War

First published Fri Feb 4, 2000; substantive revision Thu Jul 28, 2005

War should be understood as an actual, intentional and widespread armed conflict between political communities. Thus, fisticuffs between individual persons do not count as a war, nor does a gang fight, nor does a feud on the order of the Hatfields versus the McCoys. War is a phenomenon which occurs only between political communities, defined as those entities which either are states or intend to become states (in order to allow for civil war). Classical war is international war, a war between different states, like the two World Wars. But just as frequent is war within a state between rival groups or communities, like the American Civil War. Certain political pressure groups, like terrorist organizations, might also be considered “political communities,” in that they are associations of people with a political purpose and, indeed, many of them aspire to statehood or to influence the development of statehood in certain lands.

What's statehood? Most people follow Max Weber's distinction between nation and state. A nation is a group which thinks of itself as “a people,” usually because they share many things in common, such as ethnicity, language, culture, historical experience, a set of ideals and values, habitat, cuisine, fashion and so on. The state, by contrast, refers much more narrowly to the machinery of government which organizes life in a given territory. Thus, we can distinguish between the American state and the American people, or between the government of France and the French nation. At the same time, you've probably heard the term “nation-state.” Indeed, people often use “nation” and “state” interchangeably but we'll need to keep them conceptually distinct for our purposes. “Nation-state” refers to the relatively recent phenomenon wherein a nation wants its own state, and moves to form one. This started out as a very European trend—an Italian state for the Italian nation, a German state for the German people, etc., but it has spread throughout the world. Note that in some countries, such as America, Australia and Canada, the state actually presides over many nations, and you hear of “multi-national societies.” Most societies with heavy immigration are multi-national. Multi-national countries are sometimes prone to civil wars between the different groups. This has been especially true of central Africa in recent years, as different peoples struggle over control of the one state, or else move to separate themselves from the existing arrangement (itself often having been put in place by distant imperial powers insensitive to local group and ethnic differences).

All these distinctions will come in handy as we proceed. For now, we note how central the issue of statehood is to the essence of warfare. Indeed, it seems that all warfare is precisely, and ultimately, about governance. War is a violent way for determining who gets to say what goes on in a given territory, for example, regarding: who gets power, who gets wealth and resources, whose ideals prevail, who is a member and who is not, which laws get made, what gets taught in schools, where the border rests, how much tax is levied, and so on. War is the ultimate means for deciding these issues if a peaceful process or resolution can't be agreed upon.

The mere threat of war, and the presence of mutual disdain between political communities, do not suffice as indicators of war. The conflict of arms must be actual, and not merely latent, for it to count as war. Further, the actual armed conflict must be both intentional and widespread: isolated clashes between rogue officers, or border patrols, do not count as actions of war. The onset of war requires a conscious commitment, and a significant mobilization, on the part of the belligerents in question. There's no real war, so to speak, until the fighters intend to go to war and until they do so with a heavy quantum of force.

Let us here cite, by way of support, the views of the one and only (so-called) “philosopher of war,” Carl von Clausewitz. Clausewitz famously suggested that war is “the continuation of policy by other means.” Surely, as a description, this conception is both powerful and plausible: war is about governance, using violence instead of peaceful measures to resolve policy (which organizes life in a land). This notion fits in nicely with Clausewitz's own general definition of war as “an act of violence intended to compel our opponent to fulfil our will.” War, he says, is like a duel, but on “an extensive scale.” As Michael Gelven has written more recently, war is intrinsically vast, communal (or political) and violent. It is an actual, widespread and deliberate armed conflict between political communities, motivated by a sharp disagreement over governance. In fact, we might say that Clausewitz was right, but not quite deep enough: it's not just that war is the continuation of policy by other means; it's that war is about the very thing which creates policy—i.e., governance itself. War is the intentional use of mass force to resolve disputes over governance. War is, indeed, governance by bludgeon. Ultimately, war is profoundly anthropological: it is about which group of people gets to say what goes on in a given territory.

War is a brutal and ugly enterprise. Yet it remains central to human history and social change. These two facts together might seem paradoxical and inexplicable, or they might reveal deeply disturbing facets of the human character (notably, a drive for dominance over others). What is certainly true, in any event, is that war and its threat continue to be forces in our lives. Recent events graphically demonstrate this proposition, whether we think of the 9-11 attacks, the counter-attack on Afghanistan, the overthrow of Iraq's Saddam Hussein, the Darfur crisis in Sudan, the bombings in Madrid and London, or the on-going “war on terror” more generally. We all had high hopes going into the new millennium in 2000; alas, this new century has already been savagely scarred with warfare.

War's violent nature, and controversial social effects, raise troubling moral questions for any thoughtful person. Is war always wrong? Might there be situations when it can be a justified, or even a smart, thing to do? Will war always be part of human experience, or can we do something to make it disappear? Is war an outcome of unchangeable human nature or, rather, of changeable social practice? Is there a fair and sensible way to wage war, or is it all hopeless, barbaric slaughter? When wars end, how should post-war reconstruction proceed, and who should be in charge? What are our rights, and responsibilities, when our own society makes the move to go to war?

1. The Ethics of War and Peace

Three traditions of thought dominate the ethics of war and peace: Realism; Pacifism; and Just War Theory (and, through just war theory, International Law). Perhaps there are other possible perspectives but it seems that very few theories on the ethics of war succeed in resisting ultimate classification into one of these traditions. They are clearly hegemonic in this regard.

Before discussing the central elements of each tradition, let's declare the basic conceptual differences between “the big three” perspectives. The core, and controversial, proposition of just war theory is that, sometimes, states can have moral justification for resorting to armed force. War is sometimes, but of course not all the time, morally right. The idea here is not that the war in question is merely politically shrewd, or prudent, or bold and daring, but fully moral, just. It is an ethically appropriate use of mass political violence. World War II, on the Allied side, is always trotted out as the definitive example of a just and good war. Realism, by contrast, sports a profound skepticism about the application of moral concepts, such as justice, to the key problems of foreign policy. Power and national security, realists claim, motivate states during wartime and thus moral appeals are strictly wishful thinking. Talk of the morality of warfare is pure bunk: ethics has got nothing to do with the rough-and-tumble world of global politics, where only the strong and cunning survive. A country should tend to its vital interests in security, influence over others, and economic growth—and not to moral ideals. Pacifism does not share realism's moral skepticism. For the pacifist, moral concepts can indeed be applied fruitfully to international affairs. It does make sense to ask whether a war is just: that is an important and meaningful issue. But the result of such normative application, in the case of war, is always that war should not be undertaken. Where just war theory is sometimes permissive with regard to war, pacifism is always prohibitive. For the pacifist, war is always wrong; there's always some better resolution to the problem than fighting. Now let's turn to the elements of each of these three traditions.

