First published Tue May 3, 2016

[Editor's Note: The following new entry by Seth Lazar replaces the former entry on this topic by the previous author.]

Some reject the very idea of the “morality of war”.[1] Of those, some deny that morality applies at all once the guns strike up; for others, no plausible moral theory could license the exceptional horrors of war. The first group are sometimes called realists. The second group are pacifists. The task of just war theory is to seek a middle path between them: to justify at least some wars, but also to limit them (Ramsey 1961). Although realism undoubtedly has its adherents, few philosophers find it compelling.[2] The real challenge to just war theory comes from pacifism. And we should remember, from the outset, that this challenge is real. The justified war might well be a chimera.

However, this entry explores the middle path between realism and pacifism. It begins by outlining the central substantive divide in contemporary just war theory, before introducing the methodological schisms underpinning that debate. It then discusses the moral evaluation of wars as a whole, and of individual acts within war (traditionally, though somewhat misleadingly, called jus ad bellum and jus in bello respectively).

1. Traditionalists and Revisionists

Contemporary just war theory is dominated by two camps: traditionalist and revisionist.[3] The traditionalists might as readily be called legalists. Their views on the morality of war are substantially led by international law, especially the law of armed conflict. They aim to provide those laws with morally defensible foundations. States (and only states) are permitted to go to war only for national defence, defence of other states, or to intervene to avert “crimes that shock the moral conscience of mankind” (Walzer 2006: 107). Civilians may not be targeted in war, but all combatants, whatever they are fighting for, are morally permitted to target one another, even when doing so foreseeably harms some civilians (so long as it does not do so excessively).[4]

Revisionists question the moral standing of states and the permissibility of national defence, argue for expanded permissions for humanitarian intervention, problematise civilian immunity, and contend that combatants fighting for wrongful aims cannot do anything right, besides lay down their weapons.

Most revisionists are moral revisionists only: they deny that the contemporary law of armed conflict is intrinsically morally justified, but believe, mostly for pragmatic reasons, that it need not be substantially changed. Some, however, are both morally and legally revisionist. And even moral revisionists’ disagreement with the traditionalists is hardly ersatz: most believe that, faced with a clash between what is morally and what is legally permitted or prohibited, individuals should follow their conscience rather than the law.[5]

The traditionalist view received its most prominent exposition the same year as it was decisively codified in international law, in the first additional protocol to the Geneva Conventions. Michael Walzer’s Just and Unjust Wars, first published in 1977, has been extraordinarily influential among philosophers, political scientists, international lawyers, and military practitioners. Among its key contributions were its defence of central traditionalist positions on national defence, humanitarian intervention, discrimination, and combatant equality.

Early revisionists challenged Walzer’s views on national defence (Luban 1980a) and humanitarian intervention (Luban 1980b). Revisionist criticism of combatant equality and discrimination followed (Holmes 1989; McMahan 1994; Norman 1995). Since then there has been an explosion of revisionist rebuttals of Walzer (for example Rodin 2002; McMahan 2004b; McPherson 2004; Arneson 2006; Fabre 2009; McMahan 2009; Fabre 2012).

Concurrently, many philosophers welcomed Walzer’s conclusions, but rejected his arguments. They have accordingly sought firmer foundations for broadly traditionalist positions on national defence (Benbaji 2014; Moore 2014), humanitarian intervention (Coady 2002), discrimination (Rodin 2008b; Dill and Shue 2012; Lazar 2015c), and especially combatant equality (Zohar 1993; Kutz 2005; Benbaji 2008; Shue 2008; Steinhoff 2008; Emerton and Handfield 2009; Benbaji 2011).

We will delve deeper into these debates in what follows. First, though, some methodological groundwork. Traditionalists and revisionists alike often rely on methodological or second-order premises, to the extent that one might think that the first-order questions are really just proxy battles through which they work out their deeper disagreements (Lazar and Valentini forthcoming).

2. How Should We Think about the Morality of War?

2.1 Historical vs Contemporary Just War Theory

For the sake of concision this entry discusses only contemporary analytical philosophers working on war. Readers are directed to the excellent work of philosophers and intellectual historians such as Greg Reichberg, Pablo Kalmanovitz, Daniel Schwartz, and Rory Cox to gain further insights about historical just war theory (see, in particular, Cox 2016; Kalmanovitz 2016; Reichberg 2016; Schwartz 2016).

2.2 Institutions and Actions

Within contemporary analytical philosophy, there are two different ways in which moral and political philosophers think about war (Lazar and Valentini forthcoming). On the first, institutionalist, approach, philosophers’ primary goal is to establish what the institutions regulating war should be. In particular, we should prescribe morally justified laws of war. We then tell individuals and groups that they ought to follow those laws. On the second approach, we should focus first on the moral reasons that apply directly to individual and group actions, without the mediating factor of institutions. We tell individuals and groups to act as their moral reasons dictate. Since this approach focuses not on the institutions that govern our interactions, but on those interactions themselves, we will call it the “interactional” approach.[6]

In general, the institutionalist approach is favoured by indirect consequentialists and contractualists. Indirect consequentialists believe these institutions are justified just in case they will in fact have better long-run results than any feasible alternative institutions (see Mavrodes 1975; Dill and Shue 2012; Shue 2013; Waldron 2016). Contractualists believe these institutions ground or reflect either an actual or a hypothetical contract among states and/or their citizens, which specifies the terms of their interaction in war (see Benbaji 2008, 2011, 2014; Statman 2014).

Non-contractualist deontologists and direct- or act-consequentialists tend to prefer the interactional approach. Their central question is: what moral reasons bear directly on the permissibility of killing in war? This focus on killing might seem myopic—war involves much more violence and destruction than the killing alone. However, typically this is just a heuristic device; since we typically think of killing as the most presumptively wrongful kind of harm, whatever arguments one identifies that justify killing are likely also to justify lesser wrongs. And if the killing that war involves cannot be justified, then we should endorse pacifism.

Any normative theory of war should pay attention both to what the laws of war should be, and to what we morally ought to do. These are two distinct but equally important questions. And they entail the importance of a third: what ought we to do all things considered, for example when law and morality conflict? Too much recent just war theory has focused on arguing that philosophical attention should be reserved to one of the first two of these questions (Buchanan 2006; Shue 2008, 2010; Rodin 2011b). Not enough has concentrated on the third (though see McMahan 2008; Lazar 2012a).

Although this entry touches on the first question, it focuses on the second. Addressing the first requires detailed empirical research and pragmatic political speculation, both of which are beyond my remit here. Addressing the third takes us too deep into the minutiae of contemporary just war theory for an encyclopaedia entry.

What’s more, even institutionalists need some answer to the second question—and so some account of the interactional morality of war. Rule-consequentialists need an account of the good (bad) that they are hoping that the ideal laws of war will maximise (minimise) in the long run. This means, for example, deciding whether to aim to minimise all harm, or only to minimise wrongful harm. The latter course is much more plausible—we wouldn’t want laws of war that, for example, licensed genocide just in case doing so leads to fewer deaths overall. But to follow this course, we need to know which harms are (extra-institutionally) wrongful. Similarly, contractualists typically acknowledge various constraints on the kinds of rules that could form the basis of a legitimate contract, which, again, we cannot work out without thinking about the extra-institutional morality of war (Benbaji 2011).

2.3 Overarching Disputes in Contemporary Analytical Just War Theory

Even within interactional just war theory, several second-order disagreements underscore first-order disputes. First: when thinking about the ethics of war, what kinds of cases should we use to test our intuitions and our principles? We can start by thinking about actual wars and realistic wartime scenarios, paying attention to international affairs and military history. Or, more clinically, we can construct hypothetical cases to isolate variables and test their impact on our intuitions.

Some early revisionists relied heavily on highly artificial cases (e.g., McMahan 1994; Rodin 2002). They were criticized for this by traditionalists, who generally use more empirically-informed examples (Walzer 2006). But one’s standpoint on the substantive questions at issue between traditionalists and revisionists need not be predetermined by one’s methodology. Revisionists can pay close attention to actual conflicts (e.g., Fabre 2012). Traditionalists can use artificial hypotheticals (e.g., Emerton and Handfield 2009; Lazar 2013).

Abstraction forestalls unhelpful disputes over historical details. It also reduces bias—we are inclined to view actual conflicts through the lens of our own political allegiances. But it also has costs. We should be proportionately less confident of our intuitions the more removed the test case is from our lived experience. Philosophers’ scenarios involving mind-control, armed pedestrians, trolleys, meteorites, and incredibly complicated causal sequences are pure exercises in imagination. How can we trust our judgements about such cases more than we trust our views on actual, realistic scenarios? What’s more, abandoning the harrowing experience of war for sanitized hypothetical cases might be not merely epistemically unsound, but also disrespectful of the victims of war. Lastly, cleaned-up examples often omit morally relevant details—for instance, assuming that everyone has all the information relevant to their choice, rather than acknowledging the “fog of war”, and making no allowances for fear or trauma.

Artificial hypotheticals have their place, but any conclusions they support must be tested against the messy reality of war. What’s more, our intuitive judgements should be the starting-point for investigation, rather than its end.

