Tsongkhapa

First published Mon Jul 18, 2011

Tsongkhapa (1357–1419) is a well-known Tibetan religious philosopher. In his iconic form, wearing a tall yellow hat, he is the center of the Gelugpa (Tib. dge lugs pa) sect that ruled Tibet until the Chinese takeover in 1951, and whose de facto leader is the Dalai Lama. Tsongkhapa has been the subject of poor, misleading scholarship — particularly in the 19th century when so-called “Orientalist” scholars (e.g., Monier-Williams, 1888: 268, 277) falsely imagined him as a “reformer” who founded, or rediscovered, the rational and ethical school of original Buddhism.

The historical Tsongkhapa flourished in the period immediately following the final redaction of the Buddhist canon in Tibetan translation (Tib. bKa' 'gyur, pronounced Kanjur). He presents a Middle Way (Sk. madhyamaka, Tib. dbu ma pa) philosophy, based on the works of the Indian philosopher Nāgārjuna (third-fourth century), and strongly influenced by the Indo-Tibetan Buddhist logico-epistemological tradition (Sk. pramāṇa, Tib. tshad ma) founded by the Indian epistemologists Dignāga and Dharmakīrti (fifth to seventh century). In it he strikes a balance between knowledge and praxis. He unerringly characterizes all statements about ultimate truths (Sk. paramārtha-satya) framed in positive terms as false, but develops a hermeneutics to retain the authority of correct moral statements on a covering (Sk. saṃvṛti) or conventional (Sk. vyavahāra) level. His most influential writing reconciles the philosophy of emptiness (Sk. śūnyatā) with the imperative of praxis embodied in a universal altruistic principle (Sk. bodhicitta). He gives pride of place to apparently antinomian tantric praxis without devaluing the centrality of ordinary moral life, and develops a distinctive analysis of dependent origination (Sk. pratītya-samutpāda).


1. Tsongkhapa's Life

1.1 Overview

Biographical information about Tsongkhapa comes from clues in his own writing, and from the hagiography written by his student Kedrup Pelzangpo (mKhas grub dpal bzang po) (1385–1438) called Stream of Faith (Dad pa'i 'jug ngog) (partial translation in Thurman 1982).[1]

Tsongkhapa's life falls roughly into an earlier and later period. The later period is defined by a series of publications, beginning in about 1400, which systematically present his mature philosophy. Tsongkhapa, influenced by the divisions used by the editors of the Kanjur, treats non-tantric and tantric sources separately. His philosophical views on tantra, and, to a certain extent his work on ethics fall naturally into separate categories. The later period of his life includes a period of institution building, possibly with an eye to the founding of a new school or sect.

1.2 Detailed account

The name Tsongkhapa derives from Tsong kha, an ancient name for a part of the A mdo region of Greater Tibet (Bod chen) now included in Qinghai Province of the People's Republic of China, and the Tibetan suffix pa that works as an agentive nominalizing particle. His given name is Losang (sometimes written Lozang) Drakpa (bLo bzang grags pa). He is also known by the honorific title Je Rinpoche (rJe rin po che) (“Precious Lord”). He was born, probably to semi-nomadic farmers, in a settlement now incorporated into the outskirts of the Chinese city of Xi ning. His birthplace is marked by the popular Kumbum (sKu 'bum) monastery,

In his teens (1372–73), Tsongkhapa travelled from Tsong kha to Central (dBus) Tibet (Bod) where he remained until his death in 1419. He arrived as a young man in Central Tibet at the end of a long flowering of intellectual activity called “the later diffusion [of Buddhism]” (Tib. spyi dar) that began with translator Rin chen bzang po (958–1055) and the scholar-saint Dīpaṃkāra-śrījñāna Atiśa (980–1054), and ended with the most important editor of the Kanjur, Butōn (Bu ston Rin chen grub, 1290–1364).

According to Kedrup, on his arrival in Central Tibet Tsongkhapa first studied Tibetan medicine, then a traditional Buddhist curriculum of abhidharma, tenet systems (Tib. grub mtha') focusing on the Middle Way and Mind Only (Sk. cittamātra also called yogācāra) philosophy, Buddhist ethics (Tib. sdom gsum), and epistemology (Sk. pramāṇa). His early studies were pursued mainly in institutions affiliated with the two dominant scholarly traditions (Tib. lugs) of the time: the Sangphu (gSang phu ne'u tog) tradition founded by Ngok (rNgog bLo ldan shes rab) (1059–1109), and the Sakya (Sa skya) epistemological tradition based primarily on the works of the Sa skya paṇḍi ta (1182–1251). He also studied and practiced tantric Buddhism.

In his early years he wrote a number of essays on topics in abhidharma (Apple 2008), a detailed investigation of the ālaya-vijñāna (Sk.) (“foundation, storehouse, basis-of all consciousness”) (Sparham 1993), and an important treatise, Golden Garland (Legs bshad gser phreng), on the Perfection of Wisdom (Sk. prajñā-pāramitā) literature based on the codification of its topics in the Ornament for the Chapters (Abhisamayālaṃkāra) (Sparham 2008–2010).