2. Just War Theory

Just war theory is probably the most influential perspective on the ethics of war and peace. The just war tradition has enjoyed a long and distinguished pedigree, including such notables as Augustine, Aquinas, Grotius, Suarez, Vattel and Vitoria. Hugo Grotius is probably the most comprehensive and formidable classical member of the tradition; James T. Johnson is the authoritative historian of this tradition; and many recognize Michael Walzer as the dean of contemporary just war theorists. Many credit Augustine with the founding of just war theory but this is incomplete. As Johnson notes, in its origins just war theory is a synthesis of classical Greco-Roman, as well as Christian, values. If we have to “name names”, the founders of just war theory are probably the triad of Aristotle, Cicero and Augustine. Many of the rules developed by the just war tradition have since been codified into contemporary international laws governing armed conflict, such as The United Nations Charter and The Hague and Geneva Conventions. The tradition has thus been doubly influential, dominating both moral and legal discourse surrounding war. It sets the tone, and the parameters, for the great debate.

Just war theory can be meaningfully divided into three parts, which in the literature are referred to, for the sake of convenience, in Latin. These parts are: 1) jus ad bellum, which concerns the justice of resorting to war in the first place; 2) jus in bello, which concerns the justice of conduct within war, after it has begun; and 3) jus post bellum, which concerns the justice of peace agreements and the termination phase of war.

2.1 Jus ad bellum

The rules of jus ad bellum are addressed, first and foremost, to heads of state. Since political leaders are the ones who inaugurate wars, setting their armed forces in motion, they are to be held accountable to jus ad bellum principles. If they fail in that responsibility, then they commit war crimes. In the language of the Nuremberg prosecutors, aggressive leaders who launch unjust wars commit “crimes against peace.” What constitutes a just or unjust resort to armed force is disclosed to us by the rules of jus ad bellum. Just war theory contends that, for any resort to war to be justified, a political community, or state, must fulfil each and every one of the following six requirements:

1. Just cause. This is clearly the most important rule; it sets the tone for everything which follows. A state may launch a war only for the right reason. The just causes most frequently mentioned include: self-defence from external attack; the defence of others from such; the protection of innocents from brutal, aggressive regimes; and punishment for a grievous wrongdoing which remains uncorrected. Vitoria suggested that all the just causes be subsumed under the one category of “a wrong received.” Walzer, and most modern just war theorists, speak of the one just cause for resorting to war being the resistance of aggression. Aggression is the use of armed force in violation of someone else's basic rights.

The basic rights of two kinds of entity are involved here: those of states; and those of their individual citizens. International law affirms that states have many rights, notably those to political sovereignty and territorial integrity. It thus affirms that aggression involves the use of armed forces—armies, navies, air forces, marines, missiles—in violation of these rights. Classic cases would be Nazi Germany into Poland in 1939, and Iraq into Kuwait in 1990, wherein the aggressor used its armed forces to invade the territory of the victim, overthrow its government and establish a new regime in its place. Crucially, the commission of aggression causes the aggressor to forfeit its own state rights, thereby permitting violent resistance. An aggressor has no right not to be warred against in defence; indeed, it has the duty to stop its rights-violating aggression.

But why do states have rights? The only respectable answer seems to be that they need these rights to protect their people and to help provide them with the objects of their human rights. As John Locke, and the U.S. Founding Fathers, declared: governments are instituted among people to realize the basic rights of those people. If governments do so, they are legitimate; if not, they have neither right nor reason to exist. This is vital: from the moral point of view, only legitimate governments have rights, including those to go to war. We need a theory of legitimate governance to ground just war theory, and Aquinas perhaps saw this more clearly than any classical member of the tradition. This connection to legitimacy is consistent with the perspective on war offered so far: war, at its heart, is a violent clash over how a territory and its people are to be governed.

Based on international law (see Roth), it seems like there are three basic criteria for a legitimate government. If these conditions are met, the state in question has rights to govern and to be left in peace. They are as follows. First, the state is recognized as legitimate by its own people and by the international community. There is an uncoerced general peace and order within that society, and the state is not shunned as a pariah by the rest of the world. Second, the state avoids violating the rights of other legitimate states. In particular, legitimate governments don't commit aggression against other societies. Finally, legitimate states make every reasonable effort to satisfy the human rights of their own citizens, notably those to life, liberty and subsistence. States failing any of these criteria have no right to govern or to go to war. We can speak of states satisfying these criteria as legitimate, or “minimally just,” political communities.

Why do we need to talk about these rights? First, to give state rights moral legitimacy and to avoid fetishizing state rights for their own sake. Second, to describe what is wrong about aggression and why it justifies war in response. Aggression is so serious because it involves the infliction of physical force in violation of the most elemental entitlements people and their communities have: to survive; to be physically secure; to have enough resources to subsist at all; to live in peace; and to choose for themselves their own lives and societies. Aggression thus attacks the very spine of human civilization itself. This is what makes it permissible to resist with means as severe as war, provided the other jus ad bellum criteria are also met. Third, talk of legitimacy is essential for explaining justice in a civil war, wherein there isn't classical, cross-border aggression between competing countries but, rather, a vicious fight over the one state between rival communities within a formerly united society. The key to discerning morality in such cases revolves around the idea of legitimacy: which, if any, side has minimal justice? Which side is defending—or is seeking to establish—a legitimate political structure in our three-fold sense? That's the side which it is permissible to: a) be part of; or b) if you're an outsider, to support.