The second divide is related to the first. Reductivists think that killing in war must be justified by the same properties that justify killing outside of war. Non-reductivists, sometimes called exceptionalists, think that some properties justify killing in war that do not justify killing outside of war.[7] Most exceptionalists think that specific features of killing in war make it morally different from killing in ordinary life—for example, the scale of the conflict, widespread and egregious non-compliance with fundamental moral norms, the political interests at stake, the acute uncertainty, the existence of the law of armed conflict, or the fact that the parties to the conflict are organized groups. A paradigm reductivist, by contrast, might argue that justified wars are mere aggregates of justified acts of individual self- and other-defence (see Rodin 2002; McMahan 2004a).

Reductivists are much more likely to use far-fetched hypothetical cases, since they think there is nothing special about warfare. The opposite is true for exceptionalists. Walzer’s first critics relied on reductivist premises to undermine the principles of national defence (Luban 1980a; Rodin 2002), discrimination (Holmes 1989; McMahan 1994), and combatant equality (Holmes 1989; McMahan 1994). Many traditionalists replied by rejecting reductivism, arguing that there is something special about war that justifies a divergence from the kinds of judgements that are appropriate to other kinds of conflict (Zohar 1993; Kutz 2005; Benbaji 2008; Dill and Shue 2012). Again, some philosophers buck these overarching trends (for reductivist traditionalist arguments, see e.g., Emerton and Handfield 2009; Lazar 2015c; Haque forthcoming; for non-reductivist revisionist arguments, see e.g., Ryan 2016).

The debate between reductivism and exceptionalism is overblown—the concept of “war” is vague, and while typical wars involve properties that are not instantiated in typical conflicts outside of war, we can always come up with far-fetched hypotheticals that don’t involve those properties, which we wouldn’t call “wars”. But this masks a deeper methodological disagreement: when thinking about the morality of war, should we start by thinking about war, or by thinking about the permissible use of force outside of war? Should we model justified killing in war on justified killing outside of war? Or, in focusing on the justification of killing in war, might we then discover that there are some non-canonical cases of permissible killing outside of war? My own view is that thinking about justified killing outside of war has its place, but must be complemented by thinking about war directly.

Next, we can distinguish between individualists and collectivists; and we can subdivide them further into evaluative and descriptive categories. Evaluative individualists think that a collective’s moral significance is wholly reducible to its contribution to the well-being of the individuals who compose it. Evaluative collectivists think that collectives can matter independently of how they contribute to individual well-being. Descriptive individualists think that any act that might appear to be collective is reducible to component acts by individuals. Descriptive collectivists deny this, thinking that some acts are irreducibly collective.[8]

Again, the dialectic of contemporary just war theory involves revisionists first arguing that we cannot vindicate traditionalist positions on descriptively and evaluatively individualist grounds, with some traditionalists then responding by rejecting descriptive (Kutz 2005; Walzer 2006; Lazar 2012b) and evaluative individualism (Zohar 1993). And again there are outliers—individualist traditionalists (e.g., Emerton and Handfield 2009) and collectivist revisionists (e.g., Bazargan 2013).

Unlike the reductivist/exceptionalist divide, the individualist/collectivist split cannot be resolved by thinking about the morality of war on its own. War is a useful test case for theories of collective action and the value of collectives, but no more than that. Intuitions about war are no substitute for a theory of collective action. Perhaps some collectives have value beyond their contribution to the well-being of their members. For example, they might instantiate justice, or solidarity, which can be impersonally valuable (Temkin 1993). It is doubtful, however, that groups have interests independent from the well-being of their members. On the descriptive side, even if we can reduce collective actions to the actions of individual members, this probably involves such complicated contortions that we should seriously question whether it is worth doing (Lazar 2012b).

2.4 Dividing up the Subject Matter

Traditionally, just war theorists divide their enquiry into reflection on the resort to war—jus ad bellum—and conduct in war—jus in bello. More recently, they have added an account of permissible action post-war, or jus post bellum. Others suggest an independent focus on war exit, which they have variously called jus ex bello and jus terminatio (Moellendorf 2008; Rodin 2008a). These Latin labels, though unfortunately obscurantist, serve as a useful shorthand. When we refer to ad bellum justice, we mean to evaluate the permissibility of the war as a whole. This is particularly salient when deciding to launch the war. But it is also crucial for the decision to continue fighting. Jus ex bello, then, fits within jus ad bellum. The jus in bello denotes the permissibility of particular actions that compose the war, short of the war as a whole.

2.5 The Decisive Role of Necessity and Proportionality

Traditional just war theory construes jus ad bellum and jus in bello as sets of principles, satisfying which is necessary and sufficient for a war’s being permissible. Jus ad bellum typically comprises the following six principles:

  1. Just Cause: the war is an attempt to avert the right kind of injury.
  2. Legitimate Authority: the war is fought by an entity that has the authority to fight such wars.
  3. Right Intention: that entity intends to achieve the just cause, rather than using it as an excuse to achieve some wrongful end.
  4. Reasonable Prospects of Success: the war is sufficiently likely to achieve its aims.
  5. Proportionality: the morally weighted goods achieved by the war outweigh the morally weighted bads that it will cause.
  6. Last Resort (Necessity): there is no other less harmful way to achieve the just cause.

Typically the jus in bello list comprises:

  1. Discrimination: belligerents must always distinguish between military objectives and civilians, and intentionally attack only military objectives.
  2. Proportionality: foreseen but unintended harms must be proportionate to the military advantage achieved.
  3. Necessity: the least harmful means feasible must be used.

These all matter to the ethics of war, and will be addressed below. However, it is unhelpful to view them as a checklist of necessary and sufficient conditions. When they are properly understood, only proportionality and necessity (in the guise of last resort in the jus ad bellum) are necessary conditions for a war, or an act in a war, to be permissible, since no matter how badly going to war fails the other ad bellum criteria (for example) it might still be permissible because it is the least awful of one’s alternatives, and so satisfies the necessity and proportionality constraints.

To get an intuitive grasp on necessity and proportionality, note that if someone threatens my life, then killing her would be proportionate; but if I could stop her by knocking her out, then killing her would be unnecessary, and so impermissible. The necessity and proportionality constraints have the same root: with few exceptions (perhaps when it is deserved), harm is intrinsically bad. Harms (and indeed all bads) that we cause must therefore be justified by some positive reason that counts in their favour—such as good achieved or evil averted (Lazar 2012a). Both the necessity and proportionality constraints involve comparing the bads caused by an action with the goods that it achieves. They differ only in the kinds of options they compare.

The use of force is proportionate when the harm done is counterbalanced by the good achieved in averting a threat. To determine this, we typically compare the candidate course of action with what would happen if we allowed the threat to eventuate.

Of course, in most cases we will have more than one means of averting or mitigating the threat. And a harmful option can be permissible only if all the harm that it involves is justified by a corresponding good achieved. If some alternative would as successfully avert the threat, but cause less harm, then the more harmful option is impermissible, because it involves unnecessary harm.

Where an option O aims to avert a threat T, we determine O’s necessity by comparing it with all the other options that will either mitigate or avert T. We determine its proportionality by comparing it with the harm suffered if T should come about. The only difference between the proportionality and necessity constraints is that the former involves comparing one’s action with a very specific counterfactual scenario—in which we don’t act to avert the threat—while the latter involves comparing it with all your available options that have some prospect of averting or mitigating the threat. In my view, we should simply expand this so that the necessity constraint compares all your available options bar none. Then proportionality would essentially involve comparing each option with the alternative of doing nothing, while necessity would involve comparing all options (including doing nothing) in terms of their respective balances of goods and bads. On this approach, necessity would subsume proportionality. But this is a technical point with little substantive payoff.

More substantively, necessity and proportionality judgements concern consequences, and yet they are typically made ex ante, before we know what the results of our actions will be. They must therefore be modified to take this uncertainty into account. The most obvious solution is simply to refer to expected threats and expected harms, where the expected harm of an option O is the probability-weighted average of the harms that might result if I take O, and the expected threat is the probability-weighted average of the consequences of doing nothing to prevent the threat—allowing for the possibility that the threat might not eventuate at all (Lazar 2012b). We would also have to factor in the options’ probability of averting the threat. This simple move obscures a number of important and undertheorised issues that we cannot discuss in detail here. For now, we must simply note that proportionality and necessity must be appropriately indexed to the agent’s uncertainty.

Necessity and proportionality judgements involve weighing harms inflicted and threats averted, indeed all relevant goods and bads. The simplest way to proceed would be to aggregate the harms to individual people on each side, and call the act proportionate just in case it averts more harm than it causes, and necessary just in case no alternative involves less harm. But few deontologists, and indeed few non-philosophers, think in this naively aggregative way. Instead we should weight harms (etc.) according to factors such as whether the agent is directly responsible for them, and whether they are intended or merely foreseen.[9] Many also think that we can, perhaps even must, give greater importance in our deliberations to our loved ones (for example) than to those tied to us only by the common bonds of humanity (Hurka 2007; Lazar 2013; for criticism, see Lefkowitz 2009). Similarly, we might justifiably prioritise defending our own state’s sovereignty and territorial integrity, even when doing so would not be impartially best.[10] Only when all these and other factors (many of which are discussed below) are taken into consideration can we form defensible conclusions about which options are necessary and proportionate.