After completing his Golden Garland in 1388–89, Tsongkhapa spent a period of some ten years removed from the hub of intellectual activity. He engaged in meditation and ritual religious exercises in Southern Tibet (Lho kha) where, as evidenced in his short autobiographical writing from this transitional period (Thurman 1982), and corroborated by traditional sources (Kaschewsky 1971, Vostrikov 1970), he resorted to a communion or dialogue with Mañjuśrī––the iconographic representation of perfect knowledge in the Buddhist pantheon. Through the voice of Mañjuśrī he articulated a hierarchical system of philosophies culminating in what he characterized as a pristine, Middle Way, *Prāsaṅgika-madhyamaka (Tib. dBu ma thal 'gyur pa) that avoided over-reification (of the absolute) and over-negation (of the conventional).

Tsongkhapa framed his insights not as original contributions, but as a rediscovery of meanings already revealed by the Buddha. In all his works he characterizes his philosophy as identical to the Buddha's. Further, he says his philosophy is based on Nāgārjuna's and Nāgārjuna's follower Ārya-deva's (third-fourth century) explanation of what the Buddha said. His philosophy gets its name Prāsaṅgika (“those who reveal the unwelcome consequences [inherent in other's assertions]”) from the importance it gives to Buddhapalita's (late fifth century) explication of Nāgārjuna's work, and to Candrakīrti's (mid-sixth to mid-seventh century) defense of Buddhapalita's explanation, in the face of criticism by Bhavaviveka (sixth century).

Tsongkhapa presented his mature philosophy in a series of volumes during the later period of his life, beginning with the publication of his most famous work, the Great Exposition of the Stages of the Path (Lam rim chen mo) in 1402, at the age of 46. This was followed by Essence of Eloquence (Legs bshad snying po) and Ocean of Reasoning (Rigs pa'i rgya mtsho) (1407–1408), the Medium-Length Exposition of the Stages of the Path (Lam rim 'bring) in 1415, and, in the last years of his life, his Elucidation of the Intention (dGongs pa rab gsal).

Together, in this series of works written over a seventeen year period, he succeeded in setting the agenda for the following centuries, to a great extent, with later writers taking positions pro and con his arguments. As is so often the case, his stature pushed much of earlier Tibetan intellectual history into the shadows, until its rediscovery by the Eclectic Movement (Tib. Ris med) in Derge (sDe dge) in the late 18th century.

Tsongkhapa wrote his major works on tantra and ethics at the same time as his major philosophical works. Volumes 3–12 of his collected works in 18 or 19 volumes deal exclusively with topics based on tantric sources. In 1405 he completed his Great Exposition of Tantra (sNgags rim chen mo), a companion volume to his Great Exposition, where, in harmony with his philosophy, he argued that tantra is defined neither by special insight (Sk. vipaśyana) or Mahāyāna altruism (Sk. bodhicitta), but solely by deity yoga (Tib. lha'i rnal 'byor) (Hopkins 1980).

In 1402, Tsongkhapa, with his teacher Rendawa (Red mda' ba gzhon nu blo gros, 1349–1412) and others, at the temple of Namstedeng (rNam rtsed ldeng/lding) convened a gathering of monks with the intention of reinvigorating the Buddhist order. From this came Tsongkhapa's short, but influential works on basic Buddhist morality (Sk. prātimokṣa) that in turn laid the foundation for the importance some Gelukpa monasteries would place on a stricter adherence to the monastic code. In 1403 his influential works on ethical codes for bodhisattvas (Byang chub gzhung lam) (Tatz 1987) and for tantric practitioners (rTsa ltung rnam bshad) (Sparham 2005) appeared. His separate explanations of the three ethical codes (Tib. sdom gsum) are distinguished by the centrality they give to basic morality, the importance the bodhisattva's code retains in tantra, and, in the antinomian tantras, the presence of a separate, prātimokṣa-like ordination ritual and a common code of ethical conduct.

By 1409, at the age of 52, his place in Tibetan society was sufficiently established that he could garner the support and sponsorship necessary for a successful rejuvenation of the central temple in Lhasa, for establishing a new-year prayer festival (smon lam chen mo), and for completion of a large new monastery, Ganden (dGa' ldan), where he lived for much of his subsequent life until his death there in 1419. He inspired two of his students Tashi Palden (bKra shis dpal ldan) (1379–1449) and Shakya Yeshey (Ye shes) (1354–1435) to found Drepung ('Bras spungs) monastery in 1416, and Sera Monastery in 1419, respectively. These, with Ganden, would later become the three largest and most powerful Gelukpa monasteries, and indeed, the biggest monasteries in the world. In 1407 and 1413 the Ming dynasty Yongle Emperor recognized Tsongkhapa's growing fame and importance by inviting him to the Chinese court, as was the custom.

2. Early Period

2.1 Explanation of the Difficult Points (Kun gzhi dka' 'grel)

Tsongkhapa's most important works from his early period are his Explanation of the Difficult Points (Kun gzhi dka' 'grel) and Golden Garland (Legs bshad gser phreng).

In the former he gives a detailed explanation of the ālaya-vijñāna (“foundation consciousness”)––according to Tsongkhapa the distinctive eighth consciousness in the eight-consciousness system of Asaṅga's (fourth century) Indian Yogācāra Buddhism.