How does this conception of just cause impact on the issue of armed humanitarian intervention? This is when a state does not commit cross-border aggression but, for whatever reason, turns savagely against its own people, deploying armed force in a series of massacres against large numbers of its own citizens. Such events happened in Cambodia and Uganda in the 1970s, Rwanda in 1994, Serbia/Kosovo in 1998-9 and in Sudan/Darfur from 2004 to the present. Our definitions allow us to say it's permissible to intervene on behalf of the victims, and to attack with defensive force the rogue regime meting out such death and destruction. Why? There's no logical requirement that aggression can only be committed across borders. Aggression is the use of armed force in violation of someone else's basic rights. That “someone else” might be: a) another person (violent crime); b) another state (international or “external” aggression); or c) many other people within one's own community (domestic or “internal” aggression). The commission of aggression, in any of these forms, causes the aggressor to forfeit its rights. The aggressor has no right not to be resisted with defensive force; indeed, the aggressor has the duty to stop and submit itself to punishment. If the aggressor doesn't stop, it is entirely permissible for its victims to resort to force to protect themselves—and for anyone else to do likewise in aid of the victims. Usually, in humanitarian intervention, armed aid from the international community is essential for an effective resistance against the aggression, since domestic populations are at a huge disadvantage, and are massively vulnerable, to the violence of their own state.

Terrorists can commit aggression too. There's nothing to the concept which excludes this: they, too, can deploy armed force in violation of someone else's basic rights. When they do so, they forfeit any right not to suffer the consequences of receiving defensive force in response. Indeed, terrorists almost always commit aggression when they act, since terrorism is precisely the use of random violence—especially killing force—against civilians, with the intent of spreading fear throughout a population, hoping this fear will advance a political objective. On 9/11, the al-Qaeda terrorist group clearly used armed force, both to gain control of the planes and then again when using the planes as missiles against the targets in The Pentagon and The World Trade Center. This use of armed force was in violation of America's state rights to political sovereignty and territorial integrity, and to all those people's human rights to life and liberty. The terrorist strikes on 9/11 were aggression—defiantly so, deliberately modelled after Pearl Harbor. As such, they justified the responding attack on the Taliban regime in Afghanistan. The Taliban had sponsored and enabled al-Qaeda's attack, by providing resources, personnel and a safe haven to the terrorist group.

An important issue in just cause is whether, to be justified in going to war, one must wait for the aggression actually to happen, or whether in some instances it is permissible to launch a pre-emptive strike against anticipated aggression. The tradition is severely split on this issue. Vitoria said you must wait, since it would be absurd to “punish someone for an offense they have yet to commit.” Others, like Walzer, strive to define the exceptional criteria, stressing: the seriousness of the anticipated aggression; the kind and quality of evidence required; the speed with which one must decide; and the issue of fairness and the duty to protect one's people. If one knows a terrible attack is coming soon, one owes it to one's people to shift from defense to offense. The best defense, as they say, is a good offense. Why let the aggressor have the upper hand of the first strike? But that's the very issue: can you attack first and not, thereby, yourself become the aggressor? Can striking first still be considered an act of defence from aggression? International law, for its part, sweepingly forbids pre-emptive strikes unless they are clearly authorized in advance by the UN Security Council. These issues, of course, were highlighted in the run-up to the 2003 U.S.-led pre-emptive strike on Iraq. The U.S. still maintains, in its National Security Strategy, the right to strike first as part of its war on terror. Many other countries find this extremely controversial.

2. Right intention. A state must intend to fight the war only for the sake of its just cause. Having the right reason for launching a war is not enough: the actual motivation behind the resort to war must also be morally appropriate. Ulterior motives, such as a power or land grab, or irrational motives, such as revenge or ethnic hatred, are ruled out. The only right intention allowed is to see the just cause for resorting to war secured and consolidated. If another intention crowds in, moral corruption sets in. International law does not include this rule, probably because of the evidentiary difficulties involved in determining a state's intent.

3. Proper authority and public declaration. A state may go to war only if the decision has been made by the appropriate authorities, according to the proper process, and made public, notably to its own citizens and to the enemy state(s). The “appropriate authority” is usually specified in that country's constitution. States failing the requirements of minimal justice lack the legitimacy to go to war.

4. Last Resort. A state may resort to war only if it has exhausted all plausible, peaceful alternatives to resolving the conflict in question, in particular diplomatic negotiation. One wants to make sure something as momentous and serious as war is declared only when it seems the last practical and reasonable shot at effectively resisting aggression.

5. Probability of Success. A state may not resort to war if it can foresee that doing so will have no measurable impact on the situation. The aim here is to block mass violence which is going to be futile. International law does not include this requirement, as it is seen as biased against small, weaker states.

6. Proportionality. A state must, prior to initiating a war, weigh the universal goods expected to result from it, such as securing the just cause, against the universal evils expected to result, notably casualties. Only if the benefits are proportional to, or “worth”, the costs may the war action proceed. (The universal must be stressed, since often in war states only tally their own expected benefits and costs, radically discounting those accruing to the enemy and to any innocent third parties.)

Just war theory insists all six criteria must each be fulfilled for a particular declaration of war to be justified: it's all or no justification, so to speak. Just war theory is thus quite demanding, as of course it should be, given the gravity of its subject matter. It is important to note that the first three of these six rules are what we might call deontological requirements, otherwise known as duty-based requirements or first-principle requirements. For a war to be just, some core duty must be violated: in this case, the duty not to commit aggression. A war in punishment of this violated duty must itself respect further duties: it must be appropriately motivated, and must be publicly declared by (only) the proper authority for doing so. The next three requirements are consequentialist: given that these first principle requirements have been met, we must also consider the expected consequences of launching a war. Thus, just war theory attempts to provide a common sensical combination of both deontology and consequentialism as applied to the issue of war.

2.2 Jus in bello

Jus in bello refers to justice in war, to right conduct in the midst of battle. Responsibility for state adherence to jus in bello norms falls primarily on the shoulders of those military commanders, officers and soldiers who formulate and execute the war policy of a particular state. They are to be held responsible for any breach of the principles which follow below. Such accountability may involve being put on trial for war crimes, whether by one's own national military justice system or perhaps by the newly-formed International Criminal Court (created by the 1998 Treaty of Rome).