The other elements of the ethics of war contribute to the evaluation of proportionality and necessity, in one (or more) of three ways: identifying positive reasons in favour of fighting; delineating the negative reasons against fighting; or as staging-posts on the way to judgements of necessity and proportionality.

Given the gravity of the decision to go to war, only very serious threats can give us just cause to fight. So if just cause is satisfied, then you have weighty positive reasons to fight. Lacking just cause does not in itself aggravate the badness of fighting, but does make it less likely that the people killed in pursuing one’s war aims will be liable to be killed (more on this below, and see McMahan 2005a), which makes killing very hard to justify. Even if having a just cause is not strictly speaking a necessary condition for warfare to be permissible, the absence of a just cause makes it very difficult for a war to satisfy proportionality.

If legitimate authority is satisfied then additional positive reasons count in favour of fighting (see below). If it is not satisfied, then this adds an additional reason against fighting, which must be overcome for fighting to be proportionate.

The “reasonable prospects of success” criterion is a surmountable hurdle on the way to proportionality. Typically, if a war lacks reasonable prospects of success, then it will be disproportionate, since wars always involve causing significant harms, and if those harms are likely to be pointless then they are unlikely to be justified. But of course sometimes one’s likelihood of victory is very low, and yet fighting is still the best available option, and so necessary and proportionate. Having reasonable prospects of success matters only for the same reasons that necessity and proportionality matter. If necessity and proportionality are satisfied, then the reasonable prospects of success standard is irrelevant.

Right intention may also be irrelevant, but insofar as it matters its absence would be a reason against fighting; having the right intention does not give a positive reason to fight.

Lastly, discrimination is crucial to establishing proportionality and necessity, because it tells us how to weigh the lives taken in war.

3. Jus ad Bellum

3.1 Just Cause

Wars destroy lives and environments. In the eight years following the Iraq invasion in 2003, half a million deaths were either directly or indirectly caused by the war (Hagopian et al. 2013). Direct casualties from the Second World War numbered over 60 million, about 3 per cent of the world’s population. War’s environmental costs are less commonly researched, but are obviously also extraordinary (Austin and Bruch 2000). Armed forces use fuels in Olympian quantities: in the years from 2000–2013, the US Department of Defense accounted for around 80% of US federal government energy usage, between 0.75 and 1 quadrillion BTUs per year—a little less than all the energy use that year in Denmark and Bulgaria, a little more than Slovakia and Serbia (Energy Information Administration 2015a,b). They also directly and indirectly destroy habitats and natural resources—consider, for example, the Gulf war oil spill (El-Baz and Makharita 1994). For both our planet and its inhabitants, wars are truly among the very worst things we can do.

War can be necessary and proportionate only if it serves an end worth all this death and destruction. Hence the importance of having a just cause. And hence too the widespread belief that just causes are few and far between. Indeed, traditional just war theory recognizes only two kinds of justification for war: national defence (of one’s own state or of an ally) and humanitarian intervention. What’s more, humanitarian intervention is permissible only to avert the very gravest of tragedies—“crimes that shock the moral conscience of mankind” (Walzer 2006: 107).

Walzer argued that states’ claims to sovereignty and territorial integrity are grounded in the human rights of their citizens, in three ways. First, states ensure individual security. Rights to life and liberty have value “only if they also have dimension” (Walzer 2006: 58), which they derive from states’ borders—“within that world, men and women… are safe from attack; once the lines are crossed, safety is gone” (Walzer 2006: 57). Second, states protect a common life, made by their citizens over centuries of interaction. If the common life of a political community is valued by its citizens, then it is worth fighting for. Third, they have also formed a political association, an organic social contract, whereby individuals have, over time and in informal ways, conceded aspects of their liberty to the community, to secure greater freedom for all.

These arguments for national defence are double-edged. They helped explain why wars of national defence are permissible, but also make justifying humanitarian intervention harder. One can in principle successfully conclude a war in defence of oneself or one's allies without any lasting damage to the political sovereignty or territorial integrity of any of the contending parties. In Walzer’s view, humanitarian interventions, in which one typically defends people against their own state, necessarily undermine political sovereignty and territorial integrity. So they must meet a higher burden of justification.

Walzer’s traditionalist stances on national defence and humanitarian intervention met heavy criticism. Early sceptics (Doppelt 1978; Beitz 1980; Luban 1980a) challenged Walzer’s appeal to the value of collective freedom, noting that in diverse political communities freedom for the majority can mean oppression for the minority (see also Caney 2006). In modern states, can we even speak of a single common life? Even if we can, do wars really threaten it, besides in extreme cases? And even if our common life and culture were threatened, would their defence really justify killing innocent people?

Critics also excoriated Walzer’s appeal to individual rights (see especially Wasserstrom 1978; Luban 1980b). They questioned the normative purchase of his metaphor of the organic social contract (if hypothetical contracts aren’t worth the paper they’re not written on, then what are metaphorical contracts worth?). They challenged his claim that states guarantee individual security: most obviously, when humanitarian intervention seems warranted, the state is typically the greatest threat to its members.

David Rodin (2002) advanced the quintessentially reductivist critique of Walzer, showing that his attempt to ground state defence in individual defensive rights could not succeed. He popularized the “bloodless invasion objection” to this argument for national defensive rights. Suppose an unjustly aggressing army would secure its objectives without loss of life if only the victim state offers no resistance (the 2001 invasion of Afghanistan, and the 2003 invasion of Iraq, arguably meet this description, as might some of Russia’s territorial expansions). If the right of national defence is grounded in states’ members’ rights to security, then in these cases there would be no right of national defence, because their lives are at risk only if the victim state fights back. And yet we typically do think it permissible to fight against annexation and regime change.

By undermining the value of sovereignty, revisionists lowered the bar against intervening militarily in other states. Often these arguments were directly linked: some think that if states cannot protect the security of their members, then they lack any rights to sovereignty that a military intervention could undermine (Shue 1997).[11] Caney (2005) argues that military intervention could be permissible were it to serve individual human rights better than non-intervention. Others countenance so-called “redistributive wars”, fought on behalf of the global poor to force rich states to address the widespread violations of fundamental human rights caused by their economic policies (Luban 1980b; Fabre 2012; Lippert-Rasmussen 2013; Øverland 2013).

Other philosophers, equally unpersuaded by Walzer’s arguments, nonetheless reject a substantively revisionist take on just cause. If the individual self-defence-based view of jus ad bellum cannot justify lethal defence against “lesser aggression”, then we could follow Rodin (2014), and argue for radically revisionist conclusions about just cause; or we could instead reject the individual self-defence-based approach to justifying killing in war (Emerton and Handfield 2014; Lazar 2014).

Some think we can solve the “problem of lesser aggression” by invoking the importance of deterrence, as well as the impossibility of knowing for sure that aggression will be bloodless (Fabre 2014). Others think that we must take proper account of people’s interest in having a democratically elected, or at least home-grown, government, to justify national defence. On one popular account, although no individual could permissibly kill to protect her own “political interests”, when enough people are threatened, their aggregated interests justify going to war (Hurka 2007; Frowe 2014). Counterintuitively, this means that more populous states have, other things equal, more expansive rights of national defence. However, perhaps states have a group right to national defence, which requires only that a sufficient number of individuals have the relevant political interests—any excess over the threshold is morally irrelevant. Many already think about national self-determination in this way: the population of the group seeking independence has to be sufficiently large before we take their claim seriously, but differences above that threshold matter much less (Margalit and Raz 1990).

The revisionist take on humanitarian intervention might also have some troubling results. If sovereignty and territorial integrity matter little, then shouldn’t we use military force more often? As Kutz (2014) has argued, revisionist views on national defence might license the kind of military adventurism that went so badly wrong in Iraq, where states have so little regard for sovereignty that they go to war to improve the domestic political institutions of their adversaries.

We can resolve this worry in one of two ways. First, recall just how infrequently military intervention succeeds. Since it so often not only fails, but actually makes things worse, we should use it only when the ongoing crimes are so severe that we would take any risk to try to stop them.

Second, perhaps the political interests underpinning the state’s right to national defence are not simply interests in being part of an ideal liberal democracy, but in being governed by, very broadly, members of one’s own nation, or perhaps even an interest in collective self-determination. This may take us back to Walzer’s “romance of the nation-state”, but people clearly do care about something like this. Unless we want to restrict rights of national defence to liberal democracies alone (bearing in mind how few of them there are in the world), we have to recognize that our political interests are not all exclusively liberal-democratic.

What of redistributive wars? Too often arguments on this topic artfully distinguish between just cause and other conditions of jus ad bellum (Fabre 2012). Even when used by powerful states against weak adversaries, military force is rarely a moral triumph. It tends to cause more problems than it solves. Redistributive wars, as fought on behalf of the “global poor” against the “global rich”, would obviously fail to achieve their objectives, indeed they would radically exacerbate the suffering of those they aim to help. So they would be disproportionate, and cannot satisfy the necessity constraint. The theoretical point that, in principle, not only national defence and humanitarian intervention could give just causes for war is sound. But this example is in practice irrelevant (for a robust critique of redistributive wars, see Benbaji 2014).