Tsongkhapa opens his work with a brief discussion of the relationship between the views of Nāgārjuna and Asaṅga. Tsongkhapa then discovers in the different usages of the term ālaya-vijñāna and its near synonyms a negative connotation conveying the cause and effect nature of repeated suffering existences (Sk. saṃsāra). He surveys the relevant literature, limiting his discussion of gotra (“lineage,” in the sense of the innate ability a person has to grow up into a fully enlightened being) to the presentation given in Asaṅga's Bodhisattva Levels (Bodhisattva-bhūmi). There the “residual impression left by listening [to the correct exposition of the truth]” (Sk. śruta-vāsanā) is the “seed” (Sk. bīja) that matures into enlightenment. It is little more than the innate clarity of mind when it is freed from limitation by habituation to a correct vision of reality.

Tsongkhapa limits the sources for his explanation to non-tantric works, almost all by persons he will later describe as Indian Yogācāra writers, demonstrating thereby the influence the categories used in the recently redacted Kanjur and Tenjur (Tib. bsTan 'gyur, the name for the commentaries in Tibetan translation included in the canon) had on his thinking.

When Tsongkhapa arrived in Central Tibet, the pressing philosophical issue of the day was Dolpopa's (Dol po pa Shes rab rgyal mtshan) (1292–1361) Great Middle Way (Tib. dBu ma chen po, Sk. *Mahā-madhayamaka) philosophy. It propounded a hermeneutics based on the principle that a Buddha will always tell you clearly what he means. Based on a wide array of sources, and without making a clear distinction between tantric and non-tantric works, its central tenet is that an absolute, pure, transcendental mind endowed with all good qualities exists radically other than the ordinary world of appearance. It is the archetypical Tibetan Buddhist gzhan stong (pronounced shentong, “emptiness of other”) philosophy.

Dolpopa, stressing the hermeneutic stated above, says Nāgārjuna and Asaṅga, writing during the golden age, have the same philosophy, the Great Middle Way clearly articulated by the Buddha. Dolpopa distinguishes a pure, transcendental knowledge (Tib. kun gzhi ye shes) that is quite other than the defiled foundation consciousness (Tib. kun gzhi rnam shes), and equates the former with his single absolute, endowed with all the qualities of a Buddha.

Later, in his mature period, as explained below, Tsongkhapa will be explicit. He will state categorically that Asaṅga's Yogācāra Buddhism is quite separate from, and in profundity inferior to, Nāgārjuna's Middle Way school, removing all references to a Great Middle Way school. He will say the ālaya-vijñāna, devoid of subject-object bifurcation, provides the essential mind-stuff for defilement (=saṃsāra) and carries seeds for purification (=nirvāṇa) in a Yogācāra system that is fundamentally wrong, and at odds with the way things actually are. He will give the ālaya-vijñāna only a heuristic value, and say a correct view (the *Prāsaṅgika-madhyamaka view) of the workings of psycho-physical reality (the Buddhist skandhas) totally invalidates it. As Jeffrey Hopkins (2002, 2006b) has shown conclusively, such statements constitute an explicit rejection of Dolpopa's view, a view Tsongkhapa is still formulating in early works like the Explanation of the Difficult Points.

In his Explanation of the Difficult Points, Tsongkhapa is certain he does not accept the view of Dolpopa, but he is still unsure exactly what he will put in its place. He ignores Dolpopa's pure, transcendental knowledge called ālaya, mentioning it obliquely, only in passing, during a final brief survey of views based on Chinese sources; he leaves unanswered the question of the final ontological status of the eighth consciousness; and he allows the views of Asaṅga set forth in the Bodhisattva-bhūmi to retain an authority he will later explicitly deny.

2.2 Golden Garland (Legs bshad gser phreng)

Tsongkhapa's Golden Garland is his most important early work. It takes the form of a long explanation of the Perfection of Wisdom (Prajñā-pāramitā) sūtras, given pride of place in the Kanjur as the foremost words of the Buddha, after the Vinaya section (the codifications of ethical conduct). It is a word-by-word commentary on the topics in the Ornament for the Chapters (Abhisamayālaṃkāra). Tsongkhapa bases his explanation on two sub-commentaries by Ārya Vimuktiṣeṇa (sixth century?) and Hari Bhadra (end of the eighth century). It propounds a philosophy that later Gelukpas, following the taxonomy developed in the mature works of Tsongkhapa himself, call Yogācāra-svātantrika-madhyamaka, in essence a Middle Way that incorporates many of the categories of Yogācāra Buddhism, yet does not have the authority of Candrakīrti's Prāsaṅgika interpretation.

A great deal has been written on the difference between Prāsaṅgika and Svātantrika (Dreyfus and McClintock 2003). Historically, the Gelukpa's Yogācāra-svātantrika-madhyamaka is another name for the mainstream philosophical school that developed in Tibet, based primarily on the teaching of Śāntarakṣita and his student Kamalaśīla (both fl. end of the eight century), the two most important Indian paṇḍitas in the dissemination of Buddhist ideas to Tibet. Later Gelukpa scholastics, basing themselves on the mature works of Tsongkhapa, are unequivocal that Yogācāra-svātantrika-madhyamaka, like the Yogācāra philosophy of Asaṅga, is wrong, and has only heuristic value. At the same time, they tacitly acknowledge its centrality by taking this “wrong” philosophy as the foundation of their studies.

