Notes to Tsongkhapa

1. Included in the first volume (Ka) of the Collected Works of Tsongkhapa (Tibetan Buddhist Resource Center); Thurman (1981) contains authentic translations of Tsongkhapa's own short descriptions of his intellectual and spiritual life.

2. The investigation into tattva (Tib. de kho na) seeks an essential identity (Sk. sva-bhāva, Tib. rang gi ngo bo/rang bzhin) in a unique thing (Sk. bhāva, Tib. dngos po), and the investigation into tathatā (Tib. de bzhin nyid) an essential reality (ātman, Tib. bdag) uniting all things, particularly as the known objects of a single act of fully enlightened knowledge. Napper (1989) reviews a series of intellectual exchanges between Alex Wayman and Geshe Lhudup Sopa that elucidate what Tsongkhapa means by khyab che ba and khyab chung ba.

3. The primary feature defining Buddhist philosophical literature that makes an investigation into right and wrong interpretations of the list of Mahāyāna abhidharma categories (Sk. rūpādi), is the structure given by the triad: basis, path, and result (Sk. vastu, mārga, phala, Tib. gzhi, lam, 'bras bu). From the perspective of the elite scholastic philosopher for whom it is axiomatic that there is a meaningful result (liberation or enlightenment) reached through a meaningful program of praxis (the path), the problem is soteriological: explaining the unity of the final perceiving subject (the mind of an enlightened being) arrived at through the series of diverse mental states leading up to that climax. Each later moment leads up to the climax. It is a greater knowledge than each preceding knowledge, existing in its own discrete historical moment (in its own present) along the course of the path. The enlightened mind that results from these linked states of every greater knowledge is defined principally as direct and non-conceptual. It does not just remember earlier knowledge, but knows it as it knows its own present state (in the present, as it were). The primary aim motivating those developing a fully enlightened mind without an absolute value is leading others to that final state free of all duḥkha (“suffering” in the widest sense of the term). To do so those with such knowledge must know the earlier knowledge-states perfectly, not just mediated through the idea of them, as memories.

Copyright © 2011 by
Gareth Sparham <gsparham@umich.edu>

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