upon being; for this, it is argued, we need to rely upon a robust asymmetric notion of truth-making (Rodriguez-Pereyra 2005: 18–19).

3.3 Correspondence

“Catching cheats” doesn't supply a motivation for adopting truth-makers. Are there other motivations for so doing? One such motivation is that truth-making falls out naturally from the correspondence theory of truth.

Anybody who is attracted to the correspondence theory of truth should be drawn to the truth-maker [sic]. Correspondence demands a correspondent, and a correspondent for a truth is a truth-maker. (Armstrong 1997: 14; see also 1997: 128–9, 2004: 16–7)

According to Armstrong, the “truth-maker principle” (aka maximalism) just is what we are left with once we drop the assumption from the correspondence theory that the relation between truth bearers and truth-makers is one-one. Of course, the truth-making relation, however it is explicated, cannot be the relation of correspondence in terms of which truth is defined—for whereas the latter is symmetric, the former isn't (Beebee & Dodd 2005b: 13–4). But this doesn't prevent truth being defined using the truth-making relation, albeit in a more roundabout way according to the following pattern,

(C)
S is true ⇔ (∃x)(S is-made-true-by x).

Of course such a definition will only succeed if the relation expressed by “is-made-true-by” can itself be explicated without relying upon the notion of truth itself or other notions that implicitly presuppose it, e.g., entailment (Merricks 2007: 15). This is no doubt one of the reasons that principles of truth-making are typically not put forward as definitions of truth (David 2009: 144). Another objection made by Horwich is that it is implausible to suppose that an ordinary person understands the notion of truth via the heterogeneous principles that govern the provision of truth-makers for different types of propositions. It's more plausible to suppose that we first grasp what truth is, and only subsequently figure out what truth-makers are required for the various kinds of propositions there are (Horwich 2009: 188).

3.4 Deflationism

Several philosophers have argued that so far from presupposing the notion of truth, the various truth-making principles we have discussed operate at a far more subterranean level. Bigelow writes, “The force behind Truth-maker lies deeper than worries about the nature of truth and of truth-bearers” (Bigelow 1988: 127, 2009: 396–7; Robinson 2000: 152; Lewis 2001: 605–6; Horwich 2009: 188–9). Suppose we understand what it is to be truth-maker in terms of entailment. Then whatever the range of truths we think are capable of being rendered true, the “guts” of our truth-maker principle can be stated using the schema,

(Schema)
If P, then there must be something in the world whose existence entails that P.

This schema is equivalent to the infinitely many conditionals that fall under it:

(i1)
If the donkey is brown, then there must be something in the world whose existence entails that the donkey is brown;
(i2)
if the Parthenon is on the Acropolis then there must be something in the world whose existence entails that the Parthenon is on the Acropolis; and so on.

Note that neither “true” nor “truth” shows up anywhere in the schema or its instances. Arguably the only role that the notion of truth performs is the one that minimalist or deflationary theories of truth emphasize, that of enabling us to capture all of that unending string of conditionals in a single slogan,

(Slogan)
For any truth, there must be something in the world whose existence entails that truth.

But since truth is serving here only as a device of generalization, the real subject matter of (Slogan) is already expressed by the conditionals (i1), (i2) etc. Since they make no explicit mention of either propositions or truth, a theory of truth-makers is neither a theory about propositions nor a theory about truth. If so, then the theory of truth-makers can neither gain inspiration from, nor be tarred by the same brush as the correspondence theory of truth. Nor need the theory of truth-makers be bedeviled by concerns about the nature of truth bearers.

3.5 Tarski and the Truth-makers

We have just seen that some philosophers, such as Bigelow, have sought to liberate truth-making from its (apparently) spurious association with the correspondence theory of truth by deploying deflationist techniques (treating “truth” merely as a device of generalization). It's a measure of just how little consensus has been achieved in the field that other philosophers have sought to use truth-maker principles to remedy what is (purportedly) lacking in deflationary theories of truth (Mulligan, Simons, & Smith 1984; Simons 1992). According to deflationary theories of truth, there isn't much more to be said about, e.g., the truth of the statement that snow is white except that it is true iff snow is white; more generally, that there isn't much more to be said about truth than is captured by the instances of the Tarskian schema,

(T)
s is true iff p

where “s” is replaced by the designation of any sentence of the object language under study, and “p” is replaced by a meta-language translation of the sentence in question. But these highly abstract characterizations of truth arguably leave something out. The truth of a statement is the upshot of two distinguishable factors, what the statement says about reality on the one hand, whether reality accords with what the statement says on the other. Now the provision of a Tarski-style theory of truth for a language L allows us to derive for each sentence in L an instance of the schema (T). Such a theory provides us with systematic insight into what each sentence says, i.e., the conditions under which it is true. But whilst a Tarski-style theory of truth consequently achieves a high score on the meaning side—and thereby tells us everything we need to know about truth with respect to L by deflationist lights—it lets us down on the reality side; “approaches of this kind do nothing to explain how sentences about the real world are made true or false”, “so Tarski's theory is in need of supplementation by considerations about the entities in virtue of which propositions are true” (Mulligan, Simons, & Smith 1984: 288; Simons 1992: 158–9).