And yet, given the likely path of climate change, the future might see resource wars grow in salience. As powerful states find themselves lacking crucial resources, held by other states, we might find that military attack is the best available means to secure these resources, and save lives. Perhaps in some such circumstances resource wars could be a realistic option.

3.2 Just Peace

The goods and bads relevant to ad bellum proportionality and necessity extend far beyond the armistice. This is obvious, but has recently received much-needed emphasis, both among philosophers and in the broader public debate sparked by the conflicts in Iraq and Afghanistan (Bass 2004; Coady 2008; May 2012). Achieving your just cause is not enough. The aftermath of the war must also be sufficiently tolerable if the war is to be proportionate, all things considered. It is an open question how far into the future we have to look to assess the morally relevant consequences of conflict.

3.3 Legitimate Authority

Historically, just war theory has been dominated by statists. Most branches of the tradition have had some version of a “legitimate”, “proper” or “right” authority constraint, construed as a necessary condition for a war to be ad bellum just.[12] In practice, this means that sovereigns and states have rights that non-state actors lack. International law gives only states rights of national defence and bestows “combatant rights” primarily on the soldiers of states. Although Walzer said little about legitimate authority, his arguments all assume that states have a special moral standing that non-state actors lack.

The traditionalist, then, says it matters that the body fighting the war have the appropriate authority to do so. Some think that authority is grounded in the overall legitimacy of the state. Others think that overall legitimacy is irrelevant—what matters is whether the body fighting the war is authorized to do so by the polity that it represents (Lazar forthcoming-b). Either way, states are much more likely to satisfy the legitimate authority condition than non-state actors.

Revisionists push back: relying on reductivist premises, they argue that killing in war is justified by the protection of individual rights, and our licence to defend our rights need not be mediated through state institutions. Either we should disregard the legitimate authority condition or we should see it as something that non-state actors can, in fact, fulfil (Fabre 2008; Finlay 2010; Schwenkenbecher 2013).

Overall, state legitimacy definitely seems relevant for some questions in war (Estlund 2007; Renzo 2013). But authorization is more fundamental. Ideally, the body fighting the war should be authorized to do so by the institutions of a constitutional democracy. Looser forms of authorization are clearly possible; even a state that is not overall legitimate might nonetheless be authorized by its polity to fight wars of national defence.

Authorization of this kind matters to jus ad bellum in two ways. First, fighting a war without authorization constitutes an additional wrong, which has to be weighed against the goods that fighting will bring about, and must pass the proportionality and necessity tests. When a government involves its polity in a war, it uses the resources of the community at large, as well as its name, and exposes it to both moral and prudential risks (Lazar forthcoming-b). Doing this unauthorized is obviously deeply morally problematic. Any form of undemocratic decision-making by governments is objectionable; taking decisions of this magnitude without the population’s granting you the right to do so is especially wrong.

Second, authorization can allow the government to act on positive reasons for fighting that would otherwise be unavailable. Consider the claim that wars of national defence are in part justified by the political interests of the citizens of the defending state—interests, for example, in democratic participation or in collective self-determination. A government may defend these aggregated political interests only if it is authorized to do so. Otherwise fighting would contravene the very interests in self-determination that it is supposed to protect. But if it is authorized, then that additional set of reasons supports fighting.

As a result, democratic states enjoy somewhat more expansive war rights than non-democratic states and non-state movements. The latter two groups cannot often claim the same degree of authorization as democratic states. Although this might not vindicate the current bias in international law towards states, it does suggest that it corresponds to something more than the naked self-interest of the framers of international law—which were, of course, states. This obviously has significant implications for civil wars (see Parry 2016).

3.4 Proportionality

The central task of the proportionality constraint, recall, is to identify reasons that tell in favour of fighting and those that tell against it. Much of the latter task is reserved for the discussion of jus in bello below, since it concerns weighing lives in war.

Among the goods that help make a war proportionate, we have already considered those in the just cause and others connected to just peace and legitimate authority. Additionally, many also think that proportionality can be swayed by reasonable partiality towards one’s own state and co-citizens. Think back to the political interests that help justify national defence. If we were wholly impartial, then we should choose the course that will best realise people’s political interests overall. So if fighting the defensive war would undermine the political interests of the adversary state’s citizens more than it would undermine our own, then we should refuse to fight. But this is not how we typically think about the permission to resort to war: we are typically entitled to be somewhat partial towards the political interests of our co-citizens.

Some propose further constraints on what goods can count towards the proportionality of a war. McMahan and McKim (1993) argued that benefits like economic progress cannot make an otherwise disproportionate war proportionate. This is probably true in practice, but perhaps not in principle—that would require a kind of lexical priority between lives taken and economic benefits, and lexical priorities are notoriously hard to defend. After all, economic progress saves lives.

Some goods lack weight in ad bellum proportionality, not because they are lexically inferior to other values at stake, but because they are conditional in particular ways. Soldiers have conditional obligations to fulfil their roles, grounded in their contracts, oaths, and their co-citizens’ legitimate expectations. That carrying out an operation fulfils my oath gives me a reason to perform that operation, which has to be weighed in the proportionality calculation (Lazar 2015b). But these reasons cannot contribute to ad bellum proportionality in the same way, because they are conditional on the war as a whole being fought. Political leaders cannot plausibly say: “were it not for all the oaths that would be fulfilled by fighting, this war would be disproportionate”. This is because fighting counts as fulfilling those oaths only if the political leader decides to take her armed forces to war.

Another reason to differentiate between proportionality ad bellum and in bello is that the relevant comparators change for the two kinds of assessment. In a loose sense, we determine proportionality by asking whether some option is better than doing nothing. The comparator for assessing the war as a whole, then, is not fighting at all, ending the war as a whole. That option is not available when considering particular actions within the war—one can only decide whether or not to perform this particular action.

3.5 Last Resort (Necessity)

Are pre-emptive wars, fought in anticipation of an imminent enemy attack, permissible? What of preventive wars, in which the assault occurs prior to the enemy having any realistic plan of attack (see, in general, Shue and Rodin 2007)? Neoconservatives have recently argued, superficially plausibly, that the criterion of last resort can be satisfied long before the enemy finally launches an attack (see President 2002). The right answer here is boringly familiar. In principle, of course this is possible. But, in practice, we almost always overestimate the likelihood of success from military means and overlook the unintended consequences of our actions. International law must therefore retain its restrictions, to deter the kind of overzealous implementation of the last-resort principle that we saw in the 2003 invasion of Iraq (Buchanan and Keohane 2004; Luban 2004).

Another frequently discussed question: what does the “last” in last resort really mean? The idea is simple, and is identical to in bello necessity. Going to war must be compared with the alternative available strategies for dealing with the enemy (which also includes the various ways in which we could submit). Going to war is literally a last resort when no other available means has any prospect of averting the threat. But our circumstances are not often this straitened. Other options always have some chance of success. So if you have a diplomatic alternative to war, which is less harmful than going to war, and is at least as likely to avert the threat, then going to war is not a last resort. If the diplomatic alternative is less harmful, as well as less likely to avert the threat, then the question is whether the reduction in expected harm is great enough for us to be required to accept the reduction in likelihood of averting the threat. If not, then war is your last resort.[13]

4. Jus in Bello

4.1 Walzer and his Critics

The traditionalist jus in bello, as reflected in international law, holds that conduct in war must satisfy three principles:

  1. Discrimination: Targeting noncombatants is impermissible.[14]
  2. Proportionality: Collaterally harming noncombatants (that is, harming them foreseeably, but unintendedly) is permissible only if the harms are proportionate to the goals the attack is intended to achieve.[15]
  3. Necessity: Collaterally harming noncombatants is permissible only if, in the pursuit of one’s military objectives, the least harmful means feasible are chosen. [16]

These principles divide the possible victims of war into two classes: combatants and noncombatants. They place no constraints on killing combatants.[17] But—outside of “supreme emergencies”, rare circumstances in which intentionally killing noncombatants is necessary to avert an unconscionable threat—noncombatants may be killed only unintendedly and, even then, only if the harm they suffer is necessary and proportionate to the intended goals of the attack.[18] Obviously, then, much hangs on what makes one a combatant. This entry adopts a conservative definition. Combatants are (most) members of the organized armed forces of a group that is at war, as well as others who directly participate in hostilities or have a continuous combat function (for discussion, see Haque forthcoming). Noncombatants are not combatants. There are, of course, many hard cases, especially in asymmetric wars, but they are not considered here. “Soldier” is used interchangeably with “combatant” and “civilian” interchangeably with “noncombatant”.

Both traditionalist just war theory and international law explicitly license fighting in accordance with these constraints, regardless of one’s objectives. In other words, they endorse:

Combatant Equality: Soldiers who satisfy Discrimination, Proportionality, and Necessity fight permissibly, regardless of what they are fighting for. [19]

We discuss Proportionality and Necessity below; for now let us concentrate on Michael Walzer’s influential argument for Discrimination and Combatant Equality, which has proved very controversial.