We need to distinguish between external and internal jus in bello. External, or traditional, jus in bello concerns the rules a state should observe regarding the enemy and its armed forces. Internal jus in bello concerns the rules a state must follow in connection with its own people as it fights war against an external enemy.

There are several rules of external jus in bello:

1. Obey all international laws on weapons prohibition. Chemical and biological weapons, in particular, are forbidden by many treaties. Nuclear weapons aren't so clearly prohibited but it seems fair to say a huge taboo attaches to such weapons and any use of them would be greeted with incredible hostility by the international community.

2. Discrimination and Non-Combatant Immunity. Soldiers are only entitled to use their (non-prohibited) weapons to target those who are, in Walzer's words, “engaged in harm.” Thus, when they take aim, soldiers must discriminate between the civilian population, which is morally immune from direct and intentional attack, and those legitimate military, political and industrial targets involved in rights-violating harm. While some collateral civilian casualties are excusable, it is wrong to take deliberate aim at civilian targets. An example would be saturation bombing of residential areas. (It is worth noting that almost all wars since 1900 have featured larger civilian, than military, casualties. Perhaps this is one reason why this rule is the most frequently and stridently codified rule in all the laws of armed conflict, as international law seeks to protect unarmed civilians as best it can.)

3. Proportionality. Soldiers may only use force proportional to the end they seek. They must restrain their force to that amount appropriate to achieving their aim or target. Weapons of mass destruction, for example, are usually seen as being out of proportion to legitimate military ends.

4. Benevolent quarantine for prisoners of war (POWs). If enemy soldiers surrender and become captives, they cease being lethal threats to basic rights. They are no longer “engaged in harm.” Thus it is wrong to target them with death, starvation, rape, torture, medical experimentation, and so on. They are to be provided, as The Geneva Conventions spell out, with benevolent—not malevolent—quarantine away from battle zones and until the war ends, when they should be exchanged for one's own POWs. Do terrorists deserve such protection, too? Great controversy surrounds the detainment and aggressive questioning of terrorist suspects held by the U.S. at jails in Cuba, Iraq and Pakistan in the name of the war on terror.

5. No Means Mala in Se. Soldiers may not use weapons or methods which are “evil in themselves.” These include: mass rape campaigns; genocide or ethnic cleansing; using poison or treachery (like disguising soldiers to look like the Red Cross); forcing captured soldiers to fight against their own side; and using weapons whose effects cannot be controlled, like biological agents.

6. No reprisals. A reprisal is when country A violates jus in bello in war with country B. Country B then retaliates with its own violation of jus in bello, seeking to chasten A into obeying the rules. There are strong moral and evidentiary reasons to believe that reprisals don't work, and they instead serve to escalate death and make the destruction of war increasingly indiscriminate. Winning well is the best revenge.

Internal jus in bello essentially boils down to the need for a state, even though it's involved in a war, nevertheless to still respect the human rights of its own citizens as best it can during the crisis. The following issues arise: is it just to impose conscription, or press censorship? Can one curtail traditional civil liberties, and due process protections, for perceived gains in national security? Should elections be cancelled or post-poned? May soldiers disobey orders, e.g. refuse to fight in wars they believe unjust? A comprehensive theory of wartime justice must include consideration of them, and not merely focus on what one may do to the enemy. For some of the worst atrocities in wartime have occurred within, and not between, national borders. Some states, historically, have used the cloak of war with foreign powers to engage in massive internal human rights violations, usually against some disfavoured group. Other states, which are otherwise decent, panic amidst the wartime situation and impose emergency legislation which turns out to have been complete overkill, and which they later regret and view as the product of fear rather than reason.

2.3 Jus post bellum

Jus post bellum refers to justice during the third and final stage of war: that of war termination. It seeks to regulate the ending of wars, and to ease the transition from war back to peace. There is little international law here—save occupation law and perhaps the human rights treaties—and so we must turn to the moral resources of just war theory. But even here the theory has not dealt with jus post bellum to the degree it should. There is a newness, unsettledness and controversy attaching to this important topic. To focus our thoughts, consider the following proposed principles for jus post bellum:

1. Proportionality and Publicity. The peace settlement should be measured and reasonable, as well as publicly proclaimed. To make a settlement serve as an instrument of revenge is to make a volatile bed one may be forced to sleep in later. In general, this rules out insistence on unconditional surrender.

2. Rights Vindication. The settlement should secure those basic rights whose violation triggered the justified war. The relevant rights include human rights to life and liberty and community entitlements to territory and sovereignty. This is the main substantive goal of any decent settlement, ensuring that the war will actually have an improving affect. Respect for rights, after all, is a foundation of civilization, whether national or international. Vindicating rights, not vindictive revenge, is the order of the day.

3. Discrimination. Distinction needs to be made between the leaders, the soldiers, and the civilians in the defeated country one is negotiating with. Civilians are entitled to reasonable immunity from punitive post-war measures. This rules out sweeping socio-economic sanctions as part of post-war punishment.

4. Punishment #1. When the defeated country has been a blatant, rights-violating aggressor, proportionate punishment must be meted out. The leaders of the regime, in particular, should face fair and public international trials for war crimes.

5. Punishment #2. Soldiers also commit war crimes. Justice after war requires that such soldiers, from all sides to the conflict, likewise be held accountable to investigation and possible trial.

6. Compensation. Financial restitution may be mandated, subject to both proportionality and discrimination. A post-war poll tax on civilians is generally impermissible, and there needs to be enough resources left so that the defeated country can begin its own reconstruction. To beggar thy neighbor is to pick future fights.

7. Rehabilitation. The post-war environment provides a promising opportunity to reform decrepit institutions in an aggressor regime. Such reforms are permissible but they must be proportional to the degree of depravity in the regime. They may involve: demilitarization and disarmament; police and judicial re-training; human rights education; and even deep structural transformation towards a minimally just society governed by a legitimate regime. This is, obviously, the most controversial aspect of jus post bellum.

The terms of a just peace should satisfy all these requirements. There needs, in short, to be an ethical “exit strategy” from war, and it deserves at least as much thought and effort as the purely military exit strategy so much on the minds of policy planners and commanding officers.