In the Golden Garland, Tsongkhapa, following Śāntarakṣita's school as it developed in Tibet, asserts that all bases (Sk. vastu) (the psycho-physical factors locating the person as they begin their philosophical career), all mental states along the course of the path (Sk. mārga), and the final result, are illusory, because they lack any essential nature. But it is not yet clear how the basis relates to the final outcome (the result). As explained below, Tsongkhapa will solve the problem in his mature works by a clear, radical, nihilistic leap denying any essential nature whatsoever, anywhere, to anything, thereby implicitly and explicitly devaluing (in absolutist terms) the ontological status of the final, pure, unified state, relegating it to just one more conventional, dependently-originated thing.

In the Golden Garland, Tsongkhapa has not yet fully developed his mature, systematic philosophy. He is still content with discrediting Dolpopa and surveying different points of view. He uses Yogācāra terminology to present his own opinion, and uses a language to describe enlightened (and enlightening) knowledge that retains for it a separateness (through its freedom from all mental construction) from all other mental states. The primary object of philosophical inquiry in the Golden Garland is the unity of the perceiving subject in enlightenment, a topic that reflects the language and concerns of the Yogācāra-svātantrika-madhyamaka school.

The Golden Garland is driven in no small measure by an agenda dedicated to discrediting Dolpopa's Perfection of Wisdom commentaries (Kapstein 1992/3). This is evident from a comparison of Dolpopa and Tsongkhapa's sources and views. Dolpopa excoriates Ārya Vimuktiṣeṇa and Hari Bhadra and says they belong to the degenerate age, propounding doctrines harmful to golden age Buddhism. The Golden Garland, on the other hand, is based on commentaries by Ārya Vimuktiṣeṇa and Hari Bhadra privileged by the Sangphu tradition. Dolpopa says the two Defenses of the Perfection of Wisdom Sūtras (Tib. Gnod 'jom) by “the foremost, Great Middle Way master Vasubandhu,” stand as the primary scriptural authority for the Great Middle Way doctrine, superior even to the partial truths revealed by Nāgārjuna. The Golden Garland disputes that Vasubandhu is the author of the two Defenses, and says, regardless of their author, they are simply restatements of Nāgārjuna's Middle Way. Finally, Dolpopa propounds a doctrine that holds that the basis, path, and result are eternally the same, and all else is thoroughly imaginary, but the Golden Garland is certain that such a view is wrong, and directly cites a passage from Dolpopa's work, though without naming its author, saying, “since no other great path-breaker, [i.e., founder of an original philosophy] besides him has ever asserted [what Dolpopa says], learned persons are right to cast out [what he says] like a gob of spit” (Sparham 2008, p. 425).

3. Mature Period

Tsongkhapa formulated clearly the philosophy for which he is best known some ten years after finishing the Golden Garland. He characterized the vision that led him to his philosophy as a pristine Middle Way *Prāsaṅgika-madhyamaka. Reflecting back on his insight, he would write in his In Praise of Dependent Origination (brTen 'brel bstod pa trans. by Tupten Jinpa,

“Nonetheless, before the stream of this life
Flowing towards death has come to cease
That I have found slight faith in you—
Even this I think is fortunate.
Among teachers, the teacher of dependent origination,
Amongst wisdoms, the knowledge of dependent origination—
You, who're most excellent like the kings in the worlds,
Know this perfectly well, not others.”

Tsongkhapa first sets forth this mature philosophy linking dependent origination and emptiness in a special section at the end of his Great Exposition. There, in the context of an investigation into the end-product of an authentic, intellectual investigation into the truly real (Sk. tattva, Tib. de kho na), and into the way things finally are at their deepest level (Sk. tathatā, Tib. de bzhin nyid),[2] he says you have to identify the object of negation (Tib. dgag bya), i.e., the last false projection to appear as reality, by avoiding two errors: going too far (Tib. khyab che ba) and not going far enough (Tib. khyab chung ba).

That his project does not presuppose a privileged, soul-like, state of consciousness that surveys and categorizes phenomena is evident from his assertion that these two errors originate in a latent psychological tendency in philosophers: first, to hold on to vestiges of truth (reality) where there is in fact an absence of it, and second, to fall back on some version of truth (reality) in ordinary appearance after failing to avoid nihilism in a futile quest for meaning.

This section of Tsongkhapa's work is based on the opening verse of Nāgārjuna's Root Verses on the Middle Way (Mūla-madhyamaka-kārikā). Tsongkhapa's Ocean of Reasoning (Garfield and Samten 2006a) is a detailed exegesis of this work. In it, Nāgārjuna says nothing is produced because it is not produced from itself, other, both or neither. In Tsongkhapa's Great Exposition, the subject of Nāgārjuna's syllogism is primarily the embodied person, reflecting the trend that runs throughout Buddhist philosophical literature, in general, to stress the application of philosophical analysis to praxis. Furthermore, for Tsongkhapa, Nāgārjuna's statement is about a first moment in the continuum of the investigating person. By implication, reflecting the continuing influence of Śāntarakṣita, it is the person engaged in the philosophical investigation in the immediate moment. It is axiomatic for Buddhist philosophers that there is no independent subject (soul) other than the five heaps (skandhas), so the subject of the syllogism becomes the complex or continuum of sense-faculties in the present instant. Such a subject makes excellence sense of Tsongkhapa's otherwise confusing juxtaposition of Nāgārjuna's analysis with Dharmakīrti's epistemology, in which it is axiomatic that direct sense perception is an authoritative means of knowledge (Sk. pramāṇa).