Individual human beings enjoy fundamental rights to life and liberty, which prohibit others from harming them in certain ways. Since fighting wars obviously involves depriving others of life and liberty, according to Walzer, it can be permissible only if each of the victims has, “through some act of his own … surrendered or lost his rights” (Walzer 2006: 135). He then claims that, “simply by fighting”, all combatants “have lost their title to life and liberty” (Walzer 2006: 136). First, merely by posing a threat to me, a person alienates himself from me, and from our common humanity, and so himself becomes a legitimate target of lethal force (Walzer 2006: 142). Second, by participating in the armed forces, a combatant has “allowed himself to be made into a dangerous man” (Walzer 2006: 145), and thus surrendered his rights. By contrast, noncombatants are “men and women with rights, and… they cannot be used for some military purpose, even if it is a legitimate purpose” (Walzer 2006: 137). This introduces the concept of liability into the debate, which we need to define carefully. On most accounts, that a person is liable to be killed means that she is not wronged by being killed. Often this is understood, as it was in Walzer, in terms of rights: everyone starts out with a right to life, but that right can be forfeited or lost, such that one can be killed without that right being violated or infringed. Walzer and his critics all agreed that killing a person intentionally is permissible only if either she has lost the protection of her right to life, or if the good achieved thereby is very great indeed, enough that, though she is wronged, it is not all things considered wrong to kill her. Her right is permissibly infringed. Walzer and his critics believe that such cases are very rare in war, arising only when the alternative to intentionally violating people’s right to life is an imminent catastrophe on the order of Nazi victory in Europe (this is an example of a supreme emergency).

These simple building blocks give us both Discrimination and Combatant Equality—the former, because noncombatants, in virtue of retaining their rights, are not legitimate objects of attack; the latter, because all combatants lose their rights, regardless of what they are fighting for: hence, as long as they attack only enemy combatants, they fight legitimately, because they do not violate anyone’s rights.

These arguments have faced withering criticism. The simplest objection against Combatant Equality brings it into conflict with Proportionality (McMahan 1994; Rodin 2002; Hurka 2005). Unintended noncombatant deaths are permissible only if proportionate to the military objective sought. This means the objective is worth that much innocent suffering. But military objectives are merely means to an end. Their worth depends on how valuable the end is. How many innocent deaths would be proportionate to Al Shabab’s successfully gaining control of Mogadishu now or to Iraq’s capturing Kuwaiti territory and oil reserves in 1991? In each case the answer is obvious: none.

Proportionality is about weighing the evil inflicted against the evil averted (Lee 2012). But the military success of unjust combatants does not avert evil, it is itself evil. Evil intentionally inflicted can only add to, not counterbalance, unintended evils. Combatant Equality cannot be true.

Other arguments against Combatant Equality focus on Walzer’s account of how one loses the right to life. They typically start by accepting his premise that permissible killing in war does not violate the rights of the victims against being killed, at least for intentional killing.[20] This contrasts with the view that sometimes people’s rights to life can be overridden, so war can be permissible despite infringing people’s rights. Walzer’s critics then show that his account of how we lose our right to life is simply not plausible. Merely posing a threat to others—even a lethal threat—is not sufficient to warrant the loss of one’s fundamental rights, because sometimes one threatens others’ lives for very good reasons (McMahan 1994). The soldiers of the Kurdish Peshmerga, heroically fighting to rescue Yazidis from ISIL’s genocidal attacks, do not thereby lose their rights not to be killed by their adversaries. Posing threats to others in the pursuit of a just aim, where those others are actively trying to thwart that just aim, cannot void or vitiate one’s fundamental natural rights against being harmed by those very people. The consent-based argument is equally implausible as a general defence for Combatant Equality. Unjust combatants have something to gain from waiving their rights against lethal attack, if doing so causes just combatants to effect the same waiver. And on most views, many unjust combatants have nothing to lose, since by participating in an unjust war they have at least weakened if not lost those rights already. Just combatants, by contrast, have something to lose, and nothing to gain. So why would combatants fighting for a just cause consent to be harmed by their adversaries, in the pursuit of an unjust end?

Walzer’s case for Combatant Equality rests on showing that just combatants lose their rights to life. His critics have shown that his arguments to this end fail. So Combatant Equality is false. But they have shown more than this. Inspired by Walzer to look at the conditions under which we lose our rights to life, his critics have made theoretical advances that place other central tenets of jus in bello in jeopardy. They argued, contra Walzer, that posing a threat is not sufficient for liability to be killed (McMahan 1994, 2009). But they also showed that posing the threat oneself is not necessary for liability either. This is more controversial, but revisionists have long argued that liability is grounded, in war as elsewhere, in one’s responsibility for contributing to a wrongful threat. The US president, for example, is responsible for a drone strike she orders, even though she does not fire the weapon herself.

As many have noted, this argument undermines Discrimination (McMahan 1994; Arneson 2006; Fabre 2012; Frowe 2014). In many states, noncombatants play an important role in the resort to military force. In modern industrialized countries, as much as 25 per cent of the population works in war-related industries (Downes 2006: 157–8; see also Gross 2010: 159; Valentino et al. 2010: 351); we provide the belligerents with crucial financial and other services; we support and sustain the soldiers who do the fighting; we pay our taxes and in democracies we vote. Our contributions to the state’s capacity over time give it the strength and support to concentrate on war.[21] If the state’s war is unjust, then many noncombatants are responsible for contributing to wrongful threats. If that is enough for them to lose their rights to life, then they are permissible targets.

McMahan (2011a) has sought to avert this troubling implication of his arguments by contending that almost all noncombatants on the unjust side (unjust noncombatants) are less responsible than all unjust combatants. But this involves applying a double standard, talking up the responsibility of combatants, while talking down that of noncombatants, and mistakes a central element in his account of liability to be killed. On his view, a person is liable to be killed in self- or other-defence in virtue of being, of those able to bear an unavoidable and indivisible harm, the one who is most responsible for this situation coming about (McMahan 2002, 2005b). Even if noncombatants are only minimally responsible for their states’ unjust wars—that is, they are not blameworthy, they merely voluntarily acted in a way that foreseeably contributed to this result—on McMahan’s view this is enough to make them liable to be killed, if doing so is necessary to save the lives of wholly innocent combatants and noncombatants on the just side (see especially McMahan 2009: 225).

One response is to reject this comparative account of how responsibility determines liability, and argue for a non-comparative approach, according to which one’s degree of responsibility must be great enough to warrant such a severe derogation from one’s fundamental rights. But if we do this, we must surely concede that many combatants on the unjust side are not sufficiently responsible for unjustified threats to be liable to be killed. Whether through fear, disgust, principle or ineptitude, many combatants are wholly ineffective in war, and contribute little or nothing to threats posed by their side. The much-cited research of S. L. A. Marshall claimed that only 15–25 per cent of Allied soldiers in the Second World War who could have fired their weapons did so (Marshall 1978). Most soldiers have a natural aversion to killing, which even intensive psychological training may not overcome (Grossman 1995). Many contribute no more to unjustified threats than do noncombatants. They also lack the “mens rea” that might make liability appropriate in the absence of a significant causal contribution. They are not often blameworthy. The loss of their right to life is not a fitting response to their conduct.

If Walzer is right that in war, outside of supreme emergencies, we may intentionally kill only people who are liable to be killed, and if a significant proportion of unjust combatants and noncombatants are responsible to the same degree as one another for unjustified threats, and if liability is determined by responsibility, then we must decide between two unpalatable alternatives. If we set a high threshold of responsibility for liability, to ensure that noncombatants are not liable to be killed, then we will also exempt many combatants from liability. In ordinary wars, which do not involve supreme emergencies, intentionally killing such non-liable combatants would be impermissible. This moves us towards a kind of pacifism—though warfare can in principle be justified, it is so hard to fight without intentionally killing the non-liable that in practice we must be pacifists (May 2015). But if we set the threshold of responsibility low, ensuring that all unjust combatants are liable, then many noncombatants will be liable too, thus rendering them permissible targets and seriously undermining Discrimination. We are torn between pacifism on the one hand, and realism on the other. This is the “responsibility dilemma” for just war theory (Lazar 2010).

4.2 Killing Combatants

Just war theory has meaning only if we can explain why killing some combatants in war is allowed, but we are not thereby licensed to kill everyone in the enemy state. Here the competing forces of realism and pacifism are at their most compelling. It is unsurprising, therefore, that so much recent work has focused on this topic. We cannot do justice to all the arguments here, but will instead consider three kinds of response: all-out revisionist; moderate traditionalist; and all-out traditionalist.

The first camp faces two challenges: to justify intentionally killing apparently non-liable unjust combatants; but to do this without reopening the door to Combatant Equality, or indeed further undermining Discrimination. Their main move is to argue that, despite appearances, all and only unjust combatants are in fact liable to be killed.

McMahan argues that liability to be killed need not, in fact, presuppose responsibility for an unjustified threat. Instead, unjust combatants’ responsibility for just combatants’ reasonable beliefs that they are liable may be enough to ground forfeiture of their rights (McMahan 2011a). Some argue that combatants’ responsibility for being in the wrong place at the wrong time is enough (likening them to voluntary human shields).[22] More radically still, some philosophers abandon the insistence on individual responsibility, arguing that unjust combatants are collectively responsible for contributing to unjustified threats, even if they are individually ineffective (or even counterproductive) (Kamm 2004; Bazargan 2013).