Have Mulligan et al. pinpointed whence the demand for truth-makers arises? It's correct to say, as they do, that a Tarski-style theory of truth for a language L doesn't tell us how the true sentences of L are made true—in the sense of explaining the truth of a sentence in terms of a relation between it as a whole and some entity or entities. But pointing out that a Tarski-style theory of truth doesn't tell us this, doesn't establish that the theory is lacking in this respect—not unless it has already been established that a theory of truth for a language that fails to explain how its sentences are made true fails to articulate in some critical respect how reality conspires with meaning to deliver their mutual upshot, viz. truth. But this hasn't been established—at least not yet.

3.6 Truth-making and Explanation

According to McFetridge, the best way to hear questions of the form “what makes sentence S true?” is as “requests for (partial) explanations of why certain particular sentences are true” (1977: 38–39). It is striking then that Hochberg and Armstrong should have originally introduced truth-makers as entities the existence of which provide not a partial but a “full” account of the truth of a statement (Hochberg 1967: 416–7, 1978: 282–3; Armstrong 1973: 118; Bigelow 1988: 121). To provide a full account, truth-makers cannot be anything else except entities that guarantee without further ado or qualification that the statements they make true are true; if further assistance is needed then whatever entities we've appealed to so far can't be truth-makers. This gives us some insight into the otherwise puzzling assumption made by Hochberg and Armstrong that truth-makers are entities the existence of which necessitates the truth of the statements they make true; if they didn't they would fail to be the consummate explainers truth-makers are supposed to be. But it also brings to the surface a deeper and even more puzzling assumption, viz. that it's possible and necessary to provide an explanation of each and every true statement that's full in the relevant sense.

McFetridge also noted that talk of facts enters naturally into our answers to “What makes a (any) sentence true?” questions. Talk of facts does so

not because what we are particularly explaining is why certain sentences are true, but simply because such talk enters naturally into answers to any explanation seeking questions put in the idiom “What makes…?” or “In virtue of what is…?”. Thus if one were asked—“What makes salt soluble in water?”, the most natural answer would be something of the style, “The fact that it has such-and-such structure.” (1977: 39)

McFetridge remained open-minded about whether this kind of explanatory talk requires us to admit facts. He countenanced the possibility that the point of explaining truths could be grasped without positing such entities, appealing only to the philosophically austere resources of the deductive-nomological model (McFetridge 1977: 40–2; see Ruben 1990: 210, 231 for a contrary point of view).

Consider what explains why “Snow is white” is a true sentence of English. It's not enough to appeal to the axioms of a truth theory for English. These will only enable us to settle that “Snow is white” is a true sentence of English if and only if snow is white. We need to add the further premise that snow is white. Our naïve way of putting this—that what makes the (English) sentence “Snow is white” true is the fact that snow is white—is thereby justified by the point that

“the premiss that snow is white is an essential constituent of an explanation of the truth of ‘Snow is white’” (1977: 42).

If McFetridge is right that all of this can be expressed without appealing to the existence of facts then we can explain why sentences are true, describe what makes them true, without mention of the truth-makers that Hochberg, Armstrong et al. demand.

This will certainly require a great deal of elaboration before we can begin to have confidence in it. For example, McFetridge's key claim is that the premise that snow is white is “an essential constituent” of an explanation of the truth of “Snow is white”. But this seems too strong. It may be enough to explain the truth of “Snow is white” that another premise is adduced that entails “Snow is white”. But whatever else this premise might be—perhaps something about the lattice structure of snow and the way it reflects light—it will still need to be a premise about the world. So introducing qualifications of this kind still seem to leave the structure of McFetridge's insight intact. Of course, whether McFetridge has opened up a fruitful line of enquiry will itself turn upon more general issues with regard to the nature of explanation itself—e.g., upon the controversial thesis that explanations are arguments.

3.7 Truth-making and Conceptual Explanation

Other philosophers have sought in a different way to exploit the linkage between truth-making and explanation to the detriment of the idea that a true statement stands in need of a truth-maker. They appeal to the idea that when we say that a statement is true because a truth-maker for it exists, the “because” we employ is a connective (Künne 2003: 150–6; Hornsby 2005: 35–7; Melia 2005: 78–9; Schnieder 2006a: 29–37; Mulligan 2007). The truth functional operators (“&”, “∼” etc.) provide paradigm instances of what are commonly thought to be connectives, i.e., expressions that link sentences but without expressing a relation that holds between the states of affairs, facts or tropes that these sentences denote. Connectives are to be contrasted with ordinary verbs, such “x hit y”, that plausibly do expresses a relation between whatever is denoted by the singular terms that flanks its occurrence in a given statement. According to these philosophers, the truth-maker panegyrists have misconstrued the logical form of “makes true”. They have taken it to be a verb like “x hits y” when really it is akin to the connective “→” or “because” (Melia 2005: 78). There's no need to introduce truth-makers as the special things that stand at one end of the truth-making relation with true statements at the other, no need to because it's only superficial features of the grammar of our language that suggest there is a truth-making relation to stand at the ends of.