Any serious defection, by any participant, from these principles of just war settlement should be seen as a violation of the rules of just war termination, and so should be punished. At the least, violation of such principles mandates a new round of diplomatic negotiations—even binding international arbitration—between the relevant parties to the dispute. At the very most, such violation may give the aggrieved party a just cause—but no more than a just cause—for resuming hostilities. Full recourse to the resumption of hostilities may be made only if all the other traditional criteria of jus ad bellum—proportionality, last resort, etc.—are satisfied in addition to just cause.

Perhaps a few additional thoughts on coercive regime change should here be added, in light of controversial recent events, especially in Afghanistan and Iraq. Can coercive regime change ever be justified, or is it essentially an act of imperialism? In my view, forcible post-war regime change can be permissible provided: 1) the war itself was just and conducted properly; 2) the target regime was illegitimate, thus forfeiting its state rights; 3) the goal of the reconstruction is a minimally just regime; and 4) respect for jus in bello and human rights is integral to the transformation process itself. The permission is then granted because the transformation: 1) violates neither state nor human rights; 2) its expected consequences are very desirable, namely, satisfied human rights for the local population and increased international peace and security for everyone; and 3) the post-war moment is especially promising regarding the possibilities for reform. And the transformation will be successful when there's: 1) a stable new regime; 2) run entirely by locals; which is 3) minimally just. There is extensive historical evidence that this kind of success probably takes from 8 to 12 years to achieve (essentially, a decade). Note that successful, rights-respecting coercive regime change can be done, contrary to some pessimistic views; it was actually done in Germany and Japan from 1945-55, and so it is neither conceptually nor empirically impossible. It's very difficult, to be sure—and, in some cases, it's not a wise thing to do—but it's not literally impossible.

A review of the literature suggests something of a 10-point recipe for transforming a defeated aggressive regime into one which is minimally just:

  • Adhere diligently to the laws of war during the regime take-down and occupation.
  • Purge much of the old regime, and prosecute its war criminals.
  • Disarm and demilitarize the society.
  • Provide effective military and police security for the whole country.
  • Work with a cross-section of locals on a new, rights-respecting constitution which features checks and balances.
  • Allow other, non-state associations, or “civil society”, to flourish.
  • Forego compensation and sanctions in favour of investing in and re-building the economy.
  • If necessary, re-vamp educational curricula to purge past poisonous propaganda and cement new and better values.
  • Ensure, in a timely fashion, that the benefits of the new order will be: 1) concrete; and 2) widely, and not narrowly, distributed. The bulk of the population must feel their lives after the regime change are clearly better than their former lives for the change to be sustainable.
  • Follow an orderly, not-too-hasty exit strategy when the new regime can stand on its own two feet. Again, this will probably take a decade of intensive effort.

To summarize this whole section, just war theory offers rules to guide decision-makers on the appropriateness of their conduct during the resort to war, conduct during war and the termination phase of the conflict. Its over-all aim is to try and ensure that wars are begun only for a very narrow set of truly defensible reasons, that when wars break out they are fought in a responsibly controlled and targeted manner, and that the parties to the dispute bring their war to an end in a speedy and responsible fashion that respects the requirements of justice.

3. Realism

Realism is most influential amongst political scientists, as well as scholars and practitioners of international relations. While realism is a complex and often sophisticated doctrine, its core propositions express a strong suspicion about applying moral concepts, like justice, to the conduct of international affairs. Realists believe that moral concepts should be employed neither as descriptions of, nor as prescriptions for, state behaviour on the international plane. Realists emphasize power and security issues, the need for a state to maximize its expected self-interest and, above all, their view of the international arena as a kind of anarchy, in which the will to power enjoys primacy.

Referring specifically to war, realists believe that it is an inevitable part of an anarchical world system; that it ought to be resorted to only if it makes sense in terms of national self-interest; and that, once war has begun, a state ought to do whatever it can to win. In other words, “all's fair in love and war.” During the grim circumstances of war, “anything goes.” So if adhering to the rules of just war theory, or international law, hinders a state during wartime, it should disregard them and stick steadfastly to its fundamental interests in power, security and economic growth. Prominent classical realists include Thucydides, Machiavelli and Hobbes. Modern realists include Hans Morgenthau, George Kennan, Reinhold Niebuhr and Henry Kissinger, as well as so-called neo-realists, such as Kenneth Waltz.

It is important to distinguish between descriptive and prescriptive realism. Descriptive realism is the claim that states, as a matter of fact, either do not (for reasons of motivation) or cannot (for reasons of competitive struggle) behave morally, and thus moral discourse surrounding interstate conflict is empty, the product of a category mistake. States are simply not animated in terms of morality and justice: it's all about power, security and national interest for them. States are not like “big persons”: they are creations of an utterly different kind, and we cannot expect them to live by the same rules and principles we require of individual persons, especially those in peaceful, developed societies. Morality is a luxury states can't afford, for they inhabit a violent international arena, and they've got to be able to get in that game and win, if they are to serve and protect their citizens in an effective way over time. Morality is simply not on the radar screen for states, given their defensive function and the brutal environment in which they subsist.

Walzer offers arguments against this kind of realism, contending that states are in fact responsive to moral concerns, even when they fail to live up to them. States, because they are the creation of individual persons, want to act morally and justly: it could not be otherwise. Walzer goes so far as to say that any state which was motivated by nothing more than the struggle to survive and win power could not over time sustain the support from its own population, which demands a deeper sense of community and justice. He also argues that all the pretence regarding “the necessity” of state conduct in terms of pursuing power is exaggerated and rhetorical, ignoring the clear reality of foreign policy choice enjoyed by states in the global arena. States are not frequently forced into some kind of dramatic, do-or-die struggle: the choice to go to war is a deliberate one, freely entered into and often hotly debated and agonized over before the decision is made. And this is leaving unspoken the argument regarding the defiant, Machiavellian amorality behind certain kinds of realism, and the moral calibre of the actions it might recommend on this basis. For example, if it's all about power and winning in the competitive struggle, does that make it alright to unleash weapons of mass destruction? Or to launch a mass rape campaign? Commit genocide and just get rid of those bastards? Just war theory suggests not, and just war theorists like Walzer want to claim that the rest of us agree.