Lazar (forthcoming-a) suggests these arguments are unpersuasive. Complicity might be relevant to the costs one is required to bear in war, but most liberals will baulk at the idea of losing one’s right to life in virtue of things that other people did. And if combatants can be complicitously liable for what their comrades-in-arms did, then why shouldn’t noncombatants be complicitously liable also?

Blameworthy responsibility for other people’s false beliefs does seem relevant to the ethics of self- and other-defence. That said, consider an idiot who pretends to be a suicide bomber as a prank, and is shot by a police officer (Ferzan 2005; McMahan 2005c). Is killing him objectively permissible? It seems doubtful. The officer’s justified belief that the prankster posed a threat clearly diminishes the wrongfulness of killing him (Lazar 2015a). And certainly the prankster’s fault excuses the officer of any guilt. But killing the prankster still seems objectively wrong. Even if someone’s blameworthy responsibility for false beliefs could make killing him objectively permissible, most philosophers agree that many unjust combatants are not to blame for the injustice of their wars (McMahan 1994; Lazar 2010). And it is much less plausible that blameless responsibility for beliefs can make one a permissible target. Even if it did, this would count in favour of moderate Combatant Equality, since most just combatants are also blamelessly responsible for unjust combatants’ reasonable beliefs that they are liable to be killed.

Moderate traditionalists think we can avoid the realist and pacifist horns of the responsibility dilemma only by conceding a moderate form of Combatant Equality. The argument proceeds in three stages. First, endorse a non-comparative, high threshold of responsibility for liability, such that most noncombatants in most conflicts are not responsible enough to be liable to be killed. This helps explain why killing civilians in war is so hard to justify. Of course, it also entails that many combatants will be innocent too. The second step, then, is to defend the principle of Moral Distinction, according to which killing civilians is worse than killing soldiers. This is obviously true if the soldiers are liable and the civilians are not. But the challenge is to show that killing non-liable civilians is worse than killing non-liable soldiers. If we can do that, then the permissibility of intentionally killing non-liable soldiers does not entail that intentionally killing non-liable noncombatants is permissible. Of course, one might still argue that, even if Moral Distinction is true, we should endorse pacifism. But, and this is the third stage, the less seriously wrongful some act is, the lesser the good that must be realised by performing that act, for it to be all things considered permissible. If intentionally killing innocent combatants is not the worst kind of killing one can do, then the good that must be realised for it to be all things considered permissible is less than is the case for, for example, intentionally killing innocent civilians, which philosophers tend to think can be permissible only in a supreme emergency. This could mean that intentionally killing innocent soldiers is permissible even in the ordinary circumstances of war.

Warfare can be justified, then, by a combination of liability and lesser evil grounds. Some unjust combatants lose their rights not to be killed. Others’ rights can be overridden without that implying that unjust noncombatants’ rights may be overridden too. We can reject the pacifist horn of the responsibility dilemma. But a moderate Combatant Equality is likely to be true: since killing innocent combatants is not the worst kind of killing, it is correspondingly easier for unjust combatants to justify using lethal force (at least against just combatants). This increases the range of cases in which they can satisfy Discrimination, Proportionality, and Necessity, and so fight permissibly.

Much hangs, then, on the arguments for Moral Distinction. Some focus on why killing innocent noncombatants is especially wrongful; others on why killing innocent combatants is not so bad. This section considers the second kind of argument, returning to the first in the next section.

The revisionists’ arguments mentioned above might not ground liability, but do perhaps justify some reason to prefer harming combatants. Combatants can better avoid harm than noncombatants. Combatants surely do have somewhat greater responsibilities to bear costs to avert the wrongful actions of their comrades-in-arms than do noncombatants. And the readiness of most combatants to fight—regardless of whether their cause is just—likely means that even just combatants have somewhat muddied status relative to noncombatants. They conform to their opponents’ rights only by accident. They have weaker grounds for complaint when they are wrongfully killed than do noncombatants, who more robustly respect the rights of others (on robustness and respect, see Pettit 2015).

Additionally, when combatants kill other combatants, they typically believe that they are doing so permissibly. Most often they believe that their cause is just, and that this is a legitimate means to bring it about. But, insofar as they are lawful combatants, they will also believe that international law constrains their actions, so that by fighting in accordance with it they are acting permissibly. Lazar (2015c) argues that killing people when you know that doing so is objectively wrong is more seriously objectionable than doing so when you reasonably believe that you are acting permissibly.

The consent-based argument for Combatant Equality fails because of its empirical, not its normative premise. If combatants in fact waived their rights not to be killed by their adversaries, even when fighting a just war, then that would clearly affect their adversaries’ reasons for action, reducing the wrongfulness of killing anyone who had waived that right. The problem is that they have not waived their rights not to be killed. However, they often do offer a more limited implicit waiver of their rights. The purpose of having armed forces, and the intention of many who serve in them, is to protect civilians from the predations of war. This means both countering threats to and drawing fire away from them. Combatants interpose themselves between the enemy and their civilian compatriots, and fight on their compatriots’ behalf. If they abide by the laws of war, they clearly distinguish themselves from the civilian population, wearing a uniform and carrying their weapons openly. They implicitly say to their adversaries: “you ought to put down your weapons. But if you are going to fight, then fight us”. This constitutes a limited waiver of their rights against harm. Like a full waiver, it alters the reasons confronting their adversaries—under these circumstances, other things equal it is worse to kill the noncombatants. Of course, in most cases unjust combatants ought simply to stop fighting. But this conditional waiver of their opponents’ rights means that, if they are not going to put down arms, they do better to target combatants than noncombatants.

Of course, one might think that in virtue of their altruistic self-sacrifice, just combatants are actually the least deserving of the harms of war (Tadros 2014). But, first, warfare is not a means for ensuring that people get their just deserts. More importantly, given that their altruism is specifically intended to draw fire away from their compatriot noncombatants, it would be perverse to treat this as a reason to do precisely what they are trying to prevent.

These arguments and others suggest that killing innocent combatants is not the worst kind of killing one can do. It might therefore be all things considered permissible in the ordinary circumstances of war, provided enough good is achieved thereby. If unjust combatants attack only just combatants, and if they achieve some valuable objective by doing so—defence of their comrades, their co-citizens, or their territory—they therefore might fight permissibly, even though they violate the just combatants’ rights (Kamm 2004; Hurka 2005; Kamm 2005; Steinhoff 2008; Lazar 2013). At least, it is more plausible that they can fight permissibly than if we regarded every just combatant’s death as equivalent to the worst kind of murder. This does not vindicate Combatant Equality—it simply shows that, more often than one might think, unjust combatants can fight permissibly. Add to that the fact that all wars are morally heterogeneous, involving just and unjust phases (Bazargan 2013), and we quickly see that even if Combatant Equality in the laws of war lacks fundamental moral foundations, it is a sensible approximation of the truth.

Some philosophers, however, seek a more robust defence of Combatant Equality. The three most prominent lines are institutionalist. A contractualist argument (Benbaji 2008, 2011) starts by observing that states (and their populations) need disciplined armies for the purposes of national defence. If soldiers always had to decide for themselves whether a particular war was just, many states could not raise armies when they need to. They would be unable to deter aggression. All states, and all people, benefit from an arrangement whereby individual combatants waive their rights not to be killed by one another—allowing them to obey their state’s commands without second-guessing every deployment. Combatants tacitly consent to waive their rights in this way, given common knowledge that fighting in accordance with the laws of war involves such a waiver. Moreover, their assent is “morally effective” because it is consistent with a fair and optimal contract among states.

International law does appear to change the moral standing of combatants. If you join the armed forces of a state, you know that, at international law, you thereby become a legitimate target in armed conflict. This has to be relevant to the wrongfulness of harming you, even if you are fighting for a just cause. But Benbaji’s argument is more ambitious than this. He thinks that soldiers waive their rights not to be killed by one another—not the limited, conditional waiver described above, but an outright waiver, that absolves their adversaries of any wrongdoing (though it does not so absolve their military and political leaders).

The first problem with this proposal is that it rests on contentious empirical speculation about whether soldiers in fact consent in this way. But setting that aside, second, it is radically statist, implying that international law simply doesn’t apply to asymmetric conflicts between states and non-state actors, since the latter are not part of the appropriate conventions. This gives international law shallow foundations, which fail to support the visceral outrage that breaches of international law typically evoke. It also suggests that states that either don’t ratify major articles of international law, or that withdraw from agreements, can escape its strictures. This seems mistaken. Third, we typically regard waivers of fundamental rights as reversible when new information comes to light. Why shouldn’t just combatants be allowed to withdraw their rights-waiver when they are fighting a just war? Many regard the right to life as inalienable; even if we deny this, we must surely doubt whether you can alienate it once and for all, under conditions of inadequate information. Additionally, suppose that you want to join the armed forces only to fight a specific just war (McMahan 2011b). Why should you waive your rights against harm in this case, given that you plan only to fight now? Fourth, and most seriously, even if Benbaji’s argument explained why killing combatants in war is permissible regardless of the cause you are serving, it cannot explain why unintentionally killing noncombatants as a side-effect of one’s actions is permissible. By joining the armed forces of their state, soldiers at least do something that implies their consent to the regime of international law that structures that role. But noncombatants do not consent to this regime. Soldiers fighting for unjust causes will inevitably kill many innocent civilians. If those deaths cannot be rendered proportionate, then Combatant Equality does not hold.