Typically philosophers who maintain that “makes true” is a connective do not argue for this conclusion directly but encourage us to dwell upon the fact that it natural to hear the “because” that occurs in equivalent constructions as a connective. When we hear, e.g., “It is true that the rose is red because the rose is red” we don't naturally hear it as expressing a binary relation between two things. So we shouldn't hear, or at least don't have to hear, “It's true that the rose is red in virtue of the rose's being red” or “the rose's being red makes it true that the rose is red” as a expressing a binary relation between a truth and truth-maker either.

Künne has gone further and suggested that the truth-making connective is really the “because” of conceptual explanation (2003: 154–5; see also Schnieder 2006a: 36–7 who also suggests that causal explanatory ingredients are typically added to the mix in “making true” constructions too). He encourages us to hear the equivalence between,

(R)
He is a child of a sibling of one of your parents, which makes him your first cousin

and,

(R*)
He is your first cousin because he is a child of a sibling of one of your parents.

He tells us that the “because” in (R*) is the “because” of “conceptual explanation”. Since (R) and (R*) are equivalent, he concludes that the “makes” construction in (R) is just a cumbersome way of expressing the “because” of conceptual explanation in (R*). Künne then invites us take the use of “makes” in (R) as a model for understanding the truth-making construction,

(S)
The fact that snow is white makes the statement that snow is white true.

This enables us to see that (S) does “not affirm a relation of any kind between a truth vehicle and something in the world” (Künne 2003: 155). Why? Because it is equivalent to,

(S*)
The statement that snow is white is true because snow is white.

a claim that makes no (explicit) mention of facts. Moreover, the second clause of (S*), like the second clause of (R*), tells us when it is correct to affirm its first clause. In both cases we have an explanation that draws respectively upon our understanding of the concepts cousin and truth. Drawing upon these materials, we are then able to construct an explanation of the felt asymmetry whereby the truth of what we say about the world depends upon what the world is like, but not the other way around. What is written on the left-hand-side of (S*) is conceptually more sophisticated than what is written upon the right-hand-side because the former requires us to be able to grasp the concepts of statement and truth to understand it whereas the latter does not. Accordingly the latter requires less of both the world and us than the former to be both understood and true. That's why it makes sense to deploy the right-hand-side (a claim about reality) to explain the left-hand-side (a claim about a truth bearer) but not the other way around (Hornsby 2005: 44; Dodd 2007: 399–400). Of course it may still be the case that this way of thinking is just wishful thinking, and this will continue to be our predicament until it has been established in some more exacting sense that the “because” of truth making is a connective rather than a relational expression—i.e., not just because it would be technically convenient for us to believe it to be so or because it sounds like a connective to someone with the ears of a naive grammarian.

3.8 Truth Making and Quantification

A final supporting suggestion: that the grand truth-maker projects of the late twentieth century arose (partly) out of a failure to appreciate the logical variety of natural language quantifiers that we unreflectively employ when expressing the intuitions that speak in favour of truth- makers.

Consider how Armstrong expressed himself when he started out:

It seems obvious that for every true contingent proposition there must be something in the world (in the largest sense of “something”) which makes the proposition true. For consider any true contingent proposition and imagine that it is false. We must automatically imagine some difference in the world. (Armstrong 1973: 11)

Bigelow asks us to compare two worlds, one in which A is true, the other in which it is false. According to Bigelow,

There must surely be some difference between these two possible worlds! They are clearly different in that A is true in one but not the other. So there must be something in one of these worlds which is lacking in the other and which accounts for the difference in truth. (1988: 126)

Armstrong and Bigelow make the same assumption about the “some” they employ in their expression of what makes the difference between the world in which A is true and the world in which A is false; they assume it is an objectual quantifier in name position.

With this assumption in place it is an easy move to make to think that there must be some thing that we quantify over that constitutes the difference between these circumstances, viz. the truth-maker for A. But as Williamson remarks “We should not assume that all quantification is either objectual or substitutional” (1999: 262–3; cf. Prior 1971: 31–4). Williamson argues that that the truth maker principle in fact

involves irreducible non-substitutional quantification into sentence position… We should not even assume that all non-substitutional quantification is interpreted in terms of assignments of values to the variables. For “value” is a noun, not a sentence. (1999: 263)

But suppose the “some” Armstrong and Bigelow employ is understood not as an objectual quantifier that comes equipped with a domain of entities over which it ranges but is understood in some other way. Then it would be open to us to acknowledge the force of Armstrong and Bigelow's intuition that the circumstances in which A is true are somehow different from those in which it isn't, but without our having to think that there exists something that we've quantified over than makes it so. Evidently it will not be until we have arrived at a settled view of the admissible interpretations our quantifiers may bear that this issue can be settled in a principled rather than dogmatic manner.

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