Prescriptive realism, though, need not be rooted in any form of descriptive realism. Prescriptive realism is the claim that a state ought (prudential “ought”) to behave amorally in the international arena. A state should, for prudence's sake, adhere to an amoral policy of smart self-regard in international affairs. A smart state will leave its morality at home when considering what to do on the international stage. Why? Because if it's too moral, it will be exploited by other states more ruthless. Nice guys finish last. Or, a moralized and moralizing state will offend other communities, whose communities sport different values. Better to stick to the sober calculus of national interests and leave ethics out of it.

It's important to note that a prescriptive realist might, in the end, actually endorse rules for the regulation of warfare, much like those offered by just war theory. These rules include: “Wars should only be fought in response to aggression”; and “During war, non-combatants should not be directly targeted with lethal violence.” Of course, the reason why a prescriptive realist might endorse such rules would be very different from the reasons offered by the just war theorist: the latter would talk about abiding moral values whereas the former would refer to useful rules which help establish expectations of behaviour, solve coordination problems and to which prudent bargainers would consent. Just war rules, the prescriptive realist might claim, do not have independent moral purchase on the attention of states. These rules are what Douglas Lackey calls “salient equilibria”, stable conventions limiting war's destructiveness which all prudent states can agree on, assuming general compliance. There might even be some room for overlap between this kind of realism and just war theory.

4. Pacifism

It seems best to rely on Jenny Teichman's definition of pacifism as “anti-war-ism.” Literally and straightforwardly, a pacifist rejects war in favour of peace. It is not violence in all its forms that the most challenging kind of pacifist objects to; rather, it is the specific kind and degree of violence that war involves which the pacifist objects to. A pacifist objects to killing (not just violence) in general and, in particular, she objects to the mass killing, for political reasons, which is part and parcel of the wartime experience. So, a pacifist rejects war; she believes that there are no moral grounds which can justify resorting to war. War, for the pacifist, is always wrong.

Mention should straight away be made of a very popular just war criticism of pacifism which will not be used here. This criticism is that pacifism amounts to an indefensible “clean hands policy.” The pacifist, it is said, refuses to take the brutal measures necessary for the defense of himself and his country, for the sake of maintaining his own inner moral purity. It is contended that the pacifist is thus a kind of free-rider, gathering all the benefits of citizenship while not sharing all its burdens. Another inference drawn is that the pacifist himself constitutes a kind of internal threat to the over-all security of his state.

This “clean hands” argument is easily, and frequently, over-stated. It is important to note that, to the extent to which any moral stance will commend a certain set of actions or intentions deemed morally worthy, and condemn others as being reprehensible, the “clean hands” criticism is so malleable as to apply to nearly any substantive doctrine. Every moral and political theory stipulates that one ought to do what it deems good or just and to avoid what it deems bad or unjust. So this popular just war criticism of pacifism is not strong. The very idea of a selfish pacifist simply does not ring true: many pacifists have, historically, paid a very high price for their pacifism during wartime (through severe ostracism and even jail time) and their pacifism seems less rooted in regard for inner moral purity than it is in regard for constructing a less violent and more humane world order. So, this argument against pacifism fails; but what of others?

Walzer contends that pacifism's idealism is excessively optimistic. In other words, pacifism lacks realism. More precisely, the nonviolent world imagined by the pacifist is not actually attainable, at least for the foreseeable future. Since “ought implies can”, the set of “oughts” we are committed to must express a moral outlook on war less utopian in nature. While we are committed to morality in wartime, we are forced to concede that, sometimes in the real world, resorting to war can be morally justified. It's hard to see, e.g., how anything but war could've defeated the Nazis.

Another objection to pacifism is that, by failing to resist international aggression with effective means, it ends up rewarding aggression and failing to protect people who need it. Pacifists reply to this argument by contending that we do not need to resort to war in order to protect people and punish aggression effectively. In the event of an armed invasion by an aggressor state, an organized and committed campaign of non-violent civil disobedience—perhaps combined with international diplomatic and economic sanctions—would be just as effective as war in expelling the aggressor, with much less destruction of lives and property. After all, the pacifist might say, no invader could possibly maintain its grip on the conquered nation in light of such systematic isolation, non-cooperation and non-violent resistance. How could it work the factories, harvest the fields, or run the stores, when everyone would be striking? How could it maintain the will to keep the country in the face of crippling economic sanctions and diplomatic censure from the international community? And so on.

Though one cannot exactly disprove this pacifist proposition—since it is a counter-factual thesis—there are powerful reasons to agree with John Rawls that such is “an unworldly view” to hold. For, as Walzer points out, the effectiveness of this campaign of civil disobedience relies on the scruples of the invading aggressor. But what if the aggressor is utterly brutal, remorseless? What if, faced with civil disobedience, the invader “cleanses” the area of the native population, and then imports its own people from back home? What if, faced with economic sanctions and diplomatic censure from a neighbouring country, the invader decides to invade it, too? We have some indication from history, particularly that of Nazi Germany, that such pitiless tactics are effective at breaking the will to resist of even very principled people. The defence of our lives and rights may well, against such invaders, require the use of political violence. Under such conditions, Walzer says, adherence to pacifism might even amount to “a disguised form of surrender.”

Pacifists respond to this accusation of “unworldliness” by citing what they believe are real world examples of effective non-violent resistance to aggression. Examples mentioned include Mahatma Ghandi's campaign to drive the British Imperial regime out of India in the late 1940s and Martin Luther King Jr.'s civil rights crusade in the 1960s on behalf of African-Americans. Walzer replies curtly that there is no evidence that non-violent resistance has ever, of itself, succeeded. This may be rash on his part, though it is clear that Britain's own exhaustion after WWII, for example, had much to do with the evaporation of its Empire. Walzer's main counter-argument against these pacifist counter-examples is that they only illustrate his main point: that effective non-violent resistance depends upon the scruples of those it is aimed against. It was only because the British and the Americans had some scruples, and were moved by the determined idealism of the non-violent protesters, that they acquiesced to their demands. But aggressors will not always be so moved. A tyrant like Hitler, for example, might interpret non-violent resistance as weakness, deserving contemptuous crushing. “Non-violent defense”, Walzer suggests, “is no defense at all against tyrants or conquerors ready to adopt such measures.”