The second institutionalist argument starts from the belief that we have a duty to obey the law of our legitimate state. This gives unjust combatants, ordered to fight an unjust war, some reason to obey those orders. We can ground this in different ways. Estlund (2007) argues that the duty to obey orders derives from the epistemic authority of the state—it is more likely than an individual soldier to know whether this war is just (see Renzo 2013 for criticism); Cheyney Ryan (2011) emphasizes the democratic source of the state’s authority, as well as the crucial importance of maintaining civilian control of the military. These are genuine moral reasons that should weigh in soldiers’ deliberations. But are they really weighty enough to ground Combatant Equality? It seems doubtful. They cannot systematically override unjust combatants’ obligations not to kill innocent people. This point stands regardless of whether these reasons weigh in the balance, or are exclusionary reasons that block others from being considered (Raz 1985). The rights of innocent people not to be killed are the weightiest, most fundamental rights around. For some other reason to outweigh them, or exclude them from deliberation, it would have to be extremely powerful. Combatants’ obligations to obey orders simply are not weighty enough—as everyone recognises with respect to obedience to unlawful in bello commands (McMahan 2009: 66ff).

Like the first argument, the third institutionalist argument grounds Combatant Equality in its long-term results. But instead of focusing on states’ ability to defend themselves, it emphasizes the importance of limiting the horrors of war, given that we know that people deceive themselves about the justice of their cause (Shue 2008, 2010; Dill and Shue 2012; Shue 2013; Waldron 2016). Since combatants and their leaders almost always believe themselves to be in the right, any injunction to unjust combatants to lay down their arms would simply be ignored, while any additional permissions to harm noncombatants would be abused by both sides. In almost all wars, it is sufficient to achieve military victory that you target only combatants. If doing this will minimize wrongful deaths in the long run, we should enjoin that all sides, regardless of their aims, respect Discrimination. Additionally, while it is extremely difficult to secure international agreement even about what in fact constitutes a just cause for war (witness the controversy over the Rome statute on crimes of aggression, which took many years of negotiation before diplomats agreed an uneasy compromise), the traditionalist principles of jus in bello already have broad international support. They are hard-won concessions that we should abandon only if we are sure that the new regime will be an improvement (Roberts 2008).

Although this argument is plausible, it doesn’t address the same question as the act-focused arguments that preceded it. One thing we can ask is: given a particular situation, what ought we to do? How ought soldiers to act in Afghanistan, or Mali, or Syria, or Somalia? And when we ask this question, we shouldn’t start by assuming that we or they will obviously fail to comply with any exacting moral standards that we might propose (Lazar 2012a; Lazar and Valentini forthcoming). When considering our own actions, and those of people over whom we have influence, we should select from all the available options, not rule some out because we know ourselves to be too immoral to take them. When designing institutions and laws, on the other hand, of course we should think about how people are likely to respond to them. We need to answer both kinds of questions: what really ought I to do? And what should the laws be, given my and others’ predictable frailty?

A moderate Combatant Equality, then, is the likely consequence of avoiding the pacifist horn of the responsibility dilemma. To show that killing in war is permissible, we need to show that intentionally killing innocent combatants is not as seriously wrongful as intentionally killing innocent noncombatants. And if killing innocent combatants is not the worst kind of killing, it can more plausibly be justified by the goods achieved in ordinary wars, outside of supreme emergencies. On this view, contrary to the views of both Walzer and his critics, much of the intended killing in justified wars is permissible not because the targets are liable to be killed, but because infringing their rights is a permissible lesser evil. But this principle applies regardless of whether you are on the just or the unjust side. This in turn increases the range of cases in which combatants fighting on the unjust side will be able to fight permissibly: instead of needing to achieve some good comparable to averting a supreme emergency in order to justify infringing the rights of just combatants, they need only achieve more prosaic kinds of goods, since these are not the worst kinds of rights infringements. So unjust combatants’ associative duties to protect one another and their compatriots, their duties to obey their legitimate governments, and other such considerations, can sometimes make intentionally killing just combatants a permissible lesser evil, and unintentionally killing noncombatants proportionate. This means that the existing laws of war are a closer approximation of combatants’ true moral obligations than many revisionists think. Nonetheless, much of the killing done by unjust combatants in war is still objectively wrong.

4.3 Sparing Civilians

The middle path in just war theory depends on showing that killing civilians is worse than killing soldiers. This section discusses arguments to explain why killing civilians is distinctly objectionable. We discuss the significance of intentional killing when considering proportionality, below.

These arguments are discussed at great length in Lazar (2015c), and are presented only briefly here. They rest on a key point: Moral Distinction says that killing civilians is worse than killing soldiers. It does not say that killing civilians is worse than killing soldiers, other things equal. Lazar holds that stronger principle but does not think that the intrinsic differences between killing civilians and killing soldiers—the properties that are necessarily instantiated in those two kinds of killings—are weighty enough to provide Moral Distinction with the kind of normative force needed to protect noncombatants in war. That protection depends on mobilising multiple foundations for Moral Distinction, which include many properties that are contingently but consistently instantiated in acts that kill civilians and kill soldiers, which make killing civilians worse. We cannot ground Moral Distinction in any one of these properties alone, since each is susceptible to counterexamples. But when they are all taken together, they justify a relatively sharp line between harming noncombatants and harming combatants. There are, of course, hard cases, but these must be decided by appealing to the salient underlying properties rather than to the mere fact of membership in one group or the other.

First, at least deliberately killing civilians in war usually fails even the most relaxed interpretation of the necessity constraint. This is not always true—killing is necessary if it is effective at achieving your objective, and no other effective options are available. Killing civilians sometimes meets this description. It is often effective: the blockade of Germany helped end the first world war, though it may have caused as many as half a million civilian deaths; Russian targeting of civilians in Chechnya reduced Russian combatant casualties (Lyall 2009); Taliban anti-civilian tactics have been effective in Afghanistan. And these attacks are often the last recourse of groups at war (Valentino 2004); when all other options have failed or become too costly, targeting civilians is relatively easy to do. Indeed, as recent terrorist attacks have shown (Mumbai and Paris, for example), fewer than ten motivated gunmen with basic weaponry can bring the world’s most vibrant cities screeching to a halt. So, killing civilians can satisfy the necessity constraint. Nonetheless, attacks on civilians are often wholly wanton, and there is a special contempt expressed in killing innocent people either wantonly or for its own sake. At least if you have some strategic goal in sight, you might believe that something is at stake that outweighs the innocent lives taken. Those who kill civilians pointlessly express their total disregard for their victims in doing so.

Second, even when killing civilians is effective, it is usually so opportunistically (Quinn 1989; Frowe 2008; Quong 2009; Tadros 2011). That is, the civilians’ suffering is used as a means to compel their compatriots and their leaders to end their war. Sieges and aerial bombardments of civilian population centres seek to break the will of the population and of their government. Combatants, by contrast, are almost always killed eliminatively—their deaths are not used to derive a benefit that could not be had without using them in this way; instead they are killed to solve a problem that they themselves pose. This too seems relevant to the relative wrongfulness of these kinds of attacks. Of course, at the strategic level every death is intended as a message to the enemy leadership, that the costs of continuing to fight outweigh the benefits. But at the tactical level, where the actual killing takes place, soldiers typically kill soldiers eliminatively, while they kill civilians opportunistically. If this difference is morally important, as many think, and if acts that kill civilians are opportunistic much more often than are acts that kill soldiers, then acts that kill civilians are, in general, worse than acts that kill soldiers. This lends further support to Moral Distinction.

Third, as already noted above, the agent’s beliefs can affect the objective seriousness of her act of killing. Killing someone when you have solid grounds to think that doing so is objectively permissible wrongs that person less seriously than when your epistemic basis for harming them is weaker. More precisely, killing an innocent person is more seriously wrongful the more reason the killer had to believe that she was not liable to be killed (Lazar 2015a).

Last, in ordinary thinking about the morality of war, the two properties most commonly cited to explain the distinctive wrongfulness of harming civilians, after their innocence, are their vulnerability and their defencelessness. Lazar (2015c) suspects that the duties to protect the vulnerable and not to harm the defenceless are almost as basic as the duty not to harm the innocent. (Note that these duties apply only when their object is morally innocent.) Obviously, on any plausible analysis, civilians are more vulnerable and defenceless than soldiers, so if killing innocent people who are more vulnerable and defenceless is worse than killing those who are less so, then killing civilians is worse than killing soldiers.

Undoubtedly soldiers are also often vulnerable too—one thinks of the “Highway of Death”, in Iraq 1991, when American forces destroyed multiple armoured divisions of the Iraqi army, which were completely unprotected (many of the personnel in those divisions escaped into the desert). But this example just shows that killing soldiers, when they are vulnerable and defenceless, is harder to justify than when they are not. Provided the empirical claim that soldiers are less vulnerable and defenceless than civilians is true, this simply supports the case for Moral Distinction.