Nāgārjuna's statement that such a person was never produced seems paradoxical, to say the least, because it appears to undercut the reality of the very intellectual act in which the thinker is self-evidently engaged. Tsongkhapa makes it abundantly clear that in his view not only is the intellectual act itself utterly devoid of any essential reality, even the sense-faculties (the complex eye, ear and so on) also lack any essential reality, never mind the sense data they convey to the knowing individual.

Tsongkhapa's choice of the opening line's of Nāgārjuna's work as a point of departure for his philosophy stems from his belief that he has gained a true insight into dependent origination (pratītya-samutpāda). This insight, he believes, resolves the paradox between his apparent nihilism and his insistence on the weight of authoritative statements and cognitions. Thus he says in his Great Exposition,

“Therefore, the intelligent should develop an unshakeable certainty that the very meaning of emptiness is dependent-arising… Specifically, this is the subtle point that the noble Nāgārjuna and his spiritual son Āryadeva had in mind and upon which the master Buddhapālita and the glorious Candrakīrti gave fully comprehensive commentary. This is how dependent-arising bestows certain knowledge of the absence of intrinsic existence; this is how it dawns on you that it is things which are devoid of intrinsic existence that are causes and effects” (Lamrim Chenmo Translation Committee Vol. 3, 139).

Tsongkhapa set out the ramifications of his view in “eight points that are difficult to understand” (Tib. dka' gnas brgyad) first enumerated in notes (rjes byang) to one of his lectures by his contemporary and disciple, Darma rin chen (also called rGyal tshab rje “the regent”). Tillemans (1998) has nicely rendered the opening of the text as follows,

“Concerning the [ontological] bases, there are the following [three points]: (1) the conventional nonacceptance of particulars and of (2) the storehouse consciousness, and (3) the acceptance of external objects. Concerning the path, there are the following [four points]: (4) the nonacceptance of autonomous reasonings as being means for understanding reality and (5) the nonacceptance of self-awareness; (6) the way in which the two obscurations exist; (7) how it is accepted that the Buddha's disciples and those who become awakened without a Buddha's help realize that things are without any own-nature. Concerning the result, there is: (8) the way in which the buddhas know [conventional] things in their full extent. Thus, there are four accepted theses and four unaccepted theses.”

They have been discussed by a number of writers (Ruegg 2002, Cabezon 1992, 397).

I have surveyed Tsongkhapa's early work on the ālaya-vijñāna above. For Tsongkhapa, until the correct view is understood, it is necessary to assert the ālaya-vijñāna in order to save cause and effect, and avoid falling into nihilism. When the correct view is obtained, the ālaya-vijñāna stands invalidated (Tillemans's second point). For Tsongkhapa, it is only possible to understand cause and effect (in particular, as experienced in the immediate moment by an embodied person), by correctly understanding that dependent origination precludes any essential existence whatsoever.

Tsongkhapa asserts that a specific mark (Sk. sva-lakṣaṇa), for instance a mark that makes blue blue, instead of red or any other color, has not even a nominal existence. This is the first of Tillemans's eight difficult points.

In his monograph Essence of Eloquence, Tsongkhapa employs a hermeneutics that treats language and knowledge as equally semiotic in nature. This is consistent with Tsongkhapa's view that any intellectual act is itself utterly devoid of any essential reality, yet functions on a conventional level through the natural workings of dependent origination (Sk. dharmatā). This view allows him to conclude that Dignāga and Dharmakīrti's Logico-epistemological school is equivalent to Asaṅga's Yogācāra school insofar as the former school asserts a specific mark, seen by direct sense perception, that is necessary in order to retain the reality of the conventional world. Tsongkhapa takes the strong position that no datum that appears to (or is there but unknown to) thought or sense perception, has any essential reality. All are, equally, simply labeled by thought construction (Tib. rtog pas btags tsam). Only convention makes the actual sense-faculties, for example, real, and success or failure experienced in a dream, for example, false. This dependent origination (between a label and what is labeled) precludes the essential existence implicit in the Epistemologist's sva-lakṣaṇa.

Tsongkhapa's strong rejection of Yogācāra idealism leads him to assert the existence of external objects (the third point). His (discredited) Yogācāra school, based on either the works of Asaṅga or the Epistemologists, explains the absence of subject-object bifurcation as non-dual with thought or mind (Sk. citta). Realizing this in a non-conceptual, meditational state constitutes a liberating vision. Ultimately, therefore, external objects are projections of a deluded mind. Tsongkhapa rejects this, though he suggests only those who have understood the emptiness of inherent existence through reflecting on the natural workings of dependent origination can set it aside. As he says in his Ocean of Reasoning,

“The meaning of the statement that the conventional designation of subject and objects stops is that the designation of these two stops from the perspective of meditative equipoise, but it does not mean that the insight in meditative equipoise and the ultimate truth are rejected as subject and object. This is because their being subject and object is not posited from the perspective of analytic insight, but from the perspective of conventional understanding” (Garfield and Samten 2006a, p. 26).