As sensible as Walzer's remarks might seem, they remain quite narrow, by no means constituting an all-things-considered refutation of pacifism. Generally, there are two kinds of modern secular pacifism to consider: (1) a more consequentialist form of pacifism (or CP), which maintains that the benefits accruing from war can never outweigh the costs of fighting it; and (2) a more deontological form of pacifism (or DP), which contends that the very activity of war is intrinsically wrong, since it violates foremost duties of justice, such as not killing human beings. Most common amongst contemporary secular pacifists, such as Robert Holmes, is a doctrine which attempts to combine both CP and DP. (No discussion will be made here as to religious forms of pacifism. While they have been very influential historically, especially their Christian variants, as theoretical propositions I believe they rest on core premises which are too contentious and exclusionary. But the Christian pacifist literature is a very rich source of information for those interested.)

What arguments might a just war theorist employ to overcome CP and DP? A just war theorist might, for starters, focus on the relationship in CP between consequentialism and the denial of killing. Pacifism in either form places overriding value on respecting human life, notably through its injunction against killing. But this value seems to rest uneasily with consequentialism, for there is nothing inherent to consequentialism which bans killing as such. There is no absolute rule, or side-constraint, that one ought never to kill another person, or that nations ought never to deploy lethal armed force in war. With consequentialism, it's always a matter of considering the latest costs and benefits, of choosing the best option amongst feasible alternatives. Consequentialism therefore leaves conceptual space open to the claim that under these conditions, at this time and place, and given these alternatives, killing and/or war appears permissible. After all, what if killing x people (say, soldiers in an aggressive army) appears the best option if we are to save the lives of x + n people (say, fellow citizens who would perish under the brutal heel of an unchecked aggressor)? It is at least conceivable that a quick and decisive resort to war could prevent even greater killing and devastation in the future. Historians speculate, e.g., that an earlier confrontation with Hitler would've prevented World War II from ending up being so widespread and destructive. These are two telling points: CP does not, of itself, ground the categorical rejection of killing and war which is the essence of pacifism; and CP is open to counter-examples which question whether consequentialism would reject killing and war at all under certain conditions. Consequentialism might even, in a particular case, go so far as to recommend war under certain conditions.

Casting doubt on DP is a complicated procedure. Only a sketch of plausible just war theory arguments can here be offered. The first question to ask is: which foremost duty does DP understand being violated by warfare? If the DP response is the duty not to kill another human being, then contention can be made that this is by no means uncontroversial. Consider the most obvious counter-example: aggressor A attacks B for no defensible reason, posing a serious threat to B's life. Some would suggest, in good faith, that B is not duty-bound not to kill A if such seems necessary to stop A's aggression. Indeed, they would argue that B may kill A in legitimate self-defence. The DP pacifist, however, might reply that extending B moral permission to kill A, even in self-defence, violates the human rights of A. He might contend that just war theory merely compounds the wrongness of the situation by paradoxically permitting lethal force to stop lethal force. There's a clever phrase nowadays: an eye for an eye leaves us both blind.

One just war theory rejoinder to this DP contention is this: B does no wrong whatsoever—violates no human rights—by responding to A's aggression with lethal force if required. Why does B do nothing wrong? First, it is A who is responsible for forcing B to choose between her own life and rights and those of A. We can hardly blame B for choosing her own. For if she does not choose her own, she loses an enormous amount, perhaps everything. And it is patently unreasonable to expect creatures like us to suffer catastrophic loss by default. Consider also the issue of fairness: if B is not allowed to use lethal force, if necessary, against A in the event of A's aggression, then B loses everything while A loses nothing. Indeed, A gains whatever object he desired in violating or killing B. Such is an unfair reward of awful behaviour. Finally, B's having rights at all provides her with an implicit entitlement to use those means necessary to secure her rights, including the use of force in the face of a serious physical threat. These powerful considerations of responsibility, reasonableness, fairness and implicit entitlement come together in support of the just war claims that: B may respond with needed lethal force to A's initial aggression; B does no wrong in doing so; it would be wrong to prohibit B's doing so; and that A bears all of the blame for the situation. It is A who should stop, not B who should succumb.

DP pacifists are not, at this point, out of options. Holmes, for example, suggests that the foremost duty of justice violated by war is not the duty not to kill aggressors, but rather the duty not to kill innocent, non-aggressive human beings. To be innocent here means to have done nothing which would justify being harmed or killed; in particular, it means not constituting a serious threat to the lives and rights of other people. It is this sense of innocence that just war theory invokes when it claims that civilians should not be directly attacked during wartime. Even if civilians support the war effort politically, or even in terms of their personal attitudes towards the war, they clearly do not pose serious threats to others. Only armed forces, and the political-industrial-technological complexes which guide them, constitute serious threats against which threatened communities may respond in kind. Civilian populations, just war theory surmises, are morally off-limits as targets. Holmes contends that this just war (and international law) rule of non-combatant immunity can never be satisfied. For all possible wars in this world—given the nature of military technology and tactics, the heat of battle, and the limits of human knowledge and self-discipline—involve the killing of innocents, thus defined. We know this to be true from history and have no good reason for expecting otherwise in the future. But the killing of innocents, Holmes says, is always unjust. So no war can ever be fought justly, regardless of the nature of the goal sought after, such as national defence from an aggressor's attack. The very activities needed to fight wars are intrinsically corrupt, and cannot be redeemed by the supposed justice of the ends they are aimed at. How is a just war theorist to respond to this DP challenge?

Some respond by casting doubt on the concept of innocence in wartime. But a just war theorist subscribing to the rule of non-combatant immunity will neither want, nor logically be at liberty, to argue in this fashion. It is hard to see, for example, how infants could be anything other than innocent during a war, and as such entitled not to be made the object of direct and intentional attack. It is only those who, in Walzer's phrase, are “involved in harming us”—i.e. those who pose serious threats to our lives and rights—that we can justly target in a direct and intentional fashion during wartime.