4.4 Proportionality

Holding the principle of Moral Distinction allows one to escape the realist and pacifist horns of the responsibility dilemma, while still giving responsibility its due. Even revisionists who deny moderate Combatant Equality could endorse Moral Distinction, and thereby retain the very plausible insight that it is worse to kill just noncombatants than to kill just combatants. And, if they are to account for most people’s considered judgements about war, even pacifists need some account of why killing civilians is worse than killing soldiers.

However, Moral Distinction is not Discrimination. It is a comparative claim, and it says nothing about intentions. Discrimination, by contrast, prohibits intentionally attacking noncombatants, except in supreme emergencies. It is the counterpart of Proportionality, which places a much weaker bar on unintentionally killing noncombatants. Only a terrible crisis could make it permissible to intentionally attack noncombatants. But the ordinary goods achieved in individual battles can justify unintentional killing. What justifies this radical distinction?

This is one of the oldest questions in normative ethics (though for the recent debate, see Quinn 1989; Rickless 1997; McIntyre 2001; Delaney 2006; Thomson 2008; Tadros 2015). On most accounts, those who intend harm to their victims show them a more objectionable kind of disrespect than those who unavoidably harm them as a side-effect. Perhaps the best case for the significance of intentions is, first, in a general argument that mental states are relevant to objective permissibility (Christopher 1998; see also Tadros 2011). And second, we need a rich and unified theoretical account of the specific mental states that matter in this way, into which intentions fit. It may be that the special prohibition of intentional attacks on civilians overstates the moral truth. Intentions do matter. Other things equal, intentional killings are worse than unintended killings (though some unintended killings that are wholly negligent or indifferent to the victim are nearly as bad as intentional killings). But the difference between them is not categorical. It cannot sustain the contrast between a near-absolute prohibition on one hand, and a sweeping permission on the other.

Of course, this is precisely the kind of nuance that would be disastrous if implemented in international law or if internalized as a norm by combatants. Weighing lives in war is informationally incredibly demanding. Soldiers need a principle they can apply. Discrimination is that principle. It is not merely a rule of thumb, since it entails something that is morally grounded—killing civilians is worse than killing soldiers. But it is also a rule of thumb, because it draws a starker contrast between intended and unintended killing than is intrinsically morally justified.

As already noted, proportionality and necessity contain within them almost every other question in the ethics of war; we now consider two further points.

First, proportionality in international law is markedly different from the version of the principle that first-order moral theory supports. At law, an act of war is proportionate insofar as the harm to civilians is not excessive in relation to the concrete and direct military advantage realized thereby. As noted above, in first-order moral terms, this is unintelligible. But there might be a better institutional argument for this neutral conception of proportionality. Proportionality calculations involve many substantive value judgements—for example, about the significance of moral status, intentions, risk, vulnerability, defencelessness, and so on. These are all highly controversial topics. Reasonable disagreement abounds. Many liberals think that coercive laws should be justified in terms that others can reasonably accept, rather than depending on controversial elements of one’s overarching moral theory (Rawls 1996: 217). The law of armed conflict is coercive; violation constitutes a war crime, for which one can be punished. Of course, a more complex law would not be justiciable, but we also have principled grounds for not basing international law on controversial contemporary disputes in just war theory. Perhaps the current standard can be endorsed from within a wider range of overarching moral theories than could anything closer to the truth.

Second, setting aside the law and focusing again on morality, many think that responsibility is crucial to thinking about proportionality, in the following way. Suppose the Free Syrian Army (FSA) launches an assault on Raqqa, stronghold of ISIL. They predict that they will cause a number of civilian casualties in their assault, but that this is only because ISIL has chosen to operate from within a civilian area, forcing people to be “involuntary human shields”. Some think that ISIL’s responsibility for putting those civilians at risk allows the FSA to give those civilians’ lives less weight in their deliberations than would be appropriate if ISIL had not used them as human shields (Walzer 2009; Keinon 2014).

But one could also consider the following: Even if ISIL is primarily at fault for using civilians as cover, why should this mean that those civilians enjoy weaker protections against being harmed? We typically think that one should only lose or forfeit one’s rights through one’s own actions. But on this argument, civilians enjoy weaker protections against being killed through no fault or choice of their own. Some might think that more permissive standards apply for involuntary human shields because of the additional value of deterring people from taking advantage of morality in this kind of way (Smilansky 2010; Keinon 2014). But that argument seems oddly circular: we punish people for taking advantage of our moral restraint by not showing moral restraint. What’s more, this changes the act from one that foreseeably kills civilians as an unavoidable side-effect of countering the military threat to one that kills those civilians as a means to deter future abuses. This instrumentalizes them in a way that makes harming them still harder to justify.

4.5 Necessity

The foregoing considerations are all also relevant to necessity. They allow us to weigh the harms at stake, so that we can determine whether the morally weighted harm inflicted can be reduced at a reasonable cost to the agents. The basic structure of necessity is the same in bello as it is ad bellum, though obviously the same differences in substance arise as for proportionality. Some reasons apply only to in bello necessity judgements, not to ad bellum ones, because they are conditional on the background assumption that the war as a whole will continue. This means that we cannot reach judgements of the necessity of the war as a whole by simply aggregating our judgements about the individual actions that together constitute the war.

For example, in bello one of the central questions when applying the necessity principle is: how much risk to our own troops are we required to bear in order to minimize harms to the innocent? Some option can be necessary simply in virtue of the fact that it saves some of our combatants’ lives. Ad bellum, evaluating the war as a whole, we must of course consider the risk to our own combatants. But we do so in a different way—we ask whether the goods achieved by the war as a whole will justify putting our combatants at risk. We don’t then count among the goods achieved by the war the fact that multiple actions within the war will save the lives of individual combatants. We cannot count averting threats that will arise only if we decide to go to war among the goods that justify the decision to go to war.

This relates directly to the largely ignored requirement in international law that combatants must

take all feasible precautions in the choice of means and methods of attack with a view to avoiding, and in any event to minimizing, incidental loss of civilian life, injury to civilians and damage to civilian objects. (Geneva Convention, Article 57, 2(a)(ii))

This has deep moral foundations: combatants in war are morally required to reduce the risk to innocents until doing so further would involve an unreasonably high cost to them, which they cannot be required to bear. Working out when that point is reached involves thinking through: soldiers’ role-obligations to assume risks; the difference between doing harm to civilians and allowing it to happen to oneself or one’s comrades-in-arms; the importance of associative duties to protect one’s comrades; and all the considerations already adduced in favour of Moral Distinction. This calculus is very hard to perform. My own view is that combatants ought to give significant priority to the lives of civilians (Walzer and Margalit 2009; McMahan 2010b). This is in stark contrast to existing practice (Luban 2014).

5. The Future of Just War Theory

Much recent work has used either traditionalist or revisionist just war theory to consider new developments in the practice of warfare, especially the use of drones, and the possible development of autonomous weapons systems. Others have focused on the ethics of non-state conflicts, and asymmetric wars. Very few contemporary wars fit the nation-state model of the mid-twentieth century, and conflicts involving non-state actors raise interesting questions for legitimate authority and the principle of Discrimination in particular (Parry 2016). A third development, provoked by the terrible failure to plan ahead in Iraq and Afghanistan, is the wave of reflection on the aftermath of war. This topic, jus post bellum, is addressed separately.

As to the philosophical foundations of just war theory: the traditionalist and revisionist positions are now well staked out. But the really interesting questions that remain to be answered should be approached without thinking in terms of that split. Most notably, political philosophers may have something more to contribute to the just war theory debate. It would be interesting, too, to think with a more open mind about the institutions of international law (nobody has yet vindicated the claim that the law of armed conflict has authority, for example), and also about the role of the military within nation-states, outside of wartime (Ryan 2016).

The collective dimensions of warfare could be more fully explored. Several philosophers have considered how soldiers “act together” when they fight (Zohar 1993; Kutz 2005; Bazargan 2013). But few have reflected on whether group agency is present and morally relevant in war. And yet it is superficially very natural to discuss wars in these terms, especially in evaluating the war as a whole. When the British parliament debated in late 2015 whether to join the war against ISIL in Syria and Iraq, undoubtedly each MP was thinking also about what she ought to do. But most of them were asking themselves what the United Kingdom ought to do. This group action might be wholly reducible to the individual actions of which it is composed. But this still raises interesting questions: in particular, how should I justify my actions, as an individual who is acting on behalf of the group? Must I appeal only to reasons that apply to me? Or can I act on reasons that apply to the group’s other members or to the group as a whole? And can I assess the permissibility of my actions without assessing the group action of which they are part? Despite the prominence of collectivist thinking in war, discussion of war’s group morality is very much in its infancy.


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Other Internet Resources


Many thanks to Thomas Pogge for his comments on this entry, which were a great benefit throughout. This entry draws on all my work in just war theory, and so I owe a great debt to the many philosophers who have contributed so much to my understanding of these issues, both in their published work and in conversation. Most of the people in the bibliography deserve a mention, but I reserve particular thanks for Henry Shue, Jeff McMahan, and David Rodin, for setting me on this path.

Copyright © 2016 by
Seth Lazar <seth.lazar@anu.edu.au>

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