From the perspective of ordinary convention there are external objects, so it is sufficient, on that level, to assert that they are there.

Tsongkhapa does not accept svātantra (“autonomous”) reasoning (the fourth point). He asserts that it is enough, when proving that any given subject is empty of intrinsic existence, to lead the interlocutor, through reasoning, to the unwelcome consequences (prasaṅga) in their own untenable position; it is not necessary to demonstrate the thesis based on reasoning that presupposes any sort of intrinsic (=autonomous) existence. This gives Tsongkhapa's philosophy its name *Prāsaṅgika-madhyamaka, i.e., a philosophy of a middle way (between nihilism and eternalism) arrived at through demonstrating the unwelcome consequences (in any given position that presupposes intrinsic existence).

In the context of this assertion, Tsongkhapa offers a distinctive explanation of the well-known Nayāyika objection to Nāgārjuna's philosophy, namely, if the statements he uses to prove his thesis are themselves without any final intrinsic reality, they will be ineffective as proofs. Tsongkhapa says *Prāsaṅgika-madhyamakas do not simply find faults in all positions and reject all positions as their own. They only deny any thesis that presupposes an intrinsic existence. They do hold a specific thesis, to wit, that all phenomena lack an intrinsic existence. They use reasoning and logic that lacks any essential reality to establish this thesis. Such reasoning derives its efficacity on a conventional level through the natural workings of dependent origination. This is one of the most contentious assertions of Tsongkhapa.

Tsongkhapa's rejection of any form of self-referential consciousness (Sk. sva-saṃvitti, sva-saṃvedana) (the fifth point) is in essence a rejection of Śāntarakṣita's position that such self-referential or reflexive awareness is necessary to explain the self-evidential nature of consciousness, and to explain the privileged access the conscious person has to their own consciousness as immediate and veridical (Garfield 2006b).[3] At issue is the status of the knowing subject engaged in the intellectual pursuit of the truly real. Tsongkhapa holds that such a knowing subject has no essential reality at all.

Such a position requires of Tsongkhapa an explanation of memory. His solution is to deny that when you remember seeing object X you also remember the conscious act of seeing it. (Were you to do so, there would have to be an aspect of the earlier consciousness of the object that was equally conscious of itself, i.e., self-referential.) Instead, Tsongkhapa argues, memory is simply the earlier consciousness of object X, now designated “past.” When designated past, inexorably (or inferentially, as it were) the presence of a consciousness of the past object X is required to make sense of the present reality.

Tsongkhapa characterizes basic ignorance (Sk. avidyā), the root cause of suffering in Buddhist philosophy, not as a latent tendency, but as an active defiling agency (Sk. kleśāvaraṇa) that projects a reality onto objects that is in fact absent from them. This ignorance affects even sense perception and explains the veridical aspect that is, in fact, just error. The residual impressions left by distortion (literally “perfumings” Sk. vāsanā) explain the mere appearance of things as real. Beyond that, he asserts that habituation to this distortion prevents conventional and ultimate reality from appearing united in an appearing object. This explanation of the psychology of error differs markedly from earlier Tibetan explanations and constitutes the sixth difficult point.

In Tsongkhapa's mature philosophy the Mahāyāna altruistic principle (bodhicitta) is the sole criterion for distinguishing authentic Mahāyāna views and practices from non-Mahāyāna ones. By privileging the principle in this way he is able to assert that any authentic realization of truth is a realization of the way things are, namely, a realization of no sva-bhāva (Sk.) (“own-being, own-nature, intrinsic identity”). For Tsongkhapa, therefore, Hīnayānists (by which he intends followers of the basic Buddhist doctrine of the Four Noble Truths set forth in the earliest scriptures), necessarily have the same authentic knowledge of reality. Were they not to have such knowledge, he argues, they could not have reached the goals they reached (the seventh point).

Finally, Tsongkhapa has a robust explanation of the difference between true and false on the covering or conventional level. He denies any difference between a false object (a dream lottery ticket, for example) and a real one; as appearances, he asserts, both are equally false, only convention decides which is true. All phenomena equally lack truth. In Tsongkhapa's mature philosophy, therefore, all appearance is false––to appear is to appear as being truly what the appearance is of, and the principle of dependent origination precludes such truth from according with the way things actually are.

Tsongkhapa holds that sentences and their content, on the one hand, and minds and what appears to them on the other, function in the same way. Saying (1) of a set of “true” and “false” statements that they are all equally untrue, and (2) saying of unmediated sense-based perception or mistaken ideas that they are equally untrue is to say the same thing. The truth in both is decided by convention, not by something inhering in the true statement (or its content), or the valid perception (or its object). For Tsongkhapa, therefore, since all appearance is false, the Buddha knows, but without any appearance of truth (the eighth difficult point).

4. Hermeneutics

A distinctive feature of Tsongkhapa's mature philosophy is the centrality he accords hermeneutics, and the particular stratification of philosophical systems it occasions. His focus on hermeneutics stems in no small measure from his acceptance of the Kanjur as a true record of authentic statements of the Buddha, and also from his wish to discredit Dolpopa's views. According to Tsongkhapa, and worked out in detail in his Essence of Eloquence, the given record of the Buddha's diverse statements seems to contain contradictions, so a reader must decide on criteria for interpreting them. No statement of the Buddha can serve as a primary hermeneutic principle, so that principle necessarily becomes human reason (Sk. yukti, Tib. rigs pa).