The more appropriate just war response invokes, alongside Walzer, the doctrine of double effect (or DDE). The DDE, invented by Aquinas, is a complex idea. In spite of its apparent technicality, though, the DDE is closely related to our ordinary ways of thinking about moral life. The DDE assumes the following scenario: agent X is considering performing an action T, which X foresees will produce both good/moral/just effects J and bad/immoral/unjust effects U. The DDE permits X to perform T only if: 1) T is otherwise permissible; 2) X only intends J and not U; 3) U is not a means to J; and 4) the goodness of J is worth, or is proportionately greater than, the badness of U. Assume now that X is a country and T is war. The government of X, contemplating war in response to an attack by aggressor country Y, foresees that, should it embark on war to defend itself, civilian casualties will result, probably in both X and Y. The DDE stipulates that X may launch into this defensive (and thus otherwise permissible) war only if: 1) X does not intend the resulting civilian casualties but rather aims only at defending itself and its people; 2) such casualties are not themselves the means whereby X's end is achieved; and 3) the importance of X's defending itself and its people from Y's aggression is proportionately greater than the badness of the resulting civilian casualties. The DDE, in making these claims, refers to common shared principles regarding the moral importance of intent, of appealing to better expected consequences, and insisting that bad not be done so that good may follow from it.

Just war theorists claim that civilians are not entitled to absolute immunity from attack during wartime. Civilians are owed neither more nor less than what Walzer calls “due care” from the belligerent governments that they not be made casualties of the war action in question. “Due care” involves fighting only in certain ways, applying limited force to specific targets. Essentially, “due care” means fighting in adherence with jus in bello. But does this just war claim simply beg the question against the latest DP principle? DPs insist on absolute immunity for civilians, which in our world would result in banning warfare, whereas just war theorists, acknowledging the threat, seem to dodge it by re-defining the immunity to which civilians are entitled, demoting it to mere “due care.” Despite appearances, it is not question-begging but principled disagreement which roots the difference. Just war theorists will argue that civilians cannot be entitled to absolute immunity because that would outlaw all warfare. But outlawing all warfare would ignore both the responsibility for interstate aggression and the implicit entitlement of a state to use necessary means (including armed force) to secure the lives and rights of its citizens from serious and standard threats to them. In the real world, it is neither reasonable nor fair to require a political community not to avail itself of the most effective means available for resisting an aggressive invasion which threatens the lives and rights of its citizens. It is simply not reasonable to require a state to stand down while an aggressor—be it state or terrorist—wreaks havoc, murder and mayhem upon its people.

This is not a complete defeat for DP, merely a suggestion of how such defeat might be sought. DP probably constitutes the most formidable moral challenge to just war theory (whereas prescriptive realism constitutes the most formidable prudential challenge to just war theory). Suffice it for our purposes to say that the DDE is the just war principle most frequently employed to defeat the DP pacifist's assertion that it is always wrong to kill innocent human beings. Just war theorists prefer to substitute, for this DP claim, the following proposition: what is always wrong, both in peace and war, is to kill innocent human beings intentionally and deliberately. Unintended, collateral civilian casualties can be excused during the prosecution of an otherwise just war, wherein the end is the repulsion of aggression and the means are aimed at legitimate military targets.

5. Conclusion

This entry provides a sample of the rich and controversial argumentation surrounding philosophical discourse on war. This discourse is dominated by three major traditions of thought: just war theory (and its international law subsidiary); realism; and pacifism. The interaction between these three traditions structures the contemporary discussion of wartime issues, at the same time as it fuels fascinating debate about them. While just war theory occupies an especially large and influential space within the discourse, its realist and pacifist alternatives endure as provocative challenges to the philosophical mainstream which it represents.

6. Guide to the Literature

I discuss all these issues and more, with extensive reference to cases, in my forthcoming book, The Morality of War (Broadview, 2006).

All the works cited in this entry, plus relevant other works, are listed below. It may be helpful to first locate and emphasize some of the major and most influential sources.

For scholarship on the history and development of just war theory, consult the works of James T. Johnson. Hugo Grotius is often cited as the most formidable classical just war theorist (though I'd rank Vitoria up there myself). A translation of his works can be found in J. Scott's edition of Classics of International Law. The major contemporary statement of just war theory remains Michael Walzer's Just and Unjust Wars. For other comprehensive contemporary statements, see the works of: Paul Christopher; J.B. Elshtain; Michael Ignatieff; Doug Lackey; Brian Orend; and Richard Regan. Works critical of just war theory can be found in the pacifist and realist tracts below.

Other important articles on particular aspects of just war theory include: on jus ad bellum, D. Luban, “Just War and Human Rights”; on jus in bello, T. Nagel's “War and Massacre” and R. Fullinwinder's “War and Innocence”; and on jus post bellum, Kant's “Perpetual Peace” (in his Political Writings) and B. Orend's “Justice After War”.

Hans Morgenthau's Politics Among Nations remains an often-cited defense of realism, as does G. Kennan's Realities of American Foreign Policy. Henry Kissinger's Diplomacy provides the same outlook in perhaps more accessible form. Two of the most focused and effective criticisms of the realist approach to war occur at: Chapter 1 of Walzer's Just and Unjust Wars; and Chapters 1-3 of R. Holmes' On War and Morality.

The three best contemporary, secular works defending pacifism are: R. Holmes, On War and Morality; J. Teichman, Pacifism and the Just War; and R. Norman, Ethics, Killing and War. Two renowned critical essays on pacifism, both reprinted in R. Wasserstrom, ed. War and Morality, are G.E.M. Anscombe's “War and Murder” and Jan Narveson's “Pacifism: A Philosophical Analysis”.

One prominent writer on the philosophy of war who resists easy classifcation into any of these categories is Carl von Clausewitz. Clausewitz wrote On War, one of the most influential general sources, cited by soldiers and statesmen as often as by philosophers or international lawyers. M. Gelven's War and Existence is an interesting contemporary piece on the meaning and experience of war, with a Clausewitzian flavor to it.

In terms of international law, I strongly recommend the web-sites below. For hard copy sources, see especially: W. Reisman and C. Antoniou, eds. The Laws of War: A Comprehensive Collection of Primary Documents Governing Armed Conflict and A. Roberts and R. Guelff, eds., Documents on The Laws of War.

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