When human reason is brought to bear on the diverse statements of the Buddha, it concludes that all statements that an essential or intrinsic identity exists, or any statements that presupposes that, cannot be taken literally, at face value. This is because human reason, when it analyzes the ultimate truth of any object or statement, finds it empty of anything intrinsic to it that would make it true. For Tsongkhapa, the line of reasoning that leads most clearly to this conclusion is dependent origination.

Statements that require interpretation Tsongkhapa groups into those of different Buddhist philosophical schools: in ascending order, Listener (Sk. Śrāvaka) schools based on older Buddhist sources (the Vaibhāṣika and Sautrāntika), Yogācāra schools following Asaṅga and Dignāga/Dharmakīrti, and non-Prāsaṅgika Madhyamaka schools following Bhavaviveka and Śāntarakṣita. The *Prāsaṅgika-madhyamaka school of Candrakīrti alone captures the final intention of the Buddha. Tsongkhapa was certainly not the first doxographer, but his clear and definitive categories had immense influence on later writers, so much so they have anachronistically been read back into works that were written before his time.

Tsongkhapa's particular hermeneutics, the primary means he employs to lead readers to his philosophical insight, allows him to characterize particular, authentic, Buddhist philosophies as wrong (because they are wrong from a Prāsaṅgika perspective), yet right from the perspective of those particular systems. They are right because the philosophies have particular roles to play in a larger, grander scheme. This scheme is part of the larger philosophy of a perfect person whose views are in perfect accord (Sk. tathāgata) with the way things are, i.e., dependent origination, and whose statements are motivated solely by the benefit they have to those who hear them.

In this way, Tsongkhapa's hermeneutics lead to, or incorporate, a second principle, namely, bodhicitta (Sk.). The word bodhicitta has at least six different, but interrelated meanings in different contexts (Wangchuk 2007). In his philosophical works Tsongkhapa uses it to mean a universal, altruistic principle (not unlike the logos) that explains, primarily, the genesis of the Buddha's diverse statements, i.e., explains why a person with perfect intellect and powers of expression would make statements that seem to contain contradictions.

This principle plays a central role in Tsongkhapa's assertion that all authentic attainments, without distinction, are based on an authentic insight into emptiness (the seventh of the eight difficult points listed above), and it leads him to assert that the “origin” of the Mahāyāna is located in bodhicitta, and bodhicitta alone

5. Ethics

Tsongkhapa is part of a long, shared, Indo-Tibetan Buddhist tradition that conceives of ethical conduct not in absolute terms, but in the context of different individuals in different situations. There is an unspoken presupposition that ethical statements are grounded in reality, in the sense that suffering (Sk. duḥkha) comes from actions (Sk. karma) that are not in accord with the way things actually are (Tib. dngos po'i gnas lugs). The person is ultimately not present as an ethical subject, but is so, on a conventional or covering level, through the natural working of dependent origination.

Tsongkhapa groups such individuals into three separate categories (those who privilege basic Buddhist codes, bodhisattvas, and tāntrikas). Each is governed by an ethical code (Tib. sdom gsum), each superior code subsuming the points of the lesser. Beyond these three, his Great Exposition suggests ordinary ethical conduct is codified as well, in the main, in the ten ethical points (Sk. daśa-kuśala-patha) basic to any human life that rises above the mere animal.

The first of the three specifically Buddhist codes, the basic code, primarily governs the behavior of monks and nuns. Since for Tsongkhapa each higher code incorporates all the rules in the lower code, he conceives of the seven (or even twelve) sub-codes making up the basic code as, in descending order, containing fewer and fewer of the rules that constitute the full code. Each of the sub-codes is designed for particular people in particular human situations. Tsongkhapa does not expect a butcher to be governed by the rule of not killing, for example, and he does not expect a lawyer to be governed by the rule of not lying. He avoids gross devaluation of the basic code by privileging spiritual elites. In this, he takes a pragmatic approach to ethics in line with his non-absolutist stance. For Tsongkhapa, it is axiomatic that human life is not ipso facto privileged above any other form of life, but his detailed explanation gives greater “weight” to the karmic retribution that comes from killing humans, and amongst humans, noble persons, for example, than less fortunate forms of life.

Tsongkhapa's explanation of the bodhisattva moral code presented in the Bodhisattva-bhūmi (Tatz 1987) follows naturally from the importance he gives to the altruistic principle (bodhicitta) in his other writing. He reconciles rules in the bodhisattva code that enjoin behavior contradicting the basic code by positing an elite that, through a noblesse oblige of the spiritually advanced, are required to do things which would be unethical in an ordinary person. Their not doing so constitutes an ethical lapse. For example, the basic code prohibits actions that influence what food a donor puts in the begging bowl (with a few exceptions for human flesh and so on), and prohibits eating after noon. The bodhisattva code contradicts the basic code insofar as it prohibits eating meat, even though, by so doing, the donor does not get the opportunity to make charity. Tsongkhapa argues that if a monk at the bodhisattva stage of development eats meat it clashes with the dictates of the altruistic principle (bodhicitta).

Tsongkhapa accepts that the diverse body of literature, including the historically latest Buddhist tantras (some of which are distinctly antinomian in character), are the work of a fully awakened being (Sk. buddha). The last of the three codes systematizes the conduct espoused in these tantras. Tsongkhapa's presentation is distinctive for finding a code complete with a full ordination ceremony. The practical result of his presentation is to revalue the basic code for monks, and devalue the ritual of tantric consecration as it pertains to ethical conduct. It stresses ethical conduct even in the context of works that appear, in line with the nihilistic drift of Buddhist philosophy, to count ethical codes as a block to the highest spiritual and philosophical attainment.

For Tsongkhapa the tantric code is only for the very highest spiritual elite, mainly monks and nuns. Tsongkhapa divides tantras into two sections, and says the lower section is governed exclusively by the bodhisattva code, supplemented by specific ritual injunctions (Sk. vrata). He gives two interpretations of the rules for the higher tantras, reserving the truly antinomian behavior for a theoretical elite whose altruism is so strong, and whose understanding and status is so ennobled, that they engage in what ordinarily would be condemned as gross immorality. According to this code, it is an ethical lapse not to eat meat, perhaps even human flesh, the logic being that in certain specific and unusual circumstances, in a person at this stage of development, such behavior would constitute a skillful means to benefit others.

6. Tantra

Tsongkhapa does not have a different tantric philosophy. His Prāsaṅgika Middle Way is the philosophical position he articulates in his works on tantra. He does however, unlike in his non-tantric works, accept that those propounding Idealistic philosophies (Yogācāra, Svātantrika Middle Way) can have success in their practice. In this he reveals again the importance of the central Tibetan philosophical tradition going back to Śāntarakṣita.

Tsongkhapa conceives of tantra as a subset of the Mahāyāna, and to that extent all authentic Buddhist tantric activities are, necessarily, authentically altruistic. What differentiates tantric activity from other ordinary Mahāyāna activities is deity yoga (Tib. lha'i rnal 'byor), i.e., whether or not, from a first person perspective, the person is acting as a perfect, “divine” subject when engaging in (primarily ritual) behavior.

Tsongkhapa wrote works on the Vajrabhairava, Cakrasaṃvara, and Kālacakra tantras, but is best known for his exposition of the Guhyasamāja tantra based on Indian commentaries associated with the names of Nāgārjuna and Āryadeva, particularly his short but influential Commentary on the Jñāna-vajra-samuccaya (Ye shes rdo rje kun las ‘dus pa'i ṭī kā) (1410), and magisterial Clear Exposition of the Five Stages of Guhyasamāja (gSang ‘dus rim lnga gsal sgron) (1411). He accords great importance to esoteric yoga. In this respect, his work is firmly located in the mainstream Tibetan tradition, influenced in particular by the translator Mar pa (Mar pa Chos kyi blo gros) (1012–1097), who spread the Six Teachings of Nāropa (Nā ro chos drug), a later Indian synthesis of diverse tantric practices, in Tibet. Based on this Tsongkhapa gives detailed explanations of the nāḍī (channels for the energy or feelings that run through the tantric practitioner's body), cakra (circles of channels in the heart, throat, and other central points up the center of the body from the bottom of the spine, or tip of the sex organ, to the top of the head) and caṇḍalī (an intense pleasure experienced as heat that spreads through the channels and fills the body). Tsongkhapa is praised, in particular, for his explanation of theory and praxis associated with the illusory body (Sk. māyā-kāya, Tib. sgyu lus) and clear light (Sk. prabhāsvara, Tib. 'od gsal), a skillful adaptation of his understanding of the two truths to yogic praxis. This is summed up nicely in the statement, “The Pañcakramasaṃgrahaprakāśa (Illumination of the Summary of the Five Steps), a short treatise attributed to Nāropa (956–1040), combining the Six Teachings with the ‘Five Steps’ (pañcakrama) of the Ārya tradition provided Tsong kha pa with the basic ideas of his Tantric system” (Tillemans 1998).

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Other Internet Resources

  • Tibetan Buddhist Resource Center. A repository of digitally preserved works in Tibetan, including a number or editions of Tsongkhapa's collected works.
  • Tibetan and Himalayan Library, University of Virginia. A hub resource for Tibetan studies in universities worldwide.
  • Asian Classics Input Project. The ACE tool allows readers to browse and search a number of Tsongkhapa's texts.
  • The Tibet Album, Collections of photographs of Tibet (British photography in Central Tibet 1920-1950). Excellent record of pre-1959 dGe lugs monasteries and other institutions influenced by Tsongkhapa..
  • UMA Institute for Tibetan Studies. UMA = Union of the Modern and the Ancient Institute for Tibetan Studies. Contains audio-files of explanations of works of Tsongkhapa by traditional Tibetan teachers, translated by Jeffrey Hopkins.
  • The Berzin Archives. The Buddhist Archives of Dr. Alexander Berzin. A non-academic, but sometimes informative site for dGe lugs pa explanations of Tsongkhapa's ideas maintained by Alexander Berzin

Related Entries

Gelukpa [dge lugs pa] | Nāgārjuna | Śāntarakṣita | Tibetan epistemology and philosophy of language | Tibetan hermeneutics | two truths in Tibet, theory